Hannah Arendt (1906–1975) was one of the most influential political philosophers of the twentieth century. Born into a German-Jewish family, she was forced to leave Germany in 1933 and lived in Paris for the next eight years, working for a number of Jewish refugee organisations. In 1941 she immigrated to the United States and soon became part of a lively intellectual circle in New York. She held a number of academic positions at various American universities until her death in 1975. She is best known for two works that had a major impact both within and outside the academic community. The first, The Origins of Totalitarianism, published in 1951, was a study of the Nazi and Stalinist regimes that generated a wide-ranging debate on the nature and historical antecedents of the totalitarian phenomenon. The second, The Human Condition, published in 1958, was an original philosophical study that investigated the fundamental categories of the vita activa (labor, work, action). In addition to these two important works, Arendt published a number of influential essays on topics such as the nature of revolution, freedom, authority, tradition and the modern age. At the time of her death in 1975, she had completed the first two volumes of her last major philosophical work, The Life of the Mind, which examined the three fundamental faculties of the vita contemplativa (thinking, willing, judging).
- 1. Biographical Sketch
- 2. Introduction
- 3. Arendt’s Conception of Modernity
- 4. Arendt’s Theory of Action
- 5. Arendt’s Theory of Judgment
- 6. Arendt’s Conception of Citizenship
- Academic Tools
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Hannah Arendt, one of the leading political thinkers of the twentieth century, was born in 1906 in Hanover and died in New York in 1975. In 1924, after having completed her high school studies, she went to Marburg University to study with Martin Heidegger. The encounter with Heidegger, with whom she had a brief but intense love-affair, had a lasting influence on her thought. After a year of study in Marburg, she moved to Freiburg University where she spent one semester attending the lectures of Edmund Husserl. In the spring of 1926 she went to Heidelberg University to study with Karl Jaspers, a philosopher with whom she established a long-lasting intellectual and personal friendship. She completed her doctoral dissertation, entitled Der Liebesbegriff bei Augustin (hereafter LA) under Jaspers’s supervision in 1929. She was forced to flee Germany in 1933 as a result of Hitler’s rise to power, and after a brief stay in Prague and Geneva she moved to Paris where for six years (1933–39) she worked for a number of Jewish refugee organisations. In 1936 she separated from her first husband, Günther Stern, and started to live with Heinrich Blücher, whom she married in 1940. During her stay in Paris she continued to work on her biography of Rahel Varnhagen, which was not published until 1957 (hereafter RV). In 1941 she was forced to leave France and moved to New York with her husband and mother. In New York she soon became part of an influential circle of writers and intellectuals gathered around the journal Partisan Review. During the post-war period she lectured at a number of American universities, including Princeton, Berkeley and Chicago, but was most closely associated with the New School for Social Research, where she was a professor of political philosophy until her death in 1975. In 1951 she published The Origins of Totalitarianism (hereafter OT), a major study of the Nazi and Stalinist regimes that soon became a classic, followed by The Human Condition in 1958 (hereafter HC), her most important philosophical work. In 1961 she attended the trial of Adolf Eichmann in Jerusalem as a reporter for The New Yorker magazine, and two years later published Eichmann in Jerusalem (hereafter EJ), which caused a deep controversy in Jewish circles. The same year saw the publication of On Revolution (hereafter OR), a comparative analysis of the American and French revolutions. A number of important essays were also published during the 1960s and early 1970s: a first collection was entitled Between Past and Future (hereafter BPF), a second Men in Dark Times (hereafter MDT), and a third Crises of the Republic (hereafter CR). At the time of her death in 1975, she had completed the first two volumes on Thinking and Willing of her last major philosophical work, The Life of the Mind, which was published posthumously in 1978 (hereafter LM). The third volume, on Judging, was left unfinished, but some background material and lecture notes were published in 1982 under the title Lectures on Kant’s Political Philosophy (hereafter LKPP).
Hannah Arendt was one of the seminal political thinkers of the twentieth century. The power and originality of her thinking was evident in works such as The Origins of Totalitarianism, The Human Condition, On Revolution and The Life of the Mind. In these works and in numerous essays she grappled with the most crucial political events of her time, trying to grasp their meaning and historical import, and showing how they affected our categories of moral and political judgment. What was required, in her view, was a new framework that could enable us to come to terms with the twin horrors of the twentieth century, Nazism and Stalinism. She provided such framework in her book on totalitarianism, and went on to develop a new set of philosophical categories that could illuminate the human condition and provide a fresh perspective on the nature of political life.
Although some of her works now belong to the classics of the Western tradition of political thought, she has always remained difficult to classify. Her political philosophy cannot be characterized in terms of the traditional categories of conservatism, liberalism, and socialism. Nor can her thinking be assimilated to the recent revival of communitarian political thought, to be found, for example, in the writings of A. MacIntyre, M. Sandel, C. Taylor and M. Walzer. Her name has been invoked by a number of critics of the liberal tradition, on the grounds that she presented a vision of politics that stood in opposition some key liberal principles. There are many strands of Arendt’s thought that could justify such a claim, in particular, her critique of representative democracy, her stress on civic engagement and political deliberation, her separation of morality from politics, and her praise of the revolutionary tradition. However, it would be a mistake to view Arendt as an anti-liberal thinker. Arendt was in fact a stern defender of constitutionalism and the rule of law, an advocate of fundamental human rights (among which she included not only the right to life, liberty, and freedom of expression, but also the right to action and to opinion), and a critic of all forms of political community based on traditional ties and customs, as well as those based on religious, ethnic, or racial identity.
Arendt’s political thought cannot, in this sense, be identified either with the liberal tradition or with the claims advanced by a number of its critics. Arendt did not conceive of politics as a means for the satisfaction of individual preferences, nor as a way to integrate individuals around a shared conception of the good. Her conception of politics is based instead on the idea of active citizenship, that is, on the value and importance of civic engagement and collective deliberation about all matters affecting the political community. If there is a tradition of thought with which Arendt can be identified, it is the classical tradition of civic republicanism originating in Aristotle and embodied in the writings of Machiavelli, Montesquieu, Jefferson, and Tocqueville. According to this tradition politics finds its authentic expression whenever citizens gather together in a public space to deliberate and decide about matters of collective concern. Political activity is valued not because it may lead to agreement or to a shared conception of the good, but because it enables each citizen to exercise his or her powers of agency, to develop the capacities for judgment and to attain by concerted action some measure of political efficacy.
In what follows, we reconstruct Arendt’s political philosophy along four major themes: (1) her conception of modernity, (2) her theory of action, (3) her theory of judgment, and (4) her conception of citizenship.
In her major philosophical work, The Human Condition, and in some of the essays collected in Between Past and Future, Arendt articulated a fairly negative conception of modernity. In these writings Arendt is primarily concerned with the losses incurred as a result of the eclipse of tradition, religion, and authority, but she offers a number of illuminating suggestions with respect to the resources that the modern age can still provide to address questions of meaning, identity, and value.
For Arendt modernity is characterized by the loss of the world, by which she means the restriction or elimination of the public sphere of action and speech in favor of the private world of introspection and the private pursuit of economic interests. Modernity is the age of mass society, of the rise of the social out of a previous distinction between the public and the private, and of the victory of animal laborans over homo faber and the classical conception of man as zoon politikon. Modernity is the age of bureaucratic administration and anonymous labor, rather than politics and action, of elite domination and the manipulation of public opinion. It is the age when totalitarian forms of government, such as Nazism and Stalinism, have emerged as a result of the institutionalization of terror and violence. It is the age where history as a “natural process” has replaced history as a fabric of actions and events, where homogeneity and conformity have replaced plurality and freedom, and where isolation and loneliness have eroded human solidarity and all spontaneous forms of living together. Modernity is the age where the past no longer carries any certainty of evaluation, where individuals, having lost their traditional standards and values, must search for new grounds of human community as such.
This is Arendt’s vision of modernity, a vision which, at first sight, appears quite stark and unredeeming. It is worth pointing out, however, that Arendt’s negative appraisal of modernity was shaped by her experience of totalitarianism in the twentieth century, and that her work provides a number of important insights that may help us to address certain problematic features of the modern age. In her political writings, and especially in The Origins of Totalitarianism, Arendt claimed that the phenomenon of totalitarianism has broken the continuity of Occidental history, and has rendered meaningless most of our moral and political categories. The break in our tradition has become irrevocable after the tragic events of the twentieth century and the triumph of totalitarian movements East and West. In the form of Stalinism and Nazism, totalitarianism has exploded the established categories of political thought and the accepted standards of moral judgment, and has thereby broken the continuity of our history. Faced with the tragic events of the Holocaust and the Gulag, we can no longer go back to traditional concepts and values, so as to explain the unprecedented by means of precedents, or to understand the monstrous by means of the familiar. The burden of our time must be faced without the aid of tradition, or as Arendt once put it, “without a bannister” (RPW, 336). Our inherited concepts and criteria for judgment have been dissolved under the impact of modern political events, and the task now is to re-establish the meaning of the past outside the framework of any tradition, since none have retained their original validity. It is the past, then, and not tradition, that Arendt attempts to preserve from the rupture in modern time-consciousness. Only by reappropriating the past by means of what Arendt called “the deadly impact of new thoughts” (MDT, 201) can we hope to restore meaning to the present and throw some light on the contemporary situation.
The hermeneutic strategy that Arendt employed to re-establish a link with the past is indebted to both Walter Benjamin and Martin Heidegger. From Benjamin she took the idea of a fragmentary historiography, one that seeks to identify the moments of rupture, displacement and dislocation in history. Such fragmentary historiography enables one to recover the lost potentials of the past in the hope that they may find actualization in the present. From Heidegger she took the idea of a deconstructive reading of the Western philosophical tradition, one that seeks to uncover the original meaning of our categories and to liberate them from the distorting incrustations of tradition. Such deconstructive hermeneutics enables one to recover those primordial experiences (Urphaenomene) which have been occluded or forgotten by the philosophical tradition, and thereby to recover the lost origins of our philosophical concepts and categories.
By relying on these two hermeneutic strategies Arendt hopes to redeem from the past its lost or “forgotten treasure,” that is, those fragments from the past that might still be of significance to us. In her view it is no longer possible, after the collapse of tradition, to save the past as a whole; the task, rather, is to redeem from oblivion those elements of the past that are still able to illuminate our situation. To re-establish a linkage with the past is not an antiquarian exercise; on the contrary, without the critical reappropriation of the past our temporal horizon becomes disrupted, our experience precarious, and our identity more fragile. In Arendt’s view, then, it is necessary to redeem from the past those moments worth preserving, to save those fragments from past treasures that are significant for us. Only by means of this critical reappropriation can we discover the past anew, endow it with relevance and meaning for the present, and make it a source of inspiration for the future.
This critical reappropriation is facilitated, in part, by the fact that after the rupture in modern time-consciousness the past may “open up to us with unexpected freshness and tell us things no one has yet had ears to hear” (BPF, 94). The breakdown of tradition may in fact provide the great chance to look upon the past “with eyes undistorted by any tradition, with a directness which has disappeared from Occidental reading and hearing ever since Roman civilization submitted to the authority of Greek thought” (BPF, 28–9).
Arendt’s return to the original experience of the Greek polis represents, in this sense, an attempt to break the fetters of a worn-out tradition and to rediscover a past over which tradition has no longer a claim. Against tradition Arendt sets the criterion of genuineness, against the authoritative that which is forgotten, concealed, or displaced at the margins of history. Only by operating against the grain of traditionalism and the claims of conventional historiography can the past be made meaningful again, provide sources of illumination for the present, and yield its treasures to those who search for them with “new thoughts” and saving acts of remembrance.
Arendt articulates her conception of modernity around a number of key features: these are world alienation, earth alienation, the rise of the social, and the victory of animal laborans. World alienation refers to the loss of an intersubjectively constituted world of experience and action by means of which we establish our self-identity and an adequate sense of reality. Earth alienation refers to the attempt to escape from the confines of the earth; spurred by modern science and technology, we have searched for ways to overcome our earth-bound condition by setting out on the exploration of space, by attempting to recreate life under laboratory conditions, and by trying to extend our given life-span. The rise of the social refers to the expansion of the market economy from the early modern period and the ever increasing accumulation of capital and social wealth. With the rise of the social everything has become an object of production and consumption, of acquisition and exchange; moreover, its constant expansion has resulted in the blurring of the distinction between the private and the public. The victory of animal laborans refers to the triumph of the values of labor over those of homo faber and of man as zoon politikon. All the values characteristic of the world of fabrication — permanence, stability, durability — as well as those characteristic of the world of action and speech — freedom, plurality, solidarity — are sacrificed in favor of the values of life, productivity and abundance.
Arendt identifies two main stages in the emergence of modernity: the first, from the sixteenth to the nineteenth century, corresponds to world alienation and the rise of the social, the second, from the beginning of the twentieth century, corresponds to earth alienation and the victory of animal laborans. She also identifies a number of causes: the discovery of America and the corresponding shrinking of the earth, the waves of expropriation started during the Reformation, the invention of the telescope challenging the adequacy of the senses, the rise of modern science and philosophy and subsequently of a conception of man as part of a process of Nature and History, and the expansion of the realm of the economy, of the production and accumulation of social wealth.
Arendt’s interpretation of modernity can be criticized on a number of grounds. We focus attention here on two categories employed by Arendt, those of nature, and the social. With respect to the category of nature, Arendt oscillates between two contrasting accounts. According to the first account, the modern age, by elevating labor, the most natural of human activities, to the highest position within the vita activa, has brought us too close to nature. Instead of building and preserving the human artifice and creating public spaces for action and deliberation, we are reduced to engage in the activity of sheer survival and in the production of things that are by definition perishable. According to the second account, however, the modern age is characterized by a growing artificiality, by the rejection of anything that is not man-made. Arendt cites the fact that natural processes, including that of life itself, have been recreated artificially by means of scientific experiment, that our natural environment has been extensively transformed and in some instances entirely replaced by technology, and that we have searched for ways to overcome our natural condition as earth-bound creatures by setting out on the exploration of space and envisaging the possibility of inhabiting other planets. All this leads to a situation where nothing around us will be a naturally given event, object, or process, but will instead be the product of our instruments and the will to refashion the world in our image.
These two accounts are difficult to reconcile, since in the former we have nature intruding upon and even destroying the human artifice, while in the latter we have art (techne) expanding upon and replacing everything natural or merely given. The result is to endow nature with an ambiguous status, since in the former case the victory of animal laborans indicates our subjection to natural processes, while in the latter case the expansion of scientific knowledge and of technological mastery indicates the overcoming of all natural limits. The modern world would thus appear to be too natural and too artificial, too much under the dominance of labor and the life-process of the species, as well as too much under the dominance of techne.
With respect to the second category, that of the social, Arendt was unable to account for certain important features of the modern world. Arendt identifies the social with all those activities formerly restricted to the private sphere of the household and having to do with the necessities of life. Her claim is that, with the tremendous expansion of the economy from the end of the eighteenth century, all such activities have taken over the public realm and transformed it into a sphere for the satisfaction of our material needs. Society has thus invaded and conquered the public realm, turning it into a function of what previously were private needs and concerns, and has thereby destroyed the boundary separating the public and the private. Arendt also claims that with the expansion of the social realm the tripartite division of human activities has been undermined to the point of becoming meaningless. In her view, once the social realm has established its monopoly, the distinction between labor, work and action is lost, since every effort is now expended on reproducing our material conditions of existence. Obsessed with life, productivity, and consumption, we have turned into a society of laborers and jobholders who no longer appreciate the values associated with work, nor those associated with action.
From this brief account it is clear that Arendt’s concept of the social plays a crucial role in her assessment of modernity. I would argue, however, that it blinds her to many important issues and leads her to a series of questionable judgments. In the first place, Arendt’s characterization of the social is overly restricted. She claims that the social is the realm of labor, of biological and material necessity, of the reproduction of our condition of existence. She also claims that the rise of the social coincides with the expansion of the economy from the end of the eighteenth century. However, having identified the social with the growth of the economy in the past two centuries, Arendt cannot characterize it in terms of a subsistence model of simple reproduction (Benhabib 2003, Ch. 6; Bernstein 1986, Ch. 9; Hansen 1993, Ch. 3; Parekh 1981, Ch. 8). Secondly, Arendt’s identification of the social with the activities of the household is responsible for a major shortcoming in her analysis of the economy. She is, in fact, unable to acknowledge that a modern capitalist economy constitutes a structure of power with a highly asymmetric distribution of costs and rewards. By relying on the misleading analogy of the household, she maintains that all questions pertaining to the economy are pre-political, and thus ignores the crucial question of economic power and exploitation (Bernstein 1986, Ch. 9; Hansen 1993, Ch. 3; Parekh 1981, Ch. 8; Pitkin 1998; Pitkin 1994, Ch. 10, Hinchman and Hinchman; Wolin 1994, Ch. 11, Hinchman and Hinchman). Finally, by insisting on a strict separation between the private and the public, and between the social and the political, she is unable to account for the essential connection between these spheres and the struggles to redraw their boundaries. Today many so-called private issues have become public concerns, and the struggle for justice and equal rights has extended into many spheres. By insulating the political sphere from the concerns of the social, and by maintaining a strict distinction between the public and the private, Arendt is unable to account for some of the most important achievements of modernity — the extension of justice and equal rights, and the redrawing of the boundaries between the public and the private (Benhabib 2003, Ch. 6; Bernstein 1986, Ch. 9; Dietz 2002, Ch. 5; Pitkin 1998; Pitkin 1995, Ch. 3, Honig; Zaretsky 1997, Ch. 8, Calhoun and McGowan).
Arendt’s theory of action and her revival of the ancient notion of praxis represent one of the most original contributions to twentieth century political thought. By distinguishing action (praxis) from fabrication (poiesis), by linking it to freedom and plurality, and by showing its connection to speech and remembrance, Arendt is able to articulate a conception of politics in which questions of meaning and identity can be addressed in a fresh and original manner. Moreover, by viewing action as a mode of human togetherness, Arendt is able to develop a conception of participatory democracy which stands in direct contrast to the bureaucratized and elitist forms of politics so characteristic of the modern epoch.
In what follows, we focus on some of the key components of Arendt’s theory of action, such as freedom, plurality and disclosure. We then examine the links between action and narrative, the importance of remembrance, and of what may be called “communities of memory.” We then show the connection between action, power and the space of appearance. Lastly, we look at the remedies for the unpredictability and irreversibility of action, namely, the power of promise and the power to forgive.
Action, the only activity that goes on directly between men without the intermediary of things or matter, corresponds to the human condition of plurality … this plurality is specifically the condition — not only the conditio sine qua non, but the conditio per quam — of all political life. (HC, 7)
For Arendt, action is one of the fundamental categories of the human condition and constitutes the highest realization of the vita activa. Arendt analyzes the vita activa via three categories which correspond to the three fundamental activities of our being-in-the-world: labor, work, and action. Labor is the activity which is tied to the human condition of life, work the activity which is tied to the condition of worldliness, and action the activity tied to the condition of plurality. For Arendt each activity is autonomous, in the sense of having its own distinctive principles and of being judged by different criteria. Labor is judged by its ability to sustain human life, to cater to our biological needs of consumption and reproduction, work is judged by its ability to build and maintain a world fit for human use, and action is judged by its ability to disclose the identity of the agent, to affirm the reality of the world, and to actualize our capacity for freedom.
Although Arendt considers the three activities of labor, work and action equally necessary to a complete human life, in the sense that each contributes in its distinctive way to the realization of our human capacities, it is clear from her writings that she takes action to be the differentia specifica of human beings, that which distinguishes them from both the life of animals (who are similar to us insofar as they need to labor to sustain and reproduce themselves) and the life of the gods (with whom we share, intermittently, the activity of contemplation). In this respect the categories of labor and work, while significant in themselves, must be seen as counterpoints to the category of action, helping to differentiate and highlight the place of action within the order of the vita activa.
The two central features of action are freedom and plurality. By freedom Arendt does not mean the ability to choose among a set of possible alternatives (the freedom of choice so dear to the liberal tradition) or the faculty of liberum arbitrium which, according to Christian doctrine, was given to us by God. Rather, by freedom Arendt means the capacity to begin, to start something new, to do the unexpected, with which all human beings are endowed by virtue of being born. Action as the realization of freedom is therefore rooted in natality, in the fact that each birth represents a new beginning and the introduction of novelty in the world.
To be sure, Arendt recognizes that all activities are in some way related to the phenomenon of natality, since both labor and work are necessary to create and preserve a world into which new human beings are constantly born. However, of the three activities, action is the one most closely connected with natality, because by acting individuals re-enact the miracle of beginning inherent in their birth. For Arendt, the beginning that each of us represents by virtue of being born is actualized every time we act, that is, every time we begin something new. As she puts it: “the new beginning inherent in birth can make itself felt in the world only because the newcomer possesses the capacity of beginning something anew, that is, of acting ” (HC, 9).
Arendt also stresses the fact that since action as beginning is rooted in natality, since it is the actualization of freedom, it carries with it the capacity to perform miracles, that is, to introduce what is totally unexpected. “It is in the nature of beginning” — she claims — “that something new is started which cannot be expected from whatever may have happened before. This character of startling unexpectedness is inherent in all beginnings … The fact that man is capable of action means that the unexpected can be expected from him, that he is able to perform what is infinitely improbable. And this again is possible only because each man is unique, so that with each birth something uniquely new comes into the world ” (HC, 177–8).
The birth of every individual is thus the promise of a new beginning: to act means to be able to disclose one’s self and to do the unanticipated; and it is entirely in keeping with this conception that most of the concrete examples of action in the modern age that Arendt discusses are cases of revolutions and popular uprisings. Her claim is that “revolutions are the only political events which confront us directly and inevitably with the problem of beginning,” (OR, 21) since they represent the attempt to found a new political space, a space where freedom can appear as a worldly reality. The favorite example for Arendt is the American Revolution, because there the act of foundation took the form of a constitution of liberty. Her other examples are the revolutionary clubs of the French Revolution, the Paris Commune of 1871, the creation of Soviets during the Russian Revolution, the French Resistance to Hitler in the Second World War, and the Hungarian revolt of 1956. In all these cases individual men and women had the courage to interrupt their routine activities, to step forward from their private lives in order to create a public space where freedom could appear, and to act in such a way that the memory of their deeds could become a source of inspiration for the future. In doing so, according to Arendt, they rediscovered the truth known to the ancient Greeks that action is the supreme blessing of human life, that which bestows significance to the lives of individuals.
In the book On Revolution Arendt devotes much attention to the rediscovery of this truth by those who participated in the American Revolution. In her view the Founding Fathers, although they might have pretended that they longed for private life and engaged in politics only out of a sense of duty, made clear in their letters and recollections that they had discovered unexpected delights in action and had acquired a taste for public freedom and for earning distinction among their peers.
Plurality, to which we may now turn, is the other central feature of action. For if to act means to take the initiative, to introduce the novum and the unexpected into the world, it also means that it is not something that can be done in isolation from others, that is, independently of the presence of a plurality of actors who from their different perspectives can judge the quality of what is being enacted. In this respect action needs plurality in the same way that performance artists need an audience; without the presence and acknowledgment of others, action would cease to be a meaningful activity. Action, to the extent that it requires appearing in public, making oneself known through words and deeds, and eliciting the consent of others, can only exist in a context defined by plurality.
Arendt establishes the connection between action and plurality by means of an anthropological argument. In her view just as life is the condition that corresponds to the activity of labor and worldliness the condition that corresponds to the activity of work, so plurality is the condition that corresponds to action. She defines plurality as “the fact that men, not Man, live on the earth and inhabit the world,” and says that it is the condition of human action “because we are all the same, that is, human, in such a way that nobody is ever the same as anyone else who ever lived, lives, or will live ” (HC, 7–8). Plurality thus refers both to equality and distinction, to the fact that all human beings belong to the same species and are sufficiently alike to understand one another, but yet no two of them are ever interchangeable, since each of them is an individual endowed with a unique biography and perspective on the world.
It is by virtue of plurality that each of us is capable of acting and relating to others in ways that are unique and distinctive, and in so doing of contributing to a network of actions and relationships that is infinitely complex and unpredictable. This network of actions is what makes up the realm of human affairs, that space where individuals relate directly without the intermediary of things or matter — that is, through language. Let us examine briefly this connection between action and language.
In The Human Condition Arendt stresses repeatedly that action is primarily symbolic in character and that the web of human relationships is sustained by communicative interaction (HC, 178–9, 184–6, 199–200). We may formulate it as follows. Action entails speech: by means of language we are able to articulate the meaning of our actions and to coordinate the actions of a plurality of agents. Conversely, speech entails action, not only in the sense that speech itself is a form of action, or that most acts are performed in the manner of speech, but in the sense that action is often the means whereby we check the sincerity of the speaker. Thus, just as action without speech runs the risk of being meaningless and would be impossible to coordinate with the actions of others, so speech without action would lack one of the means by which we may confirm the veracity of the speaker. As we shall see, this link between action and speech is central to Arendt’s characterization of power, that potential which springs up between people when they act “in concert,” and which is actualized “only where word and deed have not parted company, where words are not empty and deeds not brutal, where words are not used to veil intentions but to disclose realities, and deeds are not used to violate and destroy but to establish relations and create new realities ” (HC, 200).
Let us now turn to an examination of the disclosing power of action and speech. In the opening section of the chapter on action in The Human Condition Arendt discusses one of its central functions, namely, the disclosure of the identity of the agent. In action and speech, she maintains, individuals reveal themselves as the unique individuals they are, disclose to the world their distinct personalities. In terms of Arendt’s distinction, they reveal “who” they are as distinct to “what” they are — the latter referring to individual abilities and talents, as well as deficiencies and shortcomings, which are traits all human beings share. Neither labor nor work enable individuals to disclose their identities, to reveal “who” they are as distinct from “what” they are. In labor the individuality of each person is submerged by being bound to a chain of natural necessities, to the constraints imposed by biological survival. When we engage in labor we can only show our sameness, the fact that we all belong to the human species and must attend to the needs of our bodies. In this sphere we do indeed “behave,” “perform roles,” and “fulfill functions,” since we all obey the same imperatives. In work there is more scope for individuality, in that each work of art or production bears the mark of its maker; but the maker is still subordinate to the end product, both in the sense of being guided by a model, and in the sense that the product will generally outlast the maker. Moreover, the end product reveals little about the maker except the fact that he or she was able to make it. It does not tell us who the creator was, only that he or she had certain abilities and talents. It is thus only in action and speech, in interacting with others through words and deeds, that individuals reveal who they personally are and can affirm their unique identities. Action and speech are in this sense very closely related because both contain the answer to the question asked of every newcomer: “Who are you?” This disclosure of the “who” is made possible by both deeds and words, but of the two it is speech that has the closest affinity to revelation. Without the accompaniment of speech, action would lose its revelatory quality and could no longer be identified with an agent. It would lack, as it were, the conditions of ascription of agency.
We have seen, then, how through action and speech individuals are able to disclose their identities, to reveal their specific uniqueness — their who — as distinct from their personal abilities and talents — their what. However, while engaging in speech and action individuals can never be sure what kind of self they will reveal. Only retrospectively, that is, only through the stories that will arise from their deeds and performances, will their identity become fully manifest. The function of the storyteller is thus crucial not only for the preservation of the doings and sayings of actors, but also for the full disclosure of the identity of the actor. The narratives of a storyteller, Arendt claims, “tell us more about their subjects, the ‘hero’ in the center of each story, than any product of human hands ever tells us about the master who produced it” (HC, 184). Without a Plato to tell us who Socrates was, what his conversations with fellow Athenian citizens were like, without a Thucydides to set down Pericles’ Funeral Speech and refashion it in his powerful and dramatic style, we would not have known what made Socrates and Pericles such outstanding personalities, nor would the reason for their uniqueness have been made fully manifest. Indeed, it is one of Arendt’s most important claims that the meaning of action itself is dependent upon the articulation retrospectively given to it by historians and narrators.
Storytelling, or the weaving of a narrative out of the actions and pronouncements of individuals, is partly constitutive of their meaning, because it enables the retrospective articulation of their significance and import, both for the actors themselves and for the spectators. Being absorbed by their immediate aims and concerns, not aware of the full implications of their actions, actors are often not in a position to assess the true significance of their doings, or to be fully aware of their own motives and intentions. Only when action has run a certain course, and its relationship to other actions has unfolded, can its significance be made fully manifest and be embodied in a narrative, whether of poets or historians. The fact that this narrative is temporally deferred, that it is at some distance from the events it describes, is one of the reasons why it can provide further insight into the motives and aims of the actors.
Narratives can thus provide a measure of truthfulness and a greater degree of significance to the actions of individuals. But they also preserve the memory of deeds through time, and in so doing, they enable these deeds to become sources of inspiration for the future, that is, models to be imitated, and, if possible, surpassed. One of the principal drawbacks of action, Arendt maintains, is to be extremely fragile, to be subject to the erosion of time and to forgetfulness; unlike the products of the activity of work, which acquire a measure of permanence by virtue of their sheer facticity, deeds and words do not survive their enactment unless they are remembered. Remembrance alone, the retelling of deeds as stories, can save the lives and deeds of actors from oblivion and futility. And it is precisely for this reason, Arendt points out, that the Greeks valued poetry and history so highly, because they rescued the glorious (as well as the less glorious) deeds of the past for the benefit of future generations (HC, 192 ff; BPF, 63–75). It was the poet’s and the historian’s political function to preserve the memory of past actions and to make them a source of instruction for the future. Homer was known as the “educator of Hellas,” since he immortalized for all those who came after him the events of the Trojan War; Thucydides, in his History of the Peloponnesian War, told a story of human ambition and folly, of courage and unchecked greed, of ruthless struggle and inevitable defeat. In their work the past became a repository of instruction, of actions to be emulated as well as deeds to be shunned. Through their narratives the fragility and perishability of human action was overcome and made to outlast the lives of their doers and the limited life-span of their contemporaries.
However, to be preserved, such narratives needed in turn an audience, that is, a community of hearers who became the transmitters of the deeds that had been immortalized. As Sheldon Wolin has aptly put it, “audience is a metaphor for the political community whose nature is to be a community of remembrance” (Wolin 1977, 97). In other words, behind the actor stands the storyteller, but behind the storyteller stands a community of memory.
It was one of the primary functions of the polis to be precisely such a community, to preserve the words and deeds of its citizens from oblivion and the ravages of time, and thereby to leave a testament for future generations. The Greek polis, beyond making possible the sharing of words and deeds and multiplying the occasions to win immortal fame, was meant to remedy the frailty of human affairs. It did this by establishing a framework where action and speech could be recorded and transformed into stories, where every citizen could be a witness and thereby a potential narrator. What the polis established, then, was a space where organized remembrance could take place, and where, as a result, the mortality of actors and the fragility of human deeds could be partially overcome.
The metaphor of the polis recurs constantly in the writings of Arendt. This is indeed a ‘metaphor’ because in employing this term Arendt is not simply referring to the political institutions of the Greek city-states, bounded as they were to their time and circumstance, but to all those instances in history where a public realm of action and speech was set up among a community of free and equal citizens. “The polis, properly speaking, is not the city-state in its physical location; it is the organization of the people as it arises out of acting and speaking together, and its true space lies between people living together for this purpose, no matter where they happen to be” (HC, 198). Thus the famous motto: “Wherever you go, you will be a polis” expressed the conviction among the Greek colonists that the kind of political association they had set up originally could be reproduced in their new settlements, that the space created by the “sharing of words and deeds” could find its proper location almost anywhere.
For Arendt, therefore, the polis stands for the space of appearance, for that space “where I appear to others as others appear to me, where men exist not merely like other living or inanimate things, but to make their appearance explicitly.” Such public space of appearance can be always recreated anew wherever individuals gather together politically, that is, “wherever men are together in the manner of speech and action” (HC, 198–9). However, since it is a creation of action, this space of appearance is highly fragile and exists only when actualized through the performance of deeds or the utterance of words. Its peculiarity, as Arendt says, is that “unlike the spaces which are the work of our hands, it does not survive the actuality of the movement which brought it into being, but disappears not only with the dispersal of men — as in the case of great catastrophes when the body politic of a people is destroyed — but with the disappearance or arrest of the activities themselves. Wherever people gather together, it is potentially there, but only potentially, not necessarily and not forever” (HC, 199).
The space of appearance must be continually recreated by action; its existence is secured whenever actors gather together for the purpose of discussing and deliberating about matters of public concern, and it disappears the moment these activities cease. It is always a potential space that finds its actualization in the actions and speeches of individuals who have come together to undertake some common project. It may arise suddenly, as in the case of revolutions, or it may develop slowly out of the efforts to change some specific piece of legislation or policy. Historically, it has been recreated whenever public spaces of action and deliberation have been set up, from town hall meetings to workers’ councils, from demonstrations and sit-ins to struggles for justice and equal rights.
This capacity to act in concert for a public-political purpose is what Arendt calls power. Power needs to be distinguished from strength, force, and violence (CR, 143–55). Unlike strength, it is not the property of an individual, but of a plurality of actors joining together for some common political purpose. Unlike force, it is not a natural phenomenon but a human creation, the outcome of collective engagement. And unlike violence, it is based not on coercion but on consent and rational persuasion.
For Arendt, power is a sui generis phenomenon, since it is a product of action and rests entirely on persuasion. It is a product of action because it arises out of the concerted activities of a plurality of agents, and it rests on persuasion because it consists in the ability to secure the consent of others through unconstrained discussion and debate. Its only limitation is the existence of other people, but this limitation, she notes, “is not accidental, because human power corresponds to the condition of plurality to begin with” (HC, 201). It is actualized in all those cases where action is undertaken for communicative (rather than strategic or instrumental) purposes, and where speech is employed to disclose our intentions and to articulate our motives to others.
Arendt maintains that the legitimacy of power is derived from the initial getting together of people, that is, from the original pact of association that establishes a political community, and is reaffirmed whenever individuals act in concert through the medium of speech and persuasion. For her “power needs no justification, being inherent in the very existence of political communities; what it does need is legitimacy ... Power springs up whenever people get together and act in concert, but it derives its legitimacy from the initial getting together rather than from any action that then may follow” (CR, 151).
Beyond appealing to the past, power also relies for its continued legitimacy on the rationally binding commitments that arise out of a process of free and undistorted communication. Because of this, power is highly independent of material factors: it is sustained not by economic, bureaucratic or military means, but by the power of common convictions that result from a process of fair and unconstrained deliberation.
Power is also not something that can be relied upon at all times or accumulated and stored for future use. Rather, it exists only as a potential which is actualized when actors gather together for political action and public deliberation. It is thus closely connected to the space of appearance, that public space which arises out of the actions and speeches of individuals. Indeed, for Arendt, “power is what keeps the public realm, the potential space of appearance between acting and speaking men, in existence.” Like the space of appearance, power is always “a power potential and not an unchangeable, measurable and reliable entity like force or strength … [it] springs up between men when they act together and vanishes the moment they disperse” (HC, 200).
Power, then, lies at the basis of every political community and is the expression of a potential that is always available to actors. It is also the source of legitimacy of political and governmental institutions, the means whereby they are transformed and adapted to new circumstances and made to respond to the opinions and needs of the citizens. “It is the people’s support that lends power to the institutions of a country, and this support is but the continuation of the consent that brought the laws into existence to begin with … All political institutions are manifestations and materializations of power; they petrify and decay as soon as the living power of the people ceases to uphold them” (CR, 140).
The legitimacy of political institutions is dependent on the power, that is, the active consent of the people; and insofar as governments may be viewed as attempts to preserve power for future generations by institutionalizing it, they require for their vitality the continuing support and active involvement of all citizens.
The discussion of Arendt’s theory of action so far has stressed a number of features, chief among which is action’s capacity to disclose the identity of the agent, to enable freedom to appear and be actualized as a worldly reality, to create and sustain a public space of appearance, and to make possible the generation of power. We have also emphasized the importance of narrative and remembrance, of the retrospective articulation of the meaning of action by means of storytelling and its preservation through a community of memory. In conclusion, we examine two other features of action, namely, unpredictability and irreversibility, and their respective remedies, the power of promise and the power to forgive.
Action is unpredictable because it is a manifestation of freedom, of the capacity to innovate and to alter situations by engaging in them; but also, and primarily, because it takes place within the web of human relationships, within a context defined by plurality, so that no actor can control its final outcome. Each actor sets off processes and enters into the inextricable web of actions and events to which all other actors also contribute, with the result that the outcome can never be predicted from the intentions of any particular actor. The open and unpredictable nature of action is a consequence of human freedom and plurality: by acting we are free to start processes and bring about new events, but no actor has the power to control the consequences of his or her deeds.
Another and related reason for the unpredictability of action is that its consequences are boundless: every act sets in motion an unlimited number of actions and reactions which have literally no end. As Arendt puts it: “The reason why we are never able to foretell with certainty the outcome and end of any action is simply that action has no end” (HC, 233). This is because action “though it may proceed from nowhere, so to speak, acts into a medium where every action becomes a chain reaction and where every process is the cause of new processes … the smallest act in the most limited circumstances bears the seed of the same boundlessness, because one deed, and sometimes one word, suffices to change every constellation” (HC, 190).
Closely connected to the boundlessness and unpredictability of action is its irreversibility. Every action sets off processes which cannot be undone or retrieved in the way, say, we are able to undo a faulty product of our hands. If one builds an artifact and is not satisfied with it, it can always be destroyed and recreated again. This is impossible where action is concerned, because action always takes place within an already existing web of human relationships, where every action becomes a reaction, every deed a source of future deeds, and none of these can be stopped or subsequently undone. The consequences of each act are thus not only unpredictable but also irreversible; the processes started by action can neither be controlled nor be reversed.
The remedy which the tradition of Western thought has proposed for the unpredictability and irreversibility of action has consisted in abstaining from action altogether, in the withdrawal from the sphere of interaction with others, in the hope that one’s freedom and integrity could thereby be preserved. Platonism, Stoicism and Christianity elevated the sphere of contemplation above the sphere of action, precisely because in the former one could be free from the entanglements and frustrations of action. Arendt’s proposal, by contrast, is not to turn one’s back on the realm of human affairs, but to rely on two faculties inherent in action itself, the faculty of forgiving and the faculty of promising. These two faculties are closely connected, the former mitigating the irreversibility of action by absolving the actor from the unintended consequences of his or her deeds, the latter moderating the uncertainty of its outcome by binding actors to certain courses of action and thereby setting some limit to the unpredictability of the future. Both faculties are, in this respect, connected to temporality: from the standpoint of the present forgiving looks backward to what has happened and absolves the actor from what was unintentionally done, while promising looks forward as it seeks to establish islands of security in an otherwise uncertain and unpredictable future.
Forgiving enables us to come to terms with the past and liberates us to some extent from the burden of irreversibility; promising allows us to face the future and to set some bounds to its unpredictability. As Arendt puts it: “Without being forgiven, released from the consequences of what we have done, our capacity to act would, as it were, be confined to one single deed from which we could never recover; we would remain the victims of its consequences forever.” On the other hand, “without being bound to the fulfillment of promises, we would never be able to keep our identities; we would be condemned to wander helplessly and without direction in the darkness of each man’s lonely heart” (HC, 237). Both faculties, in this sense, depend on plurality, on the presence and acting of others, for no one can forgive himself and no one can feel bound by a promise made only to one’s self. At the same time, both faculties are an expression of human freedom, since without the faculty to undo what we have done in the past, and without the ability to control at least partially the processes we have started, we would be the victims “of an automatic necessity bearing all the marks of inexorable laws” (HC, 246).
One of the most enduring contributions of Arendt’s political thought is to be found in her reflections on judgment which were to occupy the last years of her life. Together with the theory of action, her unfinished theory of judgment represents her central legacy to twentieth century political thought. We now explore some of the key aspects of her theory of judgment, and will examine its place in the architectonic of Arendt’s theory of politics.
Arendt’s theory of judgment was never developed as systematically or extensively as her theory of action. She intended to complete her study of the life of the mind by devoting the third volume to the faculty of judgment, but was not able to do so because of her untimely death in 1975. What she left was a number of reflections scattered in the first two volumes on Thinking and Willing (LM, vol. I; vol. II), a series of lectures on Kant’s political philosophy delivered at the New School for Social Research in the Fall of 1970 (LKPP), an essay entitled “Thinking and Moral Considerations” written at the time she was composing The Life of the Mind (TMC, 417–46), and two articles included in Between Past and Future where judgment and opinion are treated in relation to culture and taste (“The Crisis in Culture” – BPF, 197–226) and with respect to the question of truth (“Truth and Politics” – BPF, 227–64). However, these writings do not present a unified theory of judgment but, rather, two distinct models, one based on the standpoint of the actor, the other on the standpoint of the spectator, which are somewhat at odds with each other. Arendt’s writings on the theme of judgment can be seen to fall into two more or less distinct phases, an early one in which judgment is the faculty of political actors acting in the public realm, and a later one in which it is the privilege of non-participating spectators, primarily poets and historians, who seek to understand the meaning of the past and to reconcile us to what has happened. In this later formulation Arendt is no longer concerned with judging as a feature of political life as such, as the faculty which is exercised by actors in order to decide how to act in the public realm, but with judgment as a component in the life of the mind, the faculty through which the privileged spectators can recover meaning from the past and thereby reconcile themselves to time and, retrospectively, to tragedy.
In addition to presenting us with two models of judgment which stand in tension with each other, Arendt did not clarify the status of judgment with respect to two of its philosophical sources, Aristotle and Kant. The two conceptions seem to pull in opposite directions, the Aristotelian toward a concern with the particular, the Kantian toward a concern with universality and impartiality.
It would appear, therefore, that Arendt’s theory of judgment not only incorporates two models, the actor’s — judging in order to act — and the spectator’s — judging in order to cull meaning from the past — but that the philosophical sources it draws upon are somewhat at odds with each other.
Arendt’s concern with judgment as the faculty of retrospective assessment that allows meaning to be redeemed from the past originated in her attempt to come to terms with the twin political tragedies of the twentieth century, Nazism and Stalinism. Faced with the horrors of the extermination camps and what is now termed the Gulag, Arendt strove to understand these phenomena in their own terms, neither deducing them from precedents nor placing them in some overarching scheme of historical necessity. This need to come to terms with the traumatic events of the twentieth century, and to understand them in a manner that does not explain them away but faces them in all their starkness and unprecedentedness, is something to which Arendt returns again and again. Our inherited framework for judgment fails us “as soon as we try to apply it honestly to the central political experiences of our own time” (UP, 379). Even our ordinary common-sense judgment is rendered ineffective, since “we are living in a topsy-turvy world, a world where we cannot find our way by abiding by the rules of what once was common sense” (UP, 383).
The crisis in understanding is therefore coeval with a crisis in judgment, insofar as understanding for Arendt is “so closely related to and interrelated with judging that one must describe both as the subsumption of something particular under a universal rule” (UP, 383). Once these rules have lost their validity we are no longer able to understand and to judge the particulars, that is, we are no longer able to subsume them under our accepted categories of moral and political thought. Arendt, however, does not believe that the loss of these categories has brought to an end our capacity to judge; on the contrary, since human beings are distinguished by their capacity to begin anew, they are able to fashion new categories and to formulate new standards of judgment for the events that have come to pass and for those that may emerge in the future.
For Arendt, therefore, the enormity and unprecedentedness of totalitarianism have not destroyed, strictly speaking, our ability to judge; rather, they have destroyed our accepted standards of judgment and our conventional categories of interpretation and assessment, be they moral or political. And in this situation the only recourse is to appeal to the imagination, which allows us to view things in their proper perspective and to judge them without the benefit of a pre-given rule or universal. For Arendt, the imagination enables us to create the distance which is necessary for an impartial judgment, while at the same time allowing for the closeness that makes understanding possible. In this way it makes possible our reconciliation with reality, even with the tragic reality of the twentieth century.
Arendt’s participation at the trial of Eichmann in the early sixties made her once more aware of the need to come to terms with a reality that initially defied human comprehension. How could such an ordinary, law-abiding, and all-too-human individual have committed such atrocities? The impact of the trial also forced her to raise another problem concerning judgment, namely, whether we are entitled to presuppose “an independent human faculty, unsupported by law and public opinion, that judges anew in full spontaneity every deed and intent whenever the occasion arises” (PRD, 187).
Arendt returned to this issue in The Life of the Mind, a work which was meant to encompass the three faculties of thinking, willing, and judging. In the introduction to the first volume she declared that the immediate impulse to write it came from attending the Eichmann trial in Jerusalem, while the second, equally important motive, was to provide an account of our mental activities that was missing from her previous work on the vita activa. It was Eichmann’s absence of thinking, his “thoughtlessness,” that struck her most, because it was responsible in her view for his inability to judge in those circumstances where judgment was most needed. “It was this absence of thinking,” she wrote, “that awakened my interest. Is evil-doing … possible in default of not just ‘base motives’ ... but of any motives whatever … Might the problem of good and evil, our faculty for telling right from wrong, be connected with our faculty of thought?” (LM, vol. I, 4–5).
Arendt attempted a reply by connecting the activity of thinking to that of judging in a twofold manner. First, thinking — the silent dialogue of me and myself — dissolves our fixed habits of thought and the accepted rules of conduct, and thus prepares the way for the activity of judging particulars without the aid of pre-established universals. It is not that thinking provides judgment with new rules for subsuming the particular under the universal. Rather, it loosens the grip of the universal over the particular, thereby releasing judgment from ossified categories of thought and conventional standards of assessment. It is in times of historical crisis that thinking ceases to be a marginal affair, because by undermining all established criteria and values, it prepares the individual to judge for him or herself instead of being carried away by the actions and opinions of the majority.
The second way in which Arendt connected the activity of thinking with that of judging is by showing that thinking, by actualizing the dialogue of me and myself which is given in consciousness, produces conscience as a by-product. This conscience, unlike the voice of God or what later thinkers called lumen naturale, gives no positive prescriptions; it only tells us what not to do, what to avoid in our actions and dealings with others, as well as what to repent of. Arendt notes in this context that Socrates’ dictum “It is better to suffer wrong than to do wrong,” and his proposition that “It would be better for me that my lyre or a chorus I directed should be out of tune and loud with discord, and that multitudes of men should disagree with me, rather than that I, being one, should be out of harmony with myself and contradict me,” derive their validity from the idea that there is a silent partner within ourselves to whom we render account of our actions (TMC, 29–30; 35). What we fear most is the anticipation of the presence of this partner (i.e., our conscience) who awaits us at the end of the day.
Arendt also remarks that thinking, as the actualization of the difference given in consciousness, “is not a prerogative of the few but an ever-present faculty in everybody; by the same token, inability to think is not a failing of the many who lack brain power, but an ever-present possibility for everybody” (LM, vol. I, 191). For those who do engage in thinking, however, conscience emerges as an inevitable by-product. As the side-effect of thinking, conscience has its counterpart in judgment as the by-product of the liberating activity of thought. If conscience represents the inner check by which we evaluate our actions, judgment represents the outer manifestation of our capacity to think critically. Both faculties relate to the question of right and wrong, but while conscience directs attention to the self, judgment directs attention to the world. In this respect, judgment makes possible what Arendt calls “the manifestation of the wind of thought” in the sphere of appearance.
The foregoing account has explored the way in which Arendt attempted to connect the activity of thinking to our capacity to judge. To be sure, this connection of thinking and judging seems to operate only in emergencies, in those exceptional moments where individuals, faced with the collapse of traditional standards, must come up with new ones and judge according to their own autonomous values. There is, however, a second, more elaborated view of judgment which does not restrict it to moments of crisis, but which identifies it with the capacity to think representatively, that is, from the standpoint of everyone else. Arendt called this capacity to think representatively an “enlarged mentality,” adopting the same terms that Kant employed in his Third Critique to characterize aesthetic judgment. It is to this work that we must now turn our attention, since Arendt based her theory of political judgment on Kant’s aesthetics rather than on his moral philosophy.
At first sight this might seem a puzzling choice, since Kant himself based his moral and political philosophy on practical reason and not on our aesthetic faculties. Arendt, however, claimed that the Critique of Judgment contained Kant’s unwritten political philosophy, and that the first part of it, the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment,” was the most fruitful basis on which to build a theory of political judgment, since it dealt with the world of appearances from the point of view of the judging spectator and took as its starting point the faculty of taste, understood as a faculty of concrete and embodied subjects (BPF, 219–20).
For Arendt the capacity to judge is a specifically political ability insofar as it enables individuals to orient themselves in the public realm and to judge the phenomena that are disclosed within it from a standpoint that is relatively detached and impartial. She credits Kant with having dislodged the prejudice that judgments of taste lie altogether outside the political realm, since they supposedly concern only aesthetic matters. She believes, in fact, that by linking taste to that wider manner of thinking which Kant called an “enlarged mentality” the way was opened to a revaluation of judgment as a specific political ability, namely, as the ability to think in the place of everybody else. It is only in Kant’s Critique of Judgment that we find a conception of judgment as the ability to deal with particulars in their particularity, that is, without subsuming them under a pre-given universal, but actively searching the universal out of the particular. Kant formulated this distinction as that between determinant and reflective judgments. For him judgment in general is the faculty of thinking the particular as contained under the universal. If the universal, (the rule, principle, or law) is given, then the judgment which subsumes the particular under it is determinant. If, however, only the particular is given and the universal has to be found for it, then the judgment is reflective. For Kant determinant judgments were cognitive, while reflective judgments were non-cognitive. Reflective judgment is seen as the capacity to ascend from the particular to the universal without the mediation of determinate concepts given in advance; it is reasoning about particulars in their relation to the universal rather than reasoning about universals in their relation to the particular. In the case of aesthetic judgment this means that one can understand and apply the universal predicate of beauty only through experiencing a particular object that exemplifies it. Thus, upon encountering a flower, a unique landscape, or a particular painting, one is able to say that it is an example of beauty, that it possesses “exemplary validity.”
For Arendt this notion of exemplary validity is not restricted to aesthetic objects or to individuals who exemplified certain virtues. Rather, she wants to extend this notion to events in the past that carry a meaning beyond their sheer enactment, that is, to events that could be seen as exemplary for those who came after. It is here that aesthetic judgment joins with the retrospective judgment of the historian. The American and French Revolutions, the Paris Commune, the Russian soviets, the German revolutionary councils of 1918–19, the Hungarian uprising of 1956, all these events possess the kind of exemplary validity that makes them of universal significance, while still retaining their own specificity and uniqueness. Thus, by attending to these events in their particularity the historian or judging spectator is able to illuminate their universal import and thereby preserve them as “examples” for posterity.
For Arendt it is the spectators who have the privilege of judging impartially and disinterestedly, and in doing so they exercise two crucial faculties, imagination and common sense. Imagination is the faculty of representing in one’s mind that which has already appeared to one’s senses. Through the imagination one can represent objects that are no longer present and thus establish the distance necessary for an impartial judgment. Once this distancing has occurred, one is in a position to reflect upon these representations from a number of different perspectives, and thereby to reach a judgment about the proper value of an object.
The other faculty that spectators have to appeal to is common sense or sensus communis, since without it they could not share their judgments or overcome their individual idiosyncrasies. Kant believed that for our judgments to be valid we must transcend our private or subjective conditions in favor of public and intersubjective ones, and we are able to do this by appealing to our community sense, our sensus communis.
The criterion for judgment, then, is communicability, and the standard for deciding whether our judgments are indeed communicable is to see whether they could fit with the sensus communis of others. Arendt points out that the emphasis on the communicability of judgments of taste, and the correlative notion of an enlarged mentality, link up effortlessly with Kant’s idea of a united mankind living in eternal peace. She argues that “It is by virtue of this idea of mankind, present in every single man, that men are human, and they can be called civilized or humane to the extent that this idea becomes the principle not only of their judgments but of their actions. It is at this point that actor and spectator become united; the maxim of the actor and the maxim, the ‘standard,’ according to which the spectator judges the spectacle of the world, become one” (LKPP, 75).
In her reflections on Kant’s Third Critique Arendt acknowledges the links between the standpoint of the actor and that of the spectator. Let us now examine the way in which judgment operates from the standpoint of the actor.
Arendt presented a model of judgment in the essays “The Crisis in Culture” and “Truth and Politics” which could be characterized as far more ‘political’ than the one presented so far. In these essays, in fact, she treated judgment as a faculty that enables political actors to decide what courses of action to undertake in the public realm, what kind of objectives are most appropriate or worth pursuing, as well as who to praise or blame for past actions or for the consequences of past decisions. In this model judgment is viewed as a specifically political ability, namely, as “the ability to see things not only from one’s own point of view but from the perspective of all those who happen to be present,” and as being “one of the fundamental abilities of man as a political being insofar as it enables him to orient himself in the public realm, in the common world” (BPF, 221). Arendt claims that “the Greeks called this ability [to judge] phronesis, or insight, and they considered it the principal virtue or excellence of the statesman in distinction from the wisdom of the philosopher. The difference between this judging insight and speculative thought lies in that the former has its roots in what we usually call common sense, which the latter constantly transcends. Common sense … discloses to us the nature of the world insofar as it is a common world; we owe to it the fact that our strictly private and ‘subjective’ five senses and their sensory data can adjust themselves to a non-subjective and ‘objective’ world which we have in common and share with others. Judging is one, if not the most, important activity in which this sharing-the-world-with-others comes to pass” (BPF, 221).
Moreover, in discussing the non-coercive character of judgment, the fact that it can only appeal to but never force the agreement of others, she claims that “this ‘wooing’ or persuading corresponds closely to what the Greeks called peithein, the convincing and persuading speech which they regarded as the typically political form of people talking with one another” (BPF, 222). Some commentators have claimed that there is a contradiction in Arendt’s employment of the Aristotelian notion of phronesis alongside Kant’s idea of an “enlarged mentality,” since they supposedly pull in opposite directions, the former toward a concern with the particular, the latter toward universality and impartiality. However, this contradiction is more apparent than real, since Kant’s theory of aesthetic judgment is a theory of reflective judgment, that is, of those judgments where the universal is not given but must be searched out of the particular. In this respect the theory of aesthetic judgment to which Arendt appeals does have close affinities with Aristotle’s notion of phronesis: both are concerned with the judgment of particulars qua particulars, not with their subsumption under universal rules. If a distinction is to be made, it has more to do with the mode of asserting validity: In Aristotle phronesis is the privilege of a few experienced individuals (the phronimoi) who, over time, have shown themselves to be wise in practical matters; the only criterion of validity is their experience and their past record of judiciuos actions. In the case of judgments of taste, on the other hand, individuals have to appeal to the judgments and opinions of others, and thus the validity of their judgments rests on the consent they can elicit from a community of differently situated subjects.
For Arendt the validity of political judgment depends on our ability to think “representatively,” that is, from the standpoint of everyone else, so that we are able to look at the world from a number of different perspectives. And this ability, in turn, can only be acquired and tested in a public forum where individuals have the opportunity to exchange their opinions on particular matters and see whether they accord with the opinions of others. In this respect the process of opinion formation is never a solitary activity; rather, it requires a genuine encounter with different opinions so that a particular issue may be examined from every possible standpoint until, as she puts it, “it is flooded and made transparent by the full light of human comprehension” (BPF, 242). Debate and discussion, and the capacity to enlarge one’s perspective, are indeed crucial to the formation of opinions that can claim more than subjective validity; individuals may hold personal opinions on many subject matters, but they can form representative opinions only by enlarging their standpoint to incorporate those of others. As Arendt says:
Political thought is representative. I form an opinion by considering a given issue from different viewpoints, by making present to my mind the standpoints of those who are absent; that is, I represent them … The more people’s standpoints I have present in my mind while I am pondering a given issue, and the better I can imagine how I would feel and think if I were in their place, the stronger will be my capacity for representative thinking and the more valid my final conclusions, my opinion. (BPF, 241)
Opinions, in fact, are never self-evident. In matters of opinion, but not in matters of truth, “our thinking is truly discursive, running, as it were, from place to place, from one part of the world to another, through all kinds of conflicting views, until it finally ascends from these particularities to some impartial generality” (BPF, 242). In this respect one is never alone while forming an opinion; as Arendt notes, “even if I shun all company or am completely isolated while forming an opinion, I am not simply together only with myself in the solitude of philosophical thought; I remain in this world of universal interdependence, where I can make myself the representative of everybody else” (BPF, 242).
The representative character of judgment and opinion has important implications for the question of validity. Arendt always stressed that the formation of valid opinions requires a public space where individuals can test and purify their views through a process of mutual debate and enlightenment. She was, however, quite opposed to the idea that opinions should be measured by the standard of truth, or that debate should be conducted according to strict scientific standards of validity. In her view, truth belongs to the realm of cognition, the realm of logic, mathematics and the strict sciences, and carries always an element of coercion, since it precludes debate and must be accepted by every individual in possession of her rational faculties. Set against the plurality of opinions, truth has a despotic character: it compels universal assent, leaves the mind little freedom of movement, eliminates the diversity of views and reduces the richness of human discourse. In this respect, truth is anti-political, since by eliminating debate and diversity it eliminates the very principles of political life. As Arendt writes, “The trouble is that factual truth, like all other truth, peremptorily claims to be acknowledged and precludes debate, and debate constitutes the very essence of political life. The modes of thought and communication that deal with truth, if seen from the political perspective, are necessarily domineering; they don’t take into account other people’s opinions, and taking these into account is the hallmark of all strictly political thinking” (BPF, 241).
Arendt’s defense of opinion is motivated not just by her belief that truth leaves no room for debate or dissent, or for the acknowledgment of difference, but also by her conviction that our reasoning faculties can only flourish in a dialogic context. She cites Kant’s remark that “the external power that deprives man of the freedom to communicate his thoughts publicly deprives him at the same time of his freedom to think,” and underlines the fact that for Kant the only guarantee of the correctness of our thinking is that “we think, as it were, in community with others to whom we communicate our thoughts as they communicate theirs to us” (BPF, 234–5). She also quotes Madison’s statement that “the reason of man, like man himself, is timid and cautious when left alone, and acquires firmness and confidence in proportion to the number with which it is associated” (BPF, 234).
The appeal to Kant and Madison is meant to vindicate the power and dignity of opinion against those thinkers, from Plato to Hobbes, who saw it as mere illusion, as a confused or inadequate grasp of the truth. For Arendt opinion is not a defective form of knowledge that should be transcended or left behind as soon as one is in possession of the truth. Rather, it is a distinct form of knowledge which arises out of the collective deliberation of citizens, and which requires the use of the imagination and the capacity to think “representatively.” By deliberating in common and engaging in “representative thinking” citizens are in fact able to form opinions that can claim intersubjective validity. It is important to stress that Arendt does not want to dismiss the philosophers’ attempt to find universal or absolute standards of knowledge and cognition, but to check their desire to impose those standards upon the sphere of human affairs, since they would eliminate its plurality and essential relativity. The imposition of a single or absolute standard into the domain of praxis would do away with the need to persuade others of the relative merits of an opinion, to elicit their consent to a specific proposal, or to obtain their agreement with respect to a particular policy. Indeed, for Arendt the imposition of such a standard would mean that individuals would no longer be required to exercise their judgment, develop their imagination, or cultivate an “enlarged mentality,” since they would no longer need to deliberate in common. Strict demonstration, rather than persuasive argumentation, would then become the only legitimate form of discourse.
Now, we must be careful not to impute to Arendt the view that truth has no legitimate role to play in politics or in the sphere of human affairs. She does indeed assert that “All truths — not only the various kinds of rational truth but also factual truth — are opposed to opinion in their mode of asserting validity” (BPF, 239), since they all carry an element of compulsion. However, she is only preoccupied with the negative consequences of rational truth when applied to the sphere of politics and collective deliberation, while she defends the importance of factual truth for the preservation of an accurate account of the past and for the very existence of political communities. Factual truth, she writes, “is always related to other people: it concerns events and circumstances in which many are involved; it is established by witnesses and depends upon testimony … It is political by nature.” It follows, therefore, that “facts and opinions, though they must be kept apart, are not antagonistic to each other; they belong to the same realm. Facts inform opinions, and opinions, inspired by different interests and passions, can differ widely and still be legitimate as long as they respect factual truth. Freedom of opinion is a farce unless factual information is guaranteed and the facts themselves are not in dispute. In other words, factual truth informs political thought just as rational truth informs philosophical speculation” (BPF, 238).
The relationship between facts and opinions is thus one of mutual entailment: if opinions were not based on correct information and the free access to all relevant facts they could scarcely claim any validity. And if they were to be based on fantasy, self-deception, or deliberate falsehood, then no possibility of genuine debate and argumentation could be sustained. Both factual truth and the general habit of truth-telling are therefore basic to the formation of sound opinions and to the flourishing of political debate. Moreover, if the record of the past were to be destroyed by organized lying, or be distorted by an attempt to rewrite history, political life would be deprived of one of its essential and stabilizing elements. In sum, both factual truth and the practice of truth-telling are essential to political life. The antagonism for Arendt is between rational truth and well-grounded opinion, since the former does not allow for debate and dissent, while the latter thrives on it. Arendt’s defense of opinion must therefore be understood as a defense of political deliberation, and of the role that persuasion and dissuasion play in all matters affecting the political community. Against Plato and Hobbes, who denigrated the role of opinion in political matters, Arendt reasserts the value and importance of political discourse, of deliberation and persuasion, and thus of a politics that acknowledges difference and the plurality of opinions.
In this last section, we reconstruct Arendt’s conception of citizenship around two themes: (1) the public sphere, and (2) political agency and collective identity, and to highlight the contribution of Arendt’s conception to a theory of democratic citizenship.
For Arendt the public sphere comprises two distinct but interrelated dimensions. The first is the space of appearance, a space of political freedom and equality which comes into being whenever citizens act in concert through the medium of speech and persuasion. The second is the common world, a shared and public world of human artifacts, institutions and settings which separates us from nature and which provides a relatively permanent and durable context for our activities. Both dimensions are essential to the practice of citizenship, the former providing the spaces where it can flourish, the latter providing the stable background from which public spaces of action and deliberation can arise. For Arendt the reactivation of citizenship in the modern world depends upon both the recovery of a common, shared world and the creation of numerous spaces of appearance in which individuals can disclose their identities and establish relations of reciprocity and solidarity.
There are three features of the public sphere and of the sphere of politics in general that are central to Arendt’s conception of citizenship. These are, first, its artificial or constructed quality; second, its spatial quality; and, third, the distinction between public and private interests.
As regards the first feature, Arendt always stressed the artificiality of public life and of political activities in general, the fact that they are man-made and constructed rather than natural or given. She regarded this artificiality as something to be celebrated rather than deplored. Politics for her was not the result of some natural predisposition, or the realization of the inherent traits of human nature. Rather, it was a cultural achievement of the first order, enabling individuals to transcend the necessities of life and to fashion a world within which free political action and discourse could flourish.
The stress on the artificiality of politics has a number of important consequences. For example, Arendt emphasized that the principle of political equality does not rest on a theory of natural rights or on some natural condition that precedes the constitution of the political realm. Rather, it is an attribute of citizenship which individuals acquire upon entering the public realm and which can be secured only by democratic political institutions.
Another consequence of Arendt’s stress on the artificiality of political life is evident in her rejection of all neo-romantic appeals to the volk and to ethnic identity as the basis for political community. She maintained that one’s ethnic, religious, or racial identity was irrelevant to one’s identity as a citizen, and that it should never be made the basis of membership in a political community.
Arendt’s emphasis on the formal qualities of citizenship made her position rather distant from those advocates of participation in the 1960s who saw it in terms of recapturing a sense of intimacy, of warmth and authenticity. For Arendt political participation was important because it permitted the establishment of relations of civility and solidarity among citizens. She claimed that the ties of intimacy and warmth can never become political since they represent psychological substitutes for the loss of the common world. The only truly political ties are those of civic friendship and solidarity, since they make political demands and preserve reference to the world. For Arendt, therefore, the danger of trying to recapture the sense of intimacy and warmth, of authenticity and communal feelings is that one loses the public values of impartiality, civic friendship, and solidarity.
The second feature stressed by Arendt has to do with the spatial quality of public life, with the fact that political activities are located in a public space where citizens are able to meet one another, exchange their opinions and debate their differences, and search for some collective solution to their problems. Politics, for Arendt, is a matter of people sharing a common world and a common space of appearance so that public concerns can emerge and be articulated from different perspectives. In her view, it is not enough to have a collection of private individuals voting separately and anonymously according to their private opinions. Rather, these individuals must be able to see and talk to one another in public, to meet in a public-political space, so that their differences as well as their commonalities can emerge and become the subject of democratic debate.
This notion of a common public space helps us to understand how political opinions can be formed which are neither reducible to private, idiosyncratic preferences, on the one hand, nor to a unanimous collective opinion, on the other. Arendt herself distrusted the term “public opinion,” since it suggested the mindless unanimity of mass society. In her view representative opinions could arise only when citizens actually confronted one another in a public space, so that they could examine an issue from a number of different perspectives, modify their views, and enlarge their standpoint to incorporate that of others. Political opinions, she claimed, can never be formed in private; rather, they are formed, tested, and enlarged only within a public context of argumentation and debate.
Another implication of Arendt’s stress on the spatial quality of politics has to do with the question of how a collection of distinct individuals can be united to form a political community. For Arendt the unity that may be achieved in a political community is neither the result of religious or ethnic affinity, not the expression of some common value system. Rather, the unity in question can be attained by sharing a public space and a set of political institutions, and engaging in the practices and activities which are characteristic of that space and those institutions.
A further implication of Arendt’s conception of the spatial quality of politics is that since politics is a public activity, one cannot be part of it without in some sense being present in a public space. To be engaged in politics means actively participating in the various public forums where the decisions affecting one’s community are taken. Arendt’s insistence on the importance of direct participation in politics is thus based on the idea that, since politics is something that needs a worldly location and can only happen in a public space, then if one is not present in such a space one is simply not engaged in politics.
This public or world-centered conception of politics lies also at the basis of the third feature stressed by Arendt, the distinction between public and private interests. According to Arendt, political activity is not a means to an end, but an end in itself; one does not engage in political action to promote one’s welfare, but to realize the principles intrinsic to political life, such as freedom, equality, justice, and solidarity. In a late essay entitled “Public Rights and Private Interests” (PRPI) Arendt discusses the difference between one’s life as an individual and one’s life as a citizen, between the life spent on one’s own and the life spent in common with others. She argues that our public interest as citizens is quite distinct from our private interest as individuals. The public interest is not the sum of private interests, nor their highest common denominator, nor even the total of enlightened self-interests. In fact, it has little to do with our private interests, since it concerns the world that lies beyond the self, that was there before our birth and that will be there after our death, a world that finds embodiment in activities and institutions with their own intrinsic purposes which might often be at odds with our short-term and private interests. The public interest refers, therefore, to the interests of a public world which we share as citizens and which we can pursue and enjoy only by going beyond our private self-interest.
Arendt’s participatory conception of citizenship provides the best starting point for addressing both the question of the constitution of collective identity and that concerning the conditions for the exercise of effective political agency.
With respect to the first claim, it is important to note that one of the crucial questions at stake in political discourse is the creation of a collective identity, a “we” to which we can appeal when faced with the problem of deciding among alternative courses of action. Since in political discourse there is always disagreement about the possible courses of action, the identity of the “we” that is going to be created through a specific form of action becomes a central question. By engaging in this or that course of action we are, in fact, entering a claim on behalf of a “we,” that is, we are creating a specific form of collective identity. Political action and discourse are, in this respect, essential to the constitution of collective identities.
This process of identity-construction, however, is never given once and for all and is never unproblematic. Rather, it is a process of constant renegotiation and struggle, a process in which actors articulate and defend competing conceptions of cultural and political identity. Arendt’s participatory conception of citizenship is particularly relevant in this context since it articulates the conditions for the establishment of collective identities. Once citizenship is viewed as the process of active deliberation about competing identities, its value resides in the possibility of establishing forms of collective identity that can be acknowledged, tested, and transformed in a discursive and democratic fashion.
With respect to the second claim, concerning the question of political agency, it is important to stress the connection that Arendt establishes between political action, understood as the active engagement of citizens in the public realm, and the exercise of effective political agency. This connection between action and agency is one of the central contributions of Arendt’s participatory conception of citizenship. According to Arendt, the active engagement of citizens in the determination of the affairs of their community provides them not only with the experience of public freedom and public happiness, but also with a sense of political agency and efficacy, the sense, in Thomas Jefferson’s words, of being “participators in government.” In her view only the sharing of power that comes from civic engagement and common deliberation can provide each citizen with a sense of effective political agency. Arendt’s strictures against political representation must be understood in this light. She saw representation as a substitute for the direct involvement of the citizens, and as a means whereby the distinction between rulers and ruled could reassert itself. As an alternative to a system of representation based on bureaucratic parties and state structures, Arendt proposed a federated system of councils through which citizens could effectively determine their own political affairs. For Arendt, it is only by means of direct political participation, that is, by engaging in common action and collective deliberation, that citizenship can be reaffirmed and political agency effectively exercised.
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