Kant's Account of Reason

First published Fri Sep 12, 2008; substantive revision Wed Nov 1, 2017

Two of the most prominent questions in Kant’s critical philosophy concern reason. One question is central to his theoretical philosophy. It arises from the metaphysical assertions of earlier “rationalist” philosophers, especially Leibniz and Descartes. Which claims can reason hope to establish securely? A second question is central to his practical philosophy. It arises from the subservient role accorded to reason by the British empiricists—above all Hume, who declared, “Reason is wholly inactive, and can never be the source of so active a principle as conscience, or a sense of morals” (Treatise,; see also the entry on rationalism vs. empiricism). What sort of practical relevance can reason claim? These questions are reflected in the titles of two key works: the monumental Critique of Pure Reason, and the Critique of Practical Reason that is middle point of his great trio of moral writings (between the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals and The Metaphysics of Morals).

It is clear that practical reason is the foundation of Kant’s moral philosophy. It is less clear what role reason plays in his theoretical philosophy. Kant insists that “metaphysics is utterly impossible, or at best a disorderly and bungling endeavor” if we do not separate “ideas of reason” from “concepts of the understanding” (Prolegomena §41, 4:329). But while he emphasizes the solidity of empirical knowledge gained through the understanding, reason and its “ideas” often appear as mere sources of error and illusion. (This is especially so for the most-read sections of the first Critique—the Aesthetic, Analytic and Dialectic.) But if this were all that Kant meant to say, the status of philosophical reasoning would stand in grave doubt. In addition, we might note that Kant rarely discusses reason as such. This leaves a difficult interpretative task: just what is Kant’s general and positive account of reason?

This entry has the following structure. The first section sets out the role that reason plays in Kant’s account of knowledge and metaphysics in the first Critique. The second section examines key aspects of reason in the moral philosophy, with special reference to the second Critique. Reflecting Kant’s canonical texts and the bulk of the secondary literature, these discussions of theoretical and practical reason are relatively independent of one another. The third section therefore considers how Kant’s views of theoretical and practical reason may be related. It emphasizes the most prominent contemporary interpretation of Kantian reason, that of Onora O’Neill. The concluding remarks underline the philosophical interest of a unified interpretation of Kant’s account of reason.

1. Theoretical reason: reason’s cognitive role and limitations

The first half of the Critique of Pure Reason argues that we can only obtain substantive knowledge of the world via sensibility and understanding. Very roughly, our capacities of sense experience and concept formation cooperate so that we can form empirical judgments. The next large section—the “Transcendental Dialectic”—demolishes reason’s pretensions to offer knowledge of a “transcendent” world, that is, a world beyond that revealed by the senses. “Dialectic,” says Kant, is “a logic of illusion” (A293): so in his vocabulary, a dialectical idea is empty or false.

However, the Critique of Pure Reason should not be read as a demolition of reason’s cognitive role. Kant certainly wants to delimit the bounds of reason, but this is not the same as arguing that it has no role in our knowledge. Three points are crucial: (§1.1) the relation of reason to empirical truth; (§1.2) reason’s role in scientific enquiry; and (§1.3) the positive gains that come from appreciating reason’s limits.[1] In addition, sound philosophical reasoning requires that reason gain knowledge of itself—a task that the first Critique begins, but does not complete (§1.4).

1.1 Reason as the arbiter of empirical truth

The first thing to note is Kant’s bold claim that reason is the arbiter of truth in all judgments—empirical as well as metaphysical. Unfortunately, he barely develops this thought, and the issue has attracted surprisingly little attention in the literature. (But cf. Walker 1989: Ch. 4; Guyer and Walker 1990; Kant’s theory of judgment, §§1.3, 1.4).[2] However, some basic points are clear from the text. We form judgments about the world around us all the time, without a second thought. We see a hand in front of us and judge it to exist; after a dream, we judge ourselves to have been dreaming and the dream’s contents to be illusory; we see the sun rise and assume that it orbits the earth. Kant devotes great philosophical efforts to show that all these judgments rely on categories, such as cause and effect, that must order our sensory impressions. A belief that conforms to these conditions meets the “formal” conditions of truth. However, unless we are fundamentally confused about something, all our beliefs meet these conditions.[3]) So there is a further question: which of our beliefs are “materially” true, and which erroneous?

Corresponding to the fundamental priority that he ascribes to judgment, Kant begins with the observation that only once there is judgment can there be error: “It is correctly said that the senses do not err; yet not because they always judge correctly, but because they do not judge at all” (A293). For example, there is no error involved in the impressions of a dream, however confused or fantastical they may be. But if someone were to get confused about her dreamed experience, and suppose that it had really happened, then she would be making a judgment—and a false one too. So Kant claims, “error is only effected through the unnoticed influence of sensibility on understanding, through which it happens that the subjective grounds of the judgment join with the objective ones” (A294). In the example, someone confuses a subjective ground of judgment (“I had this dream”) with an objective one (“these events took place”). As Kant puts it in the Prolegomena: “The difference between truth and dream… is not decided through the quality of the representations that are referred to objects, for they are the same in both, but through their connection according to rules that determine the combination of representations in the concept of an object, and how far they can or cannot stand together in one experience.” (4:290)

How does reason enter the matter? In the famous “Refutation of Idealism,” Kant says the following: “Whether this or that putative experience is not mere imagination [or dream or delusion, etc.] must be ascertained according to its particular determinations and through its coherence with the criteria of all actual experience” (B279). To see what Kant means, consider a simple example. Suppose that our dreamer believes she has won a lottery, but then starts to examine this belief. To decide its truth, she must ask how far it connects up with her other judgments, and those of other people.[4] If it fails to connect up (she checks the winning numbers, say, and sees no match with her actual ticket), she must conclude that the belief was false. Otherwise, she would contradict a fundamental law of possible experience, that it be capable of being unified. As Kant summarizes his position: “ the law of reason to seek unity is necessary, since without it we would have no reason, and without that, no coherent use of the understanding, and, lacking that, no sufficient mark of empirical truth…” (A651/B679).[5]

In sum, what separates material error from true cognition for Kant is that true cognitions must find a definite place within a single, unified experience of the world. Since reason is an important source of the unifying structure of experience, it proves essential as an arbiter of empirical truth.

1.2 Reason in science

The same principle of reasoned unity also applies to judgments that are not readily decided by everyday experience. Why are we sure that the sun does not orbit the earth, despite all appearances? To answer such questions, we need to consider reason’s role in scientific knowledge. Kant claims that reason is “the origin of certain concepts and principles” (A299/B355) independent from those of sensibility and understanding. Kant refers to these as “transcendental ideas” (A311/B368) or “ideas of [pure] reason” (A669/B697). And he now defines reason as a “faculty of principles” (A299/B356) or the “faculty of the unity of the rules of understanding under principles” (A303/B358). The problem is how to justify these concepts and principles. This problem is acute because Kant also argues that they often lead us into error and contradiction.

Apart from ideas about objects that lie beyond sensory experience, such as God or the soul, we also form transcendental ideas about entities that are meant to form the ultimate basis of everything that exists, such as the universe as a whole: Kant speaks of “world wholes” or cosmological ideas. As discussed in a moment (§1.3), claims to objective knowledge about these cosmological ideas, such as the claim that the universe has a beginning in time or the opposing claim that it does not, lead us into contradictions or “antinomies.”

Yet science assumes that the world forms a well-ordered, systematic unity where all events can be subsumed under causal laws. As just indicated, we rely on a basic version of this principle when we judge that some impressions are illusions or dreams. It should also be clear that, however coherent our experiences might be, they are bound to be finite in extent. That is, we could never experience enough to justify this apparently cosmological claim that every object and event conforms to causal laws—let alone that these laws will continue to hold in the future.[6] Nonetheless, Kant argues that reason is justified in adopting these principles (among others), so long as it does not treat these as knowledge claims. This is his distinction between the “constitutive” and “regulative” use of ideas. (See, e.g., Buchdahl 1992; Friedman 1992c; Kant’s theory of judgment, §4.2.)

For Kant, the “constitutive” use of our faculties helps to constitute the objects of knowledge, by providing their form as objects of possible experience. Constitutive principles thereby have a strong objective standing—the paradigm case being the categories of the understanding. Regulative principles, by contrast, govern our theoretical activities but offer no (constitutive) guarantees about the objects under investigation. As Kant puts it, activities must have goals if they are not to degenerate into merely random groping (cf. Bvii, A834/B862). Science aims to discover the greatest possible completeness and systematicity (cf. Guyer 1989 & 2006, Abela 2006, Mudd 2017), subsuming objects and events under the most all-encompassing laws. When Kant speaks of the “unity of reason” in the first Critique, he means that reason gives “unity a priori through concepts to the understanding’s manifold cognitions” (A302/B359; cf. A665/B693, A680/B780).

As indicated, this unity must be a priori since it cannot be given through any set of experiences. Nor can we know in advance how far science will succeed, or that nature is wholly law-like. So the principle of seeking unity forms (what Kant calls) a “maxim” or regulative principle of reason (A666/B694; see Mudd 2016 for recent discussion of this principle and its practical nature). By contrast, the claim that such unity does exist would represent a “constitutive principle,” the sort of “cosmological” knowledge claim that we cannot justify.

Our judgment that the earth orbits the sun (and not vice versa) provides a simple illustration. The opposite claim seems more compelling to common sense, and consistency in observations is generally sufficient to confirm everyday knowledge. But scientific knowledge aspires to law-like completeness. It is not just that Galileo’s observations with the telescope suggest that everyday appearances are misleading. For Kant, more important is how reason unifies these observations through laws of gravity, momentum and so forth. By compassing the motion of all heavenly objects, and not only the movement of the sun relative to the earth, Newton provides the proper confirmation of Copernicus’ heliocentric hypothesis (Bxxii n; cf. §1.4 below). The extension and modification of Newton’s laws by general relativity gives one indication of the open-ended, “regulative” nature of this quest; so too does the as-yet unsatisfied ambition to integrate general relativity with quantum mechanics.[7]

Kant’s account of science, and especially the role of “teleological” or purposive judgment, is further developed in the Critique of Judgment. See Guyer 1990, Freudiger 1996, and Nuzzo 2005, as well as Kant’s aesthetics and teleology, §3. On Kant’s account of science more generally, see Wartenberg 1992, Buchdahl 1992, Friedman 1992b & 2013, and Breitenbach [forthcoming]. On reason and science, see Neiman 1994: Ch. 2 and Grier 2001: Ch. 8. The entry on Kant’s philosophy of science considers Kant’s view of the natural sciences, especially physics.

1.3 The limits of reason

The third point is the most well-known, and is considered in detail in the entry on Kant’s critique of metaphysics. Kant demolishes a series of supposed proofs of the existence of God (“The Ideal of Pure Reason”) and the soul (“The Paralogisms”). He also demonstrates that it is equally possible to prove some judgments about “world wholes” as it is to prove their opposites, such as the claims that space must be unbounded and that it must be bounded (“The Antinomies,” including the idea of an absolutely first cause: the problem of freedom as it is posed in the famous “Third Antinomy”). These sections have always been regarded as among the most convincing parts of the first Critique. Mendelssohn spoke for many of Kant’s contemporaries in calling him the “all destroyer,” for devastating reason’s pretenses to transcendent insight.

In establishing these limits on metaphysical knowledge, Kant’s intentions are not merely destructive. Not only does the exercise deliver self-knowledge of reason (§1.4); in addition, Kant sees that the failures of metaphysics to establish secure ground—as to what we can know—has been more damaging than any critique. In the hands of theologians and metaphysicians, reason has claimed knowledge that it cannot have, leading to empty battles that invite outright skepticism. By contrast, Kant’s critique aims to clear the ground for rational claims that can be justified. These include both the claims discussed in §1.1 and §1.2 above, and the practical claims of reason discussed below in §2. (Gava & Willaschek [forthcoming] usefully stress this aspect of the first Critique.)

At the beginning of the Doctrine of Method (the last, least-read part of the first Critique) Kant alludes to the biblical story of Babel.[8] God punished the attempt to build “a tower that would reach the heavens” (A707/B735) with a confusion of languages, leaving people unable to understand one another and unable to cooperate in such hubristic ventures.[9] Again and again, reason returns to some very simple ideas with towering implications—the immortal soul, God, freedom; what is more, it cooks up[10] more or less convincing proofs of these. Without the acid test of experience of a common world, people are bound to come up with conflicting versions of these ideas (unless, perhaps, they emptily ape one another’s words without real understanding). Then they will either talk past one another, or fall into conflict—or, one of Kant’s abiding fears, be forced to submit to an unreasoned authority. In metaphysics, Kant refers to “the ridiculous despotism of the schools” (Bxxxv).[11] When we turn to the practical sphere, however, despotism is far from ridiculous: it is the last, brutal resort for securing coexistence among people who insist on conflicting doctrines. Thus Kant often alludes to Hobbes, on whose theory order is only possible if an unaccountable sovereign overawes all the members of society.[12] Saner 1967, O’Neill 1989, and Neiman 1994 all offer interpretations that see Kantian reason as securing intersubjective order and overcoming threats of Babel-like hubris, conflict and despotism.

One of the most famous lines of the first Critique occurs in the second edition’s Preface, where Kant says, “I had to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx). Knowledge of the world as a whole, or of entities that transcend this world (the immortal soul or God) is not humanly possible: it is not possible via experience, and reason has no power to supply knowledge in its place. However, as indicated in §1.2, Kant argues that science is entitled to rely on certain principles that regulate its project, without being known as objects. In the final section of the Critique, Kant argues that knowledge is not the only or even the primary end of reason: in its practical use, reason addresses our role within the world. So Kant describes his conception of philosophy as ‘cosmic’ (ein Weltbegriff, literally “world concept”) rather than ‘scholastic’ (A838/B866; cf. Ypi 2013 and Ferrarin 2015).

In line with this conception, Kant proposes three questions that answer “all the interest of my reason”: “What can I know?” “What must I do?” and “What may I hope?” (A805/B833). We have seen his answer to the first question: I can know this world as revealed through the senses, but I cannot know the total sum of all that exists, nor a world beyond this one (a supersensible world). Kant does not answer the second question until the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, four years later. (Arguably, he sees no need to answer the question in this form, since he is confident that people have long known what their duties consist in.[13]) But the first Critique does include some observations on hope—that is, faith in God and a future world. We certainly fall into error if we think reason can know a world beyond the senses. Indeed, Kant insists that such knowledge would corrupt practical reasoning, by imposing an external incentive for moral action—fear of eternal punishment and hope of heavenly reward, what he will later call “heteronomy.” Nonetheless, human reason still has an inescapable interest in belief in God, immortality and freedom. Kant develops this claim more systematically in the second Critique, as discussed below (§2.3).

Kant’s idea that reason has “interests,” or even “needs,” may seem strange, and is discussed by Kleingeld 1998a and Ferrarin 2015: Ch. 1. For finite beings, reason is not transparently or infallibly given to consciousness (as some rationalist philosophers seemed to think), just as it cannot deliver transcendent truths. Thus reason “needs to present itself to itself in the process of gaining clarity about its own workings” (Kleingeld 1998a: 97)—above all, the principles that it must give to itself. As the next section discusses, this means that Kant views reason as essentially self-reflexive.

1.4 Reason’s self-knowledge

The first Critique argues that there has hitherto been no real progress in metaphysics. In the second edition Preface, Kant proudly proclaims that his book has finally put metaphysics on “the sure path of a science” (Bvii; cf. Axiii). What, then, is the relation of metaphysics—or philosophical reasoning more generally—to those areas of human enquiry that do seem to generate certainty (geometry and mathematics) and the expansion of knowledge (science in general)?

Kant had long insisted that mathematics could provide no model for philosophizing.[14] “Mathematics gives the most resplendent example of pure reason happily expanding itself without assistance from experience” (A712/B740). But metaphysics cannot follow its course. This is not simply a rhetorical point, since many of Kant’s predecessors had tried to do exactly this—Spinoza’s Ethics is one example, Christian Wolff’s philosophy another (see Gava [forthcoming]). Kant’s basic argument against such efforts is that mathematicians are justified in constructing objects or axioms a priori, because they can work with pure intuitions (albeit very abstract ones: a line or the form of a triangle, say), rather than being restricted to analysis of concepts alone. (See the entry on Kant’s philosophy of mathematics.) This sort of procedure is not available to philosophers, who have no right to assume any a priori intuitions or axioms about metaphysical entities. Attempts that rely on such claims have only produced “so many houses of cards” (A727/B755).

But if mathematics does not provide a model for a genuinely scientific metaphysics, the relation between metaphysics and the empirical sciences is also unpromising. In the first place, Kant has argued that experience cannot reveal metaphysical entities. We could never know, for instance, that we are free: like everything else we can know, human conduct is in principle open to fully determinate causal explanation. Second, experience cannot generate the sort of necessity Kant associates with metaphysical conclusions. (This is a long-standing bone of contention between Humean and Kantian accounts of knowledge—for instance, as regards causation. See the entry on Kant and Hume on causality.) That is, our investigation of the world, no matter how systematic or scientific, only reveals contingent facts: it cannot show that such-and-such must be the case. To hold that scientific laws have the quality of necessity—so that they really are laws, and not mere generalizations or rules of thumb—is a metaphysical rather than an empirical claim.

Neither point, however, deters Kant from using the imagery of science and experiment to describe his own philosophical endeavors. Such metaphors are especially prominent in the Preface to the second edition of the Critique, where he writes:

Reason, in order to be taught by nature, must approach nature with its principles in one hand, according to which the agreement among appearances can count as laws, and, in the other hand, the experiment thought out in accord with these principles—in order to be instructed by nature not like a pupil, who has recited to him whatever the teacher wants to say, but like an appointed judge who compels witnesses to answer the questions he puts to them. (Bxiii)

In other words, reason, as “[self-]appointed judge,” does not sit by and merely observe whatever comes along. It actively proposes principled accounts of the phenomenon it investigates—that is, law-like hypotheses. Then it devises experiments to confirm or disprove these.

As a characterization of philosophical reasoning, this prompts Kant to optimism, but it may puzzle his readers. Kant is optimistic, because what philosophy has to investigate is not the infinite scope of the empirical world, but rather “what reason brings forth entirely out of itself… as soon as [its] common principle has been discovered” (Axx). (One application of this idea is found in the Transcendental Dialectic of the first Critique, where Kant insists that there are only three transcendental ideas—the thinking subject, the world as a whole, and a being of all beings—so that it is possible to catalogue exhaustively the illusions to which reason is subject.) But there is also much room for puzzlement. Kant is suggesting that reason conduct an experiment upon itself—an idea that comes close to paradox. He also suggests that reason has a “common principle”—but nowhere in the first Critique does he explain what this consists in.

How Kant’s “experiment” functions with regard to our everyday knowledge is well-known. His Copernican hypothesis (Bxvi f) is that experience is relative to the standpoint and capacities of the observer. Only on this basis, Kant contends, can we find an explanation for the a priori structure of that experience (for example, its temporality or causal connectedness). The alternative, that we take a “single standpoint” and do not distinguish between objects of experience and those that are “merely thought… beyond the bounds of experience” (i.e., things-in-themselves), fails because it results in “an unavoidable conflict of reason with itself” (Bxviii n)—for example, in the Antimonies mentioned above (§1.3), Kant argues that the failure to separate appearances (everyday items of experience) from things-in-themselves (metaphysical entities that lie beyond experience) leads us to dramatically contradictory conclusions.

However, this still leaves awkward questions about philosophical knowledge, and reasoning more generally. Kant’s philosophical task is not just a matter of “compelling” sensibility and understanding to act as “witnesses”: reason stands before its own tribunal, too, and must give account of itself. (This metaphor is investigated by Stoddard 1988; Kant’s juridical and political metaphors are given a central philosophical role by Saner 1967 and O’Neill 1989.) When reason decides to act as judge and jury in its own case, how can we expect the results to stand up to scrutiny?

Section 3 discusses the most thorough reply to this question in the literature, that offered by Onora O’Neill. To anticipate briefly: The general problem hinted at by Kant’s metaphors—of reason’s experiment upon itself, or compelling itself to give testimony—is that of reason’s self-knowledge (cf. Axi f). Kant assumes that we have a capacity of reason; but “reason grants [respect] only to that which has been able to withstand its free and public examination” (Axi n). We cannot, therefore, dogmatically assert the authority of this capacity: “reason… has no dictatorial authority” (A738/B766). This point is especially compelling given how fallible reason has proven in metaphysics: “how little cause have we to place trust in our reason if in one of the most important parts of our desire for knowledge it does not merely forsake us but even entices us with delusions and in the end betrays us!” (Bxv). Kant’s question, then, is how we might defend reason from various doubts and worries[15] and how we might discipline it without begging questions— for instance, by invoking claims or premises that themselves are open to doubt (cf. O’Neill 1989: Ch. 1, 1992, 2004 & 2015). This is then the central task of critique (cf. Bxxxv): reason’s self-reflexive examination of itself, which establishes its limits and its “common principle,” and vindicates its authority.

2. Practical reason: morality and the primacy of pure practical reason

In the first Critique there are only hints as to the form Kant’s moral theory would take.[16] The account of practical reason in the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) and Critique of Practical Reason (1788) is radically new. Kant now claims to have discovered the supreme principle of practical reason, which he calls the Categorical Imperative. (More precisely, this principle is an imperative for finite beings like us, who have needs and inclinations and are not perfectly rational.) Notoriously, Kant offers several different formulations of this principle, the first of which runs as follows: “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). (On the different versions of the Imperative, which Kant claims are equivalent, see Kant’s moral philosophy, §§5-9.) Kant holds this principle to be implicit in common human reason: when we make moral judgments, we rely on this criterion, although invariably we do not articulate it as such.

The Categorical Imperative is not the only principle of practical reason that Kant endorses. At nearly the same level of generality is the principle underlying all “hypothetical imperatives.” (See Kant’s moral philosophy, §4.) Imperatives of skill and prudence rely on the principle: “Whoever wills the end also wills (insofar as reason has decisive influence on his actions) the indispensable necessary means to it that are within his power” (4:417f; cf. 5:19f[17]). Following Hume, many philosophers hold that practical reasoning is essentially instrumental. They therefore see all practical demands as ultimately hypothetical, that is, conditional upon our having particular ends or inclinations (cf. Kant and Hume on morality, §6). Kant, however, sees the principle of hypothetical imperatives as subordinate to the Categorical Imperative (cf. Korsgaard 1997). Reason can also be the source of unconditional demands, that is, demands that do not presuppose any particular ends or inclinations. Kant’s claim can be put even more strongly: reason is the only source of unconditional demands that human beings can ever have access to.

2.1 Freedom implies moral constraint in the form of the Categorical Imperative

Alongside the derivation of his supreme moral principle, the most difficult questions about Kant’s view of practical reason center on its relation to freedom. Although the broad outlines are consistent, Kant’s views on this topic seem to shift more than usual across his critical writings. (See Kant’s moral philosophy, §10, for a brief sketch, and Allison 1990 for a masterful, though not uncontroversial, account.) This and the following sub-section focus on Kant’s central, radical claim that “freedom and unconditional practical law [that is, for any finite being, the Categorical Imperative] reciprocally imply each other” (5:29f). On the one hand, freedom implies that practical reason can be pure (non-instrumental, unconditional), and hence that we are subject to the demands of the Categorical Imperative. On the other, our subjection to morality implies that we must be free.

Kant’s argument from freedom to the Categorical Imperative is very short indeed (see Critique of Practical Reason, 5:19–30). If I am free to step back from all inclinations, those inclinations do not provide a compelling reason to act in any particular way. All that is left to determine my way of acting (my maxim, in Kant’s terminology) is “the mere form of giving universal law” (5:27). By the “mere form of… law” Kant means that there must be some principle, some overall policy or structure, determining what I do—otherwise my actions would be merely random, and hence unintelligible: no-one would be able to follow them (not even me). More than this, no principle is truly law-like unless it abstracts from an agent’s particular motivations and situation, so as to be followable by all. Only then can it be capable of “giving universal law.”

Although Kant sometimes writes as if it were difficult to see what practical reason requires (for instance, in his comments about practical wisdom: §3.2 below), he usually assumes that everyone readily grasps the fundamental principles which all can follow. That is, he is remarkably optimistic about people’s capacity for independent moral insight. In the recent literature there is some consensus that Kant failed to recognize the complexity and difficulty of moral reasoning (cf. Herman 1993: Ch. 4 & 2007; O’Neill 1996). But judging what the Categorical Imperative requires only poses serious difficulties if Kant has adequately justified it. In particular, his equation of mere law-likeness with principles that all can follow may seem much too quick. To see what Kant means, it helps to consider some other principles that may sound stable or law-like but go beyond the “mere form of law”—and thereby fail to be justifiable.

To illustrate, take two of the six candidates he discusses in the second Critique (5:39ff). One possibility would be a policy of following my inclinations wherever they might lead (Kant identifies this view with Epicurus). This is a policy of sorts, and indeed one that a free agent could adopt. But it goes beyond the “form of law” by taking substantive guidance from merely subjective factors. In doing so, it abandons law-likeness and intersubjective validity. Apart from the fact that my inclinations will surely change and clash, it is not a policy that everyone can follow: if they did, the results would be chaotic and defeat anyone’s attempts to satisfy their inclinations. (That is, it is non-universalizable in the sense that it leads to a “contradiction in the will.” While we can conceive of a world of such agents, we cannot consistently will such a world. See Kant’s moral philosophy, §5.) More abstractly, such a policy gives weight to the particular conditions of one particular agent. But those conditions can hardly claim the authority to guide others’ thought or action. So Kant says:

it is requisite to reason’s lawgiving that it should need to presuppose only itself, because a rule is objectively and universally valid only when it holds without the contingent, subjective conditions that distinguish one rational being from another. (5:21)

A second possibility—in some respects, an inversion of the previous one—would be to disregard my own inclinations and submit to another’s dictates, or perhaps the laws and customs of my community. Kant mentions Mandeville, but Hobbes’ solution to the “state of nature” offers a more familiar example. This requires everyone to submit to a single sovereign, and not to judge for himself what he should do. There are many problems with this solution, but for Kant the most fundamental one is that to submit to another’s dictates is to give up the demand that those dictates be justified in their turn. However “benevolent” or “enlightened” the authority, its instructions would be unjustified in the fundamental sense that reasons are no longer relevant to those who submit. (Of course, one could submit insofar as one finds an authority justified. This may be perfectly reasonable, but it is not genuine submission. It is actually a sort of cooperation, where we continue to use our own judgment about whom to rely on. We often do this when we believe someone else is better able to judge a particular issue—when we accept “doctor’s orders,” for example.)

There is a common difficulty underlying all the untenable alternatives Kant considers. They look for substantive guidance from outside of reason itself—just as hypothetical imperatives only guide action if some end is taken for granted. Kant calls this heteronomy—that is, reasoning directed from the outside, by an authority that is merely assumed or imposed. The problem is to find ways of acting and thinking that are authoritative—that is, are entitled to guide everyone’s acting and thinking. To gain this entitlement, they must be autonomous—that is, not dependent on an authority that itself refuses justification.

Kant’s injunction to look to the mere form of law at first appears to provide no guidance at all, and has often been reproached on this basis. Defenders of Kant’s ethics argue that it represents a substantial constraint: to avoid all those ways of thinking and acting that cannot be followed by all. (For discussion see inter alia O’Neill 1989: Ch. 5; Herman 1993; Allison 1990: Ch. 10 §II.) If so, the autonomy of reason can point to the positive sense of freedom at the heart of Kant’s practical philosophy (cf. Brandom 1979). This is the possibility of acting in ways that do not rely on “contingent, subjective conditions that distinguish one rational being from another” (5:21), and hence do not fall foul of others’ demands for justification.

2.2 How moral constraint implies freedom: Kant’s “fact of reason”

In addition to claiming that freedom implies subjection to the Categorical Imperative, Kant also holds that moral obligation implies freedom. Throughout the critical writings, Kant argues that “nothing in appearances can be explained by the concept of freedom” (5:30). So he frequently insists that morality “exists in the sensible world [the world as known through the senses and by science] but without infringing on its laws” (5:43). Every action, considered as an event in the world of appearances, must be considered as caused (whether we think of explanations given by neuroscience or physics or perhaps even psychology). Experience of the objective world therefore gives us no warrant for assuming freedom. Instead it is to our consciousness or subjectivity that Kant turns:

Ask [someone] whether, if his prince demanded, on pain of… immediate execution, that he give false testimony against an honorable man who the prince would like to destroy under a plausible pretext, he would consider it possible to overcome his love of life… He would perhaps not venture to assert whether he would do it or not, but he must admit without hesitation that it would be possible for him. He judges, therefore, that he can do something because he is aware that he ought to do it and cognizes freedom within him, which, without the moral law, would have remained unknown to him. (5:30; cf. 5:155f)

As Kant also says, “the moral law, and with it practical reason, [have] come in and forced this concept [freedom] upon us” (5:30). In the next section, Kant introduces this idea in notorious terms, as a “fact of reason”: “Consciousness of this fundamental law may be called a fact of reason because one cannot reason it out from antecedent data of reason” (5:31; cf. 5: 6, 42f, 47, 55, 91, 104).

This “fact” has caused considerable controversy among commentators. This is partly because Kant is not altogether clear about what he takes this fact to demonstrate. It is also because he has repeatedly argued that morality cannot be based on facts about human beings, and must be revealed a priori, independently of experience. (In this regard it is significant that Kant also uses the Latin word factum, meaning deed. In other words, we are dealing with an act of reason and its result, rather than a merely given fact. See Kleingeld 2010.) Moreover, Kant speaks of “cognizing the moral law,” when he is well aware that no author before him has formulated this law as he has. A final source of difficulty is that this “fact, as it were” does not feature in his earlier treatise, the Groundwork, and does not appear again.

One school of thought—which includes many influential Kant scholars, and is sympathetically represented in Allison 1990 (Chs. 12 and 13)—sees a fundamental change in Kant’s thought here. Whereas Part III of the Groundwork seems to give a “deduction” (justification) of freedom, in the second Critique Kant sees that this project is impossible on his own premises. So he stops argument short by appealing to a supposedly indubitable fact. Others emphasize the clear continuities between the two works—in particular, Kant’s continued reliance on common moral consciousness. For example, Łuków 1993 emphasizes the parallel between the role played by Achtung (“respect” or “reverence” for morality) and the fact of reason. Kant refers to reverence in all his ethical writings: it is the only “feeling self-wrought by a rational concept [= the moral law]” (4:401n). As such, it clearly parallels what he now calls “the sole fact of pure reason” (5:31). (See also O’Neill 2002 and Timmermann 2010.)

There are serious difficulties at issue in this scholarly dispute. But Kant’s line of thought in the long passage just quoted is relatively clear: We all (most of us) recognize that there are situations where we ought to do something, even though it will cost us something that is very dear to us (i.e., we feel ourselves subject to an unconditional moral imperative). So far as we really acknowledge this “ought,” we commit ourselves to believing that it will be possible for us to do this (i.e., that we are free). This reveals something that we could hardly be certain of except on the basis of this encounter with our own activity of moral reasoning (cf. Kleingeld 2010).

Clearly, this line of thought is not immune to criticism. Our feeling of moral constraint might be explained in terms of a Freudian super-ego, for instance. But it enables us to see why Kant thought that moral awareness—unlike any other sort of experience—gives us a practical certainty of our freedom, being “a fact in which pure reason in us proves itself actually practical” (5:42). (“Practical certainty” because it is not knowledge of the same sort as empirical and scientific knowledge.) At the same time, if Kant is right that only the Categorical Imperative reveals those ways of acting that we can justify to others, then we can see why he claims, “freedom and unconditional practical law reciprocally imply each other” (5:29f).

2.3 The primacy of practical reason

Kant does not give a complete account of the relation of practical reason to theoretical reason in the Groundwork or any later works. However, the second Critique does include an important section that bears on this question: “On the primacy of pure practical reason in its connection with speculative reason” (5:119–121). (See Gardner 2006 and Willaschek 2010.) At the most general level, Kant’s notion of autonomy already implied some sort of primacy for pure practical reason. Against various stripes of rationalism, Kant denies that theoretical reason can have any insight into the supersensible. So reason has no possible access to a transcendent authority that could issue commands for thought or action. Against Hume, Kant denies normative authority to the inclinations. These points rule out the only ways that theoretical or instrumental reasoning could supply authoritative reasons to act. If there are such reasons—as the “fact of reason” pronounces —then only pure practical reason is left to supply them. Now, however, Kant argues that pure practical reason has “primacy” even on the home turf of theoretical reason. That is, pure practical reason should guide some of our beliefs, as well as our actions.

Kant defines primacy as “the prerogative of the interest of one insofar as the interests of others is subordinated to it” (5:119). He gives two reasons for thinking that practical reason has this “prerogative.”[18] First, practical reason can be “pure” or independent from “pathological conditions,” that is, our inclinations. So it is not conditioned by anything else—for instance, by a desire for happiness or subjective wishes. In other words, (pure) practical reason is independent from our inclinations. By contrast, theoretical reason falls into error if it claims independence from the deliverances of sensibility and understanding—for example, in attempting to prove the existence of God. Second, Kant argues that we cannot leave the question of primacy undecided, because practical reason would otherwise come into conflict with theoretical reason. The interest of theoretical reason consists in expanding our knowledge and avoiding error—which means suspending all claims to knowledge beyond the bounds of experience. However, insofar as theoretical reason has interests at all, this is itself a practical matter, “since all interest is ultimately practical.” So Kant writes:

But if pure reason of itself can be and really is practical, as the consciousness of the moral law proves it to be [cf. §2.2 on the “fact of reason”], it is still only one and the same reason which, whether from a theoretical or a practical perspective, judges according to a priori principles; it is then clear that, even if from the first [theoretical] perspective its capacity does not extend to establishing certain propositions [e.g., the existence of God] affirmatively, although they do not contradict it, as soon as these same propositions belong inseparably to the practical interest of pure reason it [theoretical reason] must accept them. (5:121)

Kant’s basic claim is not prima facie implausible—“all interest is ultimately practical and even that of speculative reason is only conditional and is complete in practical use alone” (5:121). But what he means by this, exactly, is a difficult matter of interpretation. (Cf. Neiman 1994: Ch. 3; Guyer 1997; Rauscher 1998.) Moreover, the uses to which Kant puts this argument are as controversial as any question in his philosophy, since he here reinstates—as items of faith rather than knowledge—the very ideas that the first Critique had argued to lie beyond human insight. (See further the entry on Kant’s philosophy of religion.)

To this end, Kant introduces the idea of a “postulate,” defined as “a theoretical proposition, though one not demonstrable as such, insofar as it is attached inseparably to an a priori unconditionally valid practical law” (5:122). “These postulates are those of immortality, of freedom considered positively (as the causality of a being insofar as it belongs to the intelligible world), and of the existence of God” (5:132).[19] The law to which they “attach” is, of course, the moral law. It enjoins us to act for the sake of duty, with no assurances that anything will follow from this for our own happiness or that of others.[20] This creates a “dialectic” or conflict between happiness and morality. While morality is, for Kant, the sole unconditional good for human beings, he certainly does not deny that happiness is an important good, and indeed the natural and necessary end of every human being (cf. 4:415). This leads him to the concept of “the highest good”:[21]

virtue (as worthiness to be happy) is the supreme condition of whatever can even seem to us desirable and hence of all our pursuit of happiness… and is therefore the supreme good. But it is not the whole and complete good for finite rational beings; for this, happiness is also required, and that not merely in the partial eyes of a person who makes himself an end, but even in the judgment of an impartial reason [in other words, the issue does not turn on a subjective judgment about whether I want to be happy, but rather an objective judgment that happiness is the natural end for human beings, just as goodness is our moral end]… happiness distributed in exact proportion to morality (as the worth of a person and his worthiness to be happy) constitutes the highest good of a possible world. (5:110)

Kant’s argument is bold but dubious. He holds that we must think of moral activity as really resulting in happiness. Yet human agency is nowhere near adequate to this task: “I [or indeed we] cannot hope to produce this [highest good] except by the harmony of my will with that of a holy and beneficent author of the world” (5:129). So, Kant argues, we must postulate God’s existence. We must also postulate immortality, since this enables us to hope that we will come closer to virtue so as to be worthy of happiness. (Reath 1988 argues that Kant sometimes also deploys a more defensible, “secular” or this-worldly, notion of the highest good. Further recent discussion includes Kleingeld 1995 and Guyer 2000a & 2000b.)

3. The unity of theoretical and practical reason

We have seen one way in which Kant links theoretical and practical reason. In answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant invokes the primacy of practical reason, so that theoretical reason may accept the postulates of God, freedom and immortality “as a foreign possession handed over to it” (5:120). While Kant’s argument for freedom may be more compelling, the other arguments find little favor among contemporary authors, although they have been taken up in some commentary on Kant’s account of teleology (both in the Critique of Judgment (Guyer 1989, Freudiger 1996; see also Kant’s aesthetics and teleology, §3) and outside that work (Wood 1970, Kleingeld 1998b)). Jens Timmermann, for example, emphasizes that Kant never doubted that practical and theoretical reason represent the same faculty, and trenchantly claims that “the principle that unifies the spheres of theoretical and practical reason… is the assumption of a wise and benevolent God who has created a teleological world that coheres with morality” (2009: 197; cf. Kleingeld 1998b: 336). Whatever Kant’s own beliefs, however, such a position lacks wider philosophical resonance. Most contemporary philosophers assume that the world does not “harmonize with” morality in this way—or, at any rate, that to create such harmony is a human task, and not a matter of divine agency. (Again, cf. Reath 1988, and see also Guyer 2000b & 2006.)

The principal attempt to uncover the unity of Kantian reason and to relate it to contemporary philosophical concerns is due to Onora O’Neill (1989 and subsequent essays). This section will focus on her central claim concerning the unifying role of the Categorical Imperative, and the main bases for this claim in Kant’s texts. Although O’Neill’s interpretation of Kantian reason enjoys considerable respect among Kant scholars, it should be added that it has not yet attracted a significant critical literature. (Among early reviews, see Engstrom 1992 and Wood 1992; for recent endorsement and restatement, see Korsgaard 2008: 12 and Westphal 2011.)[22]

3.1 Reason’s “common principle”

In the original Preface to the first Critique, Kant had raised the idea of reason’s “common principle”: “Nothing here can escape us, because what reason brings forth entirely out of itself cannot be hidden, but is brought to light by reason itself as soon as reason’s common principle (gemeinschaftliches Prinzip) has been discovered” (Axx). Unfortunately, neither edition of the Critique considers what this principle might be.

This question is raised in the works on practical reason, but then postponed and never clearly answered. In the Preface to the Groundwork, Kant explains why the book is not entitled a Critique of Pure Practical Reason:

[A critique of pure practical reason] is not of such utmost necessity as [a critique of pure theoretical reason], because in moral matters human reason can easily be brought to a high degree of correctness and accomplishment, even in the most common understanding, whereas in its theoretical but pure use it is wholly dialectical [i.e., a source of illusion]… I require that the critique of pure practical reason, if it is to be carried through completely, be able at the same time to present the unity of practical with speculative reason in a common principle, since there can, in the end, be only one and the same reason, which must be distinguished merely in its application. (4:391)

In the second Critique, Kant compares the book’s structure with the first Critique and comments: “such comparisons [are] gratifying; for they rightly occasion the expectation of being able some day to attain insight into the unity of the whole rational faculty (theoretical as well as practical) and to derive everything from one principle—the undeniable need of human reason, which finds complete satisfaction only in a complete systematic unity of its cognitions” (5:91). Kant’s tone is confident, but the fact is that “insight into the unity of the whole rational faculty” has once more been postponed. (Prauss 1981 argues that Kant failed to achieve this insight, in part because he did not appreciate how cognitive success is a fundamentally practical goal. Förster 1992 discusses Kant’s reflections on this topic in his final manuscript, the Opus Postumum.)

However, as Onora O’Neill points out in a celebrated essay (1989: Ch. 1), the claims Kant has now made about practical reason actually commit him to a third claim concerning reason’s “common principle.” Kant has argued that the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of practical reason. He has also argued that practical reason has primacy over theoretical reason. It follows, therefore, that the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of reason.—To be sure, Kant never states this conclusion explicitly. But there are reasons for thinking that this ought to have been his view, and in some places he comes very close to such a claim. (Rescher 2000 (Ch. 9) similarly emphasizes the “isomorphism” of theoretical and practical reason. Rauscher 1998 notes that Kant’s own use of the “primacy” of practical reason is more limited than O’Neill’s, while endorsing O’Neill’s overall case.)

Direct textual evidence for O’Neill’s reading is slight. The clearest passage is a footnote (!) to Kant’s essay “What is it to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” (1786):

To make use of one’s own reason means no more than to ask oneself, whenever one is supposed to assume something, whether one could find it feasible to make the ground or the rule on which one assumes it into a universal principle for the use of reason. (8:146n)

The parallel with the first formulation of the Categorical Imperative—“act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421)—hardly needs spelling out. Kant now says: think only in accordance with that maxim that could be a universal law.[23] Differently put: thinking is an activity, and if the Categorical Imperative is indeed “categorical” then it applies to all our activities.

Other strands of Kant’s thought also support this interpretation. The two that have attracted the most attention are Kant’s “maxims of common human understanding” and his well-known account of the “public use of reason.”

3.2 The “maxims of common human understanding”

Kant sets out three “maxims of common human understanding” [= reason] which are closely related to the Categorical Imperative. They appear twice in his published writings, in relation to both acting and thinking.[24] The maxims are discussed by O’Neill 1989: Ch. 2 & 1992, and by Neiman 1994: Ch. 5.

In his last published work, the Anthropology, Kant presents the maxims in a practical context, as guidelines for achieving some degree of wisdom:

Wisdom, as the idea of a practical use of reason that conforms perfectly with the law [or: is perfectly law-like—gesetzmäßig-vollkommen], is no doubt too much to demand of human beings. But also, not even the slightest degree of wisdom can be poured into a man by others; rather he must bring it forth from himself. The precept for reaching it contains three leading maxims: (1) Think for oneself, (2) Think into the place of the other [person] (in communication with human beings), (3) Always think consistently with oneself. (7:200; cf. 228f)

The maxims also appear in the Critique of Judgment, where they are closely related to the theoretical use of reason. This occurs in a famous section on the sensus communis or “community sense,” which Kant describes as:

a faculty for judging that… takes account (a priori) of everyone else’s way of representing in thought, in order as it were to hold its judgment up to human reason as a whole and thereby avoid the illusion which, from subjective private conditions that could easily be held to be objective, would have a detrimental influence on the judgment. (5:293)

That is, the maxims are precepts for judging in accordance with “reason as a whole” and avoiding the distortions that can arise from “subjective private conditions.”

To think for oneself Kant describes as the maxim of unprejudiced thought; its opposite is passivity or heteronomy in thought, leading to prejudice and superstition.[25] To think in the place of everyone else is the maxim of enlarged or broad-minded thought. And always to think in accord with oneself is the maxim of consistent thought (5:294). Although the last maxim sounds more straightforward, Kant is careful to emphasize its difficulty: it “can only be achieved through the combination of the first two and after frequent observance of them has made them automatic” (5:295). Consistency does not just involve getting rid of obvious contradictions in our explicit beliefs. It also requires consistency with regard to all the implications of our beliefs—and these are often not apparent to us. To achieve this sort of law-likeness in thought depends both on the genuine attempt to judge for oneself and the determination to expose one’s judgments to the scrutiny of others. In other words, it involves regarding oneself, first, as the genuine author of one’s judgments, and second, as accountable to others. As we might also say, it represents a determination to take responsibility for one’s judgments.

The maxims support the thesis that theoretical and practical reasoning have a unified structure, and flesh out the implications of the Categorical Imperative. As a matter of thought, to reason is to discipline one’s judgments so that others can follow them. As a matter of practical wisdom, it is to discipline one’s actions so that others can adopt the same principles.

3.3 The public use of reason and the importance of communication

Kant’s famous essay, “What is Enlightenment?” (1784), has been of particular importance to commentators concerned with Kantian reason and politics. (See O’Neill 1989: Ch. 2, 1990 & 2015: Ch. 3; Velkley 1989; Deligiorgi 2005; Patrone 2008.) Kant’s second maxim, “to think into the place of others,” shows that he regards communication as essential to making valid judgments and to acting wisely and well. Thus Kant writes: “…how much and how correctly would we think if we did not communicate with others to whom we communicate our thoughts, and who communicate theirs with us!”[26] Kant also describes the first maxim as the way to achieve “liberation from superstition,” which he equates with “enlightenment” (5:294).

In “What is Enlightenment?” Kant articulates both these thoughts in a political context, demanding that we “have the courage to use our own reason”:

Enlightenment is the human being’s emergence from his self-incurred immaturity. Immaturity is the inability to use one’s own understanding [= reason] without the guidance of another. This immaturity is self-incurred if its cause is not lack of understanding, but lack of resolution and courage to use it without the guidance of another. Sapere aude! [Dare to be wise!] Have courage to make use of your own understanding [= reason]! is thus the motto of enlightenment. (8:35)

Here, Kant is not primarily concerned with enlightenment as the activity or condition of an individual—rather, as something that human beings must work towards together. For this, he says, “nothing is required but… the least harmful… freedom: namely, freedom to make public use of one’s reason in all matters” (8:36). This is not the freedom to act politically. Instead, it is what we now call freedom of the pen—in Kant’s words, the use of reason “as a scholar before the entire public of the world of readers” (8:37).

Kant’s contrast is with the reasoning someone undertakes as an employee: as a civil servant or military officer or cleric of an established church. In each case, the employee is bound to fulfill the dictates of a given leader or organization, at least so long as he can “in conscience hold his office” (8:38). In doing so, he uses his reason to decide the best way of achieving ends that have been laid down by others. (There is a loose parallel with instrumental reasoning, which decides the best means to achieve ends laid down by inclination. In Kant’s terms, both are heteronomous—“directed by another.”) Although this sort of reasoning is often undertaken in what we now call “public offices”—as a state employee, for instance—Kant describes such uses of reason as private—that is, deprived of freedom and accountable only to a particular authority. By contrast, the public use of reason is not bound to any given ends and is accountable to all: a person speaks as a member of “the society of citizens of the world” (8:37). Outside of his post, in a capacity he shares with all other human beings, the civil servant or cleric may reason freely, offering critical scrutiny of government policies or religious teachings. Nonetheless, he must continue to enact these in his employment, as a “passive member” (8:37) of the commonwealth.

Some commentators find Kant’s emphasis on freedom of the pen elitist, and regret his emphasis on the importance of obedience. (See also Kant’s social and political philosophy, §§4, 6.) Taken together, these two points imply a clear gulf between the practical and the theoretical—or at any rate, between what citizens do and what they believe ought to be done. Nonetheless, the essay makes clear how Kant equates reason with the aspiration to full publicity. “To use one’s own reason” is to be engaged in the quest to address all “citizens of the world.” Our judgments and principles are only reasonable to the extent that they can be accepted by all. Among other things, this means that they cannot assume the authority of any particular organization or leader. In fact, Kant had already said this, in a famous passage from the Critique of Pure Reason:

Reason must subject itself to critique in all its undertakings, and cannot restrict the freedom of critique through any prohibition without damaging itself and drawing upon itself a disadvantageous suspicion. For there is nothing so important because of its utility, nothing so holy, that it may be exempted from this searching review and inspection, which knows no respect for persons [i.e. does not recognize any person as bearing more authority than any other—GW]. On this freedom rests the very existence of reason, which has no dictatorial authority, but whose claim is never anything more than the agreement of free citizens, each of whom must be able to express his reservations, indeed even his veto, without holding back. (A738f/B766f, translation slightly modified)

In the term used by several contemporary Kantians (Herman 2007: Ch. 10, Korsgaard 2008, Reath 2013), this procedure constitutes reason. It makes reason the only unconditional (that is, non-heteronomous) form of authority for our thinking and acting.

4. Concluding remarks

Kant’s discussions of theoretical reason are not obviously connected to his account of practical reason. His accounts of truth, scientific method and the limited insights of theoretical reason are complex, as is his view of practical reason and morality. No one doubts that knowledge and scientific enquiry, no less than action, are subject to demands of rationality. However, if Kant’s account of reason is based—as O’Neill above all has argued—in avoiding principles of enquiry and of action that others cannot also adopt, it would be possible to see the underlying unity of these demands. We would understand, for example, why Kant so strenuously resists claims to transcendent insight. To give authority to such claims—those of revelation and religious authority, for example—would be irrational insofar as they rest on principles of belief that cannot be adopted by all.

Underlying the difficulty of synthesizing and interpreting Kant’s account of reason is, of course, the enormous question of what reason is. Many philosophers—both contemporary and historical figures—proceed as if this were already clear. However, once this question is raised—the question of reason’s self-knowledge, as Kant puts it—it is difficult to see grounds for such confidence. While the secondary literature discussing her proposal remains limited, O’Neill’s interpretation of Kant represents an ambitious and distinctive answer to this question.

O’Neill (2000) situates the Kantian account of reason against three alternatives, which she labels the instrumental, the communitarian, and the perfectionist. The first remains very widespread: with Hume, it regards instrumental reasoning as fundamental (cf. practical reason, §4; reasons for action: internal vs. external). The second sees reason as embedded within complex traditions: rationality is what a given tradition or community takes it to consist in (cf. MacIntyre 1988; communitarianism). A third option, akin to the forms of rationalism that Kant opposed, is to see reason as an individual capacity to discern or intuit normative truths (cf. moral non-naturalism, §3). Arguably, all three accounts fail in providing reasoned justification to some audiences. The instrumental reasoner is accountable to no-one—in fact, to nothing apart from whatever desires or ends he happens to have. Someone who takes her particular tradition to define what beliefs and practices count as reasonable can have little to say to those who stand outside it. And the person who believes he can intuit what is good or true will be mute—or worse—in the face of those with different intuitions.[27]

On the interpretations advanced by Saner, O’Neill, Neiman and others, Kant was aware of all these options and rejected each. We saw above (§1.4) that Kant characterizes reason in terms of a self-reflexive procedure. Reason is autonomous and submits to no external authority; it gains authority from submitting itself to critique; and critique involves rejecting any mode of thinking or acting that cannot be adopted by all. In less abstract terms, the self-scrutiny of reason is scrutiny by all those who demand justification for any particular mode of thought or action. Such a view does not assume that we are necessarily bound to our interests and inclinations (as the instrumental account does). It does not ask us to rely on what others do accept (as the communitarian account does). It does not involve the fantasy that we already know or intuit what everyone should accept (as the perfectionist account does). It proposes, instead, a vision of human beings who are able to step back from their particular inclinations, habits and intuitions, and who are willing to use this ability to seek terms that all can accept—to construct an intersubjective order of co-existence, communication and cooperation on terms that all can accept.

Such an account depends on a particular interpretation of Kant’s texts, and is both ambitious and highly complex in its ramifications. Nonetheless, if successful, it captures two powerful attractions of Kant’s philosophizing: a universalism that transcends self-centeredness and community boundaries, and a modesty that respects the limits of human insight.


Primary sources

Citations from Kant’s works, except for the Critique of Pure Reason, are by volume and page numbers of the Akademie edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften (Berlin, 1902–); the Critique of Pure Reason is cited by the standard A and B pagination of the first (1781) and second (1787) editions respectively. The Groundwork is printed in Akademie volume 4 and the Critique of Practical Reason in volume 5; except where otherwise noted, references beginning with “4:” are to the Groundwork and those beginning with “5:” to the second Critique. The Akademie pagination is found in the margins of all modern translations. The translations cited here are from the standard Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, as follows:

  • Critique of Pure Reason, translated/edited by P. Guyer and A. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Practical Philosophy, translated/edited by M. Gregor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Includes the Groundwork, Critique of Practical Reason and “What is Enlightenment?”]
  • Religion and Rational Theology, translated/edited by A. Wood and G. di Giovanni, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Includes “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” and Conflict of the Faculties.]
  • Lectures on Ethics, translated/edited by J. B. Schneewind and P. Heath, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, translated/edited by H. Allison, M. Friedman, G. Hatfield and P. Heath, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Includes the Prolegomena.]
  • Anthropology, History, and Education, translated/edited by G. Zoller, R. Louden, M. Gregor and P. Guyer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Includes the Anthropology.]
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment, translated/edited by P. Guyer and E. Matthews, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.

Secondary literature

  • Abela, P., 2006, “The Demands of Systematicity: Rational Judgment and the Structure of Nature,” in A Companion to Kant, G. Bird (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 408–422.
  • Allison, H., 1990, Kant’s Theory of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2004, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: Revised and Expanded Edition, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Ameriks, K., 2003, Interpreting Kant’s Critiques, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Brandom, R., 1979, “Freedom and Constraint by Norms,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 16(3): 187–196.
  • –––, 2001, Articulating Reasons: An Introduction to Inferentialism, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2002, Tales of the Mighty Dead: Historical Essays in the Metaphysics of Intentionality, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Breitenbach, A., forthcoming, “Laws and Ideal Unity,” in Laws of Nature, W. Ott & L. Patton (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Buchdahl, G., 1992, Kant and the Dynamics of Reason: Essays on the Structure of Kant’s Philosophy, Oxford: Basil Blackwell (Chs. 7 & 8).
  • Deligiorgi, K., 2005, Kant and the Culture of Enlightenment, Albany NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Engstrom, S., 1992, Review of Onora O’Neill, Constructions of Reason, Ethics, 102(3): 653–655.
  • Ferrarin, A., 2015, The Powers of Pure Reason: Kant and the Idea of Cosmic Philosophy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Förster, E., 1992, “Was darf ich hoffen? Zum Problem der Vereinbarkeit von theoretischer und praktischer Vernunft bei Immanuel Kant,” Zeitschrift für philosophische Forschung, 46(2): 168–185.
  • Freudiger, J., 1996, “Kants Schlußstein: Wie die Teleologie die Einheit der Vernunft stiftet,” Kant Studien, 87(4): 423–435.
  • Friedman, M., 1992a, “Causal Laws and Foundations of Natural Science,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, P. Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 161–199.
  • –––, 1992b, Kant and the Exact Sciences, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1992c, “Regulative and Constitutive,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 30(Supplement): 73–102.
  • –––, 2013, Kant’s Construction of Nature: A Reading of the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gardner, S., 1999, Kant and the Critique of Pure Reason, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2006, “The Primacy of Practical Reason,” in A Companion to Kant, G. Bird (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 259–274.
  • Gava, G., forthcoming, “Kant, Wolff and the Method of Philosophy,” in Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy (Volume VIII), D. Garber & D. Rutherford (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Gava, G. & M. Willaschek, forthcoming, “The Transcendental Doctrine of Method of the Critique of Pure Reason,” in The Kantian Mind, S. Baiasu & M. Timmons (eds.), London & New York: Routledge.
  • Gelfert, A., 2006, “Kant on testimony,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 14(4): 627–652.
  • Grier, M., 2001, Kant’s Doctrine of Transcendental Illusion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Guyer, P., 1989, “The Unity of Reason: Pure Reason as Practical Reason in Kant’s Early Conception of the Transcendental Dialectic,” Monist, 72(2): 139–167; reprinted as Ch. 2 of his Kant on Freedom, Law and Happiness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • –––, 1990, “Reason and Reflective Judgment: Kant on the Significance of Systematicity,” Noûs, 24(1): 17–43.
  • –––, 1997, Review of Susan Neiman, The Unity of Reason, The Philosophical Review, 106(2): 291–295.
  • –––, 2000a, “Freedom as the Inner Value of the World,” Ch. 3 of his Kant on Freedom, Law and Happiness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 96–125.
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Other Internet Resources

  • Kant on the Web, including many links to other sites and e-texts, maintained by Stephen Palmquist.
  • Das Bonner Kant-Korpus, volumes 1-23 of the Akademie edition of Kant’s works (in German).


For comments on this entry, my thanks to Graham Bird, Tatiana Patrone, Alison Stone, Lea Ypi, and the referees for this Encyclopedia, Paul Guyer and R. Lanier Anderson. Further thanks to the latter with regard to the 2013 revised version, and thanks to an anonymous referee with regard to the 2017 revisions. For additional assistance my thanks to Alix Cohen, Sebastian Gardner, Onora O’Neill and Jens Timmermann. My grateful thanks, too, to Nick Bunnin, for organizing the Chinese philosophy summer school which gave me the opportunity to lecture on this topic.

Copyright © 2017 by
Garrath Williams <g.d.williams@lancaster.ac.uk>

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