Feminist Perspectives on Class and Work
A good place to situate the start of theoretical debates about women, class and work is in the intersection with Marxism and feminism. Such debates were shaped not only by academic inquiries but as questions about the relation between women’s oppression and liberation and the class politics of the left, trade union and feminist movements in the late 19th and 20th centuries, particularly in the U.S., Britain and Europe. It will also be necessary to consider various philosophical approaches to the concept of work, the way that women’s work and household activities are subsumed or not under this category, how the specific features of this work may or may not connect to different “ways of knowing” and different approaches to ethics, and the debate between essentialist and social constructionist approaches to differences between the sexes as a base for the sexual division of labor in most known human societies.
The relation of women as a social group to the analysis of economic class has spurred political debates within both Marxist and feminist circles as to whether women’s movements challenging male domination can assume a common set of women’s interests across race, ethnicity, and class. If there are no such interests, on what can a viable women’s movement be based, and how can it evade promoting primarily the interests of white middle class and wealthy women? To the extent to which women do organize themselves as a political group cutting across traditional class lines, under what conditions are they a conservative influence as opposed to a progressive force for social change? If poor and working class women’s issues are different than middle and upper class women’s issues, how can middle class women’s movements be trusted to address them? In addition to these questions, there is a set of issues related to cross-cultural comparative studies of women, work and relative power in different societies, as well as analyses of how women’s work is connected to processes of globalization.
Considerable research in the past 30 years has been devoted to women and work in the context of shifting divisions of labor globally (Ehrenreich and Hochschild 2004). Some of this feminist work proceeds from the development perspectives promoted by the UN and other policy making institutions (Chen et al. 2005), while other research takes a more critical view (Beneria 2003; Pyle and Ward 2007). Many studies address changes in the gender division of labor within specific national economies (Freeman 1999; George 2005; Rofel; Sangster 1995) while others consider the impact of transnational migration on women’s class position (Pratt 2004; Romero 1992; Stephen 2007; Keogh 2015) and women’s opportunities for cross-class solidarity and grassroots-based organizing (Mohanty 2003). More recent feminist research has addressed the restructuring of work and its impact on women and gender culture as an effect of neo-liberal economic adjustments (Adkins 2002; Enloe 2004; Federici 2008; McRobbie 2002; Skeggs 2003).
- 1. Marxism, Work, and Human Nature
- 2. Marxist-Feminist Analyses
- 3. First Wave Feminist Analyses of Women and Work
- 4. Second Wave Feminist Analyses of Housework
- 5. The Public/Private Split and Its Implications
- 6. Psychological Theories of Women and Work
- 7. Ethical Theories of Women’s Caring Work
- 8. Modernist vs. Postmodernist Feminist Theory
- 9. Race, Class, and Intersectional Feminist Analyses
- 10. Anarchist Perspectives on Work and its Other
- 11. Punitive Perspectives on Work and Non-Work
- 12. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Marxism as a philosophy of human nature stresses the centrality of work in the creation of human nature itself and human self-understanding (see the entry on Marxism). Both the changing historical relations between human work and nature, and the relations of humans to each other in the production and distribution of goods to meet material needs construct human nature differently in different historical periods: nomadic humans are different than agrarian or industrial humans. Marxism as a philosophy of history and social change highlights the social relations of work in different economic modes of production in its analysis of social inequalities and exploitation, including relations of domination such as racism and sexism. (Marx 1844, 1950, 1906–9; Marx and Engels 1848, 1850; Engels 1942). Within capitalism, the system they most analyzed, the logic of profit drives the bourgeois class into developing the productive forces of land, labor and capital by expanding markets, turning land into a commodity and forcing the working classes from feudal and independent agrarian production into wage labor. Marx and Engels argue that turning all labor into a commodity to be bought and sold not only alienates workers by taking the power of production away from them, it also collectivizes workers into factories and mass assembly lines. This provides the opportunity for workers to unite against the capitalists and to demand the collectivization of property, i.e., socialism, or communism.
According to Engels’s famous analysis of women’s situation in the history of different economic modes production in The Origin of the Family, Private Property and the State (1942), women are originally equal to, if not more powerful than, men in communal forms of production with matrilineal family organizations. Women lose power when private property comes into existence as a mode of production. Men’s control of private property, and the ability thereby to generate a surplus, changes the family form to a patriarchal one where women, and often slaves,  become the property of the father and husband.
The rise of capitalism, in separating the family household from commodity production, further solidifies this control of men over women in the family when the latter become economic dependents of the former in the male breadwinner-female housewife nuclear family form. Importantly, capitalism also creates the possibility of women’s liberation from family-based patriarchy by creating possibilities for women to work in wage labor and become economically independent of husbands and fathers. Engels stresses, however, that because of the problem of unpaid housework, a private task allocated to women in the sexual division of labor of capitalism, full women’s liberation can only be achieved with the development of socialism and the socialization of housework and childrearing in social services provided by the state. For this reason, most contemporary Marxists have argued that women’s liberation requires feminists to join the working class struggle against capitalism (Cliff 1984).
Many Marxist-feminists thinkers, prominent among them sociologists and anthropologists, have done cross-cultural and historical studies of earlier forms of kinship and economy and the role of the sexual or gender division of labor in supporting or undermining women’s social power (cf. Reed 1973, Leacock 1972, Rosaldo and Lamphere 1974). They have also attempted to assess the world economic development of capitalism as a contradictory force for the liberation of women (Federici 2004; Mies 1986; Saffioti 1978) and to argue that universal women’s liberation requires attention to the worse off: poor women workers in poor post-colonial countries (Sen & Grown 1987). Other feminist anthropologists have argued that other variables in addition to women’s role in production are key to understanding women’s social status and power (Sanday 1981; Leghorn and Parker 1981). Yet other feminist economic historians have done historical studies of the ways that race, class and ethnicity have situated women differently in relation to production, for example in the history of the United States (Davis 1983; Amott and Matthaei 1991). Finally some Marxist-feminists have argued that women’s work in biological and social reproduction is a necessary element of all modes of production and one often ignored by Marxist economists (Benston 1969; Hennessy 2003; Vogel 1995).
Those feminist analyses which have highlighted the role of women’s work in the social construction of gender and the perpetuation of male dominance have been termed liberal, radical, Marxist, and socialist feminism by such influential categorizers as Jaggar and Rothenberg [Struhl] (1978), Tong (2000), Barrett (1980), Jaggar (1983) and Walby (1990). However, the pigeonhole categories of liberal, radical, Marxist, or socialist categories apply poorly to both to first wave women’s movement feminist predecessors and contemporary deconstructionist, post-structuralist and post-colonialist perspectives.
A number of first wave feminists write about work and class as key issues for women’s liberation, such as socialist-feminist Charlotte Perkins Gilman, heavily influenced by Darwinism and 19th century utopian modernism (Gilman 1898, 1910, 1979), anarchist Emma Goldman (1969), and existentialist, radical feminist and Marxist of sorts Simone de Beauvoir (1952). This is because the debates that arose around the place of the women’s movement in class politics were different in the early and mid-twentieth century than they were in the 1960s when many feminist theorists were trying to define themselves independently of the left anti-Vietnam war and civil rights movements of the time.
The debate about the economic and social function of housework and its relation to women’s oppression is an old one that has been a feature of both the first and second wave women’s movements in the US, Britain and Europe. In both eras, the underlying issue is how to handle the public/private split of capitalist societies in which women’s reproductive functions have either limited their work to the home or created a “second shift” problem of unpaid housework and childcare as well as waged work. In the first wave, located as it was in the Victorian period where the dominant ideology for middle and upper class women was purity, piety and domesticity (also called the “cult of true womanhood”), the debate centered on whether to keep housework in the private sphere yet make it more scientific and efficient (Beecher 1841; Richards 1915 ), or whether to “socialize” it by bringing it into the public sphere, as socialist Charlotte Perkins Gilman advocated (1898).
In the US, the “public housekeeping” aspect of the Progressive movement of the 1890s through early 1900s advocated that women bring the positive values associated with motherhood into the public sphere — by obtaining the vote, cleaning out corruption in politics, creating settlement houses to educate and support immigrants, and forming the women’s peace movement, etc. (cf. Jane Addams 1914). Disagreements about whether to downplay or valorize the distinctive function and skills in motherhood as work for which women are naturally superior, or to see motherhood as restricting women’s chances for economic independence and equality with men in the public sphere, were also evident in debates between Ellen Keys (1909, 1914) and Gilman. Keys represented the difference side, that women are superior humans because of mothering; while Gilman and Goldman took the equality side of the debate, that is, that, women are restricted, and made socially unequal to men, by unpaid housework and mothering.
In the second wave movement, theorists can be grouped by their theory of how housework oppresses women. Typically, liberal feminists critique housework because it is unpaid. This makes women dependent on men and devalued, since their work is outside the meaningful sphere of public economic production (Friedan 1963). Marxist feminist theorists see this as part of the problem, but some go further to maintain that housework is part of a household feudal mode of production of goods for use that persists under capitalism and gives men feudal powers over women’s work (Benston 1969, Fox 1980). Other Marxist feminists argue that women’s housework is part of the social reproduction of capitalism (Federici 1975, 2004; Malos 1975; Vogel 1995). That the necessary work of reproducing the working class is unpaid allows more profits to capitalists. It is the sexual division of labor in productive and reproductive work that makes woman unequal to men and allows capitalists to exploit women’s unpaid labor. Some even make this analysis the basis for a demand for wages for housework (Dalla Costa 1974; Federici 1975). More recently, Federici has done an analysis of the transition to capitalism in Europe. She argues that it was the emerging capitalist class need to control working class reproduction, to eliminate working class women’s control over biological reproduction, and to assure their unpaid reproductive work in the home by restricting abortions, that fueled the campaign against witches during this period (Federici 2004).
One of the philosophical problems raised by the housework debate is how to draw the line between work and play or leisure activity when the activity is not paid: is a mother playing with her baby working or engaged in play? If the former, then her hours in such activity may be compared with those of her husband or partner to see if there is an exploitation relation present, for example, if his total hours of productive and reproductive work for the family are less than hers (cf. Delphy 1984). But to the extent that childrearing counts as leisure activity, as play, as activity held to be intrinsically valuable (Ferguson 2004), no exploitation is involved. Perhaps childrearing and other caring activity is both work and play, but only that portion which is necessary for the psychological growth of the child and the worker(s) counts as work. If so, who determines when that line is crossed? Since non-market activity does not have a clear criterion to distinguish work from non-work, nor necessary from non-necessary social labor, an arbitrary element seems to creep in that makes standards of fairness difficult to apply to gendered household bargains between men and women dividing up waged and non-waged work. (Barrett 1980).
One solution to this problem is simply to take all household activity that could also be done by waged labor (nannies, domestic servants, gardeners, chauffeurs, etc.) as work and to figure its comparable worth by the waged labor necessary to replace it (Folbre 1982, 1983). Another is to reject altogether the attempts to base women’s oppression on social relations of work, on the grounds that such theories are overly generalizing and ignore the discrete meanings that kinship activities have for women in different contexts (Nicholson 1991; Fraser and Nicholson 1991; Marchand 1995). Or, one can argue that although the line between work and leisure changes historically, those doing the activity should have the decisive say as to whether their activity counts as work, i.e., labor necessary to promote human welfare. The existence of second wave women’s movements critiques of the “second shift” of unpaid household activity indicates that a growing number of women see most of it as work, not play (cf. Hochchild 1989). Finally, one can argue that since the human care involved in taking care of children and elders creates a public good, it should clearly be characterized as work, and those who are caretakers, primarily women, should be fairly compensated for it by society or the state (Ferguson and Folbre 2000: Folbre 2000, Ferguson 2004).
Liberal, Marxist and radical feminists have all characterized women as doubly alienated in capitalism because of the public/private split that relegates their work as mothers and houseworkers to the home, and psychologically denies them full personhood, citizenship and human rights (Foreman 1974, Okin 1989, Pateman 1988, Goldman 1969). Noting that women workers on average only have about 70% of the average salary of men in the contemporary U.S., feminists have claimed this is because women’s work, tied stereotypically to housework and hence thought unskilled is undervalued, whether it is cleaning or rote service work, or nurturing work thought to be connected to natural maternal motivations and aptitudes. Hence some feminists have organized in campaigns for “comparable worth” to raise women’s wages to the same as men’s wages involving comparable skills (Brenner 2000; cf. also articles in Hansen and Philipson eds. 1990).
Many radical feminists maintain that women’s work is part of a separate patriarchal mode of reproduction that underlies all economic systems of production and in which men exploit women’s reproductive labor (Delphy 1984; O’Brien 1981; Leghorn and Parker 1981; Rich 1980; Mies 1986). Smith (1974), O’Brien (1981), Hartsock (1983 a,b), Haraway (1985) and Harding (1986) pioneered in combining this radical feminist assumption with a perspectival Marxist theory of knowledge to argue that one’s relation to the work of production and reproduction gave each gender and each social class a different way of knowing the social totality. Women’s work, they argued, ties them to nature and human needs in a different way than men’s work does, which creates the possibility of a less alienated and more comprehensive understanding of the workings of the social totality. Patricia Hill Collins argues further that the racial division of labor, institutional racism and different family structures put African American women in yet a different epistemic relation to society than white and other women (1990, 2000). Writing in a post-modernist re-articulation of this feminist standpoint theory, Donna Haraway argues that the breakdown of the nature/culture distinction because of scientific technology and its alteration of the human body makes us into “cyborgs”. Hence our perspectives are so intersectional that they cannot be unified simply by a common relation to work. What is required for a feminist politics is not a situated identity politics, whether of gender and/or race and/or class, but an affinity politics based on alliances and coalitions that combine epistemic perspectives (Haraway 1985).
Like these radical feminists, some socialist-feminists have tried to develop a “dual systems” theory (cf. Young 1981). This involves theorizing a separate system of work relations that organizes and directs human sexuality, nurturance, affection and biological reproduction. Rather than seeing this as an unchanging universal base for patriarchy, however, they have argued that this system, thought of as the “sex/gender system” (Rubin 1975; Hartmann 1978, 1981a,b), or as “sex/affective production” (Ferguson 1989, 1991; Ferguson and Folbre 1981) has different historical modes, just as Marx argued that economies do. Rubin argues that sex/gender systems have been based in different kinship arrangements, most of which have supported the exchange of women by men in marriage, and hence have supported male domination and compulsory heterosexuality. She is hopeful that since capitalism shifted the organization of the economy from kinship to commodity production, the power of fathers and husbands over daughters and wives, and the ability to enforce heterosexuality, will continue to decline, and women’s increasing ability to be economically independent will lead to women’s liberation and equality with men.
With a different historical twist, Hartmann argues that a historical bargain was cemented between capitalist and working class male patriarchs to shore up patriarchal privileges that were being weakened by the entrance of women into wage labor in the 19th century by the creation of the “family wage” to allow men sufficient wages to support a non-wage-earning wife and children at home (1981a). While Ferguson and Folbre (1981) agree that there is no inevitable fit between capitalism and patriarchy, they argue that there are conflicts, and that the family wage bargain has broken down at present. Indeed, both Ferguson and Smart (1984) argue that welfare state capitalism and the persistent sexual division of wage labor in which work coded as women’s is paid less than men’s with less job security are ways that a “public patriarchy” has replaced different systems of family patriarchy that were operating in early and pre-capitalist societies. Walby (1990) has a similar analysis, but to her the connection between forms of capitalism and forms of patriarchy is more functional and less accidental than it appears to Ferguson and Smart.
Walby argues that there are two different basic forms of patriarchy which emerge in response to the tensions between capitalist economies and patriarchal household economies: private and public patriarchy. Private patriarchy as a form is marked by excluding women from economic and political power while public patriarchy works by segregating women. There is a semi-automatic re-adjustment of the dual systems when the older private father patriarchy based on the patriarchal family is broken down due to the pressures of early industrial capitalism. The family wage and women’s second class citizenship that marked that initial re-adjustment are then functionally replaced by a public form of patriarchy, the patriarchal welfare state, where women enter the wage labor force permanently but in segregated less well paid jobs. But Ferguson (1989,1991), Smart (1984) and Folbre (1994) suggest that although the patriarchal control of fathers and husbands over wife and children as economic assets has been diminished in advanced capitalism, there is always a dialectical and contradictory tension between patriarchy and capitalism in which both advances and retreats for women’s equality as citizens and in work relations are constantly occurring in the new form of public patriarchy. Thus, the new “marriage” of patriarchal capitalism operates to relegate women to unpaid or lesser paid caring labor, whether in the household or in wage labor, thus keeping women by and large unequal to men. This is especially notable in the rise of poor single-mother-headed families. However, as it forces more and more women into wage labor, women are given opportunities for some independence from men and the possibility to challenge male dominance and sex segregation in all spheres of social life. Examples are the rise of the first and second wave women’s movements and consequent gains in civil rights for women.
The work of feminist sociologist Dorothy Smith (1989) has been a notable intervention into the public-private split by bringing into view the institutions and power regimes that regulate the everyday world, their gender subtext, and basis in a gendered division of labor. Legal feminist critics expand on the biopolitics of the patriarchal welfare state, which psychiatrizes as it threatens mothers with the loss of child custody. This represents a new eugenics twist on the enduring mistrust of working-class mothers and casting those who are imprisoned as undeserving parent (Guggenheim 2007; Law 2012). African American mothers bear the brunt of punitive and racist family and criminal law (Thompson 2010; Solinger et al. 2010).
The socialist-feminist idea that there are two interlocking systems that structure gender and the economy, and thus are jointly responsible for male domination, has been developed in a psychological direction by the psychoanalytic school of feminist theorists. Particularly relevant to the question of women and work are the theories of Mitchell (1972, 1974), Kuhn and Wolpe (1978), Chodorow (1978, 1979, 1982) and Ruddick (1989). Mothering, or, taking care of babies and small children, as a type of work done overwhelmingly by women, socializes women and men to have different identities, personalities and skills. In her first work (1972), Mitchell argues that women’s different relations to productive work, reproduction, socialization of children and sexuality in patriarchy give her lesser economic and psychological power in relation to men. In a Freudian vein, Mitchell later argues (1974) that women learn that they are not full symbolic subjects because compulsory heterosexuality and the incest taboo bar them from meeting either the desire of their mother or any other woman. Chodorow, also reading Freud from a feminist perspective, suggests that women’s predominance in mothering work is the basis for the learned gender distinction between women and men. The sexual division of infant care gives boys, who must learn their masculine identity by separating from their mother and the feminine, a motive for deprecating, as well as dominating, women. Ruddick from a more Aristotelian perspective suggests that it is the skills and virtues required in the practice of mothering work which not only socially construct feminine gender differently from men’s, but could ground an alternative vision for peace and resolving human conflicts, if a peace movement were led by women.
Ferguson argues that the “sex/affective” work of mothering and wifely nurturing is exploitative of women: women give more nurturance and satisfaction (including sexual satisfaction) to men and children than they receive, and do much more of the work of providing these important human goods (cf. also Bartky 1990). The gendered division of labor has both economic and psychological consequences, since women’s caring labor creates women less capable of or motivated to separate from others, and hence less likely to protest such gender exploitation (Ferguson 1989, 1991). Folbre argues by contrast that it is only because women’s bargaining power is less than men’s because of the power relations involved in the gender division of labor and property that women acquiesce to such inequalities (Folbre 1982). Ferguson argues that gendered exploitation in a system of meeting human needs suggests that women can be seen as a “sex class” (or gender class) which cuts across economic class lines (1979, 1989, 1991). This line of thought is also developed by Christine Delphy (1984), Monique Wittig (1980) and Luce Irigaray (1975).
On the other side of the debate, Brenner (2000) argues that women are not uniformly exploited by men across economic class lines: indeed, for working class women their unpaid work as housewives serves the working class as a whole, because the whole class benefits when its daily and future reproduction needs are met by women’s nurturing and childcare work. They argue further that middle and upper class women’s economic privileges will inevitably lead them to betray working class women in any cross-class alliance that is not explicitly anti-capitalist. Hochschild (2000) and hooks (2000) point out that career women tend to pay working class women to do the second shift work in the home so they can avoid that extra work, and they have an interest in keeping such wages, e.g., for house cleaning and nannies, as low as possible to keep the surplus for themselves. Kollias (1981) argues further that working class women are in a stronger political position to work effectively for women’s liberation than middle class women, while McKenny (1981) argues that professional women have to overcome myths of professionalism that keep them feeling superior to working class women and hence unable to learn from or work with them for social change.
Several authors have explored the ethical implications of the sexual division of labor in which it is primarily women who do caring labor. Nancy Fraser (1997) and Susan Moller Okin (1989) formulate ethical arguments to maintain that a just model of society would have to re-structure work relations so that the unpaid and underpaid caring labor now done primarily by women would be given a status equivalent to (other) wage labor by various means. In her council socialist vision, Ferguson (1989, 1991) argues that an ideal society would require both women and men to do the hitherto private unpaid work of caring or “sex/affective labor.” For example, such work would be shared by men, either in the family and/or provided by the state where appropriate (as for elders and children’s childcare), and compensated fairly by family allowances (for those, women or men, doing the major share of housework), and by higher pay for caring wage work (such as daycare workers, nurses, and teachers).
Carol Gilligan (1982) claims that women and girls tend to use a different form of ethical reasoning — she terms this the “ethics of care” — than men and boys who use an ethics of justice. Some have argued that this different ethical approach is due to women’s caring sensibilities that have been developed by the sexual division of labor (Ruddick 1989). Interestingly, the debate between feminist theorists of justice, e.g., Fraser and Okin, and ethics of care feminists such as Gilligan and Ruddick, is less about substance than a meta-ethical disbute as to whether ethics should concern principles or judgments in particular cases. All of these theorists seem to have ideal visions of society which dovetail: all would support the elimination of the sexual division of labor so that both men and women could become equally sensitized to particular others through caring work.
Useful anthologies of the first stage of second wave socialist feminist writings which include discussions of women, class and work from psychological as well as sociological and economic perspectives are Eisenstein (1979), Hansen and Philipson (1990), Hennessy and Ingraham (1997), and Holmstrom (2002). Jaggar (1983) wrote perhaps the first philosophy text explaining the categories of liberal, radical, Marxist and socialist-feminist thought and defending a socialist-feminist theory of male domination based on the notion of women’s alienated labor. Others such as Jaggar and Rothenberg (1978), Tuana and Tong (1995) and Herrmann and Stewart (1993) include classic socialist feminist analyses in their collections, inviting comparisons of the authors to others grouped under the categories of liberal, radical, psychoanalytic, Marxist, postmodern, postcolonial and multicultural feminisms.
Various post-modern critiques of these earlier feminist schools of thought such as post-colonialism as well as deconstruction and post-structuralism challenge the over-generalizations and economic reductionism of many of those constructing feminist theories that fall under the early categories of liberal, radical, Marxist or socialist feminism (cf. Grewal and Kaplan 1992; Kaplan et al. 1999; Nicholson 1991; Fraser and Nicholson 1991; hooks 1984, 2000; Anzaldúa and Moraga 1981; Sandoval 2000). Others argue that part of the problem is the master narratives of liberalism or Marxism, the first of which sees all domination relations due to traditional hierarchies and undermined by capitalism, thus ignoring the independent effectivity of racism (Josephs 1981); and the second of which ties all domination relations to the structure of contemporary capitalism and ignores the non-capitalist economics contexts in which many women work, even within so-called capitalist economies, such as housework and voluntary community work (Gibson-Graham 1996).
In spite of the “pomo” critiques, there are some powerful thinkers within this tendency who have not completely rejected a more general starting point of analysis based on women, class and work. For example, Spivak (1988), Mohanty (1997), Carby (1997), and Hennessy (1993, 2000) are creating and re-articulating forms of Marxist and socialist-feminism less susceptible to charges of over-generalization and reductionism, and more compatible with close contextual analysis of the power relations of gender and class as they relate to work. They can be grouped loosely with a tendency called materialist feminism that incorporates some of the methods of deconstruction and post-structuralism (Hennessy 1993; Landry and MacLean 1993).
Many in the contemporary feminist theory debate are interested in developing concrete “intersectional” or “integrative feminist” analyses of particular issues which try to give equal weight to gender, race, class and sexuality in a global context without defining themselves by the categories, such as liberal, radical or materialist, of the earlier feminist debate categories (cf. work by Davis 1983; Brewer 1995; Crenshaw 1997; Stanlie and James 1997; Anzaldúa 1999; hooks 1984, 2000). Nonetheless strong emphasis on issues of race and ethnicity can be found in their work on women, class and work. For example, Brewer shows that white and African-American working class women are divided by race in the workforce, and that even changes in the occupational structure historically tend to maintain this racial division of labor. Hooks argues that women of color and some radical feminists were more sensitive to class and race issues than those, primarily white, feminists whom she labels “reformist feminists” (hooks 2000).
Presupposed in the general theoretical debates concerning the relations between gender, social and economic class, and work are usually definitions of each of these categories that some thinkers would argue are problematic. For example, Tokarczyk and Fay have an excellent anthology on working class women in the academy (1993) in which various contributors discuss the ambiguous positions in which they find themselves by coming from poor family backgrounds and becoming academics. One problem is whether they are still members of the working class in so doing, and if not, whether they are betraying their families of origin by a rise to middle class status. Another is, whether they have the same status in the academy, as workers, thinkers and women, as those men or women whose families of origin were middle class or above. Rita Mae Brown wrote an early article on this, arguing that education and academic status did not automatically change a working class woman’s identity, which is based not just on one’s relation to production, but one’s behavior, basic assumptions about life, and experiences in childhood (Brown 1974). Joanna Kadi (1999) describes herself as cultural worker who tackles elitism in the white academy, including in women’s studies courses. Tokarczyk and Fay acknowledge that the definition of “class” is vague in the U.S. Rather than provide a standard philosophical definition in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions for membership in the working class, they provide a cluster of characteristics and examples of jobs, such as physically demanding, repetitive and dangerous jobs, jobs that lack autonomy and are generally paid badly. Examples of working class jobs they give are cleaning women, waitresses, lumberjacks, janitors and police officers. They then define their term “working class women academics” to include women whose parents had jobs such as these and are in the first generation in their family to attend college (Tokarczyk and Fay, 5). They challenge those that would argue that family origin can be overcome by the present position one has in the social division of labor: simply performing a professional job and earning a salary does not eradicate the class identity formed in one’s “family class” (cf. Ferguson 1979).
More recent work in socio-legal studies also has begun to question the limits of intersectional analysis (Grabham et al. 2009). It acknowledges the importance of intersectionality, a term coined by law professor Kimberlé Crenshaw (1989) to shed light on epistemic injustice done to Black women in anti-discrimination law. Yet, despite its merit for overcoming the dual system’s theoretical impasse, Joanna Conaghan also critiques the essentializing tendencies of intersectional analysis which succeeds mainly dealing with race and gender oppression at an individual level, but it has little to offer to remedy structural injustice. Furthermore, because such method is identity-focused it will not get at the dimension of class which has been traditionally thought in relational not locational terms (2008, 29–30).
To theorize the problematic relation of women to social class, Ferguson (1979, 1989, 1991) argues that there are at least three different variables — an individual’s work, family of origin, and present household economic unit — which relate an individual to a specific socio-economic class. For example, a woman may work on two levels: as a day care worker (working class), but also as a member of a household where she does the housework and mothering/child care, while her husband is a wealthy contractor (petit bourgeois, small capitalist class). If in addition her family of origin is professional middle class (because, say, her parents were college educated academics), the woman may be seen and see herself as either working class or middle class, depending on whether she and others emphasize her present relations of wage work (her individual economic class, which in this case is working class), her household income (middle class) or her family of origin (middle class).
Sylvia Walby deals with this ambiguity of economic class as applying to women as unpaid houseworkers by claiming against Delphy (1984) that the relevant economic sex classes are those who are housewives vs. those who are husbands benefiting from such work, not those of all women and men, whether or not they do or receive housework services (Walby 1990). Ferguson, however, sides with Delphy in putting all women into “sex class”, since all women, since trained into the gender roles of patriarchal wife and motherhood, are potentially those whose unpaid housework can be so exploited. But seeing herself as a member of a fourth class category, “sex class,” and hence, in a patriarchal capitalist system, seeing herself exploited as a woman worker in her wage work and unpaid second shift housework,  is thus not a given but an achieved social identity. Such an identity is usually formed through political organizing and coalitions with other women at her place of employment, in her home and her community. In this sense the concept of sex class is exactly analogous to the concept of a feminist epistemological standpoint: not a given identity or perspective, but one that is achievable under the right conditions.
Realizing the importance of this disjuncture between economic class and sex class for women, Maxine Molyneux (1984) argues in a often cited article that there are no “women’s interests” in the abstract that can unify women in political struggle. Instead, she theorizes that women have both “practical gender interests” and “strategic gender interests.” Practical gender interests are those that women develop because of the sexual division of labor, which makes them responsible for the nurturant work of sustaining the physical and psychological well-being of children, partners and relatives through caring labor. Such practical gender interests, because they tie a woman’s conception of her own interests as a woman to those of her family, support women’s popular movements for food, water, child and health care, even defense against state violence, which ally them with the economic class interests of their family. Strategic gender interests, on the contrary, may ally women across otherwise divided economic class interests, since they are those, like rights against physical male violence and reproductive rights, which women have as a sex class to eliminate male domination.
Molyneux used her distinctions between practical and strategic gender interests to distinguish between the popular women’s movement in Nicaragua based on demands for economic justice for workers and farmers against the owning classes, demands such as education, health and maternity care, clean water, food and housing, and the feminist movement which emphasized the fight for legal abortion, fathers’ obligation to pay child support to single mothers, and rights against rape and domestic violence. She and others have used this distinction between practical and strategic gender interests to characterize the tension between popular women’s movements and feminist movements in Latin America (Molyneux 2001; Alvarez 1998; Foweraker 1998).
A similar distinction between different types of women’s interests was developed further as a critique of interest group paradigms of politics by Anna Jónasdóttir (1988, 1994). Jónasdóttir argues that women have a common formal interest in votes for women, women’s political caucuses, gender parity demands, and other mechanisms which allow women a way to develop a collective political voice, even though their content interests, that is, their specific needs and priorities, may vary by race and economic class, among others. Her distinctions, and those of Molyneux, have been changed slightly — practical vs. strategic gender needs, rather than interests — to compare and contrast different paradigms of economic development by World Bank feminist theorist Carolyn Moser (1993). Most recently the Jónasdóttir distinctions have been used by Mohanty (1997) to defend and maintain, in spite of postmodernists’ emphasis on intersectional differences, that commonalities in women’s gendered work can create a cross-class base for demanding a collective political voice for women: a transnational feminism which creates a demand for women’s political representation, developing the platform of women’s human rights as women and as workers. Nonetheless, the tension between women’s economic class-based interests or needs and their visionary/strategic gender interests or needs is still always present, and must therefore always be negotiated concretely by popular movements for social justice involving women’s issues.
Another approach to the problematic nature of socio-economic class as it relates to women are empirical studies which show how class distinctions are still important for women in their daily lives as a way to compare and contrast themselves with other women and men, even if they do not use the concepts of “working class,” “professional class” or “capitalist class”. Many have pointed out that the concept of class itself is mystified in the U.S. context, but that nonetheless class distinctions still operate because of different structural economic constraints, which act on some differently from others. The Ehrenreichs (1979), in a classic article, argue that this mystification is due to the emergence of a professional-managerial class that has some interests in common with the capitalist class and some with the working class. Whatever its causes, there are empirical studies which show that class distinctions still operate between women, albeit in an indirect way. Barbara Ehrenreich (2001), by adopting the material life conditions of a poor woman, did an empirical study of the lives of women working for minimum wages and found their issues to be quite different from and ignored by middle and upper-class women. Diane Reay (2004) does an empirical study of women from manual labor family backgrounds and their relation to the schooling of their children, and discovers that they use a discourse that acknowledges class differences of educational access and career possibilities, even though it does not specifically define these by class per se. Similarly, Julie Bettie (2000) does an impressive discourse analysis of the way that Latina high school students create their own class distinctions through concepts such as “chicas,” “cholas” and “trash” to refer to themselves and their peers. These categories pick out girls as having middle class, working class or poor aspirations by performance indicators such as dress, speech, territorial hang-outs and school achievement, while never mentioning “class” by name. Women’s experiences of growing up working class are presented in the anthology edited by Tea (2003).
So far, it has been assumed that work is an intrinsic good.
What if waged or unwaged work itself were to be considered problematic or oppressive? Autonomous Marxists contest that liberal or socialist feminist perspectives have unnecessarily mystified work and have operated with a moralism. Autonomists are associated with the Operaismo, post-Operaismo and Autonomia movements, the Midnight Notes Collective, Zerowork, Lotta Feminista, and the Wages for Housework movement (Weeks 2011, 241). Whether one ought to be paid for housework or reproductive labor or seek equal employment opportunities, feminists have not sufficiently opposed the sanctification of work. Championing the refusal of work means to abandon a narrow focus on the critique of the extraction of surplus value or of the process of deskilling. Furthermore, it is imperative to interrogate how work dominates our lives (Weeks 2011, 13). Kathi Weeks charges that a productivist bias is common to feminist and Marxist analysis. The credo of autonomists then is liberation from work, in contradistinction to Marxist humanists such as Erich Fromm’s advocacy for liberation of work.
The Wages for Housework campaign demanded purposefully the impossible. These feminists did not only ask for compensation for unpaid domestic labor, but also postulated the end of such work (Federici 1995). Post-work also means post-domestic care, something that gets lost in some of the ethic of care analysis, which inadvertently fosters a romantic attachment to endowing meaning to such work. Furthermore, post-work also appeals to carving out space for “queer time” and queer resistant agency (Halberstam 2005, Lehr 1999), an appeal to unscripted life. A wholesale critique of housework is not easily understood; even Arlie Hochschild’s (1997) own analysis of her ethnographic studies of diverse family practices comes to the conclusion that authentic housework should be sanctified and set apart from mere alienating factory production (Weeks 2011, 157–59).
A post-work ethic entails a playful commitment to leisure and unstructured activities such as day-dreaming. Joseph Trullinger (2016) extends Kathi Weeks’ analysis by drawing on Marcuse’s concept of great refusal and playful labor defying commodity fetishism and productivism. By ignoring the liberatory power of play, Weeks insufficiently engages the meaning of work and the asceticism of the work ethic (Trullinger 2016, 469). Still, the danger of play morphing into (unpaid) labor is real, as evinced by social media corporate giant FaceBook exploiting play-labor for capitalist gains (Fuchs 2016) and a veritable corporate feminism may ask us to “lean in” (Sandberg 2013) rather than “lean out”.
While it is reasonable to champion daydreams and play as intrinsic goods, idle time itself is often not felt as a good or luxury, but instead a psychic imposition. This is why one speaks of “doing time,” when one is sentenced to a prison term or worse, to death row (Moses 2007). Imprisonment is anathema to indigenous, socio-centric peoples in the Global South, and imprisonment is closely connected to the disciplinary apparatus of western colonization of the Americas and Africa (Nagel 2007). The birth of the western modern prison focused on self-discipline, known as the “separate system” of Philadelphia, PA, leading to enforced isolation and separate celling. Day-dreaming in a solitary cell becomes positively dangerous and suicides and mental illness increase exponentially (Casella et al. 2016). Idle time is thus countered by another prison regime, the Auburn, NY, factory system, also known as the “silent system,” where prisoners worked in a factory, but they were forbidden to talk with each other. Under the notorious Southern US convict lease system, representing the shift “from the prison of slavery to the slavery of prisons” (Davis 1998), Black female and male prisoners are toiling in chain gangs, a visceral reminder of the trauma of chattel slavery.
Another haunting reminder of chattel slavery is the neoliberal welfare state’s intrusion in the family, charging parents with poor work ethic and neglect of their children. In the US, poor children of color, especially Black, Latino, and American Indians living on reservations, are at higher risk of being taken away from their kin and carers and turned over to the foster care system (Goldberg 2015). The world over, parents who are socially displaced such as Romanian immigrants in Norway, are under greater scrutiny by state actors, e.g., child protective services. In the US, social workers’ own white middle class (protestant) work ideology is enforced paradoxically on grieving mothers: these stigmatized women are summoned to complete parenting skills courses, cooking courses, etc., and are thus effectively forced out of a paid job, made dependent on the good will of the social worker and family court judge, who may grant access to child-supervised visits. Thus, parents charged with child abuse and/or neglect are thus unable to pursue education or a job, often creating an intergenerational cycle of the violence of poverty. In ideological terms, this is coded as welfare dependency and racialized as a controlling image, thus stereotyping young Black mothers (Fraser and Gordon 1994; Hill Collins 1990, 2000). In response, the National Welfare Rights Organization was created to destigmatize welfare by postulating it as a human right (Toney 2000) and by also demanding a basic income, as alternative to punitive welfare (Weeks 2011, 138). The proposal for basic income has gained traction in recent years, cumulating in a Swiss referendum, even though it was defeated in 2016. Migrant workers, worker-mothers who serve as domestic workers are also at risk (of deportation and/or imprisonment) for facing frivolous neglect charges or simply for lacking proper visa status. Gendered moral economies operate across national, racial and geographic borders in enforcing a domestic and domesticating patriarchal ideology and determining who is a good victim and deserves to be rescued (Keogh 2015; Nagel 2011; Gutiérrez Rodríguez 2010; Grewal and Kaplan 1992; Kaplan et al. 1999).
Stigmatized work such as erotic labor or sex work has divided feminists into two camps: those who support sex workers’ rights to organize and seek labor law protection and those who call themselves abolitionists but actually advocate a prohibitionist approach of “trafficking in women” that serves to rescue girls and women from such degrading, dangerous punishment (Nagel 2015). Some sex worker rights approaches focus on eschewing the moralizing rallying cry of choice versus coercion and seek to destigmatize such labor and offer a postcolonial critique of prohibitionist ideology (Kempadoo and Doezema 1995). Others also focus on the lived experiences and agencies of such workers and contextualize their lives within structural constraints of the feminization of poverty (Dewey 2010; Zheng 2009). Paradoxically, by focusing narrowly on income-generating activities, Dewey (2010) contents that such advocates actually reinscribe stigmatization. And some sex workers’ rights organizations such as COYOTE (“Call Off Your Old Tired Ethics”) also inadvertently endorse a traditional work-ethic ideology by appealing to a moralizing discourse of respectability (Weeks 2011, pp. 67–68).
Theoretical and empirical debates about the relation of women to class and work, and the implications of these relations for theories of male domination and women’s oppression as well as for other systems of social domination, continue to be important sources of theories and investigations of gender identities, roles and powers in the field of women and gender studies, as well as in history, sociology, anthropology and economics. They also have important implications for epistemology, metaphysics and political theory in the discipline of philosophy, and consequently other disciplines in humanities and the social sciences.
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