Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy

First published Thu May 2, 2013; substantive revision Mon May 20, 2024

Autonomy is usually understood by feminist writers in the same way that it is understood within moral psychology generally, namely, as self-government or self-direction: being autonomous is acting on motives, reasons, or values that are one’s own. Early feminist literature regarded the notion of autonomy with suspicion because it was thought to promote unattractive “masculinist” ideals of personhood; that is, it was thought to presuppose a conception of the person as “atomistic”, as ideally self-sufficient, as operating in a vacuum unaffected by social relationships, or as an abstract reasoner stripped of distorting influences such as emotions. Recently, feminists have sought to rehabilitate the notion of autonomy. Some have argued that articulating the conditions of autonomous choice is essential to understanding gender oppression and related concepts such as objectification. The challenge facing feminist theorists, therefore, is to reconceptualize autonomy from a feminist perspective. The term “relational autonomy” is often used to refer to feminist reconceptualizations of autonomy to contrast them with notions of autonomy that are thought to presuppose atomistic conceptions of the self.

1. Introduction

According to Kant’s famous dictum, “Autonomy of the will is the property the will has of being a law unto itself (independently of every property belonging to the objects of volition)” (Kant 1785, 108). Rational beings make the moral law for themselves and can regard themselves as authors of the law. Thus autonomy is manifested when rational agents “will” the moral law. For Kant, the moral law is a categorical, not a hypothetical, imperative. The act of formulating a categorical imperative, and hence the moral law, is an act of a pure autonomous will, because, unlike the formulation of a hypothetical imperative, it is untainted by the influence of the desires and interests that an agent may have relative to a particular situation. (For a more detailed account, see the entry on “Kant’s Account of Reason.”) A contemporary parallel of Kant’s conception of autonomy is John Rawls’s influential notion of free and rational agents formulating principles of justice in the “original position” (Rawls 1971). Rawls argues that rational agents formulate principles of justice from behind a “veil of ignorance,” that is, from a position in which they are making decisions about how a society will function before they know who in this society they will turn out to be. For example, in the original position, agents do not know their social status, natural abilities, or conceptions of the good (Rawls 1971, 12). Such agents, like Kantian agents, are not influenced by the particular desires and preferences that are contingent on being embedded in an actual situation. Because of this, their formulation of the principles of justice is taken to be the product of a “pure” self, and hence genuinely self-originating. (For a more detailed account, see the entry on “Original Position.”)

Feminist philosophers typically reject the Kantian and Rawlsian conceptions of autonomy. Five categories of feminist critique have been identified (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 5–12). All the critiques reject both the nature of the self and the value of autonomy implicit in the Kantian/Rawlsian account. The notion of self implicit in the Kantian and Rawlsian accounts is said to be “atomistic”; that is, it is abstracted from the social relations in which actual agents are embedded. Such a conception of the self is associated with the claim that autonomous agents are, and ought to be, self-sufficient, which in turn is associated with the character ideal of the “self-made man.” Feminists challenge this character ideal and question whether self-sufficiency, or “substantive independence,” is really a value that a theory of autonomy, and normative theories in general, should promote (Jaggar 1985; Code 1991). If autonomy is somehow conceived as inimical to being a woman—because, for example, being a women involves valuing social relationships whereas being autonomous requires repudiating such relationships—one denies women, in particular, the social and political advantages associated with the label “autonomous.”

Since these initial critical reactions, feminist philosophers have attempted to rehabilitate autonomy (e.g., Meyers 1987 and 1989; Benson 1990; Friedman 1997 and 2003; Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000a). Some feminist philosophers have argued that articulating the conditions of autonomous choice is vital to attempts to understand gender oppression. The challenge facing feminist theorists is to reconceptualize autonomy in ways that are compatible with the feminist critiques (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 3–4). “Relational autonomy” is the name that has been given to feminist reconceptualizations of the notion of autonomy. The term “relational” here may serve simply to deny that autonomy requires self-sufficiency. If relationships of care and interdependence are valuable and morally significant (cf. Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 8–10), then any theory of autonomy must be “relational” in the sense that it must acknowledge that autonomy is compatible with the agent standing in and valuing significant family and other social relationships. “Relational” may also deny the metaphysical notion of atomistic personhood, emphasizing instead that persons are socially and historically embedded, not metaphysically isolated, and shaped by factors such as race and class. It is this latter sense of “relational” that will be employed in the following sketch of relational accounts.

2. Feminist “Hard Cases”

Why is autonomy of interest to feminists? One way to answer this question is to examine what might be considered failures of autonomy that appear to be linked to practices of gender oppression. This section describes three examples that have been widely discussed in the feminist literature on autonomy. These are:

  1. self-abnegation or excessive deference to the wishes of others;
  2. “adaptive preference formation” in which choices and preferences are unconsciously accommodated to oppressive social conditions; and
  3. decisions of agents to adopt what may appear to be practices of gender oppression—e.g., veiling—including those that seem to produce significant physical and psychological harm to women, e.g., “genital cutting” (Meyers 2000a).

The examples are “hard cases” because there is disagreement among feminists over whether (and how) the cases illustrate diminished autonomy.

2.1 Self-abnegation

Several theorists (e.g., Westlund 2003, 483–4; Oshana 2006, 57–58) invoke Virginia Woolf’s critique of Coventry Patmore’s poem “Angel in the House” to motivate discussions of autonomy:

She was intensely sympathetic. She was immensely charming. She excelled in the difficult arts of family life. She sacrificed herself daily. If there was chicken, she took the leg, if there was a draught, she sat in it. (Woolf 1942, 59)

Andrea Westlund observes that the Angel resembles Thomas Hill’s well-known example of the Deferential Wife (Westlund 2003, 485–6):

She buys the clothes he prefers, invites the guests he wants to entertain, and makes love whenever he is in the mood. She willingly moves to a new city in order for him to have a more attractive job, counting her own friendships and geographical preferences insignificant by comparison... She does not simply defer to her husband in certain spheres as a trade-off for his deference in other spheres. On the contrary, she tends not to form her own interests, values, and ideals, and when she does, she counts them as less important than her husband’s. (Hill 1991, 5)

One would think that such excessive deference would be incompatible with autonomy. Excessive deference implies that others, not the agent herself, are driving the agent’s choice and preference formation. However, Westlund points out that on some popular accounts of autonomy, because the woman is willing to subordinate herself or, because she prefers deference and values her own opinions and interests less than she values those of her husband, she may be considered autonomous. For example, on Harry Frankfurt’s influential account, a preference is autonomous if it is one with which the agent wholeheartedly identifies (Frankfurt 1988). As Westlund argues, the agent here seems to identify wholeheartedly with her preference for deference to her husband: “Hill’s character is remarkable in part because she seems so unambivalent about her subservient role” (Westlund 2003, 491).

The example is of interest to feminists in the first place because the deference and apparent preference for subservience it describes is gendered. It is an outcome of systems of gender oppression that women are expected to assume servile roles, and hence may come to endorse, prefer or willingly adopt them. Moreover, perhaps precisely because of the connection between these kinds of preferences and systems of gender oppression, many feminists resist the conclusion that the Angel and the Deferential Wife are autonomous. Thus Susan Babbitt argues that although the Deferential Wife appears to have made a rational judgment about what she values, and appears therefore to be living according to her own life-plans, in fact the preference for subservience is incompatible with her autonomy: “habitual servility” defines her sense of self, and this is “not the kind of self to which a concept of autonomy can be applied” (Babbitt 1993, 250). If this is right, influential accounts of autonomy, and those feminist positions influenced by them, will have to be revised. (See the entry on “Feminist Moral Psychology” for more discussion of the example of the Deferential Wife.)

2.2 Adaptive preference formation

Discussions of adaptive preference formation are often found in the literature—both feminist and nonfeminist—on rational choice theory (Elster 1983; Superson 2005; Cudd 2006). According to Jon Elster’s classic description of adaptive preference formation, a fox, after finding that he can no longer reach some grapes, decides that he does not want the grapes after all. The fox adapts his preferences to what he perceives to be the options available to him. In order to distinguish adaptive preference formation from preference change due to learning and other processes, Elster proposes that the former is an unconscious process in which an agent turns away from a preference to avoid unpleasant cognitive dissonance that is associated with holding on to it. According to Elster, this is a “blind psychic process operating ‘behind the back’ of the person” (Elster 1983, 16; see also Colburn 2011). Others characterize adaptive preferences as those the agent finds herself with after “life-long habituation” (Nussbaum 2001, 80; Sen 1995; compare Khader 2009, 2011). For example, Martha Nussbaum describes the case of poor working women in India who, though subjected to physical abuse by their husbands, choose to remain in the marriage. Some women, like Vasanti, think that the abuse “was painful and bad, but, still, a part of women’s lot in life, just something women have to put up with as part of being a woman dependent on men, and entailed by having left her own family to move into a husband’s home” (Nussbaum 2001, 68–9).

It is increasingly noticed that adaptive preferences are formed in the circumstances of oppression. Theorists of oppression have pointed to the phenomenon of “deformed desires” in which “the oppressed come to desire that which is oppressive to them…[and] one’s desires turn away from goods and even needs that, absent those conditions, they would want” (Cudd 2006, 181). Adaptive or deformed desires may be the result of the internalization of an oppressive ideology:

Consider the eighteen year-old college student who excels in her studies, is well-liked by her many friends and acquaintances, leads an active, challenging life, yet who regularly feels bad about herself because she does not have ‘the right look’… So, on top of everything else she does, she expends a great deal of time and money trying to straighten or curl her hair, to refine her cosmetic technique, to harden or soften her body, and so on…. (Benson 1991, 389)

One plausible analysis of the student’s psychology is that she has internalized the oppressive norms of the fashion industry, according to which appearance is tied to self-worth. The student has unconsciously turned away from values that would afford her a healthier sense of self-worth; her desire for an excessive number of beauty treatments is deformed because it is the product of adopting values that are oppressive to her, and it is a desire that she would not have had absent the oppressive conditions.

Adaptive or deformed preferences have been taken to be “paradigmatically nonautonomous” (Taylor 2009, 71). For instance, feminists working on rational choice theory tend to assume that deformed desires are incompatible with both rational choice and autonomous choice, or at least that they arise only in contexts in which autonomy is already damaged (e.g., Superson 2005, 109). However, there are varying accounts of adaptive preferences in the feminist literature (Khader 2009; 2011; 2012; Stoljar 2014; Terlazzo 2016). Serene Khader proposes a “weak perfectionist” notion of adaptive preference on which the latter are compatible with both autonomy and agency (2011; 2012). Marilyn Friedman suggests that women who remain in abusive relationships (and therefore whose preferences may seem to be adaptive) can be autonomous because preferring to remain in an abusive relationship could in principle be the result of critical reflection that is sufficient for autonomy; such women may have endorsed the preference to remain and rejected competing options (Friedman 2003, 146). (Friedman’s “procedural” account of autonomy will be discussed in detail in §4.) Other autonomy theorists argue along similar lines, leaving open the possibility that adaptive preferences could count as autonomous. For instance, Andrea Westlund argues that women could “freely and authentically” be committed to norms that subordinate them, as long as they are answerable to others for their commitment to these norms (e.g., Westlund 2009, 29; see §7 of the current entry).

2.3 Practices of oppression

The third set of cases that has attracted attention among feminist autonomy theorists are those in which agents appear to self-consciously adopt (what are alleged to be) practices of oppression (such as the Islamic practice of veiling), participate in practices of oppression that severely curtail women’s options (such as arranged marriages), or subject women to physical harm (such as ‘female circumcision’ or clitoridectomy). Adopting such practices need not be the result of accommodation or adaptation; it need not be the result of an attempt to resolve cognitive dissonance at an unconscious level, or of resigned habituation to oppressive circumstances. Rather, the practices in question can be the explicit requirements of a society or culture, and self-consciously promoted by women themselves. Uma Narayan describes a community of women in India, the Sufi Pirzadi, who “live in relative purdah (seclusion) within the home and are expected to veil when they are in public” (Narayan 2002, 420). These women acknowledge that purdah severely limits their education and mobility, and has the effect of making them dependent on male members of the community. But they also explicitly recognize benefits, for instance, that veiling signifies “womanly modesty and propriety” and their “superior standing vis-à-vis other Muslim women” (Narayan 2002, 420–1).

Some theorists of autonomy (e.g., Oshana 2006) claim that severely constraining external conditions are autonomy-undermining. Other theorists are more circumspect, urging that women subject to constraining practices should not be characterized as “compliant dupes of patriarchy” (Narayan 2002, 420) and that women living under oppressive regimes could autonomously accept their conditions (Christman 2004, 152; Westlund 2009, 29). Diana Meyers writes, for instance, that “there are women [participating in the practice of female genital cutting] who conclude that cultural tradition or cohesion or getting married and bearing children are more important than bodily integrity” and that therefore “we would need far more consensus than we presently have (or are likely to get)…before we could conclude that women who opt for compliance with female genital cutting norms never do so autonomously” (Meyers 2000a, 479).

We see, then, that feminist philosophers have responded to the hard cases in different ways. The following sections provide a more detailed elaboration of the theoretical positions behind these different responses.

3. Relational Autonomy

The cases above draw attention to the fact that there is disagreement among theorists of autonomy, and among feminist theorists, over whether they are examples in which the agent’s autonomy is diminished.

One way to resolve the disagreement might be to adopt what could be called a “thin” or “minimalist” conception of autonomy. On this conception, agents are autonomous just in case certain minimal conditions for human flourishing obtain, because the preferences, choices, and so forth that one adopts in this state of well-functioning should be considered to be “one’s own”. Sarah Buss, for example, advocates such a position:

The key to…self-governing agency is the distinction between a healthy human being and a human being who suffers from some psychological or physiological ‘affliction’ (e.g., intense pain, fear, anxiety, fatigue, depression, and obsession). (Buss 2005, 215)

An agent’s autonomy is impaired, therefore, only if she suffers an affliction that is severe enough to distort and pathologize her capacity for reasoning; the default position is that she is autonomous. Narayan also suggests a thin conception of autonomy:

A person’s choice should be considered autonomous as long as the person was a ‘normal adult’ with no serious cognitive or emotional impairments and was not subject to literal outright coercion by others. (Narayan 2002, 429)

On minimalist conceptions of autonomy, most of the agents described in the hard cases would be autonomous because minimal conditions for flourishing obtain and there is no pathology, cognitive impairment, or direct coercion present. This characterization has its theoretical advantages. For example, Narayan is concerned to limit the justification for state interference in individual voluntary choice; a minimalist conception may indeed be acceptable for use in theories that regulate relations between the citizen and the state or to address issues of paternalism (Holroyd 2009).

But minimalism is not the norm within the feminist literature on autonomy. It is true that oppressive social conditions do not typically produce pathologies or cognitive impairments; neither do the social conditions of oppression usually constitute direct coercion sufficient to erode autonomy. However, minimalism overlooks the complex effects of gender norms and oppressive social conditions on agency (e.g., Bierria 2014; Liebow 2016; Johnston 2017). The hard cases are hard because they suggest that gender norms and oppressive conditions, in addition to factors such as cognitive impairment or direct coercion, potentially undermine or erode agents’ capacities for autonomy. Yet it is not clear precisely how this happens.

Feminist or “relational” theories of autonomy attempt to answer the question of how internalized oppression and oppressive social conditions undermine or erode agents’ autonomy. These theories will be sketched in §4–8. Before turning to these theories, some preliminary classifications should be made. Relational theories may be classified as either

  1. procedural, strongly substantive, or weakly substantive, versus
  2. causal or constitutive.

The procedural/substantive distinction within relational conceptions parallels a distinction within the literature on autonomy more generally (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 12–21). Procedural theories have dominated the debate since the 1970s (Dworkin 1988; Frankfurt 1988). They claim that autonomy is achieved when the agent undergoes, or has the capacity to undergo, an internal intellectual process of reflecting on her motivations, beliefs, and values, and then revising her preferences in the light of such reflection. This process is said to be “content-neutral” because the outcomes of the process of critical reflection, whatever their content, will be autonomous. Substantive theories claim that autonomy is a value-laden notion. According to “strong substantive” approaches, “the contents of the preferences or values that agents can form or act on autonomously are subject to direct normative constraints” (Benson 2005a, 133). A preference to be enslaved or to be subservient cannot be autonomous on strong substantive accounts (e.g., Charles 2010). “Weak substantive” approaches build in normative content, and hence are substantive, yet they do not place direct normative constraints on the contents of agents’ preferences (Benson 2005a; Richardson 2001). For example, some accounts require that agents exhibit moral attitudes to themselves such as self-respect or a robust sense of their own self-worth to count as autonomous (Govier 1993; McLeod 2002).

In addition to the procedural/substantive dimension, relational conceptions may be classified as either causal or constitutive. Causal conceptions acknowledge the impact of both social relationships and socio-historical circumstances on agents’ capacities. Annette Baier points out that agents are “second persons,” that is, “persons are essentially successors, heirs to other persons who formed and cared for them” (Baier 1985, 85). On this view, an agent’s social relationships influence the development of autonomy: “if we ask ourselves what actually enables people to be autonomous, the answer is not isolation, but relationships—with parents, teachers, friends, loved ones” (Nedelsky 1989, 12). If social relationships cause autonomy to develop, a lack of appropriate social relationships can also stunt its development (Friedman 1997). Similarly, social and historical conditions (such as oppressive gender socialization) may promote or impede the capacity for autonomy (e.g., Meyers 1989).

Causal accounts investigate the effects of external “relational” factors on agents’ autonomy; they do not offer an analysis of autonomy using such external factors. On constitutively relational accounts, however, interpersonal or social conditions are part of the “defining conditions” of autonomy (Christman 2004, 147). Suppose, for instance, that an agent is subject to severely constraining external conditions such as slavery. Marina Oshana argues that such external conditions are incompatible with autonomy because autonomy is a temporally extended, “global” condition of agents in which they have “de facto power and authority over choices and actions significant to the direction of [their lives]” (Oshana 2006, 2). Severely constraining external conditions remove the de facto power required for autonomy. Other theorists who adopt constitutive accounts focus rather on local autonomy, namely, what is required for choices, preferences, or desires at particular times to count as autonomous. Suppose, for instance, that autonomous choice at a particular time requires that agents have available to them a “wide enough range of…significant options” at that time (Brison 2000, 285). This account of local autonomy is constitutively relational because no matter how robust an agent’s psychological capacities, if the relevant external conditions do not obtain at a time, it is not possible for the agent’s preference at that time to be autonomous.

The procedural/substantive distinction cuts across the causal/constitutive distinction. Procedural theories are typically causally relational (see §4). For instance, although the features required for autonomy on procedural accounts—e.g., critical reflection—can be affected by oppressive socialization, it is in principle possible for the critical faculties of agents in oppressive environments, even including those who endorse oppressive norms, to be fully intact and hence for them to be fully autonomous. An important feature of procedural theories, however, is their content-neutral or formal aspect. Andrea Westlund has endorsed what she calls a formal and constitutively relational position in which interpersonal conditions are included in the definition of autonomy (see §7). Therefore, content-neutral theories can be constitutively relational. Moreover, weak substantive theories can be causally relational. Weak substantive theories build in moral self-regarding attitudes such as self-respect as necessary conditions of autonomy. Although these attitudes may be affected by interpersonal and other external conditions, weak substantive theories need not employ the external conditions as defining conditions of autonomy (see §6). However, strong substantive theories that place direct constraints on the contents of the preferences permitted for autonomous agents are constitutively relational because, on strong substantive theories, external conditions are necessary conditions of autonomy (see §8).

4. Procedural Conceptions

This section outlines two versions of procedural and content-neutral conceptions that are well-known in the feminist literature: those of Marilyn Friedman and Diana Tietjens Meyers.

Procedural conceptions have been prominent in the standard literature on autonomy from the 1970s to the present day (e.g., Dworkin 1988; Frankfurt 1988; Christman 2009). These conceptions have been adopted in different forms by feminist theorists. The concept of content-neutrality has been an extremely important tool in the feminist rehabilitation of autonomy and procedural conceptions are attractive to feminists in large part due to their content-neutrality. Many feminists hesitate to embrace autonomy because of its associations with “masculinist” ideals such as those exemplified in the “self-made man,” namely, substantive independence and self-reliance, social isolation, and hyper-rationality (Jaggar 1985; Code 1991). However, on content-neutral conceptions, there is no value or set of preferences that an autonomous person must endorse. Preferences for relationships of care and dependency such as those within marriage or other family structures can be just as autonomous as preferences for self-reliance or relative social isolation; preferences for cultural and religious norms into which agents are born can be just as autonomous as preferences to repudiate these norms, and so on. The device of content-neutrality also respects feminist attempts to preserve the differences among and the multiplicity of agents. Feminists noticed that agents’ life-plans and conceptions of the good will be influenced by a diversity of social factors such as race, class, and gender (Friedman 2003; Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b; Meyers 1989, 2002). Hence they argue that theories of autonomy must be neutral with respect to life-plans and conceptions of the good. According to some feminists, a theory of autonomy should not “homogenize” agents (Meyers 2000a, 480), nor should it impose feminist, liberal, or any other ideals on agents in the name of autonomy. Content-neutrality allows that the preferences of autonomous agents could be wrong from another perspective, either morally or because they do not align with the agent’s best interests. Many theorists consider that a criterion of a correct theory of autonomy is that it distinguish between self-rule and right-rule (Benson 2005a). Content-neutrality ensures that self-rule does not collapse into right-rule, and further that agents are protected from the risk of paternalistic interference in their decisions.

Procedural conceptions characterize autonomous agents—agents whose preferences and desires are genuinely their own—as those who critically reflect in the appropriate way to evaluate their preferences, motives, and desires. Such approaches are often hierarchical (employing a hierarchy of mental states to explain autonomy) as well as structural (proposing conditions that an agent’s existing motivational state must satisfy). One well-known example of a hierarchical and structural approach is that of Harry Frankfurt. On Frankfurt’s account, autonomy requires “wholehearted identification” at a higher-order level with lower-order motives, preferences, or desires (Frankfurt 1988). These structural and ahistorical approaches have been subject to many cogent objections (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b; Taylor 2005b). One important difficulty is the “problem of manipulation” in which it is supposed that a hypnotist inserts into an agent a mental state structure that is sufficient for autonomy (see, e.g., Taylor 2005b). On structural accounts, this agent counts as autonomous when she appears not to be.

The procedural conceptions defended by Friedman and Meyers exemplify an alternative approach in which autonomy is not tied to the structural features of an occurrent mental state but rather is achieved when the agent undergoes a historical process of critical reflection. John Christman is an important proponent in the standard literature of the historical approach (Christman 1991; Christman 2009; see also Mele 1995). For Christman, as for many others who adopt procedural conceptions, autonomous agents must be both reflectively competent and authentic. The test for authenticity on his account is historical and counterfactual: an agent is authentic with respect to a certain preference or desire if and only if she did not resist the development of the preference or desire when attending to the process of its development, or would not have resisted had she attended to the process (Christman 1990; Christman 1991, 346). In recent work, Christman develops the notion of nonalienation as the test of authenticity: an agent is authentic with respect to a desire if and only if, were she to critically reflect on the historical processes leading to the desire, she would not be alienated from the desire, where “alienation” is understood as either a negative judgment about or a negative emotional reaction to the desire (Christman 2009, 144, 155–6).

Friedman employs the related idea of reflective endorsement: a process of critical reflection can result in either endorsement and wholehearted commitment to one’s preferences and desires, to wholehearted repudiation of the preferences or desires, or to half-hearted commitment to the preferences or desires (Friedman 2003, 4–5). Friedman says that “when an agent chooses or acts in accord with wants or desires that she has self-reflectively endorsed, then she is autonomous” (Friedman 2003, 5). Agents acting on desires that satisfy this condition are acting authentically and on their deepest commitments.

On Friedman’s conception, and on procedural accounts in general, there is no reason in principle why choosing subservience, or adopting oppressive norms, could not be autonomous. An example considered by Friedman is that of a preference to remain in an abusive domestic relationship due to adherence to religious or moral norms of marriage. The preference may be adaptive in the sense described in §2 if the agent has unconsciously adjusted her preferences to accommodate the circumstances, thinking she has no other feasible options. Friedman comments that if these religious or moral norms are the ones the agent “really cares about,” her preference to remain is autonomous. She writes:

Someone’s self-reflections and choices under those conditions are less likely than otherwise to be reliable reflections of what she really cares about. Yet it is not impossible to discern or act according to one’s deeper concerns under coercive conditions (Friedman 2003, 146).

The agent may even recognize that choosing to remain in an abusive relationship is in effect to choose a situation in which her own future autonomy may be compromised. But, as Friedman points out, autonomy is not the only value, and, the case could be explained as the agent ranking her own future autonomy against other values of importance to her. In the agent’s calculations, future autonomy is ranked below other considerations; it is not overriding.

Friedman nevertheless is reluctant to treat such agents as autonomous to the highest degree. She proposes a “threshold” account. That is, when the preference for a traditional role of subservience, or to remain in an abusive relationship, reflects the agent’s deepest commitments, it meets a threshold and hence is autonomous. However, although these agents are locally autonomous relative to these preferences, they are less autonomous than agents who altogether repudiate what Friedman calls “autonomy-devaluing norms” (Friedman 2003, 24).

Meyers introduces the notion of “autonomy competency” to spell out her procedural conception. In an early paper, Meyers describes acting autonomously as “the difference between doing what one wants and doing what one really wants. The autonomous self is not identical with the apparent self; it is an authentic or ‘true’ self” (Meyers 1987, 619). For Meyers, the authentic self emerges when a person exercises the “agentic skills” that characterize autonomous people:

Autonomous people exercise a repertoire of skills to engage in self-discovery, self-definition and self-direction, and...the authentic self is the evolving collocation of attributes that emerges in this ongoing process of reflection, deliberation and action. (Meyers 2005, 49)

She argues that the skills necessary for the authentic self to be realized can be damaged by gender socialization. In the case of Western women, the “emotional receptivity and perceptiveness” that is encouraged in women is likely to enhance the skill of self-discovery and hinder those of self-definition and direction; whereas for men in Western cultures the opposite is likely to be the case (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 18).

Meyers endorses the content-neutrality of the procedural account because she considers that substantive or “value-saturated” accounts of autonomy limit the life-plans and conceptions of the good available to autonomous agents, and undermine the possibility of diversity. However, in an analysis of the practice of “genital cutting,” she acknowledges that “value-neutral” approaches to autonomy, such as her own, should not “[neglect] the possibility that a well-integrated and smoothly functioning self could be in need of rigorous scrutiny and drastic overhaul” (2000a, 480). Meyers argues for the importance in such cases of education programs that “augment autonomy” because “[s]uccessful education programs mobilize women’s introspection, imagination and imagination skills.” For example:

One program invited women to explore their feelings about their sexuality…[and encouraged them] to acknowledge the complexity of their emotional lives and to take their own subjectivity seriously. Another…invited women to empathize with [women who had become infected] and the grief of the families of women and girls who had died… [Another invited] women to imagine the lives of women whose cultures are different but whose religion is the same as their own. (Meyers 2000a, 485)

Meyers’s account implies, then, that certain specific elements of the critical reflection required for autonomy—namely, introspection and imagination—can be damaged by oppressive practices. Moreover, if agents lack self-respect due to being subjected to oppression, they may not achieve autonomy competency. Meyers proposes that self-respect is necessary to achieve the self-realization required for autonomy competency, although it “cannot be construed as a masculine or perfectionist value” (Meyers 1989, 208; compare Dillon’s feminist conception of self-respect in Dillon 1992). Due to the presence of a moral notion of self-respect in Meyers’s account, it has been questioned whether the account is really value-neutral. In one sense, her account is content-neutral: the life-plan that an autonomous agent can define for herself is not constrained by moral or other requirements; it does not have to be a moral life-plan or one that is otherwise good for the agent to undertake. In another sense, because of the role of self-nurturing and self-respect without which the exercise of autonomy competency would not be possible, Meyers’s account could be said to have “weak normative substance” and hence be weakly substantive (Benson 2005a).

Friedman’s and Meyers’s conceptions of autonomy illustrate four features of autonomy that have been influential in subsequent feminist work. First, their conceptions of autonomy are (causally) relational. Meyers considers the impact of oppressive socialization on autonomy competency. Friedman considers the impact of familial and community relationships (Friedman 2003, 97). Restrictive or oppressive social relationships may hamper an agent’s ability to develop the capacity for critical reflection that is required for autonomy, or they may provide role models, self-trust, self-confidence, and so forth, which enhance the capacity (Friedman 2003, 97).

Second, both Friedman and Meyers claim that autonomy is a matter of degree. On Friedman’s conception, autonomy comes in degrees because an agent’s capacity for critical reflection may operate at different levels of sophistication depending on the agent’s socialization and educational background. Meyers distinguishes episodic or local autonomy—the capacity to decide in particular situations—from programmatic autonomy, which is the capacity to decide major life issues (e.g., whether to be a mother, or whether to dedicate oneself to the pursuit of a career). Meyers thinks that oppressive socialization hampers programmatic autonomy but not necessarily local autonomy (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000b, 18). For example, oppressive socialization (which, for instance, might value marriage or motherhood over a career or financial independence) may truncate the range of options that girls consider to be viable, thus interfering with their programmatic autonomy. They may nevertheless have strongly developed critical reasoning faculties that allow them a high degree of competency to exercise local autonomy skills. If an agent is capable of local autonomy but not programmatic autonomy, she has autonomy only to a degree.

Third, Friedman and Meyers reject the association of autonomy with hyper-rationality or (overly) cognitive aspects of the self. Friedman notes that the “self-reflections that make choices and actions autonomous need not be conscious” and that “autonomous choice…does not need to be highly deliberate or deliberated” (Friedman 2003, 8). Moreover, feelings may constitute “reasons” on Friedman’s view: “emotions and desires, as well as imagination, can constitute a kind of reflection on or attention to objects or values of concern” (Friedman 2003, 10). Meyers also repudiates the “hyper-rational” construal of the skills that are necessary for autonomy on her theory. In recent work, she has focused on the relational and embodied dimensions of the self to ask whether autonomy skills can be exercised by what she calls the “self-as-embodied” and the “self-as-relational” (Meyers 2005). There is little discussion in the literature on autonomy of the embodied dimensions of agency and autonomy, so here Meyers has identified a fruitful avenue of further research (see also Mackenzie 2001).

Fourth, Meyers addresses the question of whether the authentic or “true self” required for autonomy must be unified (Meyers 2000b). Notions such as wholehearted endorsement seem to imply a further requirement of coherence among mental states. Indeed, Benson suggests that coherence is a feature common to procedural conceptions that are “identity-based,” namely, those claiming that preferences and actions are “genuinely my own because they are appropriately related to my identity” (Benson 2005b, 102–3). An important theme in contemporary feminist thought, however, is the rejection of the position that coherence is necessary for an agent’s sense of identity. Rather, identity is said to be “intersectional”: an agent’s sense of self is subject to multiple and intersecting modes of oppression, for instance, those of class, gender, race, and sexuality (e.g., Crenshaw 1991). Intersecting oppressions can lead to ambivalence or to a sense of self in which preferences pull in competing directions (e.g., Benson 2005b, 105–6). Meyers argues for a conception of authenticity that incorporates the lessons of intersectionality (Meyers 2000b).

The procedural theories defended by feminists have many strengths, the most noteworthy of which is the commitment to content-neutrality. However, procedural theories have been found wanting by critics for two important reasons. First, they do not put enough weight on the effects of internalized oppression on agents’ motivational states. And, second, procedural theories overlook the constitutive role of external conditions in the definition of autonomy. Consider agents for whom certain norms are ingrained through oppressive socialization, such as the eighteen-year-old student described in §2. She treats norms about beauty and fashion as important and perhaps overriding reasons for action because she has internalized the idea that appearance is a criterion of self-worth. Due to the effects of the oppressive ideology, the agent treats false stereotypes as “natural,” and formulates desires and plans based on the stereotype. On procedural accounts, false stereotypes that have been internalized by the agent may well be the agent’s own because they may be the products of reflective endorsement or the exercise of autonomy competency. This conclusion seems inadequate to many authors. For example, Benson has objected to Christman’s version of a historical procedural account that, in cases like that of the student, because the norms are so deeply ingrained, it is not plausible to think that she resisted or even would have resisted the process of development of the stereotype even had she been aware of the process (Benson 1991). Hence procedural accounts often cannot adequately explain why cases of internalized oppression appear to be nonautonomous. A second reason that procedural approaches have been deemed unsatisfactory is that it has been argued that severely constraining external circumstances, including the lack of a sufficient number of real options, compromise agents’ freedom and autonomy (Raz 1988; Brison 2000; Nussbaum 2001; Oshana 2006).

5. Normative Competency Conceptions

In his early work, Paul Benson offered a normative competence conception of “free agency” that, he argued, was congenial to feminist interpretations of moral and political agency (Benson 1987; 1990; 1991). For our purposes, Benson’s proposal can be treated as an account of autonomy because the capacity for free agency is also thought of as a capacity for exercising agency that is one’s own. As Benson points out, both Gary Watson and Susan Wolf adopt versions of normative competence views. Watson claims that endorsement is insufficient for autonomy because doing “what one wants”—that is to say, doing what one has endorsed—is compatible with mere intentional agency and does not provide the further element required to guarantee autonomous agency (Watson 1975, 205; compare Buss 1994). Watson proposes that “if what I do flows from my values and ends, there is a…sense in which my activities are inescapably my own” (Watson 1996, 233; quoted in Benson 2005b, 103). This modification of the endorsement view, although it introduces values into the analysis of autonomy, suffers from the same objection as the purely procedural theories discussed in the last section. For if an agent such as the student mentioned above has so effectively internalized oppressive norms that she values them and treats them as her ends, then it is questionable whether they are genuinely her own.

Susan Wolf adopts a normative competence view in which the capacity that is essential for autonomy is the capacity to track objective moral reasons. Wolf considers agents who have experienced a morally impoverished or distorting socialization. For instance, JoJo is the son of an evil and sadistic tyrant who has been raised to respect his father’s values and emulate his desires, so that he thoroughly internalizes his father’s evil and sadistic worldview. Suppose that on procedural theories, JoJo counts as autonomous because he endorses his desires in the appropriate ways, has the desires he really wants, and so forth. Wolf proposes that he is neither free nor morally responsible because his upbringing has undermined his capacity to distinguish right from wrong: “[i]t is unclear whether anyone with a childhood such as his could have developed into anything but the twisted and perverse sort of person that he has become” (Wolf 1987, 54). On Wolf’s account, the failure of autonomy is a failure of a capacity to track an objective aspect of the world, namely, “the moral” or “the right.” Since for Wolf the demands of morality are equivalent to the demands of objective “Reason,” in order to be autonomous, agents must be capable of discerning the requirements of Reason.

Benson employs a parallel notion of normative competence, though it does not does require a capacity to track objective morality, but rather an ability to identify and deploy norms that are appropriate to a particular domain (1987, 486). He writes that:

[F]ree agency requires normative competence, an array of abilities to be aware of applicable normative standards, to appreciate those standards, and to bring them competently to bear in one’s evaluations of open courses of action…At the heart of free agency is the power of our actions to reveal who we are, both to ourselves and to others, in the context of potential normative assessments of what we do. (Benson 1990, 54)

Autonomy based on normative competence is compatible with feminist reinterpretations of moral and political agency because it is relational in three respects (Benson 1990, 55). First, normative competence is “other-directed” in that “it makes certain normative characteristics of the agent present to others.” Second, the content of normative competence “depends on the particular norms or standards in relation to which an agent’s freedom may be determined” (Benson 1990, 55). Third, the normative standpoint relative to particular domains is that of “persons and institutions with whom (or which) one is concretely connected by friendship, family, work, neighborhood” (Benson 1990, 55).

It is plausible that the oppression experienced by marginalized groups interferes with their normative competence. The psychological harms of oppression include false consciousness (the agent adopts as true the false ideology that oppresses her) and deformed desires (the agent’s desires depend on the belief in the false ideology) (Cudd 2006, 176, 182). At worst, agents in the grip of false consciousness in a particular domain do not have the capacity relative to that domain to latch on to alternative, applicable, or “correct” standards and apply them to evaluate their preferences and desires. At best, they are faced with a contradictory set of norms:

If many of the prevailing norms which enter into what normative competence practically means for most women in the society are norms that function to suppress or trivialize women’s contributions and experience, to deny women dignity as full participants in the life of the community, then free agency would seem to confront women as a self-destructive goal (Benson 1990, 57).

In other words, attempting to exercise normative competence (that is, to promote autonomy) relative to the prevailing norms entails adopting a set of norms that is oppressive to oneself. Benson suggests that, in order to promote autonomy, members of marginal groups will need to develop alternative norms through grassroots activities such as consciousness-raising.

Benson is careful to point out that a requirement of normative competence should not be conflated with a strong substantive conception of autonomy in which the theory places direct normative constraints on the contents of the preferences of autonomous agents. Even on Wolf’s position, in which normative competence is the ability to track objective moral norms, normative competence is nevertheless a capacity. It does not require that the content of agents’ preferences correspond to the content of the applicable norms. As Benson puts it, “normatively competent persons can choose what is unreasonable or wrong or value what is bad, because competence lies some distance short of perfect evaluative perception or responsiveness” (Benson 2005a, 133–4). However, there are controversial issues raised by normative competence accounts. The first is that of the status of the moral and other norms that are employed to explicate normative competence. Wolf’s claim that there are objective moral reasons that rational agents have the capacity to track is controversial despite being a well-known and widely supported position. Benson’s normative standpoints are not derived from objective moral reasons but rather are intersubjective standpoints—those derived from “persons or institutions to which the agent is concretely connected.” The problem here, as we have seen, is that such standpoints may be oppressive to the group in which the agent is a member. Indeed, as a result of internalized oppression, the agent may competently deploy these standards to evaluate her own actions. It seems, for example, that the eighteen-year-old student is competent to evaluate her actions using oppressive norms such as “beauty is a component of self-worth.” She is normatively competent with respect to the prevailing set of intersubjective norms (those of the oppressive ideology). If the student is to be characterized as lacking autonomy, she must be judged lacking in normative competence from some other normative standpoint—but where does this other standpoint come from on Benson’s account? A final difficulty for normative competence accounts is the charge that they conflate autonomy with moral responsibility. In the case of JoJo, for example, although it is plausible that the comprehensiveness of his socialization absolves him from full moral responsibility for his acts, it may be too quick to conclude that his acts are not the product of his own (autonomous) agency. The wish to maintain a conceptual distinction between responsibility and autonomy has led Benson to revise his early normative competence approach (Benson 1994, 665).

6. Emotions and Self-regarding Attitudes

The accounts of autonomy surveyed so far offer necessary and sufficient conditions of autonomy that are, broadly speaking, rationalistic. On Friedman’s procedural and content-neutral approach, an agent’s preference is autonomous if and only if certain processes of critical reflection have been followed. On Meyers’s competency account, an agent is autonomous when the authentic self emerges as a result of the exercise of the cognitive skills of self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction. On Benson’s normative competence account, an agent must have the intellectual capacity to discern applicable norms in order to count as autonomous. Although these accounts are nuanced and recognize the role of emotion in critical reflection, none explicitly treat emotions as necessary conditions of autonomy.

This section sketches a family of approaches that argue that the reasoning processes and the intellectual competencies described above are not sufficient for autonomy (even assuming that they are necessary) (Govier 1993; Benson 1994). These approaches propose that certain emotional states and attitudes to oneself are further necessary conditions; autonomy is undermined when these emotional states are damaged. There is a close connection between the undermining of such states and oppression. The indirect effects of oppression include the harms of shame and loss of self-esteem (Cudd 2006, 176–8; compare Benson 1994, 657–9), which in turn can lead to self-doubt, and the loss of self-confidence and self-trust.

Both Trudy Govier (1993) and Carolyn McLeod (2002) argue that self-trust is a necessary condition of autonomy. Govier claims that “[p]rocedural autonomy has as its necessary condition a reliance on one’s own critical reflection and judgment, and that reliance is possible only if one has, and can maintain against criticism, a sense of one’s own basic competence and worth” (1993, 103–4). Govier proposes that other self-regarding attitudes, such as self-respect and self-esteem, are integral components of self-trust. She looks at the experiences of rape and incest victims to illustrate the ways in which self-trust can be eroded. Women who are the victims of rape or incest “tended to blame themselves, de-value themselves, and to have a diminished sense of their own competence and judgment after the sexual assaults…” (Govier 1993, 101). Govier concludes that lack of self-trust and a diminished sense of one’s own competence undermine the reflection required for autonomy.

Carolyn McLeod focuses on medical contexts to elaborate how self-trust is necessary for autonomy. Consider Anna, who suffered a miscarriage at six weeks gestation and afterwards felt considerable emotional turmoil (McLeod 2002, 53). McLeod analyzes Anna’s sense of incompetence to articulate her emotions as in part a result of others’ lack of sympathy for her grief and corresponding failure to reinforce her feelings: “[O]ften women and their partners are pressured not to grieve after miscarriage because people tend not to view the fetus’s death as an event that warrants grief” (McLeod 2002, 53). Comments such as “it was a blessing in disguise” or “it could have been worse; you could have lost a baby” fail to “give uptake to [women’s] feelings” (McLeod 2002, 55). The attitudes of others affect agents’ sense of competence, self-worth, and self-trust. When these self-regarding attitudes are diminished, so is an agent’s autonomy.

For McLeod, self-trust is an “attitude of optimism about our own competence and moral integrity” (McLeod 2002, 6). McLeod’s account differs from Govier’s in that her conception of self-trust is explicitly moral: in “acting autonomously, we strive to meet moral responsibilities to the self” (McLeod 2002, 122). Being autonomous requires treating oneself well in a moral sense (McLeod 2002, pp. 121–126). Thus although Govier’s notion of self-trust seems to be compatible with value-neutral procedural accounts of autonomy, McLeod’s is not. Rather, McLeod’s account is “‘weakly substantive” because she claims that certain moral attitudes to oneself—for example, attitudes affirming one’s own moral worth—are necessary to acting autonomously. Moreover, on McLeod’s account, the self-trust necessary for autonomy is (epistemically) “justified self-trust”: for instance, self-trust or self-distrust is not justified if agents overestimate or underestimate their competence in certain contexts (McLeod 2002, 104). Hence, for McLeod, there are epistemic as well as moral constraints on autonomy.

McLeod’s examples illustrate the ways in which interpersonal conditions affect agents’ abilities for self-trust and hence their autonomy. Benson (1994) develops a similar line of thought. He describes a case of a woman with a certain personality type (Benson 1994, 555–7): she is excitable, imaginative, and passionate, and is “prone to emotional outbursts in public” (Benson 1994, 556). The woman’s husband, whom the woman trusts, is a physician, and his response is to “medicalize” his wife’s personality type as psychologically unstable and “hysterical.” The husband treats his wife as if she were crazy. As Benson describes it, the woman’s response is helplessness and disorientation leading to lost self-worth. The husband’s and the establishment’s attitude to the woman radically affect her self-conception; it becomes destabilized and her self-confidence is eroded. Moreover, the woman does not resist the process through which she loses her self-worth because “she arrives at her sense of incompetence and estrangement…on the basis of reasons that are valued by a scientific establishment which is socially validated and which she trusts” (Benson 1994, 657). Benson argues that although the woman’s critical reasoning faculties are intact, she nevertheless lacks autonomy because of a diminished sense of self-worth.

Govier, McLeod, and Benson introduce new tools for thinking about the hard cases described in §2. Agents in oppressive circumstances may have excellent skills of critical reflection, yet in these circumstances they are subject to others’ attitudes according to which they are suited only for subservient roles, that they are of inferior worth, that they are not capable of being full participants in society or in a decision-making process, and so forth. These attitudes have the effect of eroding their self-trust, self-confidence, and sense of self-worth. For example, although the reasoning skills of the Deferential Wife may be intact—she may have reflected on her wish to always cater to her husband, and endorsed it—she may nevertheless have a diminished sense of self-worth as a result of the subtle effects of gender oppression. If she does not treat herself as worthy of being the “author of her own conduct,” she will lack autonomy (Benson 1994, 659).

Govier’s position is causally relational: interpersonal conditions affect the emotions, which in turn affect the capacities for critical reflection required for autonomy. However, McLeod’s and Benson’s positions are constitutively relational because the self-regarding attitudes necessary for autonomy are themselves understood as constitutively relational. We saw that McLeod adopts a moral notion of justified self-trust as necessary for autonomy, which makes hers a weak substantive position. Her position is also constitutively relational because agents can be wrong to trust themselves, for example, when they overestimate their own competence. Hence features of the world—facts about the agent’s competence—are necessary for justified self-trust that in turn is necessary for autonomy. Benson claims that although what is required for a sense of self-worth will be different in different agents, nevertheless there is a common feature: “the sense of worthiness to act that is necessary for free agency involves regarding oneself as being competent to answer for one’s conduct in the light of normative demands that, from one’s point of view, others might appropriately apply to one’s actions” (Benson 1994, 660). The definition of self-worth required for autonomy on Benson’s analysis employs interpersonal relations and hence his account is constitutively relational.

7. Dialogical Conceptions

A discussion of self-regarding attitudes raises the question of the interrelation between self-interpretation and interpretation of the self by others. Charles Taylor comments on the dialogical nature of the social self. Taylor writes that “we define our identity always in dialogue with, sometimes in struggle against, the things our significant others want to see in us” (Taylor 1994, 28; compare Oshana 2005, 78). In the same vein, several authors pursue “dialogical” conceptions of autonomy in which an agent’s answerability to others is the key condition. As we saw above, Benson explicates the notion of self-worth as in part a requirement of “regarding oneself as being competent to answer for one’s conduct” (Benson 1994, 660). He develops this idea in recent work to argue that autonomous agents are those who treat themselves as answerable for their conduct, who claim the authority to speak for themselves (Benson 2005b, 111 ff.) Catriona Mackenzie also proposes an account based on agents’ answerability to others. For Mackenzie, being self-governing is to have “normative authority” over one’s decisions, which means that an agent must “regard herself as the legitimate source of the authority, as able, and authorized, to speak for herself…[S]uch attitudes towards oneself can only be sustained in relations of intersubjective recognition” (Mackenzie 2008, 4).

Andrea Westlund has developed a dialogical approach in some detail (Westlund 2003; 2009; 2012; 2018). For Westlund, autonomy is neither a structural nor a historical capacity of critical reflection, but rather a disposition of an agent to “hold herself answerable, for her action-guiding commitments, to external critical perspectives” (Westlund 2009, 35). Westlund notes that “Autonomous agents will, in one way or another, manifest responsiveness to justificatory challenges and their disposition to do so is partly constitutive of their status as self-governing” (Westlund 2009, 40). Excessively deferential agents such as the Deferential Wife will almost certainly fail to have this disposition. These agents will not treat themselves as authoritative and answerable for their conduct; rather, the way in which they answer for themselves (if they do so at all) will be governed by the reasons of the agents to whom they defer. Westlund argues, however, that it should not be assumed that the women described in the hard cases above are “psychologically similar to each other” (Westlund 2009, 29). For example, Westlund wants to allow that agents who adopt oppressive practices that significantly inhibit their equality may do so autonomously and believes that if a “fundamentalist woman does freely and authentically accept a condition of social and personal subordination, it seems…problematic to assume that her condition as subordinate, in and of itself, undermines her status as a self-governing agent” (Westlund 2009, 29). Westlund distinguishes between two (hypothetical) fundamentalist women, both of whom accept their condition of subordination but only one of whom “is prepared to take up and respond to the critical perspectives of others, even if she is unconvinced by their arguments” (Westlund 2009, 29). The latter exhibits dialogical autonomy whereas the former does not. (For a critical discussion of Westlund’s account, see Stoljar 2018.)

Like accounts that employ self-regarding attitudes, dialogical accounts can be either content-neutral or substantive. Westlund characterizes her own view as “formal” (i.e., content-neutral) because it does not require an agent to endorse or reject any specific justificatory practice. Benson’s position, however, is weakly substantive for the reason that a condition of answerability on his view is that the agent treats herself as “properly…fit and worthy to possess such authority” (Benson 2005b, 117). Indeed, he is skeptical that Westlund’s account can maintain its neutrality and contends that “[t]o hold oneself answerable, in any concrete situation, is to…to be disposed to apply in that situation some normative expectation to oneself” (Benson 2011). However, the different proponents of dialogical accounts are in agreement that their position is constitutively relational. Westlund explains that the autonomy disposition requires “positioning oneself as always a potential member of a reflective or deliberative dyad” so that the psychological perspective of the autonomous agent “[points] beyond itself, to the position the agent occupies as one reflective, responsible self among many” (Westlund 2009, 35). The idea of answerability employs interpersonal relations in the definition of autonomy and hence is constitutively relational.

Dialogical accounts potentially suffer from the objection that they are too weak to capture agents whose autonomy appears to be compromised by oppressive socialization or circumstances. Suppose an agent acquiesces in and endorses a set of circumstances or an ideology that is oppressive to her. As Westlund’s account explicitly acknowledges, she may nevertheless have the capacity for answerability. In Benson’s terms, she may “regard herself as being competent to answer for her conduct in the light of normative demands that, from her point of view, others might appropriately apply to her actions.” Consider the eighteen-year-old student who is concerned to uphold dominant beauty standards. In one sense, she may lack a sense of self-worth; but on Benson’s notion of the self-worth required for free agency, she may exhibit self-worth because, with respect to the norms she believes to be applicable to her, she may regard herself as competent to answer for her actions in terms of those norms. She may be engaged in an attempt to enhance her sense of self-worth through beauty treatments precisely because she believes that it is appropriate that the norms of the fashion industry apply to her (Stoljar 2000, 108). Indeed, when an agent has acquiesced in and embraced a set of oppressive norms, she will often have the self-confidence required to articulate her commitment to these norms to others. Hence, agents who have adopted oppressive practices will often be autonomous on dialogical accounts.

8. Strong Substantive and Social-relational Conceptions

A strong substantive theory of autonomy was defined earlier as one in which “the contents of the preferences or values that agents can form or act on autonomously are subject to direct normative constraints” (Benson 2005a, 133). On strong substantive approaches, certain preferences and values are deemed to be incompatible with autonomy, not because of how they are formed, but rather because of their content. For example, choosing slavery or subservience would not be autonomous because the contents of the choices would violate the normative constraints introduced by the theory. Hence, strong substantive views offer an explanation of the intuition that internalized oppression is non-autonomous in cases in which the content of oppressive norms is incompatible with the normative constraints. Note that conceptions of autonomy that employ normative competence (§5), self-regarding attitudes (§6) and dialogical features (§7) should be distinguished from those in the strong substantive category. These conceptions may “incorporate normative substance” in different ways and hence may be weakly substantive (Benson 2005a, 133). However, none of these approaches invoke direct normative constraints on the content of agents’ preferences as necessary conditions of autonomy.

Strong substantive accounts come in various forms. One account characterizes autonomy as a moral notion: choices with criticizable moral contents are deemed nonautonomous. For example, Thomas Hill characterizes the failure of autonomy in the case of the Deferential Wife as a moral failure of self-respect, a failure to treat oneself as a moral equal (Hill 1991, 15). Agents who choose subservience are nonautonomous because they make a special kind of moral mistake (see also Superson 2005). An alternative proposal says that agents cannot manifest autonomy in a “thick” sense unless their choices are consistent with what is objectively in their interests. The Deferential Wife is making a mistake because it is in her interests to choose a life of autonomy, rather than a life of subservience. Susan Babbitt notes that “the effects of oppression may be such that people are psychologically damaged, possessing interests and desires that reflect their subservient status” (Babbitt 1993, 246). She argues that even if the Deferential Wife were a Rawlsian ideal reasoner, making choices under ideal epistemic conditions—those of “adequate instrumental reasoning abilities, full and complete information and the capacity to vividly imagine the consequences of her actions” (Babbitt 1993, 247)—she still would not choose autonomy over deference. Rather, “it is part of her social and historical identity to be inferior to men” (Babbitt 1993, 250), and hence she would have to undergo a conversion in her sense of self, so that “habitual servility is not what defines it,” to be able to makes the choice that is in her objective interest.

Strong substantive accounts are constitutively relational because they claim that preferences are autonomous if and only if their contents correspond to morally permissible or correct features of the world. A related constitutively relational conception is exemplified in Marina Oshana’s “social-relational” approach in which the presence of certain external conditions is necessary for autonomy (Oshana 2006). Up until now the theories of autonomy surveyed have treated autonomy as a psychological feature of agents. Procedural theories and Meyers’s competency approach employ psychological processes of critical reflection. Similarly, normative competence theories rely on an agent’s psychological capacity to discern substantive norms. Dialogical approaches invoke agents’ psychological states, such as the sense of one’s own answerability, although they analyze these states as related to external interpersonal conditions. Strong substantive accounts require that agents’ psychologies hook onto the world in the right ways. On all these positions, in principle, autonomy “can be achieved” by the agent as long as her psychology changes in the right way or is aligned in the right way with features of the world. (Compare Meyers’s distinction between autonomy as “something a person accomplishes” and autonomy as “something that happens to a person”: Meyers 1987, 626).

Oshana’s social-relational view proposes that autonomy can be undermined by conditions in the world that do not necessarily affect the agent’s psychology. Autonomy (or lack of it) is “something that happens” to the agent. Other theorists also invoke external conditions. For instance, Joseph Raz argues that a woman living on a desert island who is hounded by a wild animal is not capable of autonomy because her options in this situation are so severely curtailed (Raz 1988, 374). And Susan Brison claims that “if one has an inadequate range of significant options to choose from, one’s autonomy is diminished and the extent to which significant options are available to someone depends on the kind of society she lives in” (Brison 2000, 285).

Oshana’s social-relational analysis is explicit that agents who are reflective and psychologically competent can have their autonomy undermined by finding themselves in—or deliberately adopting—a situation in which their “practical control” is removed: “We correctly attribute autonomy to a person when the person has de facto power and authority to direct affairs of elemental importance to her life within a framework of rules (or values, principles, beliefs, pro-attitudes) that she has set for herself” (Oshana 2007, p. 411). For Oshana, no matter the degree of subjective self-realization or subjective endorsement of their situation, agents living under conditions of severe social constraint have limited autonomy. Consider, for example, serfs living under the protection of the lord of the manor in feudal times. On the social-relational conception, serfs would be considered lacking in autonomy due to a social structure in which the “general and routine” aspects of a serf’s life are not under his or her own control but rather under that of the lord of the manor. To the extent that agents today live under parallel social conditions, they lack or have significantly diminished autonomy. Oshana writes of the Deferential Wife that “she fails to be autonomous—not because she wants to be subservient, but because she is subservient. Her lack of autonomy is due to her personal relations with others and to the social institutions of her society” (Oshana 2006, 62). Similarly, Oshana’s example “Taliban Woman” is not autonomous because external circumstances deny her practical control:

She is not permitted to support herself financially. She does not have legal custody of her children—that remains in the hands of their father and in his male relatives should he die. She has no voice in the manner and duration of any schooling that her children, particularly her daughters, may receive. She must remain costumed in cumbersome garb—a burqa—when in public. She cannot travel unless accompanied by a male relative…and can travel only when granted permission by a male relative or religious elder. She knows that any transgression, any show of independence counts as heretical defiance and invites punishment both swift and harsh. (Oshana 2006, 60)

According to Oshana, the external conditions to which this woman is subjected render her passive and her “life-plan remains in force [only] because of the will of another” (Oshana 2006, 62). Even if the woman endorses the situation she is in, she lacks de facto control over routine aspects of daily life and hence cannot be autonomous.

Oshana’s conception of autonomy should be distinguished from the strong substantive views identified above: on her approach, the contents of preferences and conceptions of the good are irrelevant to autonomy. Agents may have autonomy-promoting conceptions of the good, yet may fail to be autonomous because constraining external conditions rule it out. Moreover, the converse case is also true. Consider a newly liberated prisoner who we will suppose satisfies the rational competency conditions that are also necessary for autonomy on Oshana’s account (Oshana 2007, p. 419). For Oshana, once the prisoner is released into autonomy-compatible external conditions, he is autonomous despite the content of his desires. The prisoner may prefer to return to prison, yet this preference will not nullify his autonomy. Although an agent may desire to be directed by the will of another, it is only if she is actually in the external conditions in which she is so directed that her autonomy is impeded. Thus, Oshana’s conception is in a sense content-neutral.

There is an additional sense in which the social-relational conception differs from other conceptions of autonomy: it is “global” not “local”. Oshana’s theory provides an analysis of the condition of the autonomous agent rather than the conditions under which an agent’s particular desires and preferences at particular times count as autonomous. This means that agents —for example, those living under conditions of slavery— could lack global autonomy but nevertheless have local autonomy with respect to particular preferences and desires. A question arises then about the relationship between local and global autonomy.

Strong substantive and social-relational approaches are perhaps the most controversial of those surveyed and have as a result attracted trenchant critiques. The first is conceptual. It has been suggested that strong substantive theories conflate autonomy (defined as self-rule) with morally right-rule (Benson 2005a, 132). In other words, on these accounts, agents are autonomous only if they make morally correct choices or choices that coincide with their objective interests. But, it is argued, being autonomous is not conceptually identical to being moral, or to always acting in ways that promote an agent’s interests. Second, it has been suggested that social-relational views are objectionable because they permit paternalism or are implicitly committed to perfectionism (Holroyd 2009; Christman 2004; compare Mackenzie 2008; Killmister 2013; Stoljar 2017). For example, Christman argues that Oshana’s position is implicitly committed to an egalitarian ideal; he claims that on her account, no other political arrangement is consistent with personal autonomy (Christman 2004; Christman 2009). Third, it has been alleged that these accounts are too quick to treat oppression as always impeding autonomy. For instance, Meyers claims that certain agents are “firebrand, adventure-loving resisters”, who thrive and flourish when they have the opportunity to oppose social norms (Meyers 2000a, 479). If this is so, autonomy should be possible even in the circumstances of the extremely constraining regime described by Oshana. Fourth, a number of theorists claim that attributing non-autonomy just in virtue of social conditions is tantamount to disrespect. In particular, if a rationally competent woman living under oppression endorses that social arrangement, it may seem disrespectful to contradict her own assessment of what is important for her flourishing (e.g., Westlund 2009, 29). This latter objection has particular currency in the context of the debate over the adaptive preferences of non-Western women (e.g., Khader 2012). It has been suggested that characterizing the preferences of non-Western women for patriarchal social arrangements as adaptive (and therefore non-autonomous) is disrespectful. Others have argued however that the mere attribution of non-autonomy does not imply disrespect (Daventry 2021; Stoljar 2024).

In an effort to resolve these potential standoffs, Catriona Mackenzie has suggested that autonomy is a multi-dimensional concept, and that the different conceptions of autonomy surveyed here correspond to different dimensions of the concept, namely self-determination, self-governance, and self-authorization (Mackenzie 2014; Mackenzie 2015). Oshana’s social-relational approach provides an account of self-determination because it identifies the external “opportunities necessary to make and enact decisions of practical import to one’s life” (Mackenzie 2015, 55). The procedural approaches of Meyers and Friedman fall under the dimension of self-governance because of their focus on the “skills and capacities necessary to make and enact decisions and to live one’s life” (Mackenzie 2015, 55). And dialogical theories of autonomy that employ answerability correspond to the dimension of self-authorization, which “involves regarding oneself as having the normative authority to be self-determining and self-governing” (Mackenzie 2015, 55). Mackenzie’s multi-dimensional approach illuminates the different concerns of relational autonomy theorists, but raises further questions. How do the three dimensions of autonomy intersect? Are any or all of the different dimensions necessary or sufficient conditions of autonomy? Is it possible for an agent to be fully autonomous is she satisfies only one dimension of autonomy?

9. Conclusion

Feminist theories of autonomy analyze the effects of internalized oppression and the circumstances of oppression on agents’ global and local autonomy. There is no consensus as to which theoretical position is correct. To some extent, the answer depends on intuitions about which view best captures the notion of agency that is one’s own. There is considerable consensus, however, that oppressive socialization and oppressive practices diminish autonomy and perhaps undermine it altogether. The relational conceptions of autonomy surveyed here are important contributions to theoretical debates on the nature of autonomy as well as to our understanding of how oppression interferes with the psychological states and social conditions required for autonomy.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I would like to thank Jennifer Saul, Anita Superson and Nancy Tuana for their careful and very helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry.

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Natalie Stoljar <natalie.stoljar@mcgill.ca>

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