Pornography and Censorship

First published Wed May 5, 2004; substantive revision Thu Sep 22, 2022

Can a government legitimately prevent consenting adults from publishing and viewing pornography in private, or would this be an unjustified violation of basic freedoms?

This question lies at the heart of a debate that raises fundamental issues about just when, and on what grounds, the state is justified in using its coercive powers to limit individual freedom.

Traditionally, liberals defended the freedom of consenting adults to publish and consume pornography in private from moral and religious conservatives who wanted pornography banned for its (alleged) obscenity and morally corrupting influence on consumers. In more recent times, however, the pornography debate has taken on a somewhat new and surprising shape. Some feminists have found themselves allied with their traditional conservative foes in calling on the state to regulate (some) pornography—although the primary focus of feminist concern is not obscenity, but rather on (alleged) harms to women. And some liberals have joined pro-censorship feminists in suggesting that the harms that violent, degrading and misogynistic pornography causes to women’s social standing and opportunities may be sufficiently great to justify legal regulation of it. Many others, both liberals and feminists, remain unconvinced. They are doubtful that pornography is a significant cause of sexual oppression, or that the “blunt and treacherous” instrument of the law is the best solution to pornography’s harms. As we shall see, debates over whether and how (some) pornography is harmful, and what should be done about harmful types of pornography, are very much alive (Altman and Watson 2018; McGowan 2019; Mikkola 2019).

1. What is Pornography?

“I can’t define pornography,” one judge once famously said, “but I know it when I see it” (Justice Stewart in Jacobellis v. Ohio 378 US 184 [1964]). Can we do better?

The word “pornography” comes from the Greek for writing about prostitutes. However, the etymology of the term is not much of a guide to current usage, since many of the things commonly called “pornography” nowadays are neither literally written nor literally about prostitutes.

Here is a first, simple definition. Pornography is any material (either pictures or words) that is sexually explicit. This definition of pornography may pick out different types of material in different contexts, since what is viewed as sexually explicit can vary from culture to culture and over time. “Sexually explicit” functions as a kind of indexical term, picking out different features depending on what has certain effects or breaks certain taboos in different contexts and cultures. Displays of women’s uncovered ankles count as sexually explicit in some cultures, but not in most western cultures nowadays (although they once did: the display of a female ankle in Victorian times was regarded as most risqué). There may be borderline cases too: do displays of bared breasts still count as sexually explicit in various contemporary western cultures? However, some material seems clearly to count as sexually explicit in many contexts today: in particular, audio, written or visual representations of sexual acts (e.g., sexual intercourse, oral sex) and exposed body parts (e.g., the vagina, anus and penis-especially the erect penis).

However, this first simple definition is not quite right. Anatomy textbooks for medical students are sexually explicit – they depict exposed genitalia, for example – but are rarely, if ever, viewed as pornography. Sexual explicitness may be a necessary condition for material to count as pornographic, but it does not seem to be sufficient. So, something needs to be added to the simple definition. What else might be required?

Here is a second definition. Pornography is sexually explicit material (verbal or pictorial) that is primarily designed to produce sexual arousal in viewers. This definition is better: it deals with the problem of anatomy textbooks and the like. Indeed, this definition is one that is frequently employed (or presupposed) in discussions of pornography and censorship (e.g., Williams 1981). Of course, it is important to distinguish here between sexually explicit material that is wholly or primarily designed to produce sexual arousal (i.e., whose only or overriding aim is to produce sexual arousal) and material whose aim is to do this in order to make some other artistic or political point. The film Last Tango in Paris arguably aims to arouse audiences, but this is not its primary aim. It does so in order to make a broader political point.

Within the general class of pornography, so defined, there is enormous variety in content. For example, some material depicts women, and sometimes men, in postures of sexual display (e.g., Playboy centerfolds). Some depicts non-violent sexual acts (both homosexual and heterosexual) between adults portrayed as equal and consenting participants. Feminist pornography is a subset of pornography (in this general sense) that aims to subvert traditional gender roles, bodies, and narratives unreflectively endorsed by mainstream heterosexual pornography. Other sexually explicit representations depict acts of violent coercion: people being whipped, beaten, bound, tortured, mutilated, raped and even killed. Some sexually explicit material may be degrading without necessarily being overtly violent. This material depicts people (most often women) in positions of servility and subordination in their sexual relations with others, or engaged in sexual acts that many people would regard as humiliating. Some sexually explicit material involves or depicts children. Some portrays bestiality and necrophilia; and so on. Researchers often distinguish between ‘hardcore’ and ‘softcore’ porn; ‘egalitarian’ and ‘inegalitarian’ porn; or between ‘violent’, ‘non-violent and degrading’, and ‘non-violent and non-degrading’ pornography, since different types of pornography may be harmful to different degrees and in different ways.

The decades following the advent of the internet have seen an explosion in the amount of readily accessible pornography; and pornography use is common among adolescents as well as adults. Pornography production and distribution is now a massive and highly profitable international industry, with a multibillion-dollar annual turnover.

The two definitions considered above are purely descriptive: They leave it open whether pornography is good or bad. By contrast, a third approach to defining pornography is value-laden. Sometimes when people describe something (e.g., a book such as Tropic of Capricorn or a film such as Baise Moi) as “pornographic,” they seem to be doing more than simply dispassionately describing its sexually explicit content or the intentions of its producers—indeed, in these debates, the intentions of producers are sometimes treated as irrelevant to the work’s status as pornography. They seem to be saying, in addition, that it is bad—and perhaps also that its badness is not redeemed by other artistic, literary, or political merit the work may possess. (Consider, for example, how the term “visual pornography” is sometimes used to condemn certain artworks, often when the work is not even sexually explicit.)

This suggests a third definition: pornography is sexually explicit material designed to produce sexual arousal in consumers that is bad in a certain way. This definition of pornography is value-laden because it is built into the definition that pornography is (somehow) bad; material that is not bad in the relevant way is not pornography. It might be that all and only sexually explicit material is bad in the relevant way (e.g., obscene), in which case “pornography” will refer to all and only the class of sexually explicit materials. But it may be that only some sexually explicit material has the (allegedly) objectionable property (e.g., subordinating women), in which case only that objectionable subset of sexually explicit material will count as pornography. And, of course, it is possible that no sexually explicit material is bad in the relevant way (e.g., harmful to women), in which case we would have an error theory about pornography: there would be no pornography, so defined, merely harmless, sexually explicit “erotica”.

Several influential approaches define pornography as sexually explicit material that is (somehow) bad—although they disagree both about why pornography is bad and exactly what materials are pornographic. A particularly influential approach, which has provided the dominant legal framework for understanding pornography in the U.S. and U.K., has been to define pornography in terms of obscenity. Material counts as obscene if an average, reasonable person applying community standards would find the work as a whole to lack any serious literary, artistic, political, or scientific value, and the work describes or depicts in an obvious way offensive sexual conduct. On this conception, which is employed by many of pornography’s conservative critics, pornography should be regulated because it transgresses certain (allegedly) shared community standards of morality or decency, and thus counts as obscene. Conservatives usually class all sexually explicit material—even egalitarian sexually explicit “erotica”—within the category of pornography since conservatives typically view all such material as obscene. (For critical discussions of this obscenity approach, see Schauer 1982; Feinberg 1987; MacKinnon 1987.)

But the badness of pornography need not reside in obscenity. Pornography might be defined, not as sexually explicit material that is obscene, but as sexually explicit material that harms women. Thus, many contemporary feminist definitions define “pornography” as material (pictures and/or words) that depicts women’s subordination in such a way as to endorse, encourage or eroticize it (Longino 1980; MacKinnon 1987). This definition of pornography leaves it open in principle that there might be sexually explicit material that is not pornography: sexually explicit material that does not depict women’s subordination, or that depicts but does not endorse it, will count as harmless “erotica.” Determining whether a given film or image functions to endorse oppressive social hierarchies is complex and context-sensitive; it depends not simply on the intrinsic content of the film or image, or on the intentions of its creators, but also on how it is interpreted or used on a particular occasion (McGowan 2019, Ch. 6). The very same material (e.g., a graphic documentary film about the sex trade) could count as pornographic in one context (e.g., if used for masturbation) but not in another (e.g., when shown in gender studies class). Likewise, although it may depict sexual relations of domination and subordination, BDSM material may not function to endorse oppressive sexual hierarchies on many or most occasions of use. If so, it would not be pornographic in this current value-laden sense, but rather harmless “erotica”.

Of course, women may not be the only people harmed by the production or consumption of certain sorts of sexually explicit material. The consumption of sexually explicit material has often been thought to be harmful to its (predominantly male) consumers: for example, by making them less likely to have long-term, loving sexual relationships. Many people strongly object to “child pornography,” that subset of sexually explicit material that involves depictions of actual children engaged in sexual activity. This class of sexually explicit material is widely regarded as objectionable because it involves the actual sexual exploitation of children, together with a permanent record of that abuse which may further harm their interests.

I have discussed how, on this third approach to defining “pornography” as sexually explicit material that is bad or harmful in a certain way, there are three possibilities: “pornography” might name all, some or even no sexually explicit material, depending on what (if any) class of sexually explicit material is in fact bad in the relevant way. But it is worth noting that there is an interesting fourth possibility. It is possible that some non-sexually explicit material might also turn out to be bad in the relevant way. It might be that some non-sexually explicit material is obscene in the relevant sense (e.g., Andres Serrano’s famously controversial artwork entitled “Piss Christ,” which displays a plastic crucifix in urine with cow’s blood). Or it might turn out that non-sexually explicit advertising that depicts women in positions of sexual servility in such a way as to endorse or eroticize that subordination is also bad in the relevant way. (As many philosophers might be inclined to put the point, the sexually explicit materials that subordinate women via their depiction of women as subordinate may turn out not to form a natural kind.) In this case, there are two options. “Pornography” might be taken to name only the sexually explicit subset of material that is bad in the relevant sense (e.g., that depicts women as men’s sexual subordinates in such a way as to endorse their subordination); or “pornography” might be taken to refer to all the material that is bad in that way, whether that material is sexually explicit or not. The former option would clearly stick more closely to the everyday conception of pornography as involving the sexually explicit. But it might be that this ordinary conception, on reflection, turns out not to capture what is of moral and political importance. There may thus be a theoretical reason to conceive of pornography more broadly than simply sexually explicit material that is bad in a certain way, or perhaps simply to invent a new term that captures the theoretically interesting kind. Some feminists seem inclined to this broader approach, suggesting that material that merely implies certain messages about sex can sometimes count as pornography if it contributes in certain ways to sexualized violence or oppression (Longino 1980; MacKinnon 1984). This may include some non-sexually explicit material that would not ordinarily be thought of as pornography: for example, photographs in artwork, advertising or fashion spreads that depict women bound, chained, or bruised in such a way as to endorse or eroticize this treatment.

The term “pornography” is used in all of these different ways in everyday discourse and debate, as well as in philosophical discussions. Sometimes it is used to mean merely material which is sexually explicit; sometimes it is used to mean material which is sexually explicit and objectionable in some particular way; and so on. (For further discussion, see Rea 2001.) We do not need to choose between these different definitions, for all of them capture something of the term’s everyday use and different definitions may be useful for different purposes. What matters crucially is that we know which definition is being used on a particular occasion. The fact that “pornography” has different senses can have two very unfortunate consequences if these differences are not clearly noted and kept in mind: It can make it seem that there is disagreement when there is not; and it can obscure the real nature of the disagreement when there is.

Here is one topical example of how this might happen. Some feminists object to pornography on the grounds that it harms women. Others claim that pornography may not always be harmful to women and may even sometimes be liberating and beneficial. It seems that there is genuine disagreement here. But is there? Not necessarily. For the two sides might mean different things by “pornography.” Suppose that feminists who object to pornography are defining “pornography” as sexually explicit material that subordinates women. So, pornography, for them, is that subset of sexually explicit material that in fact harms women. This definition makes it definitionally true that pornography, wherever it exists, is bad for women. Those who defend pornography, however, may be using “pornography” to mean simply sexually explicit material aimed or used primarily for sexual arousal (regardless of whether it is harmful to women). There may thus be no genuine disagreement here, for both sides might agree that sexually explicit material that harms women is objectionable. They might also agree that there is nothing objectionable about sexually explicit material that does not harm women (or anyone else). If different parties are using “pornography” in different senses they may be talking past each other, perhaps without realizing it.

Two really substantive issues at stake in the feminist debate over pornography are 1) whether any sexually explicit material is in fact harmful to women; and, if so, what should be done about it?; and 2) whether all sexually explicit material is in fact harmful to women; and, if so, what should be done about it? (We can thus phrase two of the important issues, if we like, without mentioning “pornography” at all.)

2. The Shape of the Traditional Pornography Debate

2.1 Conservative Arguments for Censorship

Until comparatively recently, the main opposition to pornography came from moral and religious conservatives, who argue that pornography should be banned because its sexually explicit content is obscene and morally corrupting. By “pornography,” conservatives usually mean simply sexually explicit material (either pictures or words), since conservatives typically view all such material as obscene.

According to conservatives, the sexually explicit content of pornography is an affront to decent family and religious values and deeply offensive to a significant portion of citizens who hold these values. The consumption of pornography is also bad for society. It undermines and destabilizes the moral fabric of a decent and stable society by encouraging sexual promiscuity, deviant sexual practices and other attitudes and behaviour that threaten traditional family and religious institutions and which conservatives regard as intrinsically morally wrong. Furthermore, pornography is bad for those who consume it, corrupting their character and preventing them from leading a good and worthwhile life in accordance with family and religious values.

According to conservatives, the state is justified in using its coercive power to uphold and enforce a community’s moral convictions and to prevent citizens from engaging in activities that offend prevailing community standards of morality and decency (e.g., Devlin 1968; Sandel 1984.) This position is sometimes called “legal moralism.” Governments also have a responsibility to prevent citizens from harming themselves. This is true even where the citizen is not a child (who may not yet be competent to make responsible judgements for themselves about what is in their own best interests), but a mature adult who is voluntarily engaged in an activity which they judge to be desirable and which causes no harm to others. The view that the state is entitled to interfere with the freedom of mentally competent adults against their will for their own good is often called “legal paternalism.”

Conservatives therefore think that it is entirely legitimate for the state to prohibit consenting adults from publishing and viewing pornography, even in private, in order to protect the moral health of would-be consumers and of society as a whole (Baird and Rosenbaum 1991).

2.2 The Traditional Liberal Defense of a Right to Pornography

Traditional liberal defenders of pornography famously disagree, rejecting both the principle of legal moralism and the principle of legal paternalism, at least where consenting adults are concerned. This is not to say that liberal defenders of pornography necessarily approve of it. Indeed, they frequently personally dislike and disapprove of pornography – especially violent and degrading pornography. Many concede that pornography – by which they usually mean sexually explicit material whose primary function is to produce sexual arousal in viewers – is “low value” speech: speech that contributes little, if anything, of intellectual, artistic, literary or political merit to the moral and social environment. But this does not mean that it should not be protected – quite the opposite. A vital principle is at stake for liberals in the debate over pornography and censorship. The principle is that mentally competent adults must not be prevented from expressing their own convictions, or from indulging their own private tastes, simply on the grounds that, in the opinion of others, those convictions or tastes are mistaken, offensive or unworthy. Moral majorities must not be allowed to use the law to suppress dissenting minority opinions or to force their own moral convictions on others. The underlying liberal sentiment here is nicely captured in the famous adage (often attributed to the French philosopher, Voltaire): “I disapprove of what you say, but I will defend to the death your right to say it.”[1]

For liberals, there is a very strong presumption in favor of individual freedom and against state regulation that interferes with that freedom. The only ground that liberals typically regard as providing a legitimate reason for state restrictions on individual freedom is in order to prevent harm to others. Hence, in debates over censorship and other forms of state regulation that restrict the liberty of individuals against their will, the burden of proof is always firmly on those who argue for censorship to demonstrate that the speech or conduct in question causes significant harm to individuals other than those consenting adults directly involved in its production and use. It must either be shown to directly cause actual physical violence to others (e.g., murder, rape, assault, battery), on a narrower understanding of “harm”; or to deliberately or negligently violate sufficiently important interests or rights of others, on a broader, interest-based conception of “harm”. (For further discussion of these different conceptions of harm to others, see Dyzenhaus 1992; Feinberg 1987.)

Liberals have traditionally defended a right to pornography on three main grounds. (The “right to pornography” here, and in what follows, means the negative right of consenting adults not to be prevented from making, publishing, exhibiting, distributing and consuming pornography in private). The first ground is freedom of speech or expression, which protects the freedom of individuals (in this case, pornographers) to express their opinions and to communicate those opinions to others, however mistaken, disagreeable or offensive others may find them.[2] Liberals have tended to conceive of freedom, including freedom of expression, as negative freedom – as non-interference by others – rather than as positive freedom, which involves having the positive goods and facilities required to exercise the freedom.[3] Freedom is thus something that individuals have just so long as there are no coercive external obstacles – notably, physical or legal restrictions – in their way.

Few liberals nowadays think that the (negative) right to freedom of speech is an absolute right: a freedom that can never legitimately be restricted by the state. If the speech causes sufficiently great harm to others, then the state may have a legitimate interest in regulating or preventing it. There is no simple general formula or algorithm for determining when the harm caused to others is “sufficiently great” to justify legal restrictions in the case of speech and more generally. This will depend on the outcome of a complex process of carefully weighing and balancing the strength and nature of the harm and the competing interests at stake, and an analysis of the costs and benefits of alternative policies, that needs to be undertaken on a case-by-case basis.

However, when it comes to legislation that interferes with free speech, the liberal presumption against legislation is especially high. For liberals take freedom of expression to be an especially important right that takes precedence over most other rights and interests (including equality) should they ever conflict. Levels of harm that would normally be sufficient to justify regulating the conduct which causes them may not be sufficiently great to justify restrictions in cases where the harm is caused by speech or expression. Hence, for liberals, justifying censorship of pornography requires that there is extremely reliable evidence to show that the publication or voluntary private consumption of pornography by consenting adults causes especially great and serious harm to others. The harm caused by expression must be very certain and very great before it is legitimate for a state to prohibit it. We would be justified in banning a certain type of pornography (e.g., positive rape depictions) only when we are very sure that, on average, tokens of that type (i.e., most particular positive rape depictions) cause very great harm.

This traditional free speech defense assumes (generally without much argument) that pornography is a form of speech or expression, in the sense of ‘speech’ relevant to a free speech principle. However, this assumption has been questioned. Frederick Schauer (1982) argues that a free speech principle is designed to cover only acts of mental communication. “Hardcore” pornography, however, is not primarily in the business of mental communication: Its primary function is not to communicate ideas, but rather to arouse audiences sexually. In this respect, it is more akin to a mechanical sex toy than a political pamphlet. If so, then just as production and use of sex toys cannot be defended on free speech grounds, so there is no free speech defense of hardcore pornography since hardcore pornography is not “speech” in the relevant sense. If this line of argument is correct, legal restrictions on production and consumption of pornography should not be seen as raising any free speech concerns whatsoever.

Secondly, liberals have defended a right to pornography on the grounds of a right to privacy (or “moral independence,” as one prominent liberal defender of pornography, Ronald Dworkin [1985], calls it), which protects a sphere of private activity within which individuals can explore and indulge their own personal tastes and convictions, free from the threat of coercive pressure or interference by the state and other individuals. Andrew Altman (2018) defends a right to pornography as part of a right to sexual autonomy. The specter of state intrusion into the private lives of individuals underpins much of the liberal discomfort about censorship of pornography.

Like the right to freedom of speech, the liberal commitment to privacy is not absolute. It can be overridden if the private activities of individuals are such as to cause significant harm to others. Thus, if there is reliable evidence to suggest that the voluntary private consumption of pornography causes sufficiently great harm to others then – provided that this harm is sufficiently great and that state prohibitions are the only effective way of preventing it – the state would have a legitimate interest in prohibiting it.

But – and this is the third prong of the traditional liberal defense – pornography is comparatively harmless. Neither the expression of pornographic opinions, nor the indulging of a private taste for pornography, causes significant harm to others in the relevant sense of “harm” (i.e., crimes of physical violence or other significant, wrongful rights-violations). Hence, the publication and voluntary private consumption of pornography is none of the state’s business.

2.2.1 The Harm Principle: When is the State Justified in Restricting Individual Liberty?

These three central ingredients in the liberal defense of pornography find their classic expression in a famous and influential passage from John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty (1859). In this passage, Mill sets out the principle that underpins the prevailing liberal view about when it is justified for the state to coercively interfere with the liberty of its citizens. It is a principle that continues to provide the dominant liberal framework for the debate over pornography and censorship. Mill writes:

The only principle for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinion of others, to do so would be wise or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him, or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. To justify that, the conduct from which it is desired to deter him, must be calculated to produce evil to someone else. The only part of the conduct of any one, for which he is amenable to society, is that which concerns others. In the part which merely concerns himself, his independence is, of right, absolute (Mill 1975, 15).

Mill’s central claim is that society is justified in interfering with the freedom of mentally competent adults to say and do what they wish only when their conduct will cause harm to others. This has come to be known as the “harm principle”; and it forms the cornerstone of the traditional liberal defense of individual liberty. It protects the freedom of all mentally competent adults to live however they choose, so long as they do not harm others in the process.

Mill goes on to stress that the harm principle is meant to apply “only to human beings in the maturity of their faculties” (Mill 1975,15). So, the principle permits paternalistic intervention in the case of those who are not competent to make an informed decision about what is in their best interests for themselves, and so who “must be protected against their own actions as well as external injury” (Mill 1975,15): for example, young children or those adults whose decision-making abilities are temporarily or permanently impaired. Thus, if there is reliable evidence that consumption of violent or misogynistic pornography impairs adolescents’ ability to have successful long-term egalitarian sexual relationships, then there is a strong liberal case for enforcing tighter age-restrictions on consumption of pornography.

It is generally thought to follow that child pornography, which is taken to involve the actual sexual abuse or exploitation of children (with or without their apparent consent), can legitimately be banned in order to protect the interests of children, who are not yet competent to fully understand the nature of the choice they are making or to grasp the impact of their decisions on their present and future interests. For the same reason, liberals think that children can quite rightly be prevented by parents or by the state from purchasing or viewing pornography if this is thought likely to harm them. That child pornography should be banned is common ground between liberals and conservatives. However, pornography that involves the simulated abuse of children (for example, virtual child pornography, or consenting adult actors dressed up as schoolgirls) cannot legitimately be prohibited under the harm principle unless there is good evidence to suggest that consumption of this material causes significant harm to people other than those consenting adults involved in its production and consumption, for example, by causing those who consume it to abuse children or by eroticizing inequality. The U.S. Supreme Court has ruled that virtual child pornography is protected speech, partly on the basis that virtual child pornography does not harm actual children (Levy 2002).

We are now in a better position both to see what it would take for liberals to think that censorship of pornography is justified and why liberals have been so unsympathetic to the sort of argument against pornography that conservatives make. Conservatives wish to prevent mentally competent adults from publishing and consuming pornography on the grounds that the choice to consume pornography is deeply morally misguided. But, as Mill insists, this is not a sufficient warrant for coercive interference with individual liberty. Neither the state nor moral majorities are entitled to restrict the private choices and activities of individuals against their will simply because, in the opinion of state officials or the social majority, that way of life is unworthy or unrewarding. Mill thinks that this sort of legal moralism will lead inevitably to a terrible “tyranny of the majority,” crushing individual diversity and blocking human progress and flourishing.

However, following Mill, liberals are generally happy to allow that considerations of the individual or common good may entitle the state to use other, so-called non-coercive means to persuade citizens to make wise or better choices. Thus, public education campaigns designed to inform citizens of the dangers of smoking or excessive alcohol consumption, or to persuade them to make “wise” choices (for example, to eat more fruits and vegetables) may be justified. While others cannot force an individual to do something (or to forbear from doing it) when they are not harming others, it is entirely legitimate to seek to advise, instruct or persuade them. So, if there are reasons to think that pornography is not good for the individual who consumes it (say, because it makes them less likely to be able to have successful loving or long-term relationships), public education campaigns to warn consumers of these dangers may be justified. Indeed, education and debate is precisely the solution that liberals typically recommend to counter any harm that pornography may cause (e.g., Feinberg 1985; Donnerstein et al. 1987; R. Dworkin 1985; for further discussion of the counter-speech response, see Gelber 2021). This solution respects the freedom of rational agents to exercise their own rational capacities in deciding what to think and how to live.

However, liberals insist that if attempts at persuasion should fail, and where an individual’s conduct poses no significant threat to the physical security or interests of others, the state may not use coercive legal mechanisms to enforce these “wise” choices. “The only freedom which deserves the name is that of pursuing our own good in our own way, so long as we do not attempt to deprive others of theirs, or impede their efforts to obtain it” (Mill 1975, 18). For Mill, the individual person is in the best position to judge what is in their own best interests. Even if individuals may sometimes make bad choices, it is better in general that they be left free to make these mistakes, for no one’s opinion about the good life is infallible; and, in any case, a life lived “from the inside,” in accordance with values that the individual endorses, is more likely to be happy and fulfilling than a life where the individual is forced against their will to live as others believe best.

In an influential liberal defense of pornography, Ronald Dworkin expresses this commitment in terms of a right to “moral independence.” People, he says, “have the right not to suffer disadvantage in the distribution of social goods and opportunities, including disadvantages in the liberties permitted to them by the criminal law, just on the ground that their officials or fellow-citizens think that their opinions about the right way for them to lead their own lives are ignoble or wrong” (1985, 353). The fact, if it is one, that the majority of people in a society prefer that pornography be banned because they regard it as immoral or offensive is not a legitimate reason for interfering with (pornographers’) freedom of speech or for preventing consenting adults from consuming it in private. For allowing such illegitimate “external” preferences of a majority to dictate government policy would violate the right to moral independence of the producers and consumers of pornography. It would give moral majorities the power to dictate how members of minority or non-mainstream groups can live on the basis of the majority’s opinions about what sort of people are most worthy and what sorts of lives are worth living, and this violates liberal ideals of state neutrality and the basic right of all individuals to be treated with equal concern and respect.

2.2.2 Pornography and Offense: Justifying Restrictions on the Public Display of Pornography

However, Dworkin thinks, considerations of offense may provide some justification for preventing or restricting the public display of pornography so as to avoid its causing offense to non-consenting adults who might otherwise involuntarily or unwittingly be exposed to it. Joel Feinberg, another well-known liberal defender of pornography, agrees. But Feinberg thinks that such restrictions must be justified by a principle other than the harm principle, for he thinks that certain sorts of unpleasant psychological states are not in themselves harms. Feinberg calls this additional principle the offense principle. The offense principle says that “It is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it would probably be an effective way of preventing serious offense (as opposed to injury or harm) to persons other than the actor, and that it is probably a necessary means to that end (i.e., there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to the other values)” (Feinberg 1999, 78; for a more detailed discussion, see Feinberg 1985).

Like Dworkin, Feinberg thinks that the voluntary private consumption of pornography does not cause harm to others. Hence, wholesale criminal prohibitions on the publication and private voluntary consumption of pornography cannot be justified. But the public display of pornography may nonetheless constitute an “offensive nuisance” to non-consenting adults who are involuntarily exposed to it (just as neighbors who play loud music into the wee hours of the morning may be an “offensive nuisance”). Since the harm – or rather, pseudo-harm – of pornography is the offense it may cause unwitting viewers involuntarily exposed to it, the solution is to restrict its exhibition to domains where such involuntary exposure will not occur, such as inside well sign-posted adult bookshops and cinemas where those who will be offended will know not to venture (Feinberg 1983, 105–13.) Although this may prevent pornographers from distributing their opinions as widely as they might like and may also cause some minor inconvenience to consumers (who may have to go further out of their way to find and view pornography or suffer the embarrassment of having to sneak into known adult bookstores), these costs may be relatively small compared with the level of offense that involuntary exposure is likely to cause. Such restrictions on the public display of pornography would not amount to censorship, for pornographers are still free to publish and distribute their opinions. Nor would they violate consumers’ right to privacy, for pornography would be freely available for willing consumers to view in private. The Williams Committee Report on Obscenity and Film Censorship in England (Williams 1981) made a similar recommendation, pointing to general considerations of public decency that prevent offensive public displays of conduct (e.g., nudity or sexual intercourse) that is appropriately seen or done only in private. Susan Wendell (1983) also agrees that the public display of certain sorts of pornography – visual, audio and written material that depicts and condones the unjustified physical coercion of women or other human beings – should be prohibited, although her particular concern is to remove the anxiety that involuntarily exposure to such coercive material is likely to cause women and the harm it is likely to do to their self-esteem.

Liberal defenders of the right to pornography may thus allow that restrictions on its public display may be justified. But only if pornography can reliably be shown to cause significant harm to people other than those consenting adults involved in its production and consumption will there be a legitimate case for prohibiting its voluntary private consumption. When an individual’s private activities cause harm to others, they become no longer merely a private matter but of legitimate public interest; and the state may be justified in regulating them. Thus, Dworkin says, were excessive consumption of pornography shown to cause absenteeism from work, then the public and the state might have some legitimate interest in preventing it. But, Dworkin thinks, there is as yet no reliable evidence that firmly establishes that the voluntary private production or consumption of pornography by consenting adults causes this or any other sufficiently significant harm to others in the relevant sense of “harm.” Hence, pornography satisfies only harmless personal preferences for sexual gratification and is therefore none of the state’s business.

2.2.3 Dangers of Censorship

Liberals also have technical concerns about how censorship laws might work in practice. Many liberal (and feminist) objections to censorship of pornography point to the practical costs and dangers of censorship, arguing that even if pornography does cause some harm to others, the risks involved in censoring it are too great. They point to the difficulties involved in formulating a legal definition of “pornography” that will be sufficiently precise to minimize the danger that censorship laws targeting pornography will be used (intentionally or unintentionally) to censor other unpopular material, including valuable literary, artistic and political works. Censoring pornography may thus place us on a dangerous slippery slope to further censorship of other material; and may have a general chilling effect on expression, making people reluctant to say or publish things that might be construed as pornography and for which they could be prosecuted. (For further discussion, see Williams 1981; Schauer 1982; Easton, 1994.)

These are significant dangers; and they need to be carefully taken into account in weighing the costs and benefits of censorship as a solution to any harm that pornography might cause. But it is worth noting that they are inherent in many existing forms of legislation and are not always taken to be insoluble nor to constitute a decisive reason against censorship in themselves.

3. Liberal Dissent

Although traditional defenders of a right to pornography have been liberals, it is important to note that not all contemporary liberals defend such a right. Indeed, the question of whether there might be good liberal grounds for prohibiting or otherwise regulating the voluntary private consumption of (some) pornography has become the subject of increasing and lively debate. Inspired by more recent feminist arguments against pornography, some scholars argue that the liberal commitment to protecting individual autonomy, equality, freedom of expression and other important liberal values may in fact support a policy that restricts production and consumption of certain kinds of pornography rather than the permissive stance that liberals have traditionally favored (Brison 1998, 2013; Dyzenhaus 1992; Easton 1994, 42–51; Langton 1990; McGowan 2019; Okin 1987; Watson 2007, 2018; West 2003). These theorists do not normally reject the harm principle, broadly understood: They generally agree that the crucial question in determining whether censorship of pornography is justified is whether there is reliable evidence to show that the publication or viewing of pornography by consenting adults causes sufficiently great harm to significant interests of others. Rather, they are open to the legitimacy of censorship because they think that the production and consumption of certain sorts of sexually explicit material—in particular, violent pornography and non-violent but degrading pornography—may in fact cause sufficiently significant harm to others, particularly women.

These theorists often follow social science researchers in drawing more fine-grained distinctions within the general category of pornography (i.e., the sexually explicit material whose primary function is to produce sexual arousal in those who view or read them). They often distinguish between 1) violent pornography, 2) non-violent but degrading pornography, and 3) non-violent and non-degrading pornography, since there is some evidence to suggest that some of these materials (e.g., in categories 1 and 2) may be harmful in ways that other material (e.g., category 3) is not.

One important dimension of the disagreement between those liberals who defend a right to pornography and those who think that liberals should be open to the legitimacy of censorship is empirical: They disagree about the crucial empirical issue of whether there is reliable evidence to show that the production and consumption of pornography by consenting adults in fact causes harm to others, particularly women. But frequently they also disagree about some important conceptual matters as well. In particular, they may disagree (albeit sometimes implicitly) about how three central elements of the harm principle should be understood: (i) exactly what counts as “harm” to others in the relevant sense; (ii) when can we say that something is a “cause,” or a sufficiently “direct cause,” of a harm; and (iii) how much harm to others is “sufficiently great” to justify coercive sanctions against the speech or conduct that produces it. In other words, they disagree about how the harm principle should be interpreted and applied.

Many argue that more traditional liberal conceptions of the interests or rights that individuals have, and so of what activities can cause harm to them, is too narrow. It ignores the way in which threats to individuals’ interests can come not just from the state, but also from other social practices and circumstances (e.g., substantive socio-economic disadvantage) that can prevent the meaningful exercise of freedom just as effectively. The state may thus have a legitimate role to play in promoting the social conditions that enable individuals to exercise their rights in meaningful ways and in regulating such activities of non-governmental agents or groups as may serve significantly to infringe them.

4. Feminist Approaches

4.1 Feminist Arguments against Pornography

According to anti-pornography feminists, pornography is not harmless entertainment or cathartic, therapeutic fantasy. Nor is the harm it causes merely that of “offense.” Unlike moral conservatives, who object to pornography on the grounds of the obscenity of its sexually explicit content and its corrosive effect on the conservative way of life, the primary focus of the feminist objection to pornography is on the central role that pornography is thought to play in the exploitation and oppression of women (Lederer 1980; Itzin 1992; MacKinnon 1984, 1987, 1995; McGowan 2019; Watson 2018).

This concern is reflected in the distinctive way anti-pornography feminists tend to define “pornography.” As we have seen, conservatives typically define “pornography” as including all sexually explicit material. This definition reflects the fact that conservatives object to pornography’s sexual explicitness, which is obscene or appeals to “prurient interests.” Anti-pornography feminists, however, do not object to pornography’s sexually explicit content per se. They typically draw a more fine-grained distinction within the class of sexually explicit materials between “pornography,” on the one hand, and “erotica,” on the other. “Erotica” is generally defined as sexually explicit material premised on equality, which depicts women as genuinely equal and consenting participants in sexual encounters. “Pornography,” in contrast, is typically defined as that subset of sexually explicit material that depicts women being coerced, abused, dominated or degraded in such a way as to endorse their subordination. Unlike conservatives, anti-pornography feminists have no objection to material which is merely sexually explicit, i.e., erotica, for sexually explicit material of this sort does not harm women. The objection is to pornography – that subset of sexually explicit material that subordinates women.

In 1983, two of the most prominent anti-pornography feminists in the United States, Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin, drafted an anti-pornography ordinance at the behest of the Minneapolis Council. A similar ordinance was passed by the Indianapolis City Council in 1984, but later overturned on appeal by the U.S. Supreme Court on the grounds that the ordinance violated pornographers’ First Amendment right to freedom of speech. Importantly, the ordinance did not seek to impose criminal prohibitions or sanctions on pornography: It did not seek to make the production, sale or consumption of pornography a criminal offence, punishable by imprisonment (as, for example, producing, selling or consuming heroin is a criminal offence). MacKinnon and Dworkin thought that criminalizing the production, publication or consumption of pornography would be counterproductive, serving to drive the industry underground, thereby only further obscuring the harm it causes to women. Rather, the ordinance sought civil remedies that would enable women who are harmed in the making of pornography, or as a result of its consumption, to sue for a future ban on sexually explicit material demonstrated to be harmful and to collect damages from pornographers for provable harm done by that material. There is some argument about whether the proposed legislation would have amounted to censorship, strictly speaking, since it did not seek to place a prior ban on the publication of pornographic materials. But insofar as the legislation allowed for courts to award and enforce injunctions against publication of material demonstrated to be harmful, many think that the legislation may have been functionally equivalent to censorship in practice (assuming that courts would in fact have been willing to award and enforce injunctions).

The ordinance has been the subject of a heated debate among feminists, many of whom are dubious both about the centrality of pornography’s role in the subordination of women and about the desirability of employing strategies of legal regulation in the pursuit of feminist goals (e.g., Hunter and Law 1985; Lacey 1998, 71–97; Cornell 2000; Strossen 1995). But the ordinance was significant, not least for reconceptualizing the question of pornography in the public arena in feminist terms: not as an issue about obscenity or public indecency, as it had hitherto tended to be viewed in legal and political contexts under the influence of moral conservatives, but as an issue about the civil rights of women. It also provided an influential definition of pornography that has featured prominently in many subsequent discussions. The ordinance defined “pornography” as a civil rights violation, as a systematic practice of sexual discrimination that violates women’s right to equality:

We define pornography as the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women through pictures and words that also includes (i) women are presented dehumanized as sexual objects, things, or commodities; or (ii) women are presented as sexual objects who enjoy humiliation or pain; or (iii) women are presented as sexual objects experiencing sexual pleasure in rape, incest or other sexual assault; or (iv) women are presented as sexual objects tied up, cut up or mutilated or bruised or physically hurt; or (v) women are presented in postures or positions of sexual submission, servility, or display; or (vi) women’s body parts — including but not limited to vaginas, breasts, or buttocks — are exhibited such that women are reduced to those parts; or (vii) women are presented being penetrated by objects or animals; or (viii) women are presented in scenarios of degradation, humiliation, injury, torture, shown as filthy or inferior, bleeding, bruised, or hurt in a context that makes these conditions sexual (MacKinnon 1987,176).

Dworkin and MacKinnon allow that sexually explicit material that treats men, children or transsexuals in sexually dehumanizing or subordinating ways also counts as pornography.

The Dworkin-MacKinnon definition has two parts or stages. The first part of the definition defines “pornography” broadly in terms of a certain functional role or, as MacKinnon puts it, in terms of “what it does”: “Pornography” is that sexually explicit material, whatever it is, that subordinates women.[4] The second part of the definition, the content list (i)-(viii), goes on to list of the sorts of sexually explicit material that MacKinnon and Dworkin think in fact functions to subordinate women, as revealed by the testimonial, experimental, social and clinical evidence. The content list aims to be sufficiently precise so as to minimize the likelihood of legislation against pornography, so defined, threatening other forms of speech – although many “anti-censorship” feminists, along with traditional liberal defenders of pornography, are not convinced that it succeeds (Hunter and Law 1985; R. Dworkin 1993).

I draw attention to the two-stages of the definition to reinforce a point made in section 1: that one might agree with Dworkin and MacKinnon that pornography, defined purely functionally or conceptually as sexually explicit material that subordinates women, would be a bad thing, and yet disagree that the material with the features that they go on to list in fact does this. (This might help to defuse some of the frequently acrimonious debate in feminist circles surrounding MacKinnon’s now famous claim that one cannot genuinely be a feminist and be pro-, or at least fail to be anti-, pornography. Feminists are, of course, opposed to anything that subordinates or oppresses women. Yet there is surely room for reasonable disagreement about what, if any, sexually explicit material does this, and whether pursuing legal regulation of it is a desirable feminist strategy.)

The harms that most concern anti-pornography feminists fall into two broad categories: 1) coercion and exploitation of women actors in the production of pornography; and 2) indirect harms to women, both as individuals and as a group, resulting from the consumption of pornography.

One particularly graphic example of the first sort of harm is documented in the book Ordeal (Lovelace and McGrady 1980) about Linda Marchiano, who starred as “Linda Lovelace” in the famous pornographic film Deep Throat. In Ordeal, Marchiano tells of how she was abducted, hypnotized, drugged, beaten and tortured in order to perform her starring role. Marchiano was one of a number of women who testified about their experience of the harm caused by pornography at the Minneapolis City Council hearings into pornography in 1983. (The transcript of the hearings is published as Pornography and Sexual Violence: Evidence of the Links (see Minneapolis City Council, 1988). Marchiano’s case is a particularly horrifying and extreme example of how women may be harmed in the making of pornography; and much of what was done to Marchiano (the abduction, the beatings and the torture) are criminal offences in their own right. Many, both liberals and feminists, think that since these physical assaults should not be allowed, enduring pornographic representations of these crimes that cause further harm to the victim’s interests should not be permitted to be distributed or consumed either (MacKinnon 1987; Wendell 1983).

Of course, not all women who perform in pornography are literally physically coerced as paradigm slaves are, and as Marchiano was. Nonetheless, many anti-pornography feminists are concerned that there is an important sense in which the “choice” to participate in the making of pornography may not be a genuinely free one for many of the women who perform in it, who often come from underprivileged socio-economic backgrounds and who have few alternative options for making a living. Under these circumstances, there may be an important sense in which the choice to perform in pornography is coerced, insofar as the women would not have chosen to perform in pornography had other reasonable options been available to them. The pornography industry may take unfair advantage of underprivileged women, preying on their psychic and economic vulnerability, to reap enormous profits at their expense. MacKinnon puts the point graphically: Pornography is a public institution of sexual slavery, trafficking in vulnerable women and children, and profiting from their suffering and subjugation.

Some of the women who perform in pornography vigorously reject the claim that they are exploited. At least in their own case, they argue, the decision to become a porn star was a genuinely autonomous one (Gruen and Panichas 1997). They regard the claim that they are victims of exploitation as offensively patronizing and paternalistic, implying that pornography is not a worthwhile or valid career choice, and portraying the women who act in pornography as hapless dupes of patriarchy. In reality, female porn actors may be fully autonomous and intelligent citizens pursuing a perfectly valid and rewarding career of their own choosing. Banning pornography, they argue, would constitute unjustified, paternalistic interference with their right to pursue their career of choice (McElroy 1995). Of course, that the decision to pursue a career in pornography is a free and fulfilling one for some women does not show that it is necessarily a free and fulfilling choice for all or even most of the women who perform in pornography.

Even if the pornography industry does exploit some of the women who perform in it, however, there is a question about whether this justifies disallowing it. As a number of feminists and liberals have noted in reply, other industries (such as supermarkets or fast-food chains) may likewise take advantage of workers with few alternative opportunities. Should these too be banned on grounds of exploitation? Surely not, they think. The best solution to such exploitation is arguably not to ban pornography (or fast-food chains). For this would only further deprive those already deprived of one more option, and one that they might prefer over others of the limited range available to them. We may do better to focus our efforts on redressing the underlying economic and material conditions of disadvantage that make exploitation possible, so that the choice to perform in pornography might be made, if it is made, as a genuinely free one, under fuller conditions of equality (R. Dworkin 1993; Wendell, 1983).

Second, anti-pornography feminists point to a range of indirect harms to women that result from the consumption of pornography. (For a variety of analyses here, see A. Dworkin 1981; MacKinnon 1987; Jeffreys 1990; Kappeler 1986; Coward 1984; Smart 1989, Ch. 6; Itzin 1998.) These may include, but are not limited to, pornography’s role as a cause of violent sexual crime. Some feminists in the U.K. have argued for anti-pornography legislation on the model of existing U.K. laws preventing racial incitement: Pornography is speech that incites sexual violence, and prohibition of such speech as incites sexual violence is justified for the same reason as prohibitions against racially incendiary speech, namely, to protect the physical security and bodily integrity of individuals (Itzin 1992).

Other feminist arguments focus instead, or as well, on the broader role pornographic representations may play in harming other of women’s significant interests. Some have suggested that pornography can be viewed as a sort of false advertising about women and sexuality, or as being akin to libelous speech – speech that defames women as a group, causing corresponding harm to their reputation, credibility, opportunities and income expectations. They argue that women as a group have a right to (civil) legal protection from these harms and to claim compensation for such harm as pornographic speech can be demonstrated to have produced (Longino 1980; Hill 1987; MacKinnon 1995, 3–28; for criticism, see Soble 1985). This is a promising strategy for anti-pornography feminists, since liberals already generally accept that individuals have a right to protection from libelous or defamatory speech.

Other feminist arguments focus on the related role pornography may play in restricting women’s autonomy by reproducing and reinforcing a dominant public perception of the nature of women and sexuality that prevents women from articulating and exploring their own conceptions of sexuality and of the good life (Easton 1994; Dyzenhaus 1992).

Yet another line of feminist argument draws on the work of the prominent liberal philosopher, John Rawls, to suggest that regulation of pornography is justified insofar as rational, self-interested individuals in the original position would not agree to basic social institutions that “asymmetrically either forced or gave strong incentives to members of one sex to become sex objects for the other” (Okin 1987, 68). Rae Langton (1990) also seeks to use liberals’ own theoretical commitments to make a (liberal) case for the legitimacy of censorship, though her chosen liberal is Ronald Dworkin. Langton seeks to turn the tables on Dworkin’s argument in an ingenious way, arguing that a consistent application of Dworkin’s own principles actually supports a policy that prohibits pornography, rather than the permissive policy he himself favours. Preferences to consume pornography necessarily depend on external preferences about the inferior worth of women that violate women’s right to moral independence. Furthermore, positive arguments for prohibiting pornography may aim at securing social equality for women. If this is the goal, then, by Dworkin’s own lights, pornographers would have no rights against a prohibitive policy.

Many of these concerns figure in a somewhat new light in a significant, rights-based strand of feminist argument associated originally with Catharine MacKinnon. This approach has subsequently been developed by scholars in several different ways (e.g., Bianchi 2008; Langton 1993, McGowan 2019, Mikkola 2017, Watson 2018). On one distinctive version of this approach, pornography does not merely cause sexual discrimination and others harms; its production and consumption constitutes an act of sexual discrimination (Langton 1993; McGowan 2019). Since this approach has provoked particular interest and discussion among both liberals and feminists, and has come to constitute a dominant framework for much of the contemporary debate between liberals and feminists over pornography, it is worth examining it in more detail. According to MacKinnon, pornography harms women in a very special and serious way: by violating their civil rights (MacKinnon 1984, 1987, 1992). In particular, pornography subordinates women or violates their right to equal civil status; and it silences them or violates their civil right to freedom of speech.

Pornography subordinates women by sexualizing their inequality. Pornography both expresses the view that women exist primarily as objects for men’s sexual gratification – that they are men’s sexual slaves, and frequently their willing sexual slaves – and it propagates this view by conditioning consumers to regard women’s subordination as a sexy, natural and legitimate feature of normal heterosexual relations. Pornography “sexualizes rape, battery, sexual harassment, prostitution and child sexual abuse; it thereby celebrates, promotes, authorizes and legitimizes them” (MacKinnon 1987, 171–172). By authorizing and legitimating the subjection of women, pornography makes the very real harm of women’s subordination invisible as harm: Rape, harassment and other forms of oppression come to be seen simply as sex. “The harm of pornography, broadly speaking, is the harm of the civil inequality of the sexes made invisible as harm” (MacKinnon 1987, 178). The view of women and sexuality that pornography helps to form and perpetuate manifests itself not simply in crimes of sexual violence against women, but in discrimination against women more generally: in the legal system, in politics and public debate, and in the workplace. Pornography “institutionalizes the sexuality of male supremacy…Men treat women as who they see women as being. Pornography constructs who that is” (MacKinnon 1987, 172). By conditioning consumers to view and treat women as their sexual subordinates, pornography undermines women’s ability to participate as full and equal citizens in public, as well as private, realms.

One significant dimension of this inequality is that women’s speech, where it occurs, lacks the credibility, authority and influence of men’s. Women as a group are systematically and differentially silenced, MacKinnon thinks; and pornography contributes to this in at least three ways (MacKinnon 1987, 1995; for further discussion, see Caponetto 2021; Maitra 2009; McGowan 2017, 2019; West 2021).

First, pornography silences women by helping to shape and reinforce a hostile and uncomprehending social environment which makes many women reluctant to speak at all. Thus, for example, rape, sexual harassment and other violent sexual crime is significantly underreported by women.

Second, pornography creates a social climate in which, even where women do speak, their opinions are frequently paid little serious attention – especially where what women say contradicts the picture of women contained in pornography. Thus, women who do report sexual crime are often disbelieved, ignored, ridiculed, or dismissed. In MacKinnon’s words, pornography “strips and devastates women of credibility, from our accounts of sexual assault to our everyday reality of sexual subordination. We are stripped of authority and reduced and devalidated and silenced” (MacKinnon 1992, 483–484).

Third, pornography may silence women by causing their speech to fail to be understood, or to be misunderstood. For example, pornography may help to form and reinforce the general view that women who utter “no” in sexual contexts frequently do not intend to refuse a man’s sexual advantages by so speaking, and indeed may often intend to further encourage them in order to heighten sexual excitement. In a social environment in which this expectation is prevalent, women may not be able to successfully communicate the idea of refusal to others: Although they may utter the appropriate sounds (e.g., “no”), those sounds may frequently fail to communicate the idea they were intended to express. Pornography may thus prevent women from communicating their ideas to others, not by preventing them from producing or distributing sounds and scrawls, but by preventing those sounds and scrawls from securing “uptake” (“illocutionary disablement”) or being understood by hearers as expressing the idea they were intended to express (Langton 1993; Hornsby 1995; Hornsby and Langton 1998; Maitra 2009; McGowan 2003, 2019; McGowan, Adelman, Helmers, Stolzenberg, 2011; Mikkola 2011; West 2003, 2021; for criticism, see Anthony 2011, 2017; De Gaynesford 2010; Jacobsen 2001; Bird 2002; Bauer 2015). If pornography silences women in this way, there may be some reason to be skeptical that the solution preferred by many liberals (and feminists) of countering the harms of pornography with more speech – protest, satire, education and public debate – will be effective, for pornography may make the relevant speech acts “unspeakable” for women.

For MacKinnon, then, a desire for pornography and sexual violence is not an epiphenomenal symptom or side-effect of other material and social conditions that lie at the root of women’s subordinate position in society, as some other feminists are inclined to think. Rather, it is a central cause of the subordinate position of women in society. So long as there is pornography, MacKinnon thinks, women will remain subordinate and silenced.

One novel and strategically ingenious feature of MacKinnon’s argument against pornography (and one that has provoked much of the more recent interest and debate) is her conceptualization of the harm of pornography as the violation of women’s civil rights, of which sexual violence against women may be but one, albeit significant, dimension. The violation of civil rights is a harm that most liberals have special reason for taking very seriously. While some liberals understand the notion of “harm” to others very narrowly, as including only physical interference with a person’s bodily integrity (e.g., murder, battery, torture, kidnap, rape and other such physical assaults), most liberals nowadays are inclined to accept a slightly broader interpretation of the harm principle. On this broader, interest- or rights-based interpretation of the harm principle, any speech or conduct that willfully or negligently interferes with important interests or rights of others is harmful conduct. On this interest-based interpretation of the harm principle, the state is entitled to pass laws against conduct that deliberately or negligently interferes with the rights of others, just so long as the rights-violation is sufficiently serious and the harm cannot effectively be prevented by other, less costly means (for example, through public education or debate). Of course, how this version of the harm principle applies depends crucially on the nature and relative importance of the rights that individuals have; and this is the subject of much ongoing debate.

Some liberals have accepted that pornography may contribute to women’s subordination: if not by directly causing crimes of sexual violence, then at least by conditioning consumers to view women as sex objects, rather than as autonomous individuals worthy of equal concern and respect. They grant that this may contribute to discrimination against women in society and that it may prevent women from having the same social and political influence that men generally possess. But, they argue, this harm is not sufficiently great to justify interfering with pornographers’ freedom of speech. The right to freedom of expression is a more important right. So, if we have to choose between the right to equality (of women) and the right to freedom of speech (of pornographers), we must choose freedom of speech.[5] But MacKinnon’s argument, if successful, would turn the tables on these traditional liberal defenses of pornography: Pornography could no longer be defended simply on the grounds of the primacy of the right to freedom of speech, for permitting pornography violates women’s right to freedom of speech too. We now seem to have a conflict of rights: not simply between pornographers’ right to freedom of speech and women’s right to equal civil status, but within the right to freedom of expression itself between pornographers’ right to freedom of speech and women’s right to freedom of speech. Why should pornographers’ right to freedom of expression take precedence over women’s? The next section turns to the debates surrounding this question.

4.2 Feminist Arguments against Legal Regulation

Of course, not all feminists object to pornography, even in MacKinnon’s sense (Burstyn 1985; Chester and Dickey 1988; Cornell 2000; Hunter and Law 1985; Gruen and Panichas 1997; Rubin 1993). The question of pornography and censorship has divided feminists, just as it has begun to divide liberals. Some feminists argue that pornography is an important form of sexual expression that does not harm women and may even benefit them by liberating women and women’s sexuality from the oppressive shackles of tradition and sexual conservatism. Pornography, on this view, is an important tool for exploring and expressing new or minority forms of female sexuality. Far from making downtrodden victims of women, pornography may have a vital role to play in challenging traditional views about femininity and female sexuality and in empowering women, both homosexual and heterosexual, to shape their own identities as sexual beings. (Note that material that benefits women ought to count as erotica, rather than pornography, on MacKinnon’s definition. So, as noted in section 1, if there is substantive disagreement between “pro-pornography” feminists and MacKinnon here, it will be about whether there really is any sexually explicit material that is beneficial).

There are also a significant number of feminists who object to pornography, or to certain forms of it, on the grounds that it harms women, but who do not think that regulating or banning it is the most desirable or effective way to remedy the harms that pornography causes. These feminists, though not always liberals, nonetheless share some general liberal concerns about using the “blunt and treacherous” instrument of the law in the quest to redress harms, especially in light of the way in which the law has frequently been used to oppress women, or where laws enacted with the best of intentions have nonetheless had this unintended effect. Censorship, they think, may well cause more harm to women than it removes. They recommend more speech – education, protest, picketing, satire and public debate – rather than censorship or other forms of legal regulation as less dangerous and more effective tools for raising public consciousness and effecting the desired attitudinal and cultural change. These feminists are anti-pornography (in the sense that they think material that degrades women is objectionable), but they are also anti-censorship.

Indeed, eighty individual feminists, along with the Feminist Anti-Censorship Taskforce (F.A.C.T.) and the Women’s Legal Defense Fund, presented an Amici Brief to the Hudnut court outlining a range of feminist concerns about the anti-pornography legislation proposed by MacKinnon and Dworkin (Hunter and Law 1985). These included concerns about the political dangers of feminists aligning themselves with the conservative, evangelical right; the possibility of the legislation discriminating against minority forms of sexuality (e.g., lesbianism); interference with women’s freedom to choose to produce and perform in pornography; perpetuating traditional ideas that sex is bad for women; and diverting attention and resources away from more important immediate efforts to bring an end to violence against women.

5. Ongoing Debate: Liberals and Feminists

Despite the efforts of anti-pornography feminists, many traditional liberal defenders of pornography remain unconvinced. They typically continue to maintain either that pornography does not cause harm to women (in the relevant, usually narrow, sense of “harm”), or they admit that pornography probably does cause some harm to women’s interests, but deny that this harm is sufficiently great to offset the dangers inherent in censorship and to justify the violation of the rights of pornographers and would-be consumers.

5.1 Does Pornography Cause Harm to Others? The Empirical Evidence

Liberal defenders of pornography readily admit that, if there were reliable evidence to show that consumption of pornography significantly increases the incidence of violent sexual crime, there would be a very strong liberal case for prohibiting it. However, liberal defenders of pornography remain unconvinced that there is reliable evidence to show that pornography is a cause of rape or other sexual crime. Ronald Dworkin, for example, writes “…in spite of MacKinnon’s fervent declarations, no reputable study has concluded that pornography is a significant cause of sexual crime: many of them conclude, on the contrary, that the causes of violent personality lie mainly in childhood, before exposure to pornography can have had any effect, and that desire for pornography is a symptom rather than a cause of deviance” (1993, 38).

The question of whether pornography causes harm raises tricky conceptual issues about the notion of causality, as well as empirical and methodological ones (Eaton 2007; Schauer 1987; The Attorney General’s Commission on Pornography 1986, excerpts from which are reprinted in Mappes and Zembaty 1997, 212–218). The causal connection between consumption of pornography and violent sexual crime, if there is one, is unlikely to be a simple one. As some liberals have argued, it seems implausible to think that consumption of pornography, on a single or even repeated occasions, will cause otherwise “normal, decent chaps” with no propensity to rape suddenly “to metamorphose into rapists”(Feinberg, 1985, 153; also see entry on Freedom of Speech). However, we might agree with Feinberg and yet think that pornography might still be a cause of rape. Consumption of pornography might cause rape by making it more likely that those who are already inclined to rape will actually rape, thereby increasing the overall incidence of rape. Of course, pornography may not be the only cause of rape or other violent sexual crime. The contributing causes of violence against women are likely to be numerous and connected in complex ways: they may include, among other things, “macho values” (as Feinberg suggests) and certain sorts of childhood events and circumstances (as R. Dworkin says). But the mere fact that there may be other causes of sexual violence against women does not show that consumption of pornography cannot also be a cause. Consumption of pornography may, on its own, be neither necessary nor sufficient for violent sexual crime (or for sexist attitudes and behavior more generally); yet it might still be a cause of violent sexual crime and these other harms if it increases the incidence of them.

It might be helpful to consider an analogy with smoking. Smoking cigarettes, on its own, is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition for developing lung cancer, since there are people who smoke like chimneys who never develop lung cancer and live perfectly healthy lives to a ripe old age; and there are people who have never smoked a cigarette in their whole life who develop lung cancer. Yet it is generally agreed nowadays that smoking cigarettes is a cause of lung cancer. This is because smoking (in combination with other factors such as genetics, diet and exercise) makes it significantly more likely that a person will develop lung cancer, or so the studies suggest. Likewise, we might think that consumption of pornography will be a cause of violent sexual crime (or of sexist attitudes and behavior more generally) if there is good evidence to suggest that consumption of pornography increases the incidence of sexual violence or sexist behavior, holding fixed other known causes of these harmful states of affairs.[6]

There is considerable disagreement, among social science researchers as well as liberal and feminist philosophers, about whether pornography is a cause of violent sexual crime (Donnerstein et al. 1987; Copp and Wendell 1983; Itzin 1992). Both the final report of the Commission on Obscenity and Pornography in the U.S. in 1970 and the Williams Committee Report on Obscenity and Film Censorship in the U.K. surveyed the data from clinical and experimental trials then available and found no evidence of a causal connection between pornography and rape (although the 1970 Commission did not review the evidence concerning sexually violent material). However, the Attorney General’s Commission on Pornography in the U.S., which submitted its final report in 1986, found that the clinical and experimental research “virtually unanimously” shows that exposure to sexually violent material increases the likelihood of aggression toward women and that “the available evidence strongly supports the hypothesis that substantial exposure to sexually violent materials…bears a causal relationship to antisocial acts of sexual violence and, for some subgroups, possibly to unlawful acts of sexual violence” (Mappes and Zembaty 1997, 215). The report also found that non-violent but degrading pornographic material produced effects “similar to, although not as extensive as that involved with violent material.” However, the report concluded that non-degrading and non-violent material (erotica, in feminist terms) “does not bear a causal relationship to rape and other acts of sexual violence.”

A more recent meta-analysis revealed an overall significant positive association between pornography use and attitudes supporting violence against women in non-experimental, as well as experimental, settings (Hald, Malamuth and Yuen 2010).

A number of studies have found a positive correlation between exposure to violent pornographic images (for example, of rape, bondage, molestation involving weapons and mutilation) and positive reactions to rape and other forms of violence against women. Studies suggest, among other things, that exposure to violent pornography can significantly enhance a subject’s arousal in response to the portrayal of rape, that exposure to films that depict sexual violence against women can act as a stimulus for aggressive acts against women, and that prolonged exposure to degrading pornography (of a violent or non-violent sort) leads to increased callousness towards victims of sexual violence, a greater acceptance of “rape-myths” (for example, that women enjoy rape and do not mean no when they say “no”), a greater likelihood of having rape-fantasies, and a greater likelihood of reporting that one would rape women or force women into unwanted sex acts if there was no chance of being caught. Skeptics, however, argue that existing studies have serious limitations and flaws (Altman 2018) and point to countries such as Japan that have low reported rates of sexual assault but high rates of pornography consumption as evidence that the connection between pornography consumption and sexual violence is weak (Strossen 1995).

5.2 Liberals and Feminists

The empirical evidence remains the subject of ongoing debate and investigation. But in the absence of sufficiently conclusive evidence that pornography is associated with a significant increase in violent sexual crime, liberals may continue to view the case for legal regulation as weak.

However, the rights-based feminist arguments against pornography do not rest entirely on the claim that consumption of pornography is a significant cause of violent sexual crime. The claim that pornography contributes to women’s inequality, and the claim that it violates women’s right to freedom of speech, can rest on more moderate empirical claims about which there is likely to be more agreement: for example, that pornography helps to form and reinforce the view that women are sex objects, which manifests itself in how women are perceived and treated in society and so perpetuates women’s inequality. Among other things, it may increase the likelihood of sexual harassment and other forms of discrimination against women, undermine women’s credibility in certain contexts, encourage a general expectation that women who say “no” in sexual contexts often do not intend to refuse, and so on.

Ronald Dworkin is one prominent liberal who has explicitly considered, and rejected, MacKinnon’s version of the rights-based arguments for anti-pornography legislation. This is not primarily because he rejects the moderate empirical claims. Rather it is because he thinks that, even if those claims were true, there would be no legitimate sense in which the publication and voluntary private consumption of pornography violate women’s civil rights.

According to Dworkin, the argument for anti-pornography legislation on the grounds that pornography subordinates women rests on the “frightening principle that considerations of equality require that some people not be free to express their tastes or convictions or preferences anywhere” (Dworkin 1993, 39). Accepting this principle would have “devastating consequences,” namely, that “government could forbid the graphic or visceral or emotionally charged expression of any opinion that might reasonably offend a disadvantaged group. It could outlaw performances of The Merchant of Venice, or films about professional women who neglect their children, or caricatures or parodies of homosexuals in nightclub routines.” Dworkin’s concern is a kind of logical slippery slope objection that he takes to constitute a reductio of MacKinnon’s view. The worry is that the principle that underpins MacKinnon’s argument would, if consistently applied, threaten many other forms of speech in clearly unacceptable ways.

Note that Dworkin construes – or misconstrues – MacKinnon’s argument as a version of the old moralistic argument that objects to pornography on grounds of its offensiveness; and, as we have seen, liberals reject offense as legitimate grounds for preventing the voluntary consumption of pornography in private. However, MacKinnon’s argument does not – or need not – rest on this “frightening” principle. The feminist case is not that pornography should be regulated because it expresses opinions that are offensive to feminists. Rather, it should be regulated because, offensive or not, it contributes significantly to a regime of sexual inequality.

Nonetheless, this principle – that government is justified in prohibiting speech that contributes significantly to a group’s inequality – is one that some liberals may find equally disturbing. For it may well apply to speech other than pornography, including perhaps the examples that Dworkin mentions.

Dworkin is not alone in this concern. Other liberals and feminists have questioned MacKinnon’s focus on pornography as the key site of women’s oppression when it seems that many other non-sexually explicit materials plausibly also endorse and perpetuate a view of women as sex objects, albeit perhaps in less graphic and explicit forms. (Perhaps this lack of explicitness makes them more insidious, and hence of more, rather than less, concern.) Pornography may sexualize women’s inequality, but advertising and romance novels plausibly glamorize and romanticize it respectively and hence may celebrate, authorize and legitimize women’s inequality in the same way as pornography (e.g., Cocks 1989; Coward 1984; Valverde 1985; Kappeler 1986; Skipper 1993). Indeed, some of these other representations may be especially worrying, not simply because they may be more pervasive, but also insofar they may condition women to be complicit in their own subjection. MacKinnon’s focus on the graphic sexually explicit material that celebrates women’s inequality may thus seem arbitrary in the absence of evidence that the sexually explicit subset of material is an especially significant cause of women’s inequality.

Perhaps there are principled, pragmatic reasons for singling out pornography (i.e., the sexually explicit subset of the material that conditions people to view women as willing sex objects) for censorship or regulation, even if we were to agree that non-sexually explicit material may also condition consumers to this view of women. It might be that censorship of pornography would alleviate a considerable amount of this harm, without incurring the same costs as censoring some or all of the non-sexually explicit material that contributes to the harm. But this is controversial.

What about the claim that pornography violates women’s right to freedom of speech? The argument rests on a “dangerous confusion,” Dworkin thinks: the confusion of positive and negative liberty. It rests on the “unacceptable proposition: that the right to free speech includes a right to circumstances that encourage one to speak, and a right that others grasp and respect what one means to say….These are obviously not rights that any society can recognise or enforce. Creationists, flat-earthers, and bigots, for example, are ridiculed in many parts of America now; that ridicule undoubtedly dampens the enthusiasm that many of them have for speaking out and limits the attention others pay to what they have to say” (Dworkin 1993, 38). But, Dworkin suggests, we surely should not think that this violates their right to freedom of speech: e.g., that creationists have a legitimate claim on the state to ban the publication of books or videos recommending the theory of evolution on the grounds that these may cause the speech of creationists to receive an unsympathetic or dismissive reception.

Dworkin concedes that it is perhaps true that the right to freedom of speech, if it is to be meaningful, requires that everyone has some opportunity to have their ideas heard: a society in which only the rich and powerful have access to the media may be one in which there is not genuine freedom of speech. But it goes far beyond this, Dworkin thinks, to claim that a meaningful right to freedom of speech requires “a guarantee of a sympathetic or even competent understanding of what one says” (Dworkin 1993, 38). This would license state regulation of speech on a massive scale, paving the way to terrible “tyranny” (Dworkin 1993, 42).

A number of commentators have developed Mackinnon’s claims in the face of Dworkin’s response, arguing that, to be valuable, freedom of speech must be more than simply being free to produce and distribute sounds and symbols that have a meaning in a language. It requires, in addition, that there are not systematic barriers to audience “uptake” of speech—i.e., that audiences are not systematically prevented from recognizing speakers’ communicative intentions (e.g., Hornsby and Langton 1998; West 2003; for replies, see Jacobson 2001; Green 1998). In different ways, these commentators argue that the traditional liberal conception of free speech, and of the right to free speech, fails to pay sufficient attention to the way language works and, in particular, to the way in which what words mean – and so what it is possible for speakers to communicate or do with their words – depends on social context, a context that pornography may help to shape and perpetuate.

The traditional liberal conception of freedom of speech assumes that people are free to speak just so long they are not prevented from producing meaningful sounds and scrawls that others are not prevented from hearing or viewing. But we might wonder whether this is sufficient to protect free speech, even by liberals’ own lights. A society that permitted the distribution of meaningful sounds and symbols, but somehow managed systematically to prevent those sounds and symbols from being comprehended by audiences, would be little better as far as free speech values are concerned than a society that simply prevented distribution of meaningful noises altogether. Either way, speakers are prevented from communicating their opinions to others, which defeats what liberals take to be the point of free speech: the right of speakers not to be prevented by the actions of other agents from communicating their feelings and opinions to others who might wish to hear them (West 2003).

6. Non-Legal Remedies

So far, I have focused on the controversial question of whether and why legal regulation of (some) pornography—either in the form of criminal liability or civil penalties—can be justified in a liberal society. But legal regulation is costly. Consequently, if there are less restrictive measures to prevent or counteract pornography’s harms available, these should obviously be preferred instead of—or as well as—legal regulation.

By far the most popular alternative to regulation recommends countering “bad” speech with more “good” speech (Gelber 2021). In principle, this might include government sponsored public education campaigns to warn consumers of the harmful effects of consuming violent and misogynistic pornography, and/or to promote a counter-message of sexual equality and respect for women. In practice, however, liberal states have generally taken little direct action to counteract inegalitarian pornography’s messages about women and sex, preferring to leave the burden of counter-speech entirely to private individuals. Even if legal regulation of violent and misogynistic pornography is unwarranted or undesirable all things considered, such state inaction in the face of pornography’s role in endorsing and perpetuating sexual inequality may be indefensible. If violent and misogynistic pornography perpetuates and reinforces harmful sexist attitudes and behavior (quite apart from whether it also leads to sexual violence) then there may be an important role for governments to play in helping to counter pornography’s harmful sexist messaging through government-backed public education campaigns. Without restricting anyone’s speech, such campaigns would lend the epistemic and political authority of the state to private opinion in countering harmful inegalitarian messages about sex. State-backed counter-speech may be especially important to inform adolescent consumers of harms associated with inegalitarian pornography, and also if private counter-speakers are silenced, so that counter-speech is otherwise liable systematically to be ignored or misunderstood (see Dotson’s discussion of “testimonial quieting” in Dotson 2011).

In the end, it is an empirical question what combination of legal and non-legal means are likely to be most effective in challenging sexual inequality; however, there are some reasons to think that counter-speech alone may be less effective than advocates commonly suppose. Firstly, if widespread consumption of pornography “silences” women, or restricts their ability successfully to communicate relevant counter-messages, then counter-speech is not an option, at least for those silenced. Secondly, pornography may affect consumers’ attitudes in ways that escape their conscious notice. It may be going too far to liken consumers of pornography to Pavlov’s dogs, but it is not unreasonable to think that much of pornography’s influence is less than fully mentally-intermediated, and so less amenable to rational revision in response to counter-speech.


What are the harms of pornography? How should liberal societies respond to the proliferation of harmful pornography? How should liberals conceptualize and balance important values such as equality and freedom of speech? What role should the state play in protecting and promoting values such as autonomy and equality? Can liberal ideals be reconciled with feminist principles and goals? The search for answers to important questions such as these accounts for much of the ongoing philosophical interest in the question of pornography and censorship.


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