Fictionalism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Tue Apr 22, 2008; substantive revision Mon Jul 23, 2018

Mathematical fictionalism (hereafter, simply fictionalism) is best thought of as a reaction to mathematical platonism. Platonism is the view that (a) there exist abstract mathematical objects (i.e., nonspatiotemporal mathematical objects), and (b) our mathematical sentences and theories provide true descriptions of such objects. So, for instance, on the platonist view, the sentence ‘3 is prime’ provides a straightforward description of a certain object—namely, the number 3—in much the same way that the sentence ‘Mars is red’ provides a description of Mars. But whereas Mars is a physical object, the number 3 is (according to platonism) an abstract object. And abstract objects, platonists tell us, are wholly nonphysical, nonmental, nonspatial, nontemporal, and noncausal. Thus, on this view, the number 3 exists independently of us and our thinking, but it does not exist in space or time, it is not a physical or mental object, and it does not enter into causal relations with other objects. This view has been endorsed by Plato, Frege (1884, 1893–1903, 1919), Gödel (1964), and in some of their writings, Russell (1912) and Quine (1948, 1951), not to mention numerous more recent philosophers of mathematics, e.g., Putnam (1971), Parsons (1971), Steiner (1975), Resnik (1997), Shapiro (1997), Hale (1987), Wright (1983), Katz (1998), Zalta (1988), Colyvan (2001), McEvoy (2012), and Marcus (2015).

Fictionalism, on the other hand, is the view that (a) our mathematical sentences and theories do purport to be about abstract mathematical objects, as platonism suggests, but (b) there are no such things as abstract objects, and so (c) our mathematical theories are not true. Thus, the idea is that sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are false, or untrue, for the same reason that, say, ‘The tooth fairy is generous’ is false or untrue—because just as there is no such person as the tooth fairy, so too there is no such thing as the number 3. It is important to note, however, that despite the name, fictionalist views do not have to involve any very strong claims about the analogy between mathematics and fiction. For instance, there is no claim here that mathematical discourse is a kind of fictional discourse. Thus, fictionalists are not committed to the thesis that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction. (We will return to this issue below, in section 2.4.) Finally, it should also be noted at the start that fictionalism is a version of mathematical nominalism, the view that there are no such things as mathematical objects.

Fictionalism was first introduced by Field (1980, 1989, 1998, 2016). Since then, the view has been developed—in a few different ways—by Balaguer (1996a, 1998a, 2001, 2009), Rosen (2001), Yablo (2002a, 2002b, 2005), Leng (2005a, 2005b, 2010), and Bueno (2009), though as will become clear below, one might question whether Bueno and Yablo are best interpreted as fictionalists. Others to endorse or defend fictionalism (or views in the neighborhood of fictionalism) include Daly (2006), Liggins (2010), Contessa (2016), and Plebani (2018). Finally, one might also interpret Melia (2000) as defending a fictionalist view, though he doesn’t really commit to this.

It’s worth noting that Hoffman (2004) also endorses a view that is a kind of fictionalism. Her view is very different from the fictionalist view defined above, however, because it doesn’t involve a commitment to thesis (a). She reinterprets mathematics along the lines of Kitcher (1984) and then endorses a fictionalist view of this reinterpretation; i.e., she maintains that once mathematics is reinterpreted in this way, it’s singular terms fail to refer and its sentences are not true. (It’s not clear how much this view differs from Kitcher’s view; one might interpret Kitcher as endorsing a very similar view.) In any event, it is important to note that Hoffman’s rejection of thesis (a) makes her view radically different from more standard fictionalist views. As will become clear below, thesis (a) is very plausible, and its plausibility is one of the main reasons for the popularity of platonism. Thus, one of the main selling points of fictionalism—i.e., the standard sort of fictionalism defined above—is that it combines an acceptance of thesis (a) with an anti-platonistic ontology.

It’s also worth noting that Lear (1982) and Corkum (2012) argue that Aristotle held a version of mathematical fictionalism; but as Corkum notes, it’s unlikely that Aristotle held the version of fictionalism defined above.

When one first hears the fictionalist hypothesis, it can seem a bit crazy. Are we really supposed to believe that sentences like ‘3 is prime’ and ‘2 + 2 = 4’ are false? But the appeal of fictionalism starts to emerge when we realize what the alternatives are. By thinking carefully about the issues surrounding the interpretation of mathematical discourse, it can start to seem that fictionalism is actually very plausible, and indeed, that it might just be the least crazy view out there.

Section 1 provides a formulation of what might be thought of as the central argument for fictionalism. Section 2 provides a discussion of a number of different objections to fictionalism, as well as a number of different versions of fictionalism. These two things go together very naturally, because the different versions of fictionalism have emerged in connection with the responses that different philosophers have given to the various objections to fictionalism.

1. The Argument For Fictionalism

1.1 The Main Argument

The main argument for fictionalism proceeds essentially by trying to eliminate all of the alternatives to fictionalism. The argument can be put like this:

  1. Mathematical sentences like ‘4 is even’ should be read at face value; that is, they should be read as being of the form ‘Fa’ and, hence, as making straightforward claims about the nature of certain objects; e.g., ‘4 is even’ should be read as making a straightforward claim about the nature of the number 4. But
  2. If sentences like ‘4 is even’ should be read at face value, and if moreover they are true, then there must actually exist objects of the kinds that they’re about; for instance, if ‘4 is even’ makes a straightforward claim about the nature of the number 4, and if this sentence is literally true, then there must actually exist such a thing as the number 4. Therefore, from (1) and (2), it follows that
  3. If sentences like ‘4 is even’ are true, then there are such things as mathematical objects. But
  4. If there are such things as mathematical objects, then they are abstract objects, i.e., nonspatiotemporal objects; for instance, if there is such a thing as the number 4, then it is an abstract object, not a physical or mental object. But
  5. There are no such things as abstract objects. Therefore, from (4) and (5) by modus tollens, it follows that
  6. There are no such things as mathematical objects. And so, from (3) and (6) by modus tollens, it follows that
  7. Sentences like ‘4 is even’ are not true (indeed, they’re not true for the reason that fictionalists give, and so it follows that fictionalism is true).

The three inferences in this argument are all pretty clearly valid, and so the only question is whether the four basic premises—(1), (2), (4), and (5)—are true. And the nice thing about the way this argument is set up is that each of these premises is supposed to get rid of a different alternative to fictionalism. So the argument in (1)–(7) is actually a shell of a much longer argument that includes subarguments in favor of the basic premises and, hence, against the various alternatives to fictionalism.

Given this, we can say that there are five alternatives (or if you’d rather, five categories of alternatives) to fictionalism. Those who reject (1) can be called paraphrase nominalists; those who reject (2) can be called deflationary-truth nominalists; those who reject (4) are either physicalists or psychologists; and those who reject (5) are platonists. In order to motivate their view, fictionalists need to provide arguments against all of these views.

The easiest part of the fictionalist’s job here is arguing against the various anti-platonist views. All of these views—paraphrase nominalism, deflationary-truth nominalism, physicalism, and psychologism—can be understood (as fictionalism can) as reactions to platonism. Platonism is a very attractive view because it provides an extremely natural and pleasing account of mathematical practice and mathematical discourse. But despite this, many philosophers do not endorse platonism because they cannot bring themselves to accept its ontology. In other words, they simply don’t believe that there are any such things as abstract objects. Because of this, much of the work that’s been done in the philosophy of mathematics has been dedicated to attempts to avoid platonism. In particular, paraphrase nominalism, deflationary-truth nominalism, physicalism, and psychologism can all be understood in these terms. They all attempt to undermine the platonistic view of the truth conditions of mathematical sentences. But as will become clear below, there are serious problem with all of these views. And this is where fictionalism comes in: it grants the platonistic view of the truth conditions of mathematical sentences but still denies the platonist’s ontological thesis that there exist abstract objects. This makes fictionalism different from other anti-platonist views in an important way. We can appreciate this by noting that platonism involves two different theses, one semantic and the other ontological. The semantic thesis is an empirical hypothesis about the truth conditions of ordinary mathematical utterances, and the ontological thesis is a deeply metaphysical hypothesis about the existence of abstract objects. Every version of anti-platonism rejects the platonist’s ontological hypothesis, and all of the non-fictionalistic versions of anti-platonism reject the semantic thesis as well. Fictionalism is the only anti-platonistic view that doesn’t reject the semantic thesis. And this is why fictionalism can seem more attractive than the other versions of anti-platonism—because the platonist’s semantic hypothesis is extremely plausible and well-motivated. Thus, the versions of anti-platonism that reject this hypothesis can seem implausible and unmotivated.

So, again, the easy part of the argument for fictionalism (or at any rate, the easier part) is carried out by providing arguments for premises (1), (2), and (4)—or equivalently, by providing arguments against the various non-fictionalistic versions of anti-platonism, i.e., paraphrase nominalism, deflationary-truth nominalism, physicalism, and psychologism. The next three subsections (1.2–1.4) discuss these four views as well as some arguments that fictionalists might mount against them. Section 1.5 covers the more difficult part of the fictionalist’s argument—i.e., premise (5) and the question of how fictionalists might argue against platonism.

1.2 Premise (1) and Paraphrase Nominalism

Paraphrase nominalism is the view that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ should not be read at face value—or more specifically, that they should not be read as being of the form ‘Fa’ and making claims about mathematical objects. There are a few different versions of this view. Perhaps the most famous is if-thenism. On this view, ‘3 is prime’ is best interpreted as expressing a conditional claim, such as ‘If there were numbers, then 3 would be prime’, or perhaps ‘Necessarily, if there are numbers, then 3 is prime.’ (Versions of if-thenism have been developed by Putnam (1967a,b), Horgan (1984), Hellman (1989), Dorr (2008), and Yablo (2017); moreover, a precursor to this view was endorsed by the early Hilbert (see his 1899 and his letters to Frege in Frege 1980). Finally, other versions of paraphrase nominalism have been endorsed by Chihara (1990), Yi (2002), Hofweber (2005), Rayo (2008, 2013), and Moltmann (2013); and one might also interpret Curry (1951) and Wittgenstein (1956) in this way.)

The problem with paraphrase nominalist views is very simple: they involve empirical hypotheses about the meanings of ordinary mathematical utterances that are extremely implausible. For instance, in connection with if-thenism, it’s just really hard to believe that the best interpretation of what ordinary speakers of mathematical discourse (ordinary mathematicians and ordinary folk) are saying when they utter, e.g., ‘3 is prime’ is that if there were numbers then 3 would be prime. This just seems to get wrong what people actually mean when they utter sentences like this. Indeed, it seems that a more general point can be made here. There is a good interpretive principle that says something like this: we should interpret people’s utterances at face value unless there’s evidence that they have positive intentions to be interpreted nonliterally. Given this, and given (what seems obvious) that ordinary people don’t have positive intentions for their mathematical utterances to be interpreted nonliterally—e.g., as expressing conditional propositions—it seems to follow that we ought to interpret our mathematical utterances at face value. But this means that we ought to accept premise (1) and reject paraphrase nominalism.

Paraphrase nominalists might try to respond to this argument by denying that they are committed to the thesis that their paraphrases fit with the intentions of ordinary mathematicians and ordinary folk. Indeed, claims of this sort have been made by both Chihara (1990, 2004) and Hellman (1998). But paraphrase nominalists cannot endorse this stance, for if they do, their view will collapse into a version of fictionalism. If paraphrase nominalists admit that platonists and fictionalists are right about the meanings of real mathematical utterances—i.e., the utterances of actual mathematicians—then (since they also want to maintain that there are no such things as abstract objects) they will be committed to the claim that the utterances of actual mathematicians are untrue. Thus, if paraphrase nominalists don’t claim that their paraphrases capture the actual meanings of ordinary mathematical sentences, then their view won’t provide a genuine alternative to fictionalism. It will collapse into a version of fictionalism. More specifically, a paraphrase nominalist would just be a fictionalist who thinks that we ought to alter our mathematical language, or what we mean by our mathematical utterances; or perhaps the claim would simply be that we could alter our mathematical language if we wanted to and that this fact provides fictionalists with a way of responding to certain objections.

1.3 Premise (2) and Deflationary-Truth Nominalism

Deflationary-truth nominalism is the view that (a) as platonists and fictionalists maintain, ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ should be read at face value, i.e., as being of the form ‘Fa’ and hence as making claims about mathematical objects, and (b) there are no such things as mathematical objects, but (c) our mathematical sentences are still true. Views of this kind have been endorsed by Azzouni (1994, 2004, 2010) and Bueno (2005, 2009). It should be noted, however, that Bueno—in his (2009)—calls his version of deflationary-truth nominalism a version of fictionalism. This isn’t because he really endorses the view that’s being called fictionalism in this essay; it’s because he uses the term ‘fictionalism’ differently from the way in which it’s being used in this essay. But it’s important to note that Bueno’s usage isn’t that different; for as we are about to see, deflationary-truth nominalism and fictionalism (as it’s being defined here) are fairly similar views. (Bueno’s view also differs from the fictionalist view defined here in a second way: he endorses agnosticism about abstract objects rather than full-blown anti-realism. But this difference is even less important than the first one; if we rephrased (b) and (c) in the above definition of fictionalism so that they were consistent with agnosticism, virtually nothing else about the fictionalist view would have to change. So fictionalists can choose whether they want to be agnostic or anti-realist about abstract objects, and this decision won’t have a very big impact on the rest of their view. Indeed, as will become clear in section 3, Bueno’s agnosticism might be more or less equivalent to the views of certain fictionalists.)

Before describing the problems with deflationary-truth nominalism, it’s important to note that the central claim behind that view is an empirical hypothesis about ordinary discourse. In particular, it’s a claim about the meaning of the term ‘true’, or about the concept of truth. When deflationary-truth nominalists say that, e.g., ‘3 is prime’ could be true even if there were no such thing as the number 3, they are making a claim about the ordinary concept of truth. They are saying that that concept applies in certain situations that most of us—platonists and fictionalists and just about everyone else—think it doesn’t apply in. If deflationary-truth nominalists try to deny that they are making a claim about the ordinary concept of truth, then their view will collapse into a version of fictionalism. For since they agree with fictionalists that ‘3 is prime’ purports to be about a certain abstract object, and since they also agree that there are no such things as abstract objects, it follows that if they endorsed a standard view of truth—i.e., a platonist-fictionalist view according to which a sentence of the form ‘Fa’ could not be true unless ‘a’ referred to an actually existing object—then they would have to admit that ‘3 is prime’ is untrue. Now, they might go on to argue that these sentences are true*—where this is defined in such a way that sentences of the form ‘Fa’ can be true* even if there is no such thing as a—but, of course, fictionalists would agree with this. So if deflationary-truth nominalism is to be genuinely distinct from fictionalism, it has to involve a thesis about the meaning of the ordinary word ‘true’; in particular, the claim has to be that sentences of the form ‘Fa’ can be true, in the ordinary sense of the term, even if the singular term ‘a’ doesn’t refer to any actually existing object.

Given this, most fictionalists would probably say that the problem with deflationary-truth nominalism is that it’s empirically implausible. In other words, the objection would be that deflationary-truth nominalism flies badly in the face of our intuitions about the meaning of ‘true’. And there does seem to be some justification for this claim. For instance, it just seems intuitively obvious that the sentence ‘Mars is a planet’ could not be literally true unless there really existed such a thing as Mars. Moreover, intuitively, the sentence ‘Mars is a planet, but it doesn’t exist’ seems like a contradiction, and this intuition seems to be incompatible with deflationary-truth nominalism. If this is right—if the deflationary-truth semantic thesis runs counter to our semantic intuitions—then this provides strong evidence for thinking it’s false.

But there is also a second problem with deflationary-truth nominalism: it’s supposed to provide us with a way of avoiding platonism, but in fact, it doesn’t. Prima facie, it might seem that deflationary-truth nominalism does deliver a way of avoiding platonism, because the argument for platonism might seem to rely upon premise (2) above—i.e., it might seem to rely upon the anti-deflationary-truth claim that if sentences like ‘4 is even’ should be read at face value, i.e., as being of the form ‘Fa’, and if these sentence are literally true, then we are committed to believing in the objects that they’re about, e.g., the number 4. But, in fact, platonists can formulate their argument so that it doesn’t rely upon this anti-deflationary-truth premise. To bring this point out, let’s begin by introducing two new terms of art—‘true1’ and ‘true2’—and stipulating that ‘true1’ is to be taken as expressing the platonist-fictionalist concept of truth, so that a sentence of the form ‘Fa’ cannot be true1 unless ‘a’ refers to an actually existing object, whereas ‘true2’ expresses a deflationary concept of truth, so that a sentence of the form ‘Fa’ can be true2 even if ‘a’ doesn’t refer to any actually existing object. Given this, platonists can say the following:

We just don’t care whether the word ‘true’, as it’s used in ordinary English, expresses truth1 or truth2 (or whether it’s ambiguous and sometimes expresses the one concept and sometimes the other). We acknowledge that standard formulations of the argument for platonism involve claims to the effect that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are true. But we could just as easily base our argument on the claim that sentences like this are true1. In doing this, we wouldn’t weaken our argument in any way. For the arguments we use to motivate the truth of mathematics—most notably, the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument discussed below—are already arguments for the truth1 of mathematics. And this shouldn’t be surprising; for when we say that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are true, what we mean is that they’re true1; so, of course, the arguments that we give for the truth of mathematics are already supposed to be arguments for the truth1 of mathematics.

Given that platonists can proceed in this way, it seems that the question of whether the deflationary-truth semantic thesis is right—i.e., the question of whether the English word ‘true’ expresses the concept of truth1 or truth2—is simply a red herring. The real question is whether platonists have any good arguments for the truth1 of mathematics (and, of course, whether anti-platonists have any good arguments against the truth1 of mathematics). In other words, if we assume that premises (1) and (4) are true, so that we have to read our mathematical claims as being about (or at least purporting to be about) abstract objects, then the real question is whether there are any good reasons for choosing between platonism and fictionalism.

1.4 Premise (4) and Physicalism and Psychologism

Physicalism is the view that our mathematical sentences and theories are about ordinary physical objects. John Stuart Mill (1843) developed a view of this kind. On his view, mathematics is just a very general natural science. Thus, for instance, according to Mill, the sentence ‘2 + 3 = 5’ is not a claim about abstract objects (the numbers 2, 3, and 5); rather, it’s a claim about piles of physical objects (in particular, it tells us that if we push a pile of two objects together with a pile of three objects, we’ll get a pile of five objects. (Phillip Kitcher (1984) and the early Penelope Maddy (1990) have also endorsed views with “physicalistic leanings”, but in the end, neither is plausibly interpreted as falling into this camp. Maddy’s early view is better thought of as a non-traditional sort of platonism, because according to this view, mathematics is about nonphysical objects that exist in space and time; and Kitcher’s view is best thought of as a kind of paraphrase nominalism, because on his view, mathematical utterances turn out not to be about any actually existing objects.)

There are numerous problems with physicalistic views of mathematics. To mention just one of these problems, physicalism seems completely incapable of accounting for various kinds of claims about infinities that we find in mathematics. For instance, it is a theorem of set theory that there are infinitely many transfinite cardinal numbers that keep getting bigger and bigger without end. Thus, set theory is committed to the existence of infinite sets that are so huge that they simply dwarf garden variety infinite sets, like the set of all the natural numbers. There is just no plausible way to interpret this talk of gigantic infinite sets as being about physical objects.

Psychologism is the view that mathematical sentences and theories are about mental objects. Probably the most common version of this view holds that numbers are something like ideas in our heads, and ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ provide descriptions of these ideas. This view was popular in the late 19th Century; it was endorsed by, e.g., the early Husserl (1891), as well as the intuitionists, Brouwer (1912, 1948) and Heyting (1956). But Frege (1884, 1893–1903) provided a host of arguments against the view and essentially buried it. To give just one argument here, it seems that psychologism is just as incapable as physicalism is of dealing with the huge infinities in mathematics. As was just seen, standard set theories entail that there actually exist huge infinities of mathematical objects. But it’s just not believable that there are that many ideas in our heads. Indeed, it seems clear that there are only finitely many ideas in our heads. Therefore, it is not plausible to maintain that the claims of set theory are made true by mental objects.

In response, one might claim that even if there aren’t infinitely many ideas in our heads, it seems likely that we have ideas of infinities in our heads. This is no doubt true—there are such ideas in our heads—but this does not save psychologism from the above objection. For our mathematical theories entail that there actually exist infinitely many different mathematical objects. E.g., standard theories of arithmetic entail that there is such a thing as 1, and that there is such a thing as 2 (and that it’s distinct from 1), and that there is such a thing as 3 (and that it’s distinct from both 1 and 2), and so on. So our mathematical theories are true descriptions of ideas in our heads only if there actually exist infinitely many different ideas in our heads. Thus, since there aren’t that many ideas in our heads, we cannot maintain that our mathematical theories are true descriptions of such things.

Alternatively, one might respond to the above argument against psychologism by moving to a view according to which mathematical claims are about ideas that we could construct, or possible mental objects, or some such thing. But this would not be a psychologistic view, because on this view, the objects of mathematics would not be actual mental objects; they would be possible objects, which, presumably, are either abstract objects or objects of some other metaphysically dubious kind.

Finally, one might object to both of the arguments in this subsection—i.e., the arguments against physicalism and psychologism—by saying something like this:

The arguments given here are supposed to motivate the idea that ordinary mathematical sentences like ‘4 is even’ are not plausibly interpreted as being about physical or mental objects—or more specifically, that they are better interpreted as being about (or at least purporting to be about) abstract objects. But one might object here that, as an interpretation of ordinary mathematical discourse, the platonist/fictionalist view is no more plausible than physicalism or psychologism. For one might find it implausible to suppose that when ordinary folk make mathematical claims, they intend to be speaking about abstract objects.

But platonists and fictionalists are not committed to the thesis that people have positive intentions to be talking about abstract objects. Rather, they can say the following: (i) ordinary mathematical claims are best interpreted at face value—and, hence, as making claims about objects—because typical mathematicians (and, indeed, typical examples of ordinary folk) do not have positive intentions to be speaking nonliterally when they utter mathematical sentences; and (ii) there are features of the intentions of typical mathematicians and typical folk, with respect to their mathematical utterances, that are inconsistent with the idea that these utterances are about physical or mental objects; and (iii) there is nothing in the intentions of typical mathematicians or typical folk that is inconsistent with the idea that our mathematical sentences are about abstract objects. Thus, on this view, the platonist/fictionalist semantic theory is better than other semantic theories of mathematical discourse because it’s the only theory that’s consistent with the data—not because mathematicians and ordinary folk have positive intentions to be speaking about abstract objects when they utter mathematical sentences.

(It’s worth noting, before moving on, that one can claim that the existence of mathematical objects like numbers is dependent on us without endorsing a psychologistic view of these objects. For one might claim that numbers are mind-dependent abstract objects—i.e., non-spatiotemporal objects that came into being because of the activities of human beings. Views of this general kind are endorsed by Liston (2003–04), Cole (2009), and Bueno (2009).)

1.5 Premise (5) and Platonism

If the arguments given so far are correct, then the only remaining views—the only philosophies of mathematics that haven’t been ruled out—are platonism and fictionalism. Thus, to complete their argument, fictionalists need merely to provide an argument for premise (5); in other words, they just need to argue against platonism. But this turns out to be a lot harder than arguing against the various non-fictionalistic versions of anti-platonism considered above. As we’ve seen, fictionalists can argue against those views by simply motivating a series of empirical hypotheses about ordinary mathematical discourse and the ordinary meaning of the word ‘true’. More specifically, fictionalists can argue against these views by arguing that (a) ordinary mathematical utterances are best interpreted at face value, and (b) these utterances cannot plausibly be interpreted as being about physical or mental objects, and (c) sentences of the form ‘The object a is an F’ cannot be true, in the ordinary sense of the term, unless there really is such a thing as a. But fictionalists cannot argue against platonism in anything like this way, because fictionalists and platonists are in agreement about the meanings of ordinary mathematical utterances (and the word ‘true’). Indeed, platonists and fictionalists don’t disagree about any semantic theses. Their disagreement is about an ontological thesis: platonists believe in abstract objects, whereas fictionalists do not. Thus, if fictionalists are going to argue against platonism, they’re going to have to use a different kind of argument.

There are a few different arguments that have been brought against mathematical platonism, but the most important—and the most famous—is what is known as the epistemological argument against platonism. This argument goes back at least to Plato. In contemporary times, it received its most classical statement in a paper by Paul Benacerraf (1973), although most philosophers of mathematics agree that Benacerraf’s formulation of the argument is problematic because of its reliance on an implausible causal theory of knowledge. A better way to formulate the argument is as follows:

  1. Human beings exist entirely within spacetime.
  2. If there exist any abstract mathematical objects, then they exist outside of spacetime. Therefore, it seems likely that
  3. If there exist any abstract mathematical objects, then human beings could not attain knowledge of them. But
  4. It’s built into the platonistic view that there do exist abstract objects and that human beings can acquire knowledge of them (after all, according to platonism, mathematical knowledge just is knowledge of abstract objects). Therefore,
  5. Platonism is false.

Platonists have tried to respond to this argument in a few different ways, but the most popular (and, it can be argued, the most plausible) response is to try to undermine the inference from (i) and (ii) to (iii) by explaining how (iii) could be false even if (i) and (ii) are true—i.e., how human beings could acquire knowledge of abstract objects despite the fact that they are causally isolated from such objects and, hence, do not have any information-transferring contact with such objects. This strategy of response has been pursued by Quine (1948, 1951), Steiner (1975), Katz (1981, 1998), Resnik (1982, 1997), Shapiro (1989, 1997), Lewis (1986), Linsky and Zalta (1995), Balaguer (1995, 1998a), and Linnebo (2006). The question of whether any of these responses succeeds is extremely controversial among philosophers of mathematics. Moreover, anti-platonists do not have any compelling argument for the thesis that platonists couldn’t provide the required explanation here—i.e., that they couldn’t explain how human beings could acquire knowledge of abstract objects without the aid of any information-transferring contact with such objects. Thus, to make a very long story short, it seems fair to say that the epistemological argument against platonism is, at best, controversial and inconclusive.

(For a more complete discussion of the epistemological argument against platonism, including discussions of the various responses that platonists have attempted, see the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry entitled “Platonism in Metaphysics”.)

Given that the epistemological argument does not succeed in refuting platonism, fictionalists might attempt to provide some other argument against platonism. One such argument that has received considerable attention is the multiple-reductions argument. The classical statement of this argument is given, once again, by Benacerraf (1965). The argument can be run in connection with any of our mathematical theories, but the point is usually made in connection with arithmetic. Moreover, even when we zero in on arithmetic, there are still many different ways to formulate the argument. One way to do this is as follows: (A) if there are any sequences of abstract objects that satisfy our arithmetical theories, then there are infinitely many, and there is nothing “metaphysically special” about any of these sequences that makes it stand out as the sequence of natural numbers; but (B) platonism is committed to the thesis that there is a unique sequence of abstract objects that is the natural numbers. Therefore, (C) platonism is false.

Platonists have offered numerous responses to this argument. Probably the most common strategy has been to reject (A), i.e., to argue that platonists can in fact defend the claim that there is a unique sequence that stands out as the sequence of natural numbers. This strategy has been pursued in different ways by, e.g., Resnik (1997), Shapiro (1997), Parsons (1990), and Linsky and Zalta (1995). Moreover, Balaguer (1998a) argues that even if (A) is true, it doesn’t matter, because (B) is false: platonists can simply admit that there are numerous sequences that satisfy our arithmetical theories and that it may be that none of them stands out as the one and only sequence of natural numbers. There is no widespread agreement on the status of these platonistic responses, and so, as is the case with the epistemological argument, it would be extremely controversial, if not downright implausible, to claim that the multiple-reductions argument refutes platonism.

Aside from this, the only argument against platonism that has received much attention in the philosophy of mathematics is an Ockham’s-razor-based argument. We will return to this argument (very briefly) in section 3; for now, we can simply note that, like the epistemological argument and the multiple-reductions argument, the Ockham’s-razor-based argument is very controversial, and the claim that this argument refutes platonism is (at the very least) tendentious. Thus, the overall conclusion that we seem led to here is this: even if fictionalists can motivate the platonist/fictionalist semantics of mathematical discourse and, thus, eliminate all of the anti-platonistic alternatives to fictionalism, they do not have any really compelling argument against platonism, or for the conclusion that fictionalism is superior to platonism. In other words, fictionalists don’t have any compelling argument for premise (5), and so the positive argument for their view is, at best, incomplete.

2. Objections to Fictionalism and Responses

Given that there are no compelling arguments against platonism, the next question one might naturally ask is whether there are any good arguments against fictionalism (and hence, if platonism is really the only plausible alternative to fictionalism, in favor of platonism). The present section considers several such arguments. In going through the fictionalist responses to these arguments, we will also see how different philosophers have developed different versions of fictionalism.

2.1 The Indispensability Argument

By far the most important and widely discussed argument against fictionalism is what’s known as the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument (see, e.g., Quine (1948, 1951), Putnam (1971), Resnik (1997), and Colyvan (2001)). This argument has been formulated in a number of different ways. One very simple version of the argument can be put like this: (i) mathematical sentences form an indispensable part of our empirical theories of the physical world—i.e., our theories of physics, chemistry, and so on; (ii) we have good reasons for thinking that these empirical theories are true, i.e., that they give us accurate pictures of the world; therefore, (iii) we have good reasons to think that our mathematical sentences are true and, hence, that fictionalism is false.

Fictionalists have developed two different kinds of responses to this argument. The first one, due to Field (1980, 2016), can be called the nominalization response, and the version of fictionalism it gives us can be called hard-road fictionalism. The second response, developed by Balaguer (1996a, 1998a), Melia (2000), Rosen (2001), Yablo (2005), Bueno (2009), and Leng (2010), can be called the no-nominalization response, and the version of fictionalism it gives us can be called easy-road fictionalism, or weasel fictionalism. Moreover, (The names here are due to Colyvan and Melia; the former speaks of ‘hard-road nominalism’ and ‘easy-road nominalism’, and the latter speaks of ‘weasel nominalism’.)

Field’s hard-road response is based on the rejection of premise (i). He argues that mathematics is, in fact, not indispensable to empirical science. Field tries to establish this thesis by arguing that our empirical theories can be nominalized, i.e., reformulated in a way that avoids reference to, and existential quantification over, abstract objects. This is an extremely controversial claim, and it is very difficult to establish, for presumably, one would have to actually carry out the nominalization for every one of our empirical theories—thus, the name hard-road fictionalism. Field did not try to do this for all of our empirical theories. Rather, he tried to motivate his position by explaining how the nominalization would go for one empirical theory, namely, Newtonian Gravitation Theory. Now, some people have complained that even if Field’s strategy could work for this one theory, it might not work for other theories, and in particular, Malament (1982) has argued that his strategy would not work in connection with Quantum Mechanics (but see Balaguer (1996b and 1998a) for an argument that Field’s strategy can be extended to the case of quantum mechanics, and see Bueno (2003) for a response). Moreover, there are several other objections that have been raised against Field’s program—see, e.g., Malament (1982), Shapiro (1983), Resnik (1985), and Chihara (1990, chapter 8, section 5). On the other hand, there are other works that develop, or provide motivation for, hard-road nominalist views; e.g., Arntzenius and Dorr (2012) develop a way to nominalize the theory of differentiable manifolds. At present, the status of the Fieldian hard-road response to the Quine-Putnam argument remains controversial.

Balaguer’s easy-road response begins by granting premise (i) of the Quine-Putnam argument—i.e., by granting (for the sake of argument) that there do exist indispensable applications of mathematics to empirical science. Balaguer’s strategy is simply to account for these applications from a fictionalist point of view. His argument can be summarized as follows: If there are any such things as abstract objects, then they are causally inert. But given this, it follows that the truth of empirical science depends upon two sets of facts that hold or don’t hold independently of one another. One of these sets of facts is purely platonistic and mathematical, and the other is purely physical (or more precisely, purely anti-platonistic). Since these two sets of facts hold or don’t hold independently of one another, fictionalists can maintain that (a) there does obtain a set of purely physical facts of the sort required here, i.e., the sort needed to make empirical science true, but (b) there doesn’t obtain a set of purely platonistic facts of the sort required for the truth of empirical science (because there are no such things as abstract objects). Therefore, fictionalism is consistent with an essentially realistic view of empirical science, because fictionalists can maintain that even if there are no such things as mathematical objects and, hence, our empirical theories aren’t strictly true, these theories still paint an essentially accurate picture of the physical world, because the physical world is just the way it needs to be for empirical science to be true. In other words, fictionalists can maintain that the physical world “holds up its end of the empirical-science bargain”. Finally, to provide a view of what mathematics is doing in empirical science, the claim is that it functions as a descriptive or representational aid. In other words, it gives us an easy way of making claims about the physical world. For instance, by making reference to real numbers—or, better, by using terms that purport to refer to real numbers—we give ourselves an easy way of describing the temperature states of physical systems. And Balaguer argues that mathematics can succeed in its role as a descriptive aid even if it isn’t true; indeed, he argues that truth is simply no help at all in this connection.

Others have developed similar views. For instance, Melia (2000) argues that we can assert our empirical theories and then simply take back the platonistic/mathematical consequences of those assertions. And Rosen (2001) argues that fictionalism is epistemically permissible because another community of scientists could accept the very same theories that we do while endorsing—or, more to the point, rationally endorsing—a fictionalist attitude toward the mathematical components of their theories. And Bueno (2009) argues that mathematics plays a descriptive role in empirical science, and because of this, it needn’t be true in order to be applicable. And Leng (2010) argues that the indispensability argument does not refute fictionalism because fictionalists can provide an adequate account of the success of science.

Yablo (2005, 2002a, 2002b) also develops a view like this (and it’s worth noting that his view here draws heavily on the work of Walton (1990)). Yablo claims that mathematics appears in science as a representational aid and that it doesn’t need to be true in order to do this well. But his version of the view is a bit different because he thinks that the sentences of our platonistically formulated empirical theories—or at least typical utterances of these sentences—are actually true, because their real contents are nominalistic. To use a trivial sort of example, consider the sentence

(M) The number of Martian moons is 2.

According to Yablo, typical utterances of sentences like (M) are analogous to ordinary instances of figurative speech, e.g., sentences like

(A) The average mum has 2.4 children.

The syntactic form of (A) seems to suggest that it’s about an actual object known as the average mum; but, of course, it isn’t—to read it in this way would be to misunderstand what people mean when they utter sentences like (A). Likewise, according to Yablo, while it might seem that (M) is making a claim partially about an actual object known as 2, it really isn’t. Rather, the real content of (M)—i.e., what typical utterances of this sentence really say—is that there are two Martian moons. And, of course, this claim—i.e., the claim that there are two Martian moons—is not a claim about the number 2 or any other abstract object; it is nominalistically kosher. In sum, then, the idea here is that fictionalists about pure mathematics can endorse a paraphrase nominalist view of mixed mathematical sentences.

(It is worth noting that Yablo also seems to think that, at least sometimes, pure mathematical sentences have real contents—i.e., really say things—that are nominalistic and true. For instance, he thinks that, at least sometimes, sentences like ‘3 + 2 = 5’ say things like if there are three Fs and two Gs, then (barring overlap) there are five F-or-Gs. Moreover, at times, Yablo seems to at least hint at the view that, at least sometimes, when we utter sentences like ‘3 is prime,’ what we’re really saying is that ‘3 is prime’ is true or acceptable according to the theory (or the story, or the game) of arithmetic. It’s not clear how seriously Yablo takes this idea, however; at any rate, it seems pretty clear that if he endorses it at all, he thinks it’s true in only some contexts, i.e., of only some pure mathematical utterances. Whatever Yablo’s view is, though, it’s important to note that views of this general kind—i.e., views that take pure mathematical sentences to have real contents, or really say things, that are nominalistic and true—are not versions of fictionalism at all, as that view has been defined here. They are rather versions of paraphrase nominalism, and so they are subject to the argument against that view given in section 1.2. We will return (very briefly) to the issue of whether Yablo’s view is really a version of fictionalism in section 2.3.)

For more on views like Yablo’s, see Plebani (2018) and Berto and Plebani (2015).

It’s worth noting that proponents of easy-road nominalism do not prefer their view to Field’s simply because it’s “easier”, or because it doesn’t involve a commitment to the controversial claim that our empirical theories can be nominalized. Melia, Yablo, and Balaguer all argue that the view is independently superior to Field’s view because it fits better with actual scientific practice.

It’s also worth noting that easy-road responses to the Quine-Putnam argument have been developed by people who don’t endorse fictionalism—e.g., Sober (1993), Maddy (1995, 1997), Mortensen (1998), and Azzouni (2004).

A response to the easy-road view has been given by Colyvan (2002, 2010) and Baker (2005, 2009). They argue that mathematics doesn’t just play a descriptive role in science. It also plays an explanatory role. For instance, Baker considers a case involving various species of periodic cicadas in which the nymphal stage is either 13 or 17 years. Why are the nymphal stages 13 or 17 years? According to evolutionary biologists, the answer is that 13 and 17 are prime numbers, and this minimizes intersections with other periodic species. Colyvan and Baker argue that cases like this—cases in which mathematical objects play an indispensable role in the explanations of physical phenomena—provide us with a better and more powerful version of the indispensability argument. Indeed, they argue that if there really are cases involving genuinely mathematical explanations of physical phenomena, then easy-road versions of fictionalism cannot succeed. But this claim is open to debate, and responses to these explanatory versions of the indispensability argument have been given by Melia (2002), Leng (2005b), Bangu (2008), Daly and Langford (2009), and Yablo (2012).

2.2 Objectivity

A second objection to fictionalism is based on the idea that fictionalists cannot account for the objectivity of mathematics. It is an obvious fact about mathematical practice that there’s some sort of objectivity at work in that practice. There’s an important difference in mathematics between sentences like ‘2 + 2 = 4’ and ‘3 is prime’ on the one hand and ‘2 + 2 = 5’ and ‘3 is composite’ on the other. There’s obviously some sense in which the first two sentences, but not the second two, are “correct”, or “right”, or “good”, or some such thing. The most obvious thing to say here is that the first two sentence are true whereas the latter two are false. But fictionalists cannot say this; they’re committed to saying that all four of these sentences are untrue. Thus, the question arises whether fictionalists have any adequate account of the objectivity of mathematics—i.e., of the differences between these two kinds of sentences.

Once again, there are two different responses that fictionalists have given to this problem. These two responses give us versions of fictionalism that, for lack of a better pair of terms, can be called formalistic fictionalism and non-formalistic fictionalism.

The formalistic view has been developed by Field (1980, 1989, 1998). On his view, the difference between ‘3 is prime’ and ‘3 is composite’ is analogous to the difference between, say, ‘Santa Claus wears a red suit’ and ‘Santa Claus wears a green suit’. More specifically, Field’s idea is that the difference between sentences like ‘3 is prime’ and ‘3 is composite’ is that the former (but not the latter) are part of a certain well-known “story”, namely, the story of mathematics. Field puts this point by saying that while ‘3 is prime’ and ‘3 is composite’ are both strictly untrue, the former is true in the story of mathematics, whereas the latter is not. Now, most of Field’s view here is consistent with both formalistic fictionalism and non-formalistic fictionalism. The difference between these two views has to do with what fictionalists take the story of mathematics to consist in. For Field, the story of mathematics consists essentially in a bunch of formal systems, namely, the ones that we currently accept. More precisely, he says (1998, p. 391) that a mathematical sentence is fictionalistically correct if and only if it is “a consequence of accepted axioms [in a]…sense of consequence that goes a bit beyond first-order consequence in including the logic of the quantifier ‘only finitely many’”. So on this view, the difference between sentences like ‘3 is prime’ and ‘3 is composite’—the reason the former are “correct” and the latter are not—is that the former follow from accepted mathematical axioms. (This view has also been endorsed by Leng (2010); she says that mathematical acceptability comes down to following from accepted axioms.)

Balaguer (2001, 2009) argues that Field’s formalistic view can’t be right, and he develops a non-formalistic alternative to it. His argument against the formalistic view is that it cannot account for all of the objectivity that we find in mathematics. Most importantly, the formalistic view entails (incorrectly) that there can be no objectively correct answers to questions that ask about the truth values of mathematical sentences that are undecidable in currently accepted mathematical theories. The most famous example here is probably the continuum hypothesis (CH), which is undecidable in currently accepted set theories, e.g., Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory (ZF). (In other words, ZF is consistent with both CH and ~CH; i.e., ZF+CH and ZF+~CH are both consistent set theories.) Given this, it follows from Field’s view that neither CH nor ~CH is part of the story of mathematics and, hence, that there is no objectively correct answer to the CH question. This, however, seems unacceptable, because it could turn out that mathematicians are going to discover an objectively correct answer to the CH question. For instance, suppose that some mathematician came up with a new axiom candidate AX such that (i) all mathematicians agreed that AX was an intuitively obvious claim about sets, and (ii) ZF+AX entailed CH. If this happened, then mathematicians would say that they had proven CH, and that they had discovered that CH was correct, and so on. Field’s view would force us to say that if we endorsed AX, then CH would become true in the story of mathematics. But this seems to get things wrong. Given the intuitive obviousness of AX, it seems very natural to say that, in this scenario, mathematicians discovered that CH had been true (or “correct”, or true in the story of mathematics, or whatever we want to call it) all along—i.e., that we didn’t just make this up by endorsing a new theory. And, again, it seems that this is what mathematicians would say. So, Balaguer argues, Field’s formalistic view of the objectivity of mathematics is unacceptable.

Balaguer’s non-formalistic version of fictionalism retains Field’s thesis that mathematical “correctness” has to do with being true in the story of mathematics, but it abandons the Fieldian view that the story of mathematics consists in currently accepted axioms. According to Balaguer, the so-called “story of mathematics” consists in the thesis that there actually exist abstract mathematical objects of the kinds that platonists have in mind, i.e., the kinds that our mathematical theories purport to be about. Thus, on this view, a mathematical sentence is fictionalistically correct if and only if it would have been true if there had actually existed abstract mathematical objects of the kinds that platonists have in mind. Balaguer argues that if fictionalists adopt this view, they can avoid the above problem with Field’s view and, more generally, they can completely solve the problem of objectivity because they can mimic everything platonists say about objectivity.

2.3 Revolutionism and Hermeneuticism

Another objection to fictionalism is put forward by Burgess (2004)—and it should be noted that the argument here has roots in Burgess (1983) and Burgess and Rosen (1997). The argument can be put like this:

Fictionalists face a dilemma: they have to endorse either hermeneutic fictionalism or revolutionary fictionalism, but neither is plausible. We can define hermeneutic fictionalism as the view that mathematicians (and perhaps ordinary folk) intend their mathematical talk to be taken as a form of fiction; more specifically, the view here is that, according to ordinary mathematical intentions, singular terms like ‘3’ are not supposed to refer, and sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are not supposed to be true. But hermeneutic fictionalism is implausible and unmotivated; as an empirical hypothesis about what mathematicians intend, there is simply no good evidence for it, and it seems obviously false. Revolutionary fictionalism, on the other hand, is the view that (a) mathematicians do not intend their utterances to be taken as fiction, or as non-literal in any other way; and so (b) we should interpret mathematicians as really asserting what their sentences say, i.e., as making assertions that are about (or that purport to be about) mathematical objects; but (c) since there are no such things as mathematical objects, the assertions of mathematicians are simply untrue claims. But revolutionary fictionalism is implausible as well; given the track records of philosophers and mathematicians, it would be “comically immodest” for philosophers to presume that they had discovered a problem with mathematics (Burgess, 2004, p. 30).

No one has ever defended hermeneutic fictionalism, as it’s defined above. Yablo (2002a) claims that his view is a version of hermeneutic fictionalism—and Plebani (2018) follows him in this way of talking—but the view that these philosophers have in mind is a bit different from the hermeneutic fictionalist view described above. Yablo does not claim that mathematicians intend their utterances of sentences like ‘3 is prime’ to be taken as fictional claims. Rather, he thinks these utterances are (at least sometimes, or perhaps typically) analogous to ordinary examples of figurative speech, e.g., sentences like ‘The back burner is where you put things to let them simmer.’ This sentence contains a singular term—‘the back burner’—that seems (syntactically) to be a denoting expression; but it’s not really a denoting expression (at least in typical cases) and to interpret it as a genuine denoting expression in sentences like the above would be to badly misunderstand what typical speakers of sentences like this intend to be saying. Yablo thinks that something like this is true in connection with typical utterances of (pure and mixed) mathematical sentences, e.g., sentences like ‘3 is prime’ and ‘The number of Martian moons is 2.’ So Yablo is certainly proposing a hermeneutic nominalist view, but it’s not clear that his view is best thought of as a kind of hermeneutic fictionalism. As was noted above (section 2.1), the view might be better classified as a sort of paraphrase nominalism. Yablo calls his view figuralism, and he talks as if it is a version of fictionalism. But he seems to be using the term ‘fictionalism’ differently from how it’s been defined here. What he likely has in mind is this: on a literal reading, mathematical sentences are untrue, as fictionalism says, but there’s an alternative reading on which they come out true (and nominalistically kosher). But what makes it awkward to take Yablo’s view as a version of fictionalism is that he seems to think that what (pure and mixed) mathematical sentences really say—or, more precisely, what typical utterances of these sentences really say—is true and nominalistic in content. This sounds more like paraphrase nominalism than fictionalism.

Stanley (2001) has mounted several arguments against hermeneutic fictionalism. Responses to his arguments are given by Yablo (2002a) and Liggins (2010).

In contrast to Yablo, Leng (2005a, 2010), Daly (2006), and Balaguer (2009) respond to Burgess’s argument by defending revolutionary fictionalism. Leng’s version of the response is based on the claim that it is acceptable for philosophers to evaluate and criticize the work of mathematicians. Of course, Leng acknowledges that mathematics is a very successful practice and that philosophers have to respect this, but her claim is that we can account for the success of mathematics without supposing that it’s true. And given this, she argues, we can rationally evaluate and criticize mathematical practice from the outside, from a philosophical point of view.

But there’s another kind of revolutionary fictionalism that doesn’t involve any sort of criticism of mathematics. As it’s formulated above, revolutionary fictionalism is simply the view that (i) we should interpret mathematicians as asserting what their sentences say, so that (ii) their utterances are untrue claims about abstract objects. But it doesn’t follow from this that there’s something wrong with mathematics—something worthy of criticism. This suggests that ‘revolutionary fictionalism’ isn’t a very good name for the view. ‘Assertional fictionalism’ would be a better name. If we spoke this way, then we could say that there are both revolutionary and non-revolutionary kinds of assertional fictionalism. Revolutionary assertional fictionalists would say that we should change what we’re doing in mathematics so that we’re no longer making untrue claims; e.g., we should start intending our mathematical claims to be taken as fictions, or we should start using our mathematical sentences to mean what if-thenists think they mean, or some such thing. Non-revolutionary assertional fictionalists, on the other hand, would say that there’s nothing wrong with mathematics, as it’s currently practiced; they would admit that mathematical sentences like ‘4 is even’ aren’t true; but they would maintain that there’s nothing wrong with this because the mark of goodness in mathematics isn’t truth—it’s truth in the story of mathematics, or some such thing.

Field seems to endorse some view in the neighborhood of this sort of non-revolutionism. In discussing Burgess’s argument in the preface to the second edition of Science Without Numbers, he says this: “In my view, this is a false dichotomy. I certainly didn’t think that the account I was providing was ‘hermeneutic,’ but it wasn’t ‘revolutionary’ either: I took what I was doing, rather, as providing an account that explains why ordinary mathematical practice is perfectly fine.” (Field, 2016, p. 4.)

Finally, Balaguer (2009) argues that there are ways for fictionalists to avoid both hermeneuticism and assertionalism and, hence, that they might be able to avoid Burgess’s dilemma altogether. Moreover, Field (2016) seems to endorse a view like this as well. But Armour-Garb (2011) has argued that the version of (non-hermeneuticist, non-assertional) fictionalism that Balaguer proposes here is untenable.

2.4 Similarity to Fiction

A few people—e.g., Katz (1998), Thomas (2000 and 2002), Hoffman (2004), Burgess (2004), and Thomasson (2013)—have objected to fictionalism on the grounds that there are obvious disanalogies between mathematics and fiction. (What exactly the disanalogies are differs in different versions of the objection. E.g., Katz argues that consistency is an important criterion for goodness in mathematics but not in fiction. And Burgess argues that the question of whether mathematical objects exist is not empirically meaningful, whereas the question of whether the (non-abstract) objects in our fictional stories exist is empirically meaningful.)

One way that fictionalists can respond to this objection is to claim that it’s simply irrelevant because fictionalism does not involve the claim that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction. As it was defined above, fictionalism is the view that (a) our mathematical sentences and theories do purport to be about abstract mathematical objects, as platonism suggests, but (b) there are no such things as abstract objects, and so (c) our mathematical theories are not true. There is no claim about fictional discourse at all here, and so fictionalists can simply deny that their view entails that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction.

Now, this does not mean that fictionalists can’t claim that there are some relevant analogies between mathematics and fiction. They can of course claim that there are; e.g., they might want to say that, as is the case in mathematics, there are no such things as fictional objects and, because of this, typical fictional sentences are not literally true. But by making such claims, fictionalists do not commit themselves to any stronger claims about the analogy between mathematics and fiction—e.g., that mathematical discourse is a kind of fictional discourse—and they certainly don’t commit themselves to the claim that there are no important disanalogies between the two enterprises. In short, fictionalism is perfectly consistent with the claim that there are numerous important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction.

Finally, it should be noted that there are some fictionalists who do seem to want to make some stronger claims about the analogy between mathematics and fiction. Such people might have to take objections of the above kind more seriously. But none of the fictionalists discussed in this essay endorses any very strong claims of this kind; in particular, none of them says anything that entails that there are no important disanalogies between mathematics and fiction. On the other hand, it should be noted that Yablo and Bueno have made some claims in this connection that go beyond what fictionalists need to say. For instance, Bueno (2009) says that mathematical objects are similar to fictional characters in that they are abstract artifacts (in saying this, he follows Thomasson’s (1999) view of fictional characters). And Yablo has made some relatively strong claims about an analogy that he thinks holds between mathematical utterances and metaphorical utterances, or figurative utterances. Thus, Yablo’s particular version of fictionalism is open to objections to the effect that mathematical utterances are in fact not similar or analogous to metaphorical utterances. Some objections of this kind have been raised by Stanley (2001), and Yablo responds to them in his (2002a). But since Yablo doesn’t claim that mathematical utterances are analogous to fictional utterances, he does not have to respond to objections of the kind mentioned at the start of the present subsection.

2.5 Accepting and Believing

As became clear in section 2.2, while fictionalists think that sentences like ‘2 + 2 = 4’ are strictly speaking false, they nonetheless think they’re “correct” in some sense of the term. What, then, is the fictionalist’s attitude toward these sentences? Following Bas van Fraassen (1980), who endorses a similar view with respect to empirical science, the standard fictionalist line here is that they accept sentences like ‘2 + 2 = 4’ without believing them. How exactly acceptance should be defined is a matter of some controversy, but one obvious way to proceed here is to claim that fictionalists accept a pure mathematical sentence S if and only if they believe that S is true in the story of mathematics.

Some people object to the distinction between belief and acceptance. Horwich (1991), O’Leary-Hawthorne (1997), and Burgess and Rosen (1997) present arguments for the claim that there is no real difference between acceptance and belief because, roughly, (a) to believe something is just to be disposed to behave in certain ways, and (b) those who believe that 2 + 2 = 4 and those who allegedly only accept that 2 + 2 = 4 are presumably disposed to behave in exactly the same ways.

Daly (2008) and Leng (2010) provide a number of responses to this argument. One point Daly makes is that fictionalists are in fact not disposed to behave in the same ways that platonists are. They’re disposed to behave very differently in response to questions like, “Do there actually exist any such things as numbers?”

2.6 Mysterious Extra Content

Thomasson (2013) raises an objection to Yablo’s specific version of fictionalism. As we saw above, Yablo (2005, 2002a, 2002b) distinguishes between the literal contents and the real contents of sentences like

(M) The number of Martian moons is 2.

Thomasson argues that Yablo is committed to the claim that something more is needed for the truth of the literal contents of sentences like (M) than is needed for the truth of the real contents of these sentences. But what could this extra something be? According to Thomasson, this is obscure, and unless Yablo can say something more about this, we ought not to accept his view.

One response to this—given by Contessa (2016, p. 771)—is that it’s obvious what more is needed; it needs to be the case that there are “mind-independent, non-spatiotemporally located, causally inert abstract objects.”

A different response is given by Plebani (2018). He argues that regardless of whether Yablovian fictionalists can articulate two different truth conditions for sentences like (M), the real and literal contents of these sentences can be distinguished because they have different subject matters.

2.7 Other Objections

There are, of course, other objections to fictionalism. Probably the most widely discussed is based on the claim that fictionalism is not a genuinely nominalistic view because the very formulation of fictionalism includes statements that involve ontological commitments to abstract objects. It would be difficult to address this objection here, though, because it takes a different form in connection with each different version of fictionalism, and as the foregoing discussion makes clear, there are many different versions of fictionalism (e.g., one can endorse either hard-road fictionalism or easy-road fictionalism; and both of these views can be combined with either formalistic fictionalism or non-formalistic fictionalism; and any of these views can be combined with hermeneutic fictionalism or revolutionary assertional fictionalism or non-revolutionary assertional fictionalism; and so on). It should be noted, though, that several different defenders of fictionalism have responded to worries about the nominalistic status of their own particular versions of fictionalism. In particular, Field (1989) defends his version of fictionalism against the charge that it is commits to the existence of spacetime points, which one might think are not nominalistically kosher; and Balaguer (1998a) defends his version against the charge that it (and, indeed, Field’s version) are committed to the existence of stories, which would presumably be abstract objects if they existed; and finally, Rosen (2001) defends his view against the charge that it commits to theories and possible worlds. Balaguer and Rosen are both concerned with the worry that ficitionalists are committed to the existence of sentence types, which would presumably be abstract objects. Daly presents a version of this worry in his (2008), and he provides a counter to Balaguer’s response to the worry. He also provides a counter to a response that Rosen had given earlier, in his (1990).

Another objection to fictionalism (or, more precisely, to easy-road fictionalism) is raised by Szabo (2001). Let S be some mathematical sentence like ‘4 is even’. Szabo argues against easy-road fictionalists on the grounds that if they deny that S is true but continue to use it in ways that seem indistinguishable from the ways that platonists use it, then they’re essentially committed to saying things like ‘4 is even, but I don’t believe it’—which, according to Szabo, gets them into trouble with respect to Moore’s paradox.

Finally, Chihara (2010) raises objections to the fictionalist views of both Field and Balaguer.

3. Conclusion

So there are several different objections to fictionalism out there, but fictionalists have responses to all of them, and it is not at all obvious that any of the objections succeeds in refuting fictionalism. Thus, at the present time, it seems at least prima facie plausible to suppose that fictionalism can be defended. On the other hand, if the claims of section 1 are correct, then fictionalists do not have a compelling positive argument in favor of their view. The arguments of sections 1.2–1.4 suggest that there are good reasons for rejecting the various anti-platonistic alternatives to fictionalism and, hence, for thinking that platonism and fictionalism are the two best views of mathematics, but there does not seem to be any good argument for favoring fictionalism over platonism or vice versa. Now, most fictionalists would probably say—and some have said (see, e.g., Leng, 2010)—that this situation itself already gives us a good reason to favor fictionalism over platonism. For if we take the claim that there is no good positive argument for platonism and we combine it with Ockham’s razor (i.e., the principle that tells us that if two theories account for all the same facts, then, ceteris parabis, we ought to endorse the more ontologically parsimonious of the two), then we seem to be led to the result that fictionalism is superior to platonism. It should be noted, however, that this argument is explicitly rejected by at least two of the defenders of fictionalism discussed above. Rosen (see, e.g., Burgess and Rosen, 1997) doubts that there is any good reason to accept Ockham’s razor, and Balaguer (1998a) argues that even if we accept it, there are reasons to think that it is not applicable in the present case. Thus, Rosen and Balaguer both think that, at present, we do not have any good reason to endorse platonism or fictionalism. Moreover, as was noted in section 1.3, Bueno (2009) thinks fictionalists should be agnostic about the existence of abstract objects; this seems to be more or less equivalent to Rosen’s view; Balaguer’s view is a bit different because he actually thinks that there’s no fact of the matter whether abstract objects exist.


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