Jean Jacques Rousseau

First published Mon Sep 27, 2010; substantive revision Fri May 26, 2017

Jean-Jacques Rousseau remains an important figure in the history of philosophy, both because of his contributions to political philosophy and moral psychology and because of his influence on later thinkers. Rousseau’s own view of philosophy and philosophers was firmly negative, seeing philosophers as the post-hoc rationalizers of self-interest, as apologists for various forms of tyranny, and as playing a role in the alienation of the modern individual from humanity’s natural impulse to compassion. The concern that dominates Rousseau’s work is to find a way of preserving human freedom in a world where human beings are increasingly dependent on one another for the satisfaction of their needs. This concern has two dimensions: material and psychological, of which the latter has greater importance. In the modern world, human beings come to derive their very sense of self from the opinion of others, a fact which Rousseau sees as corrosive of freedom and destructive of individual authenticity. In his mature work, he principally explores two routes to achieving and protecting freedom: the first is a political one aimed at constructing political institutions that allow for the co-existence of free and equal citizens in a community where they themselves are sovereign; the second is a project for child development and education that fosters autonomy and avoids the development of the most destructive forms of self-interest. However, though Rousseau believes the co-existence of human beings in relations of equality and freedom is possible, he is consistently and overwhelmingly pessimistic that humanity will escape from a dystopia of alienation, oppression, and unfreedom. In addition to his contributions to philosophy, Rousseau was active as a composer and a music theorist, as the pioneer of modern autobiography, as a novelist, and as a botanist. Rousseau’s appreciation of the wonders of nature and his stress on the importance of feeling and emotion made him an important influence on and anticipator of the romantic movement. To a very large extent, the interests and concerns that mark his philosophical work also inform these other activities, and Rousseau’s contributions in ostensibly non-philosophical fields often serve to illuminate his philosophical commitments and arguments.

1. Life

Jean-Jacques Rousseau was born in the independent Calvinist city-state of Geneva in 1712, the son of Isaac Rousseau, a watchmaker, and Suzanne Bernard. Rousseau’s mother died nine days after his birth, with the consequence that Rousseau was raised and educated by his father until the age of ten. Isaac Rousseau was one of the small minority of Geneva’s residents who enjoyed the rank of citizen of Geneva, a status which Jean-Jacques was to inherit. According to Rousseau’s own subsequent accounts, the haphazard education that he received from his father included both the inculcation of republican patriotism and the reading of classical authors such as Plutarch who dealt with the Roman republic. On his father’s exile from the city to avoid arrest, Jean-Jacques was put in the care of a pastor at nearby Bossey and subsequently apprenticed to an engraver. Rousseau left the city the age of sixteen and came under the influence of a Roman Catholic convert noblewoman, Francoise-Louise de la Tour, Baronne de Warens. Mme de Warens arranged for Rousseau to travel to Turin, where he converted to Roman Catholicism in April 1728. Rousseau spent some time working as a domestic servant in a noble household in Turin, and during this time a shameful episode occurred in which he falsely accused a fellow servant of the theft of a ribbon. This act marked him deeply and he returns to it in his autobiographical works.

Rousseau then spent a brief period training to become a Catholic priest before embarking on another brief career as an itinerant musician, music copyist and teacher. In 1731 he returned to Mme de Warens at Chambéry and later briefly became her lover and then her household manager. Rousseau remained with Mme de Warens through the rest of the 1730s, moving to Lyon in 1740 to take up a position as a tutor. This appointment brought him within the orbit of both Condillac and d’Alembert and was his first contact with major figures of the French Enlightenment. In 1742 he travelled to Paris, having devised a plan for a new numerically-based system of musical notation which he presented to the Academy of Sciences. The system was rejected by the Academy, but in this period Rousseau met Denis Diderot. A brief spell as secretary to the French Ambassador in Venice followed before Rousseau moved to Paris on a more permanent basis from 1744, where he continued to work mainly on music and began to write contributions to the Encyclopédie of Diderot and d’Alembert.

In 1745 Rousseau met Thérèse Levasseur, a barely literate laundry-maid who became his lover and, later, his wife. According to Rousseau’s own account, Thérèse bore him five children, all of whom were deposited at the foundling hospital shortly after birth, an almost certain sentence of death in eighteenth-century France. Rousseau’s abandonment of his children was later to be used against him by Voltaire.

In 1749, while walking to Vincennes to visit the briefly-imprisoned Diderot, Rousseau came across a newspaper announcement of an essay competition organized by the Academy of Dijon. The Academy sought submissions on the theme of whether the development of the arts and sciences had improved or corrupted public morals. Rousseau later claimed that he then and there experienced an epiphany which included the thought, central to his world view, that humankind is good by nature but is corrupted by society. Rousseau entered his Discourse on the Sciences and Arts (conventionally known as the First Discourse) for the competition and won first prize with his contrarian thesis that social development, including of the arts and sciences, is corrosive of both civic virtue and individual moral character. The Discourse was published in 1750 and is mainly important because Rousseau used it to introduce themes that he then developed further in his later work, especially the natural virtue of the ordinary person and the moral corruption fostered by the urge to distinction and excellence. The First Discourse made Rousseau famous and provoked a series of responses to which he in turn replied.

Music remained Rousseau’s primary interest in this period, and the years 1752 and 1753 saw his most important contributions to the field. The first of these was his opera Le Devin du Village (The Village Soothsayer), which was an immediate success (and stayed in the repertoire for a century). The second was his participation in the “querelle des bouffons”, a controversy that followed the performance in Paris of Pergolesi’s La Serva Padrona by a visiting Italian company and which pitted the partisans of Italian music against those of the French style. Rousseau, who had already developed a taste for Italian music during his stay in Venice, joined the dispute through his Letter on French Music and the controversy also informed his (unpublished) Essay on the Origin of Languages. Rousseau’s emphasis on the importance of melody and the communication of emotion as central to the function of music was in opposition to the views of Rameau, who stressed harmony and the relationship between music, mathematics, and physics. Rousseau went so far as to declare the French language inherently unmusical, a view apparently contradicted by his own practice in Le Devin.

Rousseau’s conversion to Catholicism had rendered him ineligible for his hereditary status as Citizen of Geneva. In 1754 he regained this citizenship by reconverting to Calvinism. In the following year he published his Discourse on the Origins of Inequality, again in response to an essay competition from the Academy of Dijon. Though he did not win the Academy’s prize a second time, the Second Discourse is a far more accomplished work, and in it Rousseau begins to develop his theories of human social development and moral psychology. With the Second Discourse, the distance between Rousseau and the Encyclopédiste mainstream of the French Enlightenment thought became clear. This rift was cemented with his 1758 publication of the Letter to d’Alembert on the Theater, in which he denounced the idea that his native city would benefit from the construction of a theater. In Rousseau’s view theater, far from improving the population, tends to weaken their attachment to the life of the polis.

The years following the publication of the Second Discourse in 1755 were the most productive and important of Rousseau’s career. He withdrew from Paris and, under the patronage of, first Mme d’Epinay and then the Duke and Duchess of Luxembourg, worked on a novel, Julie, ou La Nouvelle Héloïse, and then on Emile and The Social Contract. Julie appeared in 1761 and was an immediate success. The novel is centred on a love triangle between Julie, her tutor Saint Preux and her husband Wolmar. The work is cast in epistolary form, and is an important supplementary source for the interpretation of Rousseau’s social philosophy, containing, as it does, such elements as a vision of rural community and the presence of a manipulative genius who achieves the appearance of natural harmony though cunning artifice and who thus anticipates both the tutor in Emile and the legislator of The Social Contract. Both works appeared in 1762, marking the high point of Rousseau’s intellectual achievement.

Unfortunately for Rousseau, the publication of these works led to personal catastrophe. Emile was condemned in Paris and both Emile and The Social Contract were condemned in Geneva on grounds of religious heterodoxy. Partly in response to this, Rousseau finally renounced his Genevan citizenship in May 1763. Rousseau was forced to flee to escape arrest, seeking refuge first in Switzerland and later, in January 1766, at the invitation of David Hume, travelling to England.

Rousseau’s stay in England was marked by increasing mental instability and he became wrongly convinced that Hume was at the center of a plot against him. He spent fourteen months in Staffordshire where he worked on his autobiographical work, the Confessions, which also contains evidence of his paranoia in its treatment of figures like Diderot and the German author Friedrich Melchior, Baron von Grimm. He returned to France in 1767 and then spent much of the rest of his life working on autobiographical texts, completing the Confessions but also composing the Dialogues: Rousseau Judge of Jean-Jacques and The Reveries of the Solitary Walker. He also completed his Considerations on the Government of Poland in this period. In later life he further developed his interest in botany (where his work proved influential in England via his letters on the subject to the Duchess of Portland) and in music, as he met and corresponded with the operatic composer Christoph Gluck. Rousseau died in 1778. In 1794 the French revolutionaries transferred his remains to the Panthéon in Paris.

2. Conjectural history and moral psychology

Rousseau repeatedly claims that a single idea is at the centre of his world view, namely, that human beings are good by nature but are rendered corrupt by society. Unfortunately, despite the alleged centrality of this claim, it is difficult to give it a clear and plausible interpretation. One obvious problem is present from the start: since society, the alleged agent of corruption, is composed entirely of naturally good human beings, how can evil ever get a foothold? It is also difficult to see what “natural goodness” might be. In various places Rousseau clearly states that morality is not a natural feature of human life, so in whatever sense it is that human beings are good by nature, it is not the moral sense that the casual reader would ordinarily assume. In order, therefore, to address this puzzling central claim, it is best to look first at the details of Rousseau’s moral psychology, especially as developed in the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality and in Emile.

Rousseau attributes to all creatures an instinctual drive towards self-preservation. Human beings therefore have such a drive, which he terms amour de soi (self love). Amour de soi directs us first to attend to our most basic biological needs for things like food, shelter and warmth. Since, for Rousseau, humans, like other creatures, are part of the design of a benevolent creator, they are individually well-equipped with the means to satisfy their natural needs. Alongside this basic drive for self-preservation, Rousseau posits another passion which he terms pitié (compassion). Pitié directs us to attend to and relieve the suffering of others (including animals) where we can do so without danger to our own self-preservation. In some of his writings, such as the Second Discourse, pitié is an original drive that sits alongside amour de soi, whereas in others, such as Emile and the Essay on the Origin of Languages, it is a development of amour de soi considered as the origin of all passions.

In the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality Rousseau imagines a multi-stage evolution of humanity from the most primitive condition to something like a modern complex society. Rousseau denies that this is a reconstruction of history as it actually was, and Frederick Neuhouser (2014) has argued that the evolutionary story is merely a philosophical device designed to separate the natural and the artificial elements of our psychology. At each step of this imagined evolution human beings change their material and psychological relations to one another and, correspondingly, their conception of themselves, or what Rousseau calls the “sentiment of their existence.” According to this narrative, humans live basically solitary lives in the original state of the human race, since they do not need one another to provide for their material needs. The human race barely subsists in this condition, chance meetings between proto-humans are the occasions for copulation and reproduction, child-care is minimal and brief in duration. If humans are naturally good at this stage of human evolution, their goodness is merely a negative and amounts to the absence of evil. In this story, human beings are distinguished from the other creatures with which they share the primeval world only by two characteristics: freedom, and perfectibility. Freedom, in this context, is simply the ability not to be governed solely by appetite; perfectibility is the capacity to learn and thereby to find new and better means to satisfy needs. Together, these characteristics give humans the potential to achieve self-consciousness, rationality, and morality. Nevertheless, it will turn out that such characteristics are more likely to condemn them to a social world of deception, dissimulation, dependence, oppression, and domination.

As human populations grow, simple but unstable forms of co-operation evolve around activities like hunting. According to Rousseau, the central transitional moment in human history occurs at a stage of society marked by small settled communities. At this point a change, or rather a split, takes place in the natural drive humans have to care for themselves: competition among humans to attract sexual partners leads them to consider their own attractiveness to others and how that attractiveness compares to that of potential rivals. In Emile, where Rousseau is concerned with the psychological development of an individual in a modern society, he also associates the genesis of amour propre with sexual competition and the moment, puberty, when the male adolescent starts to think of himself as a sexual being with rivals for the favours of girls and women.

Rousseau’s term for this new type of self-interested drive, concerned with comparative success or failure as a social being, is amour propre (love of self, often rendered as pride or vanity in English translations). Amour propre makes a central interest of each human being the need to be recognized by others as having value and to be treated with respect. The presentation of amour propre in the Second Discourse—and especially in his note XV to that work—often suggests that Rousseau sees it as a wholly negative passion and the source of all evil. Interpretations of amour propre centered on the Second Discourse (which, historically, are the most common ones (for example Charvet 1974)), often focus on the fact that the need for recognition always has a comparative aspect, so that individuals are not content merely that others acknowledge their value, but also seek to be esteemed as superior to them. This aspect of our nature then creates conflict as people try to exact this recognition from others or react with anger and resentment when it is denied to them. More recent readings of both the Second Discourse, and especially of Emile, have indicated that a more nuanced view is possible (Den 1988, Neuhouser 2008). According to these interpretations, amour propre is both the cause of humanity’s fall as well as the promise of its redemption because of the way in which it develops humans’ rational capacities and their sense of themselves as social creatures among others. Although Rousseau held that the overwhelming tendency, socially and historically, is for amour propre to take on toxic and self-defeating (‘inflamed’) forms, he also held that there are, at least in principle, ways of organizing social life and individual education that allow it to take on a benign character. This project of containing and harnessing amour propre finds expression in both The Social Contract and Emile. In some works, such as the Second Discourse, Rousseau presents amour propre as a passion that is quite distinct from amour de soi. In others, including Emile, he presents it as a form that amour de soi takes in a social environment. The latter is consistent with his view in Emile that all the passions are outgrowths or developments of amour de soi.

Although amour propre has its origins in sexual competition and comparison within small societies, it does not achieve its full toxicity until it is combined with a growth in material interdependence among human beings. In the Discourse on Inequality, Rousseau traces the growth of agriculture and metallurgy and the first establishment of private property, together with the emergence of inequality between those who own land and those who do not. In an unequal society, human beings who need both the social good of recognition and such material goods as food, warmth, etc. become enmeshed in social relations that are inimical both to their freedom and to their sense of self worth. Subordinates need superiors in order to have access to the means of life; superiors need subordinates to work for them and also to give them the recognition they crave. In such a structure there is a clear incentive for people to misrepresent their true beliefs and desires in order to attain their ends. Thus, even those who receive the apparent love and adulation of their inferiors cannot thereby find satisfaction for their amour propre. This trope of misrepresentation and frustration receives its clearest treatment in Rousseau’s account of the figure of the European minister, towards the end of the Discourse on Inequality, a figure whose need to flatter others in order to secure his own wants leads to his alienation from his own self.

2.1 Morality

Amour de soi, amour propre and pitié are not the full complement of passions in Rousseau’s thinking. Once people have achieved consciousness of themselves as social beings, morality also becomes possible and this relies on the further faculty of conscience. The fullest accounts of Rousseau’s conception of morality are found in the Lettres Morales and in sections of the Confession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar, a part of Emile. In the most primitive forms of human existence, before the emergence of amour propre, pitié balances or restrains self-interest. It is, to that extent, akin to a moral sentiment such as Humean sympathy. But as something that is merely instinctual it lacks, for Rousseau, a genuinely moral quality. Genuine morality, on the other hand, consists in the application of reason to human affairs and conduct. This requires the mental faculty that is the source of genuinely moral motivation, namely conscience. Conscience impels us to the love of justice and morality in a quasi-aesthetic manner. As the appreciation of justice and the desire to act to further it, conscience is based on a rational appreciation of the well-orderedness of a benign God’s plan for the world. However, in a world dominated by inflamed amour propre, the normal pattern is not for a morality of reason to supplement or supplant our natural proto-moral sympathies. Instead, the usual course of events in civil society is for reason and sympathy to be displaced while humans’ enhanced capacity for reasoning is put at the service, not of morality, but of the impulse to dominate, oppress and exploit. (For recent discussion of Rousseau on conscience and reason, see Neidleman, 2017, ch. 7.)

A theme of both the Second Discourse and the Letter to d’Alembert is the way in which human beings can deceive themselves about their own moral qualities. So, for example, theatre audiences derive enjoyment from the eliciting of their natural compassion by a tragic scene on the stage; then, convinced of their natural goodness, they are freed to act viciously outside the theater. Philosophy, too, can serve as a resource for self-deception. It can give people reasons to ignore the promptings of pitié or, as in Rousseau’s essay Principles of the Right of War, it can underpin legal codes (such as the law of war and peace) that the powerful may use to license oppressive violence whilst deadening their natural feelings of compassion.

3. Political Philosophy

Rousseau’s contributions to political philosophy are scattered among various works, most notable of which are the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality, the Discourse on Political Economy, The Social Contract, and Considerations on the Government of Poland. However, many of his other works, both major and minor, contain passages that amplify or illuminate the political ideas in those works. His central doctrine in politics is that a state can be legitimate only if it is guided by the “general will” of its members. This idea finds its most detailed treatment in The Social Contract.

In The Social Contract, Rousseau sets out to answer what he takes to be the fundamental question of politics, the reconciliation of the freedom of the individual with the authority of the state. This reconciliation is necessary because human society has evolved to a point where individuals can no longer supply their needs through their own unaided efforts, but rather must depend on the co-operation of others. The process whereby human needs expand and interdependence deepens is set out in the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality. In that work, the final moment of Rousseau’s conjectural history involves the emergence of endemic conflict among the now-interdependent individuals and the argument that the Hobbesian insecurity of this condition would lead all to consent to the establishment of state authority and law. In the Second Discourse, this establishment amounts to the reinforcement of unequal and exploitative social relations that are now backed by law and state power. In an echo of Locke and an anticipation of Marx, Rousseau argues that this state would, in effect, be a class state, guided by the common interest of the rich and propertied and imposing unfreedom and subordination on the poor and weak. The propertyless consent to such an establishment because their immediate fear of a Hobbesian state of war leads them to fail to attend to the ways in which the new state will systematically disadvantage them.

The Social Contract aims to set out an alternative to this dystopia, an alternative in which, Rousseau claims, each person will enjoy the protection of the common force whilst remaining as free as they were in the state of nature. The key to this reconciliation is the idea of the general will: that is, the collective will of the citizen body taken as a whole. The general will is the source of law and is willed by each and every citizen. In obeying the law each citizen is thus subject to his or her own will, and consequently, according to Rousseau, remains free.

3.1 The idea of the general will

Rousseau’s account of the general will is marked by unclarities and ambiguities that have attracted the interest of commentators since its first publication. The principal tension is between a democratic conception, where the general will is simply what the citizens of the state have decided together in their sovereign assembly, and an alternative interpretation where the general will is the transcendent incarnation of the citizens’ common interest that exists in abstraction from what any of them actually wants (Bertram 2012). Both views find some support in Rousseau’s texts, and both have been influential. Contemporary epistemic conceptions of democracy often make reference to Rousseau’s discussion in Book 2 chapter 3 of of The Social Contract. These accounts typically take Condorcet’s jury theorem as a starting point, where democratic procedures are conceived of as a method for discovering the truth about the public interest; they then interpret the general will as a deliberative means of seeking outcomes that satisfy the preferences of individuals and render the authority of the state legitimate (see for example, Grofman and Feld 1988). The tension between the “democratic” and the “transcendental” conceptions can be reduced if we take Rousseau to be arguing for the view that, under the right conditions and subject to the right procedures, citizen legislators will be led to converge on on laws that correspond to their common interest; however, where those conditions and procedures are absent, the state necessarily lacks legitimacy. On such a reading, Rousseau may be committed to something like an a posteriori philosophical anarchism. Such a view holds that it is be possible, in principle, for a state to exercise legitimate authority over its citizens, but all actual states—and indeed all states that we are likely to see in the modern era—will fail to meet the conditions for legitimacy.

Rousseau argues that in order for the general will to be truly general it must come from all and apply to all. This thought has both substantive and formal aspects. Formally, Rousseau argues that the law must be general in application and universal in scope. The law cannot name particular individuals and it must apply to everyone within the state. Rousseau believes that this condition will lead citizens, though guided by a consideration of what is in their own private interest, to favor laws that both secure the common interest impartially and that are not burdensome and intrusive. For this to be true, however, it has to be the case that the situation of citizens is substantially similar to one another. In a state where citizens enjoy a wide diversity of lifestyles and occupations, or where there is a great deal of cultural diversity, or where there is a high degree of economic inequality, it will not generally be the case that the impact of the laws will be the same for everyone. In such cases it will often not be true that a citizen can occupy the standpoint of the general will merely by imagining the impact of general and universal laws on his or her own case.

3.2 The emergence of the general will: procedure, virtue and the legislator

In The Social Contract Rousseau envisages three different types or levels of will as being in play. First, individuals all have private wills corresponding to their own selfish interests as natural individuals; second, each individual, insofar as he or she identifies with the collective as a whole and assumes the identity of citizen, wills the general will of that collective as his or her own, setting aside selfish interest in favor of a set of laws that allow all to coexist under conditions of equal freedom; third, and very problematically, a person can identify with the corporate will of a subset of the populace as a whole. The general will is therefore both a property of the collective and a result of its deliberations, and a property of the individual insofar as the individual identifies as a member of the collective. In a well-ordered society, there is no tension between private and general will, as individuals accept that both justice and their individual self-interest require their submission to a law which safeguards their freedom by protecting them from the private violence and personal domination that would otherwise hold sway. In practice, however, Rousseau believes that many societies will fail to have this well-ordered character. One way in which they can fail is if private individuals are insufficiently enlightened or virtuous and therefore refuse to accept the restrictions on their own conduct which the collective interest requires. Another mode of political failure arises where the political community is differentiated into factions (perhaps based on a class division between rich and poor) and where one faction can impose its collective will on the state as a whole.

The Social Contract harbors a further tension between two accounts of how the general will emerges and its relation to the private wills of citizens. Sometimes Rousseau favors a procedural story according to which the individual contemplation of self interest (subject to the constraints of generality and universality and under propitious sociological background conditions such as rough equality and cultural similarity) will result in the emergence of the general will from the assembly of citizens (see Sreenivasan 2000). In this account of the emergence of the general will, there seems to be no special need for citizens to have any specifically moral qualities: the constraints on their choice should be enough. However, Rousseau also clearly believes that the mere contemplation of self interest would be inadequate to generate a general will. This may partly concern issues of compliance, since selfish citizens who can will the general will might still not be moved to obey it. But Rousseau also seems to believe that citizen virtue is a necessary condition for the emergence of the general will in the first place. This presents him with a problem for which his figure of the legislator is one attempted solution. As a believer in the plasticity of human nature, Rousseau holds that good laws make for good citizens. However, he also believes both that good laws can only be willed by good citizens and that, in order to be legitimate, they must be agreed upon by the assembly. This puts him in some difficulty, as it is unlikely that the citizens who come together to form a new state will have the moral qualities required to will good laws, shaped as those citizens will have been by unjust institutions. The legislator or lawgiver therefore has the function of inspiring a sense of collective identity in the new citizens that allows them to identify with the whole and be moved to support legislation that will eventually transform them and their children into good citizens. In this story, however, the new citizens at first lack the capacity to discern the good reasons that support the new laws and the lawgiver has to persuade them by non-rational means to legislate in their own best interests.

The figure of the legislator is a puzzle. Like the tutor in Emile, the legislator has the role of manipulating the desires of his charges, giving them the illusion of free choice without its substance. Little wonder then that many critics have seen these characters in a somewhat sinister light. In both cases there is a mystery concerning where the educator figure comes from and how he could have acquired the knowledge and virtue necessary to perform his role. This, in turn, raises a problem of regress. If the legislator was formed by a just society, then who performed the legislator’s role for that society, and how was that legislator formed? How did the tutor acquire his education if not from a tutor who, in turn, was educated according to Rousseau’s program by an earlier tutor?

3.3 Rousseau’s claim to reconcile freedom and authority

What then of Rousseau’s key claim that freedom and authority are reconciled in his ideal republic through obedience to the general will? This claim finds notorious and deliberately paradoxical expression in Book 1 chapter 7 of The Social Contract, where Rousseau writes of citizens being “forced to be free” when they are constrained to obey the general will. The opening words of The Social Contract themselves refer to freedom, with the famous saying that “Man is born free, but is everywhere in chains”. This ringing declaration, however, is almost immediately followed by a note of paradox, as Rousseau declares that he can make this subjection “in chains” legitimate. The thought that Rousseau’s commitment to freedom might not be all that it first appears is strengthened by other passages in the book, most notably his declaration that those subject to the general will are “forced to be free.” The value of freedom or liberty is at the center of Rousseau’s concerns throughout his work. Since he uses the notion in several distinct ways, though, it is important to distinguish several uses of the term. First, we should note that Rousseau regards the capacity for choice, and therefore the ability to act against instinct and inclination, as one of the features that distinguishes the human race from animal species and makes truly moral action possible. In the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality, for example, he characterizes animal species in essentially Cartesian terms, as mechanisms programmed to a fixed pattern of behavior. Human beings, on the other hand are not tied to any particular mode of life and can reject the promptings of instinct. This makes possible both the development of the human species and also its fall from grace, since individuals can ignore benign impulses (such as pitié) if they wish to. The freedom to act contrary to the “mechanism of the senses”, and the power of willing and choosing is, for Rousseau, something entirely outside the laws of the physical world and is therefore not subject to scientific explanation. Rousseau also takes this freedom to choose to act as the basis of all distinctively moral action. In The Social Contract the connection between freedom of choice and morality is central to his argument against despotic government, where he writes that the renunciation of freedom is contrary to human nature and that to renounce freedom in favour of another person’s authority is to “deprive one’s actions of all morality” (SC 1.4).

In Book I chapter 8 of the The Social Contract, Rousseau tries to illuminate his claim that the formation of the legitimate state involves no net loss of freedom, but in fact, he makes a slightly different claim. The new claim involves the idea of an exchange of one type of freedom (natural freedom) for another type (civil freedom). Natural freedom involves an unlimited right to all things, an idea that is reminiscent of Hobbes’s “right of nature” in Leviathan. Since all human beings enjoy this liberty right to all things, it is clear that in a world occupied by many interdependent humans, the practical value of that liberty may be almost nonexistent. This is because any individual’s capacity to get what he or she wants will be limited by his or her physical power and the competing physical power of others. Further, inevitable conflict over scarce resources will pit individuals against each other, so that unhindered exercise of natural freedom will result in violence and uncertainty. The formation of the state, and the promulgation of laws willed by the general will, transforms this condition. With sovereign power in place, individuals are guaranteed a sphere of equal freedom under the law with protection for their own persons and security for their property. Provided that the law bearing equally on everyone is not meddlesome or intrusive (and Rousseau believes it will not be, since no individual has a motive to legislate burdensome laws) there will be a net benefit compared to the pre-political state.

Rousseau makes a further claim in the same chapter of The Social Contract, namely that in conditions of civil society the citizen achieves “moral freedom,” by which he means obedience to a law that one has prescribed to oneself (for discussion see especially Neuhouser 1993). Although this latter claim is presented almost as an afterthought, it is the form of freedom most directly responsive to the challenge Rousseau had set for himself two chapters earlier, which involved finding “a form of association” in which each citizen would “obey only himself.” Naturally, this raises the question of whether the citizen does in fact obey only himself when he obeys the general will. On the face of it, this claim looks difficult to reconcile with the fact of majorities and minorities within a democratic state, since those citizens who find themselves outvoted would seem to be constrained by a decision with which they disagree. Rousseau’s solution to this puzzle is found much later, in Book 4 chapter 3 of The Social Contract, where he argues that those who obey laws they did not vote for remain bound by a will that is their own, since the democratic process has enabled them to discover the content of a general will in which that they share. Many commentators have not found this argument fully convincing.

Rousseau’s invocation of three types of freedom (natural, civil, and moral) in the text of The Social Contract can appear confusing. The picture is further complicated by the fact that he also relies on a fourth conception of freedom, related to civil freedom but distinct from it, which he nowhere names explicitly. This is “republican freedom” and consists, not in my being subject to my own will, but rather in the fact that the law protects me from being subject to the will of any other particular person in the manner of a slave or serf. To find Rousseau’s explicit endorsement of this idea, we have to look not to The Social Contract, but rather to some of his unpublished notes. Yet the concept is clearly implicit in the notorious “forced to be free” passage in Book 1 chapter 7, since he there explains that when each citizen is constrained to obey the general will, he is thereby provided with a guarantee against “all personal dependence”.

3.4 Representation and government

One feature of Rousseau’s political philosophy that has proved least persuasive to later thinkers is his doctrine of sovereignty and representation, with his apparent rejection of “representative government”. At the center of Rousseau’s view in The Social Contract is his rejection of the Hobbesian idea that a people’s legislative will can be vested in some group or individual that then acts with their authority but rules over them. Instead, he takes the view that to hand over one’s general right of ruling oneself to another person or body constitutes a form a slavery, and that to recognize such an authority would amount to an abdication of moral agency. This hostility to the representation of sovereignty also extends to the election of representatives to sovereign assemblies, even where those representatives are subject to periodic re-election. Even in that case, the assembly would be legislating on a range of topics on which citizens have not deliberated. Laws passed by such assemblies would therefore bind citizens in terms that they have not themselves agreed upon. Not only does the representation of sovereignty constitute, for Rousseau, a surrender of moral agency, the widespread desire to be represented in the business of self-rule is a symptom of moral decline and the loss of virtue.

The practical difficulties of direct self-rule by the entire citizen body are obvious. Such arrangements are potentially onerous and must severely limit the size of legitimate states. It is noteworthy that Rousseau takes a different view in a text aimed at practical politics: Considerations on the Government of Poland. Nevertheless, it is not entirely clear that the widespread interpretation of Rousseau as rejecting all forms of representative government is correct. One of the key distinctions in The Social Contract is between sovereign and government. The sovereign, composed of the people as a whole, promulgates laws as an expression of its general will. The government is a more limited body that administers the state within the bounds set by the laws, and which issues decrees applying the laws in particular cases. If the laws are conceived of as the people setting a constitutional framework for society, with the government’s decrees comprising the more normal business of “legislation,” then the distance between a Rousseauian republic and a modern constitutional democracy may be smaller than it at first appears. In effect, the institution of the sovereign may be inconsistent with a representative model, where the executive power of the government can be understood as requiring it. Such a picture gains credibility when the details of Rousseau’s views on government are examined. Although a variety of forms of government turn out to be theoretically compatible with popular sovereignty, Rousseau is sceptical about the prospects for both democracy (where the people conduct the day to day running of the state and the application of the laws) and monarchy. Instead, he favors some form of elective aristocracy: in other words, he supports the idea that the day-to-day administration should be in the hands of a subset of the population, elected by them according to merit.

Two important issues arise in relation to Rousseau’s account of relations between sovereign and government. The first of these concerns his political pessimism, even in the case of the best-designed and most perfect republic. Just as any group has a collective will as opposed to the individual private will of its members, so does the government. As the state becomes larger and more diffuse, and as citizens become more distant from one another both spatially and emotionally, so the effective government of the republic will need a proportionally smaller and more cohesive group of magistrates. Rousseau thinks it almost inevitable that this group will end up usurping the legitimate sovereign power of the people and substituting its corporate will for the people’s general will. The second issue concerns how democratic Rousseau envisaged his republic to be. He sometimes suggests a picture in which the people would be subject to elite domination by the government, since the magistrates would reserve the business of agenda-setting for the assembly to themselves. In other cases, he endorses a conception of a more fully democratic republic. (For competing views of this question see Fralin 1978 and Cohen 2010.)

Although Rousseau rejects Hobbes’s view of the sovereign as representing or acting in the person of the subject, he has a similar view of what sovereignty is and its relation to the rights of the individual. He rejects the idea that individuals associated together in a political community retain some natural rights over themselves and their property. Rather, such rights as individuals have over themselves, land, and external objects, are a matter of sovereign competence and decision. Individual rights must be specified by the sovereign in ways that are compatible with the interests of all in a just polity, and Rousseau rejects the idea that such rights could be insisted on as a check on the sovereign’s power.

3.5 Civil religion and toleration

The final full chapter of The Social Contract expounds Rousseau’s doctrine of civil religion. Contemporary readers were scandalized by it, and particularly by its claim that true (original or early) Christianity is useless in fostering the spirit of patriotism and social solidarity necessary for a flourishing state. In many ways the chapter represents a striking departure from the main themes of the book. First, it is the only occasion where Rousseau prescribes the content of a law that a just republic must have. Second, it amounts to his acceptance of the inevitability of pluralism in matters of religion, and thus of religious toleration; this is in some tension with his encouragement elsewhere of cultural homogeneity as a propitious environment for the emergence of a general will. Third, it represents a very concrete example of the limits of sovereign power: following Locke, Rousseau insists upon the inability of the sovereign to examine the private beliefs of citizens. The tenets of Rousseau’s civil religion include the affirmation of the existence of a supreme being and of the afterlife, the principle that the just will prosper and the wicked will be punished, and the claim that the social contract and the laws are sacred. In addition, the civil religion requires the provision that all those willing to tolerate others should themselves be tolerated, but those who insist that there is no salvation outside their particular church cannot be citizens of the state. The structure of religious beliefs within the just state is that of an overlapping consensus: the dogmas of the civil religion are such that they can be affirmed by adherents of a number of different faiths, both Christian and non-Christian.

Despite Rousseau’s concern for religious toleration both in the chapter and elsewhere, modern readers have often been repelled by one striking note of intolerance. Rousseau argues that those who cannot accept the dogmas can be banished from the state. This is because he believes that atheists, having no fear of divine punishment, cannot be trusted by their fellow citizens to obey the law. He goes even further, to suggest the death penalty for those who affirm the dogmas but later act as if they do not believe them.

4. Language

Rousseau’s writings on language and languages are contained in two places, the unpublished Essay on the Origin of Languages and in a section of the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality. In the Essay, Rousseau tells us that human beings want to communicate as soon as they recognize that there are other beings like themselves. But he also raises the question of why language, specifically, rather than gesture is needed for this purpose. The answer, strangely enough, is that language permits the communication of the passions in a way that gesture does not, and that the tone and stress of linguistic communication are crucial, rather than its content. This point enables Rousseau to make a close connection between the purposes of speech and melody. Such vocabulary as there originally was, according to Rousseau, was merely figurative and words only acquire a literal meaning much later. Theories that locate the origin of language in the need to reason together about matters of fact are, according to Rousseau, deeply mistaken. While the cry of the other awakens our natural compassion and causes us to imagine the inner life of others, our purely physical needs have an anti-social tendency because they scatter human beings more widely across the earth in search of subsistence. Although language and song have a common origin in the need to communicate emotion, over time the two become separated, a process that becomes accelerated as a result of the invention of writing. In the south, language stays closer to its natural origins and southern languages retain their melodic and emotional quality (a fact that suits them for song and opera). Northern languages, by contrast, become oriented to more practical tasks and are better for practical and theoretical reasoning.

In Part I of the Second Discourse, Rousseau’s focus is slightly different and occurs in the context of a polemic against philosophers (such as natural law theorists like Condillac) who attribute to primitive human beings a developed capacity for abstract reasoning. Rousseau proposes need as the cause of the development of language, but since language depends on convention to assign arbitrary signs to objects, he puzzles about how it could ever get started and how primitive people could accomplish the feat of giving names to universals.

5. Education

Rousseau’s ideas about education are mainly expounded in Emile. In that work, he advances the idea of “negative education”, which is a form of “child-centered” education. His essential idea is that education should be carried out, so far as possible, in harmony with the development of the child’s natural capacities by a process of apparently autonomous discovery. This is in contrast to a model of education where the teacher is a figure of authority who conveys knowledge and skills according to a pre-determined curriculum. Rousseau depends here on his thesis of natural goodness, which he asserts at the beginning of the book, and his educational scheme involves the protection and development of the child’s natural goodness through various stages, along with the isolation of the child from the domineering wills of others. Up to adolescence at least, the educational program comprises a sequence of manipulations of the environment by the tutor. The child is not told what to do or think but is led to draw its own conclusions as a result of its own explorations, the context for which has been carefully arranged. The first stage of the program starts in infancy, where Rousseau’s crucial concern is to avoid conveying the idea that human relations are essentially ones of domination and subordination, an idea that can too easily by fostered in the infant by the conjunction of its own dependence on parental care and its power to get attention by crying. Though the young child must be protected from physical harm, Rousseau is keen that it gets used to the exercise of its bodily powers and he therefore advises that the child be left as free as possible rather than being confined or constrained. From the age of about twelve or so, the program moves on to the acquisition of abstract skills and concepts. This is not done with the use of books or formal lessons, but rather through practical experience. The third phase of education coincides with puberty and early adulthood. The period of isolation comes to an end and the child starts to take an interest in others (particularly the opposite sex), and in how he or she is regarded. At this stage the great danger is that excessive amour propre will extend to exacting recognition from others, disregarding their worth, and demanding subordination. The task of the tutor is to ensure that the pupil’s relations with others are first mediated through the passion of pitié (compassion) so that through the idea of the suffering others, of care, and of gratitude, the pupil finds a secure place for the recognition of his own moral worth where his amour propre is established on a non-competitive basis. The final period of education involves the tutor changing from a manipulator of the child’s environment into the adult’s trusted advisor. The young and autonomous adult finds a spouse who can be another source of secure and non-competitive recognition. This final phase also involves instruction into the nature of the social world, including the doctrines of Rousseau’s political philosophy.

6. Legacy

Rousseau’s thinking has had a profound influence on later philosophers and political theorists, although the tensions and ambiguities in his work have meant that his ideas have been developed in radically incompatible and divergent ways. In modern political philosophy, for example, it is possible to detect Rousseau as a source of inspiration for liberal theories, communitarian ideas, civic republicanism, and in theories of deliberative and participatory democracy. Hostile writers have portrayed Rousseau as a source of inspiration for the more authoritarian aspects of the French revolution and thence for aspects of fascism and communism.

Rousseau’s most important philosophical impact was on Immanuel Kant. A portrait of Rousseau was the only image on display in Kant’s house, and legend has it that the only time that Kant forgot to take his daily walk was when reading Emile. Instances of direct influence include Kant’s idea of the categorical imperative, the third formulation of which in the Groundwork of the Metaphysic of Morals (the so-called formula of the kingdom of ends) recalls Rousseau’s discussion of the general will in The Social Contract. Ironically, Kant’s detachment of the idea of universal legislation from its context in the particularity of single society reverses Rousseau’s own approach, since Rousseau had, in preparatory work for The Social Contract rejected the idea of a general will of the human race as that notion appeared in Diderot’s article “Natural Right” in the Encyclopédie. Rousseau’s influence can also be seen in Kant’s moral psychology, especially in work such as Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone, in Kant’s own thinking about conjectural history, and in his writings on international justice which draw on Rousseau’s engagement with the work of the Abbé St. Pierre.

The cases of Hegel and Marx are more complex. Hegel’s direct references to Rousseau are often uncomplimentary. In the Philosophy of Right, while praising Rousseau for the idea that will is the basis of the state, he misrepresents the idea of the general will as being merely the idea of the overlap between the contingent wills of private individuals. In the Encyclopedia Logic he demonstrates an awareness that this was not Rousseau’s view. Hegel’s discussion of the master-slave dialectic and the problem of recognition in the Phenomenology of Spirit also draws on Rousseau, in this case on the notion of amour propre and the ways in which attempts to exact respect and recognition from others can be self-defeating. Karl Marx’s concerns with alienation and exploitation have also been thought to bear some kind of relationship to Rousseau’s thinking on related topics. Here the evidence is more indirect, since the references to Rousseau in Marx’s work are few and insubstantial.

In contemporary political philosophy, it is clear that the thinking of John Rawls, especially in A Theory of Justice reflects the influence of Rousseau. A good example of this is the way in which Rawls uses the device of the “original position” to put self-interested choice at the service of the determination of the principles of justice. This exactly parallels Rousseau’s argument that citizens will be drawn to select just laws as if from an impartial perspective, because the universality and generality of the law means that when considering their own interests they will select the measure that best reflects their own interests.


Principal works by Rousseau

The standard French edition of Rousseau is Oeuvres complètes (5 volumes), Bernard Gagnebin and Marcel Raymond (eds.), Paris: Gallimard, 1959–1995.

A major work that is not included in the Oeuvres complètes in a satisfactory form is Principes du droit de la guerre published together with Écrits sur la paix perpetuelle, Bruno Bernadi and Gabriella Silvestrini (eds), Paris: Vrin, 2008.

The most comprehensive English edition of Rousseau’s works is Collected Writings (13 volumes), Roger Masters and Christopher Kelly (eds.), Dartmouth: University Press of New England, 1990–2010. The individual works below are included in each of these editions.

Accessible English translations of major works include:

  • The Discourses and Other Early Political Writings, Victor Gourevitch (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • The Social Contract and Other Later Political Writings, Victor Gourevitch (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • The Social Contract and Other Political Writings, Quintin Hoare (trans.) and Christopher Bertram (ed.), London: Penguin, 2012.(This volume includes the English translation of the reconstruction by Bernadi et al of Principles of the Right of War.)
  • 1750, Un Discours sur les Sciences et les Arts (Discourse on the Sciences and the Arts; First Discourse).
  • 1755, Un Discours sur l’Origine et les Fondemens de l’Inégalité parmi les Hommes (A Discourse on the Origin of Inequality; Second Discourse).
  • c. 1753–61, Essai sur l’Origine de Langues (Essay on the Origin of Languages).
  • 1755, De l’économie politique (A Discourse on Political Economy).
  • 1755, Lettre sur la Musique Française (Letter on French Music).
  • 1758, Lettre à M. d’Alembert sur les Spectacles(Letter to d’Alembert on the Theater).
  • 1761, Julie, ou La Nouvelle Héloïse.
  • 1762, Émile, ou de l’Éducation (Emile, or On Education).
  • 1762, Du Contrat Social (The Social Contract).
  • 1764–5, Project de Constitution pour la Corse (Project for a Constitution for Corsica).
  • 1764–6, Les Confessions (The Confessions).
  • 1770–1, Considérations sur le Gouvernement de Pologne (Considerations on the Government of Poland).
  • 1772–6, Rousseau Juge de Jean-Jacques: Dialogues (Rousseau Judge of Jean-Jacques: Dialogues).
  • 1776–8, Les Rêveries du Promeneur Solitaire (The Reveries of the Solitary Walker).

Works about Rousseau

  • Berman, M., 1970, The Politics of Authenticity, New York: Atheneum.
  • Bertram, C., 2004, Rousseau and The Social Contract, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2012, “Rousseau’s Legacy in Two Conceptions of the General Will: Democratic and Transcendent.”, Review of Politics, 74: 403–420.
  • Cassirer, E, 1954, The Question of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, trans. P. Gay, Bloomington: Indiana.
  • Charvet, J., 1974, The Social Problem in the Philosophy of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, J. 2010, Rousseau: A Free Community of Equals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dent, N.J.H, 1988, Rousseau: An Introduction to his Psychological, Social and Political Theory, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 1992, A Rousseau Dictionary, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 2005, Rousseau, London: Routledge.
  • Fralin, R., 1978, Rousseau and Representation, New York: Columbia.
  • Gauthier, D., 2006, Rousseau: The Sentiment of Existence, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Grofman, B. and Feld, S.L., 1988, “Rousseau’s General Will: A Condorcetian Perspective”, American Political Science Review, 82: 567–76.
  • Masters, R.D., 1968, The Political Philosophy of Rousseau, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Neidleman, J., 2017, Rousseau’s Ethics of Truth, London: Routledge.
  • Neuhouser, F., 1993, “Freedom, Dependence and the General Will”, Philosophical Review, 102: 363–95.
  • –––, 2008, Rousseau’s Theodicy of Self-Love, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Rousseau’s Critique of Inequality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • O’Hagan, T., 1999, Rousseau, London: Routledge.
  • Roosevelt, G.G. 1990, Reading Rousseau in the Nuclear Age, Philadelphia: Temple.
  • Sreenivasan, G., 2000, “What is the General Will?”, Philosophical Review 109: 545–81.
  • Starobinski, J., 1988, Transparency and Obstruction, trans A. Goldhammer, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Williams, D.L., 2014, Rousseau’s Social Contract, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wokler, R., 1995, Rousseau, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Rousseau, the Age of Enlightenment, and Their Legacies, Bryan Garsten (ed.) Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Biographies of Rousseau

  • Cranston, M., 1982, Jean-Jacques: The Early Life and Work of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, 1712–1754, London: Allen Lane.
  • –––, 1991, The Noble Savage: Jean-Jacques Rousseau, 1754–1762, London: Allen Lane.
  • –––, 1997, The Solitary Self: Jean-Jacques Rousseau in Exile and Adversity, London: Allen Lane.
  • Lester G. Crocker, 1974, Jean-Jacques Rousseau-the Quest 1712–1758, New York: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1974, Jean-Jacques Rousseau The Prophetic Voice 1758–1778, New York: Macmillan.
  • Damrosch, L., 2005, Jean-Jacques Rousseau: Restless Genius, New York: Houghton Mifflin.


The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) for notifying us about several typographical errors in this entry.

Copyright © 2017 by
Christopher Bertram <>

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