Feminist Perspectives on Objectification

First published Wed Mar 10, 2010; substantive revision Mon Dec 16, 2019

Objectification is a notion central to feminist theory. It can be roughly defined as the seeing and/or treating a person, usually a woman, as an object. In this entry, the focus is primarily on sexual objectification, objectification occurring in the sexual realm. Martha Nussbaum (1995, 257) has identified seven features that are involved in the idea of treating a person as an object:

  1. instrumentality: the treatment of a person as a tool for the objectifier’s purposes;
  2. denial of autonomy: the treatment of a person as lacking in autonomy and self-determination;
  3. inertness: the treatment of a person as lacking in agency, and perhaps also in activity;
  4. fungibility: the treatment of a person as interchangeable with other objects;
  5. violability: the treatment of a person as lacking in boundary-integrity;
  6. ownership: the treatment of a person as something that is owned by another (can be bought or sold);
  7. denial of subjectivity: the treatment of a person as something whose experiences and feelings (if any) need not be taken into account.

Rae Langton (2009, 228–229) has added three more features to Nussbaum’s list:

  1. reduction to body: the treatment of a person as identified with their body, or body parts;
  2. reduction to appearance: the treatment of a person primarily in terms of how they look, or how they appear to the senses;
  3. silencing: the treatment of a person as if they are silent, lacking the capacity to speak.

The majority of the thinkers discussing objectification have taken it to be a morally problematic phenomenon. This is particularly the case in feminist discussions of pornography. Anti-pornography feminists Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin, influenced by Immanuel Kant’s conception of objectification, have famously argued that, due to men’s consumption of pornography, women as a group are reduced to the status of mere tools for men’s purposes. Moreover, feminists like Sandra Bartky and Susan Bordo have argued that women are objectified through being excessively preoccupied with their appearance. Important recent work by feminists has also been devoted to exploring the connection between objectivity and objectification. More recently, some thinkers, such as Martha Nussbaum, have challenged the idea that objectification is a necessarily negative phenomenon, arguing for the possibility of positive objectification. While treating a person as an object (in one or more of the ways mentioned above) is often problematic, Nussbaum argues that objectification can in some contexts take benign or even positive forms, and can constitute a valuable and enjoyable part of our lives. In her forthcoming work, Nancy Bauer questions the very idea that it makes sense to specify the marks and features of the term ‘objectification’. Such an attempt, she argues, will only distort the phenomenon in question (2015).

1. Kant on sexuality and objectification

Immanuel Kant’s views on sexual objectification have been particularly influential for contemporary feminist discussions on this topic. Kant thought that sexuality is extremely problematic when exercised outside the context of monogamous marriage, arguing that in such instances it leads to objectification. He characteristically writes in the Lectures on Ethics that “sexual love makes of the loved person an Object of appetite; as soon as that appetite has been stilled, the person is cast aside as one casts away a lemon which has been sucked dry. … as soon as a person becomes an Object of appetite for another, all motives of moral relationship cease to function, because as an Object of appetite for another a person becomes a thing and can be treated and used as such by every one” (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 163).

Objectification, for Kant, involves the lowering of a person, a being with humanity, to the status of an object. Humanity, for Kant, is an individual’s rational nature and capacity for rational choice. The characteristic feature of humanity is an individual’s capacity for rationally setting and pursuing her own ends. A being with humanity is capable of deciding what is valuable, and of finding ways to realise and promote this value. Humanity is what is special about human beings. It distinguishes them from animals and inanimate objects. Because human beings are special in this sense they, unlike animals and objects, have a dignity (an ‘inner worth’, as opposed to a ‘relative worth’) (Kant 1785, 42). It is crucial, for Kant, that each person respects humanity in others, as well as humanity in their own person. Humanity must never be treated merely as a means, but always at the same time as an end (Kant 1797, 209).

Kant is worried that when people exercise their sexuality outside the context of monogamous marriage, they treat humanity merely as a means for their sexual purposes. In the Lectures on Ethics Kant often speaks about ‘degradation’, ‘subordination’, and ‘dishonouring’ of humanity when exercise of sexuality is involved. He goes so far as to say that sexual activity can lead to the loss or ‘sacrifice’ of humanity (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 163–4). The loved person loses what is special to her as a human being, her humanity, and is reduced to a thing, a mere sexual instrument. Kant’s notion of objectification, therefore, focuses largely on instrumentality: the treatment of a person as a mere tool for the lover’s purposes. Objectification, for Kant, involves regarding someone “as an object, something for use” (Herman 1993, 57). According to Alan Soble, for Kant, “both the body and the compliant actions of the other person are tools (a means) that one uses for one’s sexual pleasure, and to that extent the other person is a fungible, functional thing” (Soble 2002a, 226). The idea that within sexual relationships people are reduced to objects, that they lose their rational nature, is an extreme one. Halwani rightly points out that this reduction to the status of an object rarely happens in sexual objectification. He explains that “Outside rape, it is rare to treat our sexual partners as objects: not only are we aware of their humanity; we are also mindful of it.” (Halwani 2010, 193) Halwani offers a more sensible reading of Kant’s claim here, in admitting that there is truth to the idea that “Sexual desire is powerful enough to make reason its own tool; it can subvert our rational capacity to set ends” (Halwani 2010, 209). In this way, people can “endanger their dignity by undermining their reason” (Halwani 2010, 209). Therefore, even though the view that humanity is completely destroyed when people exercise their sexuality is an unappealing one, it is not unreasonable to think that, in some cases, sexual desire and exercise of sexuality can undermine our rationality.

Kant thought that in theory both men and women can be objectified, but he was well aware that in practice women are the most common victims of objectification. This is obvious in Kant’s discussions of prostitution and concubinage. Exercise of sexuality within these morally problematic sexual contexts leads to the reduction of women (prostitutes and concubines) to men’s objects of appetite.

Kant defines prostitution as the offer for profit of one’s person for another’s sexual gratification. A person, Kant holds, cannot allow others to use her body sexually in exchange for money without losing her humanity and becoming an object. He explains that “… a man is not at his own disposal. He is not entitled to sell a limb, not even one of his teeth. But to allow one’s person for profit to be used for the satisfaction of sexual desire, to make of oneself an Object of demand, is to dispose over oneself as over a thing” (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 165). The prostitute’s commodification necessarily leads to her objectification; she is reduced to “a thing on which another satisfies his appetite” (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 165). Kant states that “human beings are … not entitled to offer themselves, for profit, as things for the use of others in the satisfaction of their sexual inclinations. In so doing, they would run the risk of having their person used by all and sundry as an instrument for the satisfaction of inclination” (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 165). Kant blames the prostitute for her objectification. He takes her to be responsible for sacrificing her humanity, in offering herself as an object for the satisfaction of the clients’ sexual desires.

The other relationship in which objectification is, for Kant, clearly present is concubinage. According to Kant, concubinage is the non-commodified sexual relationship between a man and more than one woman (the concubines). Kant takes concubinage to be a purely sexual relationship in which all parties aim at the satisfaction of their sexual desires (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 166). The inequality that is involved in this relationship makes it problematic. Kant explains that “the woman surrenders her sex completely to the man, but the man does not completely surrender his sex to the woman” (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 169). Since body and self are for Kant inseparable and together they constitute the person, in surrendering her body (her sex) exclusively to her male partner, the woman surrenders her whole person to the man, allowing him to possess it. The man, by contrast, who has more than one sexual partner, does not exclusively surrender himself to the woman, and so he does not allow her to possess his person. In allowing her male partner to possess her person, without herself being able to similarly possess his person, Kant believes that eventually the concubine (and this also applies to the woman in any other polygamous relationship, including polygamous marriage) loses her person and is made ‘into a thing’ (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 166).

The only relationship in which two people can exercise their sexuality without the fear of reducing themselves to objects is monogamous marriage. Monogamy is required to ensure that there is equality and reciprocity in the surrender and ownership of the two spouses’ persons. The spouses exclusively surrender their persons to one another, so neither of them is in danger of losing his or her person and becoming an object. This perfect equality and reciprocity between the spouses is described by Kant as follows: “… if I yield myself completely to another and obtain the person of the other in return, I win myself back; I have given myself up as the property of another, but in turn I take that other as my property, and so win myself back again in winning the person whose property I have become. In this way, the two persons become a unity of will” (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 167). Furthermore, this mutual exchange of the two spouses’ persons must, for Kant, be legally enforced. Kant explains that marriage is “sexual union in accordance with law” (Kant 1797, 62). He wants something external, namely, the law, to guarantee this lifelong ownership of the two parties’ persons in marriage. He argues that this legal obligation to surrender one’s person to one’s spouses makes marriage different from a monogamous relationship between two unmarried partners.

2. Pornography and objectification

Like Kant, anti-pornography feminists Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin take inequality to be tightly linked to objectification. In the eyes of both these feminists and Kant, there is the powerful objectifier on the one hand, and on the other hand there exists his powerless victim. Due to their unequal power, the former objectifies the latter.

Kant is concerned with inequality taking place within polygamous relationships. MacKinnon and Dworkin, on the other hand, believe that inequality is a much more widespread and pervasive phenomenon. It covers all aspects of our society. MacKinnon and Dworkin emphasise that we live in a world of gender inequality. A person’s gender is, for MacKinnon, clearly distinguished from a person’s sex. Gender, being a man or a woman, is socially constructed, whereas sex, being male or female, is biologically defined. Within our patriarchal societies, men and women have clearly defined roles: women (all women, women as a group) are objectified, whereas men (all men, men as a group) are their objectifiers (MacKinnon 1987, 6, 32–45, 50; MacKinnon 1989a, 113–4, 128, 137–40; Haslanger 1993, 98–101) (For more on sex and gender, see also the entries feminist perspectives on sex and gender and feminist perspectives on power.) Even though MacKinnon does acknowledge that a female (sex) individual can be an objectifier and a male (sex) individual can be objectified, she takes it that the former is a man and the latter is a woman, since in her view a man (gender) is by definition the objectifier and a woman (gender) is by definition the objectified.

This situation of gender inequality which troubles our societies and is so tightly linked to the objectification of women is, MacKinnon and Dworkin believe, created and sustained by men’s consumption of pornography. MacKinnon defines pornography as “the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women through pictures or words that also includes women dehumanised as sexual objects, things, or commodities; enjoying pain or humiliation or rape; being tied up, cut up, mutilated, bruised, or physically hurt; in postures of sexual submission or servility or display; reduced to body parts, penetrated by objects or animals, or presented in scenarios of degradation, injury, torture; shown as filthy or inferior; bleeding, bruised, or hurt in a context that makes these conditions sexual” (MacKinnon 1987, 176).

In our society, MacKinnon holds, pornography defines women’s role as sexual objects available for men’s consumption: “Pornography defines women by how we look according to how we can be sexually used. … Pornography participates in its audience’s eroticism through creating an accessible sexual object, the possession and consumption of which is male sexuality, as socially constructed; to be consumed and possessed as which, is female sexuality, as socially constructed” (MacKinnon 1987, 173). According to MacKinnon, pornography is responsible for both men’s and women’s conception of women as objects available for men’s consumption.

MacKinnon’s and Dworkin’s understanding of objectification is similar to Kant’s. For both of them, as for Kant, objectification involves treating a person, someone with humanity, as an object of merely instrumental worth, and consequently reducing this person to the status of an object for use. The objectified individual is made into a tool for others’ sexual purposes. Objectification, therefore, constitutes a serious harm to a person’s humanity.

Dworkin uses Kantian language to describe the phenomenon of sexual objectification: “Objectification occurs when a human being, through social means, is made less than human, turned into a thing or commodity, bought and sold. When objectification occurs, a person is depersonalised, so that no individuality or integrity is available socially or in what is an extremely circumscribed privacy. Objectification is an injury right at the heart of discrimination: those who can be used as if they are not fully human are no longer fully human in social terms; their humanity is hurt by being diminished” (Dworkin 2000, 30–1). When a person is treated as less than human, as merely an object for another’s use, she becomes, according to Dworkin, less than human. In this way, her humanity is harmed by being diminished.

MacKinnon too describes objectification in similar terms. She writes: “… A sex object is defined on the basis of its looks, in terms of its usability for sexual pleasure, such that both the looking—the quality of gaze, including its points of view—and the definition according to use become eroticised as part of the sex itself. This is what the feminist concept of ‘sex object’ means” (MacKinnon 1987, 173). She furthermore holds: “A person, in one Kantian view, is a free and rational agent whose existence is an end in itself, as opposed to instrumental. In pornography women exist to the end of male pleasure” (MacKinnon 1987, 173). Insofar as an individual has only instrumental value, she is clearly not regarded as an end in herself.

MacKinnon and Dworkin have argued that, even if women consent to their being used as mere means for men’s sexual purposes, this is not sufficient to make such use permissible. For instance, these feminists claim that women in the pornographic industry consent to be used as objects simply out of lack of options available to them within our patriarchal society. Women’s consent, therefore, is not true consent. MacKinnon writes: “The sex is not chosen for the sex. Money is the medium of force and provides the cover of consent” (MacKinnon 1993, 28). This does not only hold for women in pornography. For MacKinnon and Dworkin, all women’s consent to be sexually used by men cannot be true consent under the existing conditions of gender inequality. They hold that women are not truly blameworthy for their reduction to things of merely instrumental value. Women’s objectification is demanded and inflicted by men in our societies. It is men who want, and also, Dworkin claims, need to use women as objects, and demand them to be object-like (Dworkin 1997, 142–3).

Kant compares the objectified individual to a lemon, used and discarded afterwards, and elsewhere to a steak consumed by people for the satisfaction of their hunger (Kant Lectures on Ethics, 163 and 165). In a similar manner, MacKinnon blames pornography for teaching its consumers that women exist to be used by men. A woman, according to MacKinnon, becomes comparable to a cup (a thing), and as such she is valued only for how she looks and how she can be used (MacKinnon 1987, 138). Similarly, Dworkin talks about men being the only “human centre” of the world, surrounded by objects for use, including women. A man experiences his power, according to Dworkin, in using objects, both inanimate objects and “persons who are not adult men” (Dworkin 1989, 104).

Kant took exercise of sexuality to be inherently problematic. For Dworkin and MacKinnon, on the other hand, what is problematic is not sexuality per se, but rather sexuality as constructed through pornography. These feminists believe that objectification is a consequence of gender inequality and it is created and sustained by pornography’s existence and consumption. Pornography, according to MacKinnon, makes women’s sexuality into “something any man who wants to can buy and hold in his hands… She becomes something to be used by him, specifically, an object of his sexual use” (MacKinnon 1987, 138). MacKinnon fears that use can easily be followed by violence and abuse. Since women are things (as opposed to human beings), it seems to men that there is nothing problematic with abusing them. The object status of women, then, is the cause of men seeing nothing problematic with violent behaviour towards women.

Moreover, MacKinnon notes, women in pornography are presented as enjoying how they are being used and violated by men: “In pornography, women desire disposition and cruelty. Men … create scenes in which women desperately want to be bound, battered, tortured, humiliated, and killed. Or merely taken and used. Women are there to be violated and possessed, men to violate and possess us…” (MacKinnon 1987, 148). Dworkin similarly writes: “Men do not believe that rape and battery are violations of female will in part because men … have consumed pornography in the private world of men for centuries. … The most enduring sexual truth in pornography is that sexual violence is desired by the normal female, needed by her, suggested or demanded by her” (Dworkin 1989, 166). Pornography, then, teaches its consumers that, not only is it permissible to treat women in these ways, but also that women themselves enjoy being used, violated and abused by men. Watson furthermore argues that use of pornography restricts the sexual autonomy of boys and men, due to pornography’s pervasiveness as a tool of sex education. Pornography consumption powerfully shapes its users’ beliefs, attitudes, preferences and desires. Pornography, she argues, distorts these and in this way undermines people’s sexual autonomy and restricts the development of authentic sexuality for both women and men (Altman and Watson 284, 287–8).

The idea that pornography causes men to treat women as objects to be used and abused has been defended by a number of feminists. Alison Assiter argues that what is wrong with pornography is that it reinforces desires on the part of men to treat women as objects (as mere means to achieve their purposes) (Assiter 1988, 68). Rae Langton also discusses the possibility of such a causal connection between men’s consumption of pornography and women’s objectification. She writes: “As a matter of human psychology, when men sexually use objects, pornographic artifacts, as women, they tend to use real woman as objects. One weaker variant of this causal claim might be restricted to a subset of pornography… As a matter of human psychology, when men sexually use objects as women, and those objects are pornographic artifacts, whose content is violent or misogynistic, then they will tend to use real women as objects” (Langton 1995, 178).)

MacKinnon, however, holds that the connection between men’s use of pornography and women’s objectification is not simply a causal one. She has famously claimed that pornography involves “sex between people and things, human beings and pieces of paper, real men and unreal women”. And, as a result for MacKinnon, “the human [women, in particular] becomes a thing” (MacKinnon 1993, 109 and 25). Men’s consumption of pornography, then, is (constitutes) women’s objectification. (This is admittedly a puzzling claim, but one which I will not delve into further here. Detailed defenses of the claim have been offered by Melinda Vadas (Vadas 2005) and Rae Langton (Langton 1995), and a criticism has been put forward by Jennifer Saul (Saul 2006).)

Kant thought that the solution to sexual objectification is marriage. This is because he conceived this relationship as one of perfect equality and reciprocity between the spouses. Each of them surrenders his or her person to the other and receives the person of the other in return. This way, Kant believed, neither of them is objectified by losing his or her person. (For a detailed discussion of Kantian marriage see Herman 1993 and Papadaki 2010b.) For Dworkin and MacKinnon, however, Kant’s suggested solution is inappropriate. Objectification, according to these feminists, is present within all heterosexual relationships in our society and harms women’s humanity. Marriage, or any other heterosexual relationship for that matter, is clearly not regarded as an exception by them. According to MacKinnon and Dworkin, the way to fight objectification is to fight gender inequality, which is created and sustained by men’s consumption of pornography. They take it that pornography has power and authority over its audience (men and boys). This view is also defended by Langton, who argues that it does not matter that the speech of pornographers is not generally held in high esteem. What matters, rather, is that men and boys learn about sex primarily through pornography. Pornography passes the message to its audience that women are objects readily available for men’s consumption (Langton 1993, 312).

The view that pornography has this amount of influence over men and plays such a central role in women’s objectification has received criticism. Deborah Cameron and Elizabeth Frazer question the idea that men are conditioned to behave in certain ways as a consequence of pornography consumption. What is problematic with this idea, according to them, is that men are presented as incapable of critically interpreting pornographic materials, and as simply imitating what they see in pornography (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 248–251). In a similar spirit, Altman argues that pornography consumption cannot alter a person’s preferences and desires, sexual or otherwise. He claims that men find women’s subordination arousing, not as a result of their having consumed pornography. Rather, they enjoy pornography, which includes the subordination of women, because they already find this subordination arousing. Thus, pornography does not make anything sexy but it deals with what its consumers already find sexy (Altman and Watson, 68–9).

Even assuming that pornography does indeed pass the message that women are object-like to its consumers, however, it has been suggested that pornography is not special with respect to sustaining gender inequality and women’s objectification. Leslie Green explains that the idea that women are mere objects/tools is reinforced through parental pressure, television, popular novels, music videos, and fashion. What we need to do, Green says, is change our society, in a way that women’s subjectivity will be acknowledged (Green 2000, 43–52). Nussbaum too argues that we should not see pornography as the primary cause of women’s objectification. Sexual objectification is, according to Nussbaum, often caused by social inequality, but there is no reason to believe that pornography is the core of such inequality (Nussbaum 1995, 286, 290).

A similar view has been put forward by Ronald Dworkin, according to whom: “It might be odd that feminists have devoted such energy to that campaign [the campaign for outlawing pornography]… No doubt mass culture is in various ways an obstacle to sexual equality, but the most popular forms of that culture—the view of women presented in soap operas and commercials, for example—are much greater obstacles to that equality than the dirty films watched by a small minority” (R. Dworkin 1993, 36). (For further discussions about pornography, see also the entries on feminist perspectives on sex markets and on pornography and censorship.)

3. Feminine appearance and objectification

It has been pointed out by some feminist thinkers that women in our society are more identified and associated with their bodies than are men, and, to a greater extent than men, they are valued for how they look (Bartky 1990; Bordo 1993, 143). In order to gain social acceptability, women are under constant pressure to correct their bodies and appearance more generally, and to make them conform to the ideals of feminine appearance of their time, the so-called ‘norms of feminine appearance’ (the standards of appearance women feel they should be living up to) (Saul 2003, 144). Some feminists have argued that, in being preoccupied with their looks, women treat themselves as things to be decorated and gazed upon.

In her book Femininity and Domination, Sandra Bartky uses Marx’s theory of alienation to explain the objectification that results from women’s preoccupation with their appearance. A feature of Marx’s theory of alienation is the fragmentation of the human person, this “splintering of human nature into a number of misbegotten parts”. For Marx, labour is the most distinctively human activity, and the product of labour is the exteriorisation of the worker’s being. Under capitalism, however, workers are alienated from the products of their labour, and consequently their person is fragmented (Bartky 1990, 128–9).

Bartky believes that women in patriarchal societies also undergo a kind of fragmentation “by being too closely identified with [their body]… [their] entire being is identified with the body, a thing which… has been regarded as less inherently human than the mind or personality” (Bartky 1990, 130). All the focus is placed on a woman’s body, in a way that her mind or personality are not adequately acknowledged. A woman’s person, then, is fragmented. Bartky believes that through this fragmentation a woman is objectified, since her body is separated from her person and is thought as representing the woman (Bartky 1990, 130).

Bartky explains that, typically, objectification involves two persons, one who objectifies and one who is objectified. (This is also the idea of objectification put forward by Kant as well as by MacKinnon and Dworkin.) However, as Bartky points out, objectifier and objectified can be one and the same person. Women in patriarchal societies feel constantly watched by men, much like the prisoners of the Panopticon (model prison proposed by Bentham), and they feel the need to look sensually pleasing to men (Bartky 1990, 65). According to Bartky: “In the regime of institutionalised heterosexuality woman must make herself ‘object and prey’ for the man. … Woman lives her body as seen by another, by an anonymous patriarchal Other” (Bartky 1990, 73). This leads women to objectify their own persons. Bartky argues that the woman “[takes] toward her own person the attitude of the man. She will then take erotic satisfaction in her physical self, revelling in her body as a beautiful object to be gazed at and decorated”. Such an attitude is called ‘narcissism’, which is defined by Bartky as the infatuation with one’s bodily being (Bartky 1990, 131–2).

In being infatuated with their bodily beings, Bartky argues that women learn to see and treat themselves as objects to be gazed at and decorated, they learn to see themselves as though from the outside. Narcissism, as Simone de Beauvoir also points out, “consists in the setting up of the ego as a double ‘stranger’” (Beauvoir 1961, 375). The adolescent girl “becomes an object and she sees herself as an object; she discovers this new aspect of her being with surprise: it seems to her that she has been doubled; instead of coinciding exactly with herself, she now begins to exist outside” (Beauvoir 1961, 316) (See the entry on Simone de Beauvoir.) However, this ‘stranger’ who inhabits women’s consciousness, Bartky writes, is hardly a stranger; it is, rather, the woman’s own self (Bartky 1993, 134).

As Nancy Bauer holds, drawing on Beauvoir, women will always have reasons to succumb to the temptation of objectifying themselves. Bauer mentions the widespread recent phenomenon of female college students who claim that they gain pleasure in performing unilateral oral sex on male students. A woman who turns herself into an “object of the helpless desire of a boy”in this way, Bauer explains, experiences a sense of power and pleasure, which, however, are not unadulterated (Bauer 2011, 124). A great theme of The Second Sex, Bauer concludes, is that, in order to achieve full personhood, it is necessary not only that men stop objectifying women, but also that “women care about abjuring the temptation to objectify themselves” (Bauer 2011, 128).

Bartky talks about the disciplinary practices that produce a feminine body and are the practices through which women learn to see themselves as objects. First of all, according to her, there are those practices that aim to produce a body of a certain size and shape: women must conform to the body ideal of their time (i.e. a slim body with large breasts), which, Bartky holds, requires women to subject their bodies to the ‘tyranny of slenderness’ (put themselves through constant dieting and exercise) (Bartky 1990, 65–7). Susan Bordo also emphasises the fact that women are more obsessed with dieting than are men. This is linked to serious diseases such as anorexia and bulimia. Ninety percent of all anorexics, Bordo points out, are women (Bordo 1993, 143, 154). Furthermore, a large number of women have plastic surgery, most commonly liposuction and breast enlargement, in order to make their bodies conform to what is considered to be the ideal body.

According to Bartky, the second category of these disciplinary practices that produce a feminine body are those that aim to control the body’s gestures, postures, and movements. Women, she holds, are more restricted than men in the way they move, and they try to take up very little space as opposed to men, who tend to expand to the space available. Women’s movements are also restrained by their uncomfortable clothes and shoes (Bartky 1990, 68–9). The final category of the disciplinary practices, Bartky holds, are those that are directed towards the display of a woman’s body as an ‘ornamented surface’: women must take care of their skin and make it soft, smooth, hairless and wrinkle-free, they must apply make-up to disguise their skin’s imperfections. Our culture demands the ‘infantilisation’ of women’s bodies and faces (Bartky 1990, 71–2).

According to Bartky: “… whatever else she [a woman] may become, she is importantly a body designed to please or to excite” (Bartky 1990, 80). Iris Marion Young adds that women’s preoccupation with their appearance suppresses the body potential of women: “Developing a sense of our bodies as beautiful objects to be gazed at and decorated requires suppressing a sense of our bodies as strong, active subjects…” (Young, 1979).

Who is responsible for women’s situation? According to Bartky: “The disciplinary power that inscribes femininity in the female body is everywhere and it is nowhere; the disciplinarian is everyone and yet no one in particular” (Bartky 1990, 74). The message that women should look more feminine is everywhere: it is reinforced by parents, teachers, male partners, and it is expressed in various ways throughout the media. Men, then, are not the only ones to blame for women’s situation. Because of the pervasiveness of this disciplinary power that inscribes femininity, women’s constant preoccupation with appearance has come to be regarded as something natural and voluntary; it is something that women have internalised. Therefore, it is far from easy for women, in Bartky’s view, to free themselves from their objectification.

Not all feminists, however, share the concern about the inevitability of objectification involved in women’s appearance-related pursuits. Janet Richards takes women’s preoccupation with their looks to be a matter of personal preference, and not a feminist matter. She claims that there is nothing inherently degrading or objectifying about women trying to be sensually pleasing (Richards 1980, 184–204). Natasha Walter too takes it that women’s preoccupation with their appearance is not necessarily objectifying. She also points to the fact that men in our society engage in self-decoration and seek to be admired by women (Walter 1998, 86–102).

Bordo herself acknowledges the fact that men have increasingly started to spend more time, money and effort on their appearance (Bordo 1999). She emphasises the fact that men’s magazines today, like women’s, are full of articles and advice on how men should look: how to be more muscular, what clothes to wear, what creams and other cosmetics to use, etc. Men feel the need to make their looks conform to the prevailing ideals of masculinity. Bordo believes that it is consumer capitalism that drives men to be increasingly concerned with their appearance: “Why should [the cosmetics, diet, exercise, and surgery industries] restrict themselves to female markets, if they can convince men that their looks need constant improvement too?,” she asks (Bordo 1999, 220).

The fact that men too face pressure to look a certain way, and engage in constant efforts to improve their appearance, however, is not on its own sufficient to show that women’s (and men’s) preoccupation with appearance is not objectifying. According to Saul, “The increasing pressure on men to conform to unattainable standards of beauty is far from a sign of progress: it is, instead, a sign that the problem has grown” (Saul 2003, 168).

4. Objectivity and Objectification

MacKinnon introduces the idea that there are important connections between objectivity and objectification. MacKinnon writes: “The stance of the ‘knower’ … is … the neutral posture, which I will be calling objectivity—that is the nonsituated distanced standpoint… [This] is the male standpoint socially … [The] relationship between objectivity as the stance from which the world is known and the world that is apprehended in this way is the relationship of objectification. Objectivity is the epistemological stance of which objectification is the social process, of which male dominance is the politics, the acted out social practice. That is, to look at the world objectively is to objectify it” (MacKinnon 1987, 50). Her claim has become the focus of recent feminist investigation. Drawing on MacKinnon’s work, Rae Langton and Sally Haslanger have explored the idea that objectification is often hidden, and ‘masked’ as objectivity.

According to Haslanger, in trying to be objective about our world and function within it, we go about trying to discover things’ natures. An object’s nature is essential to it, and any change to it will inevitably destroy it. An object cannot exist without those properties that constitute its nature. Discovering an object’s nature enables us to explain the behaviour of that object under normal circumstances. This means that in practical decision-making, we must be attentive to objects’ natures (Haslanger 1993, 103, 105). She writes: “It won’t do to try to fry an egg on a paper plate; there is no point in trying to teach a rock how to read. Because the world is not infinitely malleable to our wants or needs, reasonable decision making will accommodate ‘how things are’, where this is understood as accommodating the natures of things, the background conditions constraining our actions” (Haslanger 1993, 105).

A plausible strategy for discovering a thing’s nature is to look for observed regularities. This is because natures are responsible for the regular behaviour of things under normal circumstances. For example, I observe that my ferns die if deprived of water. I therefore come to believe that the nature of ferns is such that they cannot survive without water. I adjust my decision-making in accordance with this observed regularity, and so water my ferns to prevent them from dying. In observing the regularity that ferns die when depraved of water, I have concluded that this is due to ferns’ nature. Haslanger points out that this procedure of drawing on observed regularities to set constraints on our practical decision making seems to be “a paradigm of ‘neutral,’ ‘objective,’ or ‘reasonable’ procedure” (Haslanger 1993, 105).

The above procedure, however, can be problematic. This becomes obvious when moving to the social world. For example, aiming to discover women’s nature following the above procedure in patriarchal societies (like ours, according to MacKinnon) is highly problematic. MacKinnon believes that it is an observed regularity in our societies that women are submissive and object-like (and men are women’s objectifiers). This means that one might be led to the belief that women are by their nature submissive and object-like. (It should be noted here that MacKinnon, and also Haslanger and Langton following her, use ‘men’ and ‘women’ to refer to gender categories, which are socially (not biologically) defined: one is a woman or a man by virtue of one’s social position; see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender.) However, the belief that women are naturally submissive and object-like is false, since women have been made to be like that.

Women’s object-like status is not a natural fact, but rather a consequence of gender inequality. In structuring our world in such a way as to accommodate this allegedly natural fact about women, we sustain the existing situation of gender inequality. As MacKinnon vividly puts it: “if [we] look neutrally on the reality of gender so produced, the harm that has been done will not be perceptible as harm. It becomes just the way things are” (MacKinnon 1987, 59). Haslanger adds: “Once we have cast women as submissive and deferential ‘by nature’, then efforts to change this role appear unmotivated, even pointless. … These reflections suggest that what appeared to be a ‘neutral’ or ‘objective’ ideal, namely, the procedure of drawing on observed regularities to set constraints on practical decision making—is one which will, under conditions of gender hierarchy reinforce the social arrangements on which such hierarchy depends” (Haslanger 1993, 106).

Drawing on MacKinnon, Haslanger suggests that there are four conditions that are necessary in order for person A to objectify person B:

  1. Person A views and treats person B as an object for the satisfaction of A’s desire;
  2. Where person A desires person B to have some property, A forces B to have that property;
  3. Person A believes that person B has that property;
  4. Person A believes that person B has that property by nature (Haslanger 1993, 102–3).

When it comes to women’s sexual objectification by men, the above conditions go as following:

  1. Men view and treat women as objects of male sexual desire;
  2. Men desire women to be submissive and object-like and force them to submit;
  3. Men believe that women are in fact submissive and object-like;
  4. Men believe that women are in fact submissive and object-like by nature.

According to Haslanger, in order for an objectifier to ‘mask’ his power and believe that the observed differences between men and women are consequences of their natures, he must resort to a norm of aperspectivity; he must believe that his observations are not conditioned by his own social position, and that he has no impact on the circumstances under observation. Haslanger discusses a norm, which is often used by objectifiers, the norm of Assumed Objectivity, which consists of the following four sub-norms:

  1. Epistemic neutrality: one must take a genuine regularity in the behaviour of something to be a consequence of its nature.
  2. Practical neutrality: one must constrain one’s decision making to accommodate things’ natures.
  3. Absolute aperspectivity: one must count observed regularities as “genuine” when: (i) observations occur under normal circumstances, (ii) observations are not conditioned by the observer’s social position, (iii) the observer has not influenced the behaviour of items under observation.
  4. Assumed aperspectivity: one must believe that any regularity one observes is a “genuine” regularity, and so reveals the nature of the things under observation (Haslanger 1993, 106–7).

Haslanger argues that, under conditions of social hierarchy, the Norm of Assumed Objectivity would perpetuate the existing patterns of women’s objectification. Therefore, our efforts at social change would become unmotivated. The norm in question should be rejected in this case because it has bad practical consequences for women, while serving the interests of men (it is pragmatically bad). Furthermore, Haslanger argues that the norm of Assumed Objectivity should be rejected because it yields false beliefs, like the belief that women are submissive and object-like by their nature (it is epistemically bad) (Haslanger 1993, 108–115).

Langton agrees with Haslanger that, under conditions of social hierarchy, the norm of Assumed Objectivity is problematic and therefore should be rejected. Her reasons are twofold: First of all, (as Haslanger also noted) because it yields false beliefs; beliefs which do not fit the world at all, like the belief that women are object-like by nature. Secondly, because it yields true but unjustified beliefs, beliefs that are true “for the wrong reasons” (Langton 1993, 383); for example, the belief that women are actually submissive and object-like. The belief is unjustified, according to Langton, because of its direction of fit. In this case, Langton explains, instead of men arranging their belief to fit the world, the world arranges itself to fit the belief of men. Those people who occupy a position of power and pursue the norm of Assumed Objectivity will make the world conform to their belief (Langton 1993, 383).

Langton explains that objectivity is about the ways in which the mind conforms to the world (the way in which our beliefs arrange themselves to fit the world). When someone is objective, his or her beliefs have the right direction of fit: the beliefs are arranged in order to fit the way the world is. Objectification, on the other hand, is about the ways in which the world conforms to mind (conforms to our beliefs). An objectifier’s beliefs have the wrong direction of fit: the objectifier arranges the world in order to fit his or her beliefs, which are influenced by his or her desires, instead of arranging his or her beliefs to fit the way the world actually is. Objectification, then, is a process in which the social world comes to be shaped by desire and belief. An objectifier thinks that her or his beliefs have come to fit the world, where in fact the world has come to fit her or his beliefs.

When it comes to the objectification of women, Langton explains that women become submissive and object-like because of men’s desires and beliefs. Men desire women to be this way, and, if they have power, they force women to become this way. Following the norm of Assumed Objectivity, then, men form the belief that women are in fact submissive and object-like, and also that women are like that due to their nature. So, when it comes to women’s objectification, the world conforms to men’s minds. Men’s beliefs, however, have the wrong direction of fit because men arrange the world to fit their beliefs and desires about women being submissive and object-like. The norm of Assumed Objectivity, then, yields the belief that women are submissive and object-like, which is true but has the wrong direction of fit (Langton 2000, 138–142), along with the false belief that women are naturally this way. (For a further discussion about beliefs with an anomalous direction of fit, as well as a discussion of the mechanisms that are responsible for generating them, see also Langton’s work on ‘projection’ and its role in women’s objectification in her 2004 article “Projection and Objectification”. For a criticism of Langton’s argument that the norm of Assumed Objectivity is responsible for yielding beliefs that are true but have a wrong direction of fit, see Papadaki 2008.)

5. The possibility of positive objectification

So far, we have looked at various concerns regarding the wrongness involved in objectification. A number of thinkers, however, have challenged the idea that objectification is always morally problematic.

Alan Soble questions the widely held Kantian view according to which human dignity is something that people have. He argues that objectification is not inappropriate. Everyone is already only an object and being only an object is not necessarily a bad thing. In one sense, then, no one can be objectified because no one has the higher ontological status that is required to be reduce-able by objectification. In another sense, everyone is vulnerable to objectification, and everyone can and may be objectified, because to do so is to take them to their correct ontological level. He writes:

The claim that we should treat people as ‘persons’ and not dehumanise them is to reify, is to anthropomorphise humans and consider them more than they are. Do not treat people as objects, we are told. Why not? Because, goes the answer, people qua persons deserve not to be treated as objects. What a nice bit of illusory chauvinism. People are not as grand as we make them out to be, would like them to be, or hope them to be. (Soble 2002b, 53–4)

In the case of pornography, then, there is nothing wrong, according to Soble, with treating pornographic actors and models as objects for sexual pleasure and deny their humanity. That is because there is no negative objectification that needs to be taken into moral account. Soble adds that pornography’s task is in fact a good one; pornography takes these people (both men and women), who according to him are good at sex, and makes sure that they do something with their lives (Soble 2002b).

Leslie Green is another thinker who argues that it is permissible and also required to treat people as objects. As Green explains, people are embodied, extended in space, they exist in time, and they are subject to the laws of nature. People, however, are clearly more than objects. What is problematic therefore, according to Green, is to treat a person merely as an object, merely as a means to one’s own ends. We can treat other people as means only if we at the same time respect their integrity as agents with their own purposes (Green 2000, 44).

Green points to Kant’s Categorical Imperative, according to which the prohibition is against treating a person merely as means, and not at the same time as an end. As Green emphasises, there is no prohibition against treating a person as a means (as an instrument) (Green 2000, 44). In fact, Green holds, “we must treat others as instruments, for we need their skills, their company, and their bodies—in fact, there is little that we social creatures can do on our own, and so little that is fulfilling” (Green 2000, 45–6). According to Green, when people are old, severely disabled, or chronically unemployed what they fear the most is that they no longer are of use to others. As Green puts it, “they miss not only their diminished agency, but also their diminished objectivity. … They become … subjectified” (Green 2000, 46).

Martha Nussbaum too aims to challenge the widely-held idea that objectification is inconsistent with respect for a person’s humanity. She offers a systematic analysis of objectification, a concept not at all easy to define and one that writers on the topic have not sufficiently clarified, as she acknowledges (Nussbaum 1995, 251).

Objectification, for Nussbaum is the seeing and/or treating a person as an object; it involves treating one thing as another: one is treating as an object what in fact is not an object, but a human being (Nussbaum 1995, 256–7). Nussbaum, then, disagrees with Green’s view that people are partly objects. According to Nussbaum, there are seven features involved in the idea of objectification: instrumentality, denial of autonomy, inertness, fungibility, violability, ownership, denial of subjectivity. A detailed exposition of these seven features is provided in the introduction of this entry.

According to Nussbaum, a person is objectified when they are seen and/or treated in one or more of the above seven ways. Instrumentality, then, Nussbaum points out, the core notion of Kant’s, MacKinnon’s, Dworkin’s, as well as Green’s conceptions of objectification, is only one of the ways a person can be treated as an object. (Nussbaum does believe, however, that, among these seven notions, instrumentality is especially problematic, and is often linked to other forms of objectification (Nussbaum 1995, 265)). Nussbaum’s conception of objectification, then, is broader than Kant/MacKinnon/Dworkin’s because objectification for Nussbaum is not merely defined in terms of instrumentalisation, and also because it can take place when a person is only seen, but not treated, as an object (seen in one or more of the above seven ways that she mentions).

According to Nussbaum, objectification need not have devastating consequences to a person’s humanity. In fact, Nussbaum criticises MacKinnon and Dworkin for conceiving of objectification as a necessarily negative phenomenon (Nussbaum 1995, 273). Nussbaum believes that it is possible that “some features of objectification… may in fact in some circumstances… be even wonderful features of sexual life”, and so “the term objectification can also be used… in a more positive spirit. Seeing this will require … seeing how the allegedly impossible combination between (a form of) objectification and equality, respect, and consent might after all be possible” (Nussbaum 1995, 251).

According to Nussbaum, then: “In the matter of objectification context is everything. … in many if not all cases, the difference between an objectionable and a benign use of objectification will be made by the overall context of the human relationship” (Nussbaum 1995, 271); “… objectification has features that may be either good or bad, depending upon the overall context” (Nussbaum 1995, 251). Objectification is negative, when it takes place in a context where equality, respect and consent are absent. Among the negative objectification cases she discusses in her article are Hankinson’s Isabelle and Veronique, the magazine Playboy, and James’s The Golden Bowl. And it is benign/positive, when it is compatible with equality, respect and consent. Nussbaum gives an example of benign objectification: “If I am lying around with my lover on the bed, and use his stomach as a pillow there seems to be nothing at all baneful about this, provided that I do so with his consent (or, if he is asleep, with a reasonable belief that he would not mind), and without causing him pain, provided as well, that I do so in the context of a relationship in which he is generally treated as more than a pillow” (Nussbaum 1995, 265).

Nussbaum believes that ‘Lawrentian objectification’ (objectification occurring between the lovers in D. H. Lawrence’s novels) is a clear example of positive objectification. The passage from Lady Chatterley’s Lover that she quotes in her article describes a sex scene between two lovers. Connie and Mellors, in a context characterised by rough social equality and respect, identify each other with their body parts, they “… put aside their individuality and become identified with their bodily organs. They see one another in terms of those organs” (Nussbaum 1995, 275). Consequently, the two lovers deny each other’s autonomy and subjectivity, when engaging in the sex act.

However, Nussbaum explains, “when there is loss of autonomy in sex, the context is… one in which on the whole, autonomy is respected and promoted. … Again, when there is loss of subjectivity in the moment of lovemaking, this can be and frequently is accompanied by an intense concern for the subjectivity of the partner at other moments…” (Nussbaum 1995, 274–6). As Nussbaum also emphasises in her latest essay on objectification, a person’s “chosen resignation of autonomous self-direction, or her willed passivity may be compatible with, and even a valued part of, a relationship in which the woman is treated as an end for her own sake… as a full fledged human being” (Nussbaum 2007, 51). Furthermore, Connie and Mellors do not treat each other merely as means for their purposes, according to Nussbaum. Even though they treat each other as tools for sexual pleasure, they generally regard each other as more than that. The two lovers, then, are equal and they treat one another as objects in a way that is consistent with respecting each other as human beings.

Nussbaum’s list of the seven features involved in objectification and the relations that exist between them provides perhaps the most systematic analysis of the concept of objectification to date. But Papadaki has argued that Nussbaum’s conception is too broad (Papadaki 2010a). A person is objectified, according to Nussbaum, if they are seen and/or treated as an object (in one or more of the seven ways that she mentions). If every time a person is treated (or merely seen) by another, say, as an instrument (not a mere instrument) for some further purpose, we take it that the person in question is objectified, then it seems that in our daily lives we objectify nearly everyone, including ourselves. Inevitably, we use each other and ourselves instrumentally all the time (for instance, I use a taxi driver as a means to get to my destination, I use myself as a means to prepare a meal, etc). Papadaki argues that if objectification is to be a meaningful concept, we need to restrict it. Halwani is also in favor of a narrower conception of objectification. He argues that we are better off with a definition of objectification that includes “only treatment or behavior towards someone”. According to this view, if someone merely sees or regards another in a sexual way, there is no objectification. Such a definition, Halwani suggests, “…is less cluttered and more accurately reflects the problem with objectification: its impact on the objectified (often thought as victims)” (Halwani 2008, 342 and Halwani 2010, 187–8). He believes that we are better off arguing that, in Nussbaum’s positive objectification cases, there is no objectification to begin with. This is better than “engaging in mental gymnastics to try to show that there is objectification but that it is okay or good” (Halwani 2010, 197). Nussbaum herself seems to be concerned, at times, about her objectification category being too inclusive. For example, she states that sometimes we do not treat the occurrence of only one of the seven notions on her list as sufficient for objectification (Nussbaum 1995, 258). However, Papadaki suggests, she does not give us enough guidance as to how we can decide whether objectification is present when a person is treated in one of the seven ways she mentions. In addition, she suggests that once objectification’s association with the morally problematic is weakened, there is the risk that the fight against (negative) objectification might be undermined (Papadaki 2010a, 27–31).

6. The futility of specifying the marks and features of objectification

Recently, Nancy Bauer has expressed scepticism regarding the possibility of laying out a set of criteria for what counts as sexual objectification. She argues that it is difficult to specify the marks and features of a term that plays a normative role in our mutually shared worldview. And if the term in question is important to my outlook, but not yours, she claims that it is impossible for me to specify criteria for the term’s application that pick out the phenomenon from your point of view. She writes: “If the term ‘sexual objectification’ is critical in helping you make sense of the world as you see it, then, more or less, you will know sexual objectification when you see it. … Insofar as the philosophical literature sets out to delineate the marks and features of sexual objectification, it is bound not only to fail but to miss the very phenomenon it seeks to illuminate” (Bauer 2015, part I).

Regarding the feminist concept of sexual objectification, Bauer explains that it was coined as part of a feminist shift in how to understand the world and one’s experience in it. According to the shift in question, in a context in which women experience widespread, systematic, diachronic, and structural disadvantages, certain ways of perceiving and representing women tend to cause them material and psychological harm. Bauer argues that once someone participates in this shift, the term ‘sexual objectification’ will ‘light up’ the relevant phenomena, and the person in question will see objectification everywhere she looks in contemporary culture. This is the case even if she is not in a position to specify exactly its marks and features. Bauer explains that ‘lighting up’ in certain cases may take the form of a conversion experience that consists in our seeing things that we did not see before. For Bauer, the metaphor of ‘lighting up’ is crucial in thinking about sexual objectification and other terms that make sense only in a context of a systematic normative way of understanding the world (what she calls a ‘worldview’ (Bauer, forthcoming, part II)).

7. Conclusion

Undoubtedly, objectification is a concept difficult to define, as Nussbaum also acknowledges, since it turns out to be ‘slippery’ and ‘multiple’ (Nussbaum 1995, 251). How to best to define objectification, if we can define it at all, and whether this notion should be restricted to describe the morally objectionable, or expanded to cover benign and/or positive aspects of the way we see and treat each other in our daily lives is an ongoing debate. Much recent feminist work has been devoted to comprehensive philosophical analyses of objectification, which will hopefully lead to more complete and coherent understandings of this notion.


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