Foreknowledge and Free Will
Fatalism is the thesis that human acts occur by necessity and hence are unfree. Theological fatalism is the thesis that infallible foreknowledge of a human act makes the act necessary and hence unfree. If there is a being who knows the entire future infallibly, then no human act is free.
Fatalism seems to be entailed by infallible foreknowledge by the following informal line of reasoning:
For any future act you will perform, if some being infallibly believed in the past that the act would occur, there is nothing you can do now about the fact that he believed what he believed since nobody has any control over past events; nor can you make him mistaken in his belief, given that he is infallible. Therefore, there is nothing you can do now about the fact that he believed in a way that cannot be mistaken that you would do what you will do. But if so, you cannot do otherwise than what he believed you would do. And if you cannot do otherwise, you will not perform the act freely.
The same argument can be applied to any infallibly foreknown act of any human being. If there is a being who infallibly knows everything that will happen in the future, no human being has any control over the future.
This theological fatalist argument creates a dilemma because many people have thought it important to maintain both (1) there is a deity who infallibly knows the entire future, and (2) human beings have free will in the strong sense usually called libertarian. But the theological fatalist argument seems to show that (1) and (2) are incompatible; the only way consistently to accept (2) is to deny (1). Those philosophers who think there is a way to consistently maintain both (1) and (2) are called compatibilists about infallible foreknowledge and human free will. Compatibilists must either identify a false premise in the argument for theological fatalism or show that the conclusion does not follow from the premises. Incompatibilists accept the incompatibility of infallible foreknowledge and human free will and deny either infallible foreknowledge or free will in the sense targeted by the argument.
- 1. The argument for theological fatalism
- 2. Compatibilist responses to theological fatalism
- 3. Incompatibilist responses to the argument for theological fatalism
- 4. Logical fatalism
- 5. Beyond fatalism
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1. The argument for theological fatalism
There is a long history of debate over the soundness of the argument for theological fatalism, so its soundness must not be obvious. Nelson Pike (1965) gets the credit for clearly and forcefully presenting the dilemma in a way that produced an enormous body of work by both compatibilists and incompatibilists, leading to more careful formulations of the argument.
A precise version of the argument can be formulated as follows: Choose some proposition about a future act that you think you will do freely, if any act is free. Suppose, for example, that the telephone will ring at 9 am tomorrow and you will either answer it or you will not. So it is either true that you will answer the phone at 9 am tomorrow or it is true that you will not answer the phone at 9 am tomorrow. The Law of Excluded Middle rules out any other alternative. Let T abbreviate the proposition that you will answer the phone tomorrow at 9, and let us suppose that T is true. (If not-T is true instead, simply substitute not-T in the argument below).
Let “now-necessary” designate temporal necessity, the type of necessity that the past is supposed to have just because it is past. We will discuss this type of necessity in sections 2.3 and 2.6, but we can begin with the intuitive idea that there is a kind of necessity that a proposition has now when the content of the proposition is about something that occurred in the past. To say that it is now-necessary that milk has been spilled is to say nobody can do anything now about the fact that the milk has been spilled.
Let “God” designate a being who has infallible beliefs about the future, where to say that God believes p infallibly is to say that God believes p and it is not possible that God believes p and p is false. It is not important for the logic of the argument that God is the being worshiped by any particular religion, but the motive to maintain that there is a being with infallible beliefs is usually a religious one.
One more preliminary point is in order. The dilemma of infallible foreknowledge and human free will does not rest on the particular assumption of foreknowledge and does not require an analysis of knowledge. Most contemporary accounts of knowledge are fallibilist, which means they do not require that a person believe in a way that cannot be mistaken in order to have knowledge. She has knowledge just in case what she believes is true and she satisfies the other conditions for knowledge, such as having sufficiently strong evidence. Ordinary knowledge does not require that the belief cannot be false. For example, if I believe on strong evidence that classes begin at my university on a certain date, and when the day arrives, classes do begin, we would normally say I knew in advance that classes would begin on that date. I had foreknowledge about the date classes begin. But there is nothing problematic about that kind of foreknowledge because events could have proven me wrong even though as events actually turned out, they didn’t prove me wrong. Ordinary foreknowledge does not threaten to necessitate the future because it does not require that when I know p it is not possible that my belief is false. The key problem, then, is the infallibility of the belief about the future, and this is a problem whether or not the epistemic agent with an infallible belief satisfies the other conditions required by some account of knowledge, such as sufficient evidence. As long as an agent has an infallible belief about the future, the problem arises.
Using the example of the proposition T, the argument that infallible foreknowledge of T entails that you do not answer the telephone freely can be formulated as follows:
- Basic Argument for Theological Fatalism.
- (1) Yesterday God infallibly believed T. [Supposition of infallible foreknowledge]
- (2) If E occurred in the past, it is now-necessary that E occurred then. [Principle of the Necessity of the Past]
- (3) It is now-necessary that yesterday God believed T. [1, 2]
- (4) Necessarily, if yesterday God believed T, then T. [Definition of “infallibility”]
- (5) If p is now-necessary, and necessarily (p → q), then q is now-necessary. [Transfer of Necessity Principle]
- (6) So it is now-necessary that T. [3,4,5]
- (7) If it is now-necessary that T, then you cannot do otherwise than answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am. [Definition of “necessary”]
- (8) Therefore, you cannot do otherwise than answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am. [6, 7]
- (9) If you cannot do otherwise when you do an act, you do not act freely. [Principle of Alternate Possibilities]
- (10) Therefore, when you answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am, you will not do it freely. [8, 9]
This argument is formulated in a way that makes its logical form as perspicuous as possible, and there is a consensus that this argument or something close to it is valid. That is, if the premises are all true, the conclusion follows. The compatibilist about infallible foreknowledge and free will must therefore find a false premise. There are four premises that are not straightforward substitutions in definitions: (1), (2), (5), and (9). Premises (1) and (2) have been attacked in influential ways in the history of discussion of theological fatalism. Boethius and Aquinas denied premise (1) on the grounds that God and his beliefs are not in time, a solution that has always had some adherents. William of Ockham denied premise (2) on the grounds that the necessity of the past does not apply to the entire past, and God’s past beliefs are in the part of the past to which the necessity of the past does not apply. This solution also has some contemporary adherents. Premise (9) has been attacked by a few contemporary philosophers who argue that the denial of (9) is consistent with maintaining that human beings have libertarian free will, the kind of free will that is incompatible with causal determinism (Zagzebski, 1991). It has been proposed that Augustine had a form of this solution (Hunt 1999), although it was not attributed to him historically. The denial of (9) is mostly due to contemporary discussions of the relation between free will and the ability to do otherwise. Premise (5) has rarely been disputed and is an analogue of an axiom of modal logic. However, it might have been denied by Luis de Molina (Freddoso 1988, 57–58), and it has been denied in some of the recent literature. Finally, we will consider the possibility that premise (2) can be rejected in a more radical way than the Ockhamist position. In addition to the foregoing compatibilist solutions, there are two incompatibilist responses to the problem of theological fatalism. One is to deny that God (or any being) has infallible foreknowledge. The other is to deny that human beings have free will in the libertarian sense of free will. These responses will be discussed in section 3. The relationship between theological fatalism and logical fatalism will be discussed in section 4. In section 5 we will look at the problem of fatalism as a special case of a more general problem in the metaphysics of time that has nothing to do with free will.
2. Compatibilist responses to theological fatalism
2.1 The Aristotelian solution
One response to the dilemma of infallible foreknowledge and free will is to deny that the proposition T has a truth value because no proposition about the contingent future has a truth value. This response rejects the terms in which the problem is set up. The idea behind this response is usually that propositions about the contingent future become true when and only when the event occurs that the proposition is about. If the event does not occur at that time, then the proposition becomes false. This seems to have been the position of Aristotle in the famous Sea Battle argument of De Interpretatione IX, where Aristotle is concerned with the implications of the truth of a proposition about the future, not the problem of infallible knowledge of the future. But some philosophers have used Aristotle’s move to solve the dilemma we are addressing here. In the recent literature this position has been defended by J.R. Lucas (1989), Richard Purtill (1988), and Joseph Runzo (1981). More recently D.K. Johnson (2009) has taken up this solution to both logical and theological fatalism, relating this solution to presentism, the position that only the present exists. The connection between this solution and “open theism” will be discussed in section 3.
This solution collapses truth into necessity and falsehood into impossibility, at least for propositions about the future. That may be sufficient to make it implausible to some logicians, but it is not clear that this move avoids the problem of theological fatalism anyway. According to the definition of infallibility used in the basic argument, if God is infallible in all his beliefs, then it is not possible that God believes T and T is false. But there is a natural extension of the definition of infallibility to allow for the case in which T lacks a truth value but will acquire one in the future: If God is infallible in all his beliefs, then it is not possible that God believes T and T is either false or becomes false. If so, and if God believes T, we get an argument for theological fatalism that parallels our basic argument. Premise (4) would need to be modified as follows:
- (4′) Necessarily, if yesterday God believed T, then T will become true.
- (6′) It is now-necessary that T will become true.
The modifications in the rest of the argument are straightforward.
It is open to the defender of this solution to maintain that God has no beliefs about the contingent future because he does not infallibly know how it will turn out, and this is compatible with God’s being infallible in everything he does believe. It is also compatible with God’s omniscience if omniscience is the property of knowing the truth value of every proposition that has a truth value. But clearly, this move restricts the range of God’s knowledge, so it has religious disadvantages in addition to its disadvantages in logic.
2.2 The Boethian solution
This solution denies the first premise of the basic argument: (1) Yesterday God infallibly believed T. What is denied according to this solution is not that God believes infallibly, and not that God believes the content of proposition T, but that God believed T yesterday. This solution probably originated with the 6th century philosopher Boethius, who maintained that God is not in time and has no temporal properties, so God does not have beliefs at a time. It is therefore a mistake to say God had beliefs yesterday, or has beliefs today, or will have beliefs tomorrow. It is also a mistake to say God had a belief on a certain date, such as June 1, 2004. The way Boethius describes God’s cognitive grasp of temporal reality, all temporal events are before the mind of God at once. To say “at once” or “simultaneously” is to use a temporal metaphor, but Boethius is clear that it does not make sense to think of the whole of temporal reality as being before God’s mind in a single temporal present. It is an atemporal present in which God has a single complete grasp of all events in the entire span of time.
Aquinas adopted the Boethian solution as one of his ways out of theological fatalism, using some of the same metaphors as Boethius. One is the circle analogy, in which the way a timeless God is present to each and every moment of time is compared to the way in which the center of a circle is present to each and every point on its circumference (SCG I, 66). In contemporary philosophy an important defense of the Boethian idea that God is timeless was given by Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann (1981), who applied it explicitly to the foreknowledge dilemma (1991). Recently it has been defended by Katherin Rogers (2007a) (2007b), Kevin Timpe (2007) Michael Rota (2010), Joseph Diekemper (2013), and Ciro De Florio (2015).
Most objections to the timelessness solution to the dilemma of foreknowledge and freedom focus on the idea of timelessness itself, arguing either that it does not make sense or that it is incompatible with other properties of God that are religiously more compelling, such as personhood (e.g., Pike 1970, 121–129; Wolterstorff 1975; Swinburne 1977, 221). Zagzebski has argued (1991, chap. 2 and 2011) that the timelessness move does not avoid the problem of theological fatalism since an argument structurally parallel to the basic argument can be formulated for timeless knowledge. If God is not in time, the key issue would not be the necessity of the past, but the necessity of the timeless realm. So the first three steps of the argument would be reformulated as follows:
- (1t) God timelessly knows T.
- (2t) If E is in the timeless realm, then it is now-necessary that E.
- (3t) It is now-necessary that T.
Perhaps it is inappropriate to say that timeless events such as God’s timeless knowing are now-necessary, yet we have no more reason to think we can do anything about God’s timeless knowing than about God’s past knowing. The timeless realm is as much out of our reach as the past. So the point of (3t) is that we cannot now do anything about the fact that God timelessly knows T. The rest of the steps in the timeless dilemma argument are parallel to the basic argument. Step (5t) says that if there is nothing we can do about a timeless state, there is nothing we can do about what such a state entails. It follows that we cannot do anything about the future.
The Boethian solution does not solve the problem of theological fatalism by itself, but since the nature of the timeless realm is elusive, the intuition of the necessity of the timeless realm is probably weaker than the intuition of the necessity of the past. The necessity of the past is deeply embedded in our ordinary intuitions about time; there are no ordinary intuitions about the realm of timelessness. One possible way out of this problem is given by K.A. Rogers, who argues (2007a, 2007b) that the eternal realm is like the present rather than the past, and so it does not have the necessity we attribute to the past.
An interesting puzzle for Christian defenders of the Boethian solution is the problem of whether the knowledge of Jesus Christ during his time on earth was infallible. The problem here is that the incarnate Christ was in time even if God is timeless. A particular problem discussed by Timothy Pawl (2014a, 2014b) is whether Christ had infallible foreknowledge of his own future choices, and if so, whether his created will was free. Pawl defends the compatibility of Christ’s infallible foreknowledge and the freedom of his created will.
2.3 The Ockhamist solution
The next solution is due to the thirteenth century philosopher William of Ockham, and was revived in the contemporary literature by Marilyn Adams (1967).
This solution rejects premise (2) of the basic argument in its full generality. Following Ockham, Adams argues that premise (2) applies only to the past strictly speaking, or the “hard” past. A “soft” fact about the past is one that is in part about the future. An example of a soft fact about the past would be the fact that it was true yesterday that a certain event would occur a year later. Adams argues that God’s existence in the past and God’s past beliefs about the future are not strictly past because they are facts that are in part about the future.
Adams’s argument was unsuccessful since, among other things, her criterion for being a hard fact had the consequence that no fact is a hard fact (Fischer 1989, introduction), but it led to a series of attempts to bolster it by giving more refined definitions of a “hard fact” and the type of necessity such facts are said to have—what Ockham called “accidental necessity” (necessity per accidens). Recent discussions of the hard fact/soft fact distinction appear in Todd (2013) and Pendergraft and Coates (2014).
One of the best-known Ockhamist proposals after Adams was made by Alvin Plantinga (1986), who defined the accidentally necessary in terms of lack of counterfactual power. For someone, Jones, to have counterfactual power over God’s past beliefs, the following must be true:
- (CPP) It was within Jones’ power at t2 to do something such that if he did it, God would not have held the belief he in fact held at t1.
Plantinga argued that counterfactual power over God’s past beliefs about human free choices is coherent and if it occurs, these beliefs are not accidentally necessary; they do not have the kind of necessity the past is alleged to have in premise (2) of the basic argument.
Notice that counterfactual power over the past is not the same thing as changing the past. Under the assumption that there is only one time line, changing the past is incoherent since it amounts to there being one past prior to t2 in which God has a certain belief at t1, and then Jones does something to make a different past. That requires two pasts prior to t2, and that presumably makes no sense. What (CPP) affirms instead is that there is only one actual past, but there would have been a different past if Jones acted differently at t2. (CPP) also does not require the assumption that what Jones does at t2 causes God to have the belief he has at t1. There is much debate about the way to analyze the causal relation, but it is generally thought that causation does not reduce to a counterfactual dependency of an effect on its cause. The dependency of God’s belief on Jones’ act need not be a causal dependency. (CPP) is therefore weaker than the claim that Jones’ act at t2 causes God’s belief at t1. A discussion of the counterfactual dependence of God’s past belief on human future acts is given in Zagzebski (1991, chap 4).
There was considerable debate over Ockhamism in the eighties and nineties. Some of the defenses in this period appear in Freddoso (1983), Kvanvig (1986), Zemach and Widerker (1987), Wierenga (1989), and Craig (1990). Some of the criticisms appear in Fischer (1983b, 1985b), Hasker (1989), Zagzebski (1991), Pike (1993), and Brant (1997).
Recently the idea that God’s past beliefs depend upon our future free acts was enlivened by Trenton Merricks (2009), who argues that the idea appears in Molina (see section 2.4). Fischer and Todd (2011) argue that Merricks’ solution is a form of Ockhamism, and Merricks (2011) replies that the dependency relation between God’s past beliefs and human acts is not the same as Ockham’s strategy. The Ockhamist solution is intertwined with work on the reality of the past and future. Finch and Rea (2008) have argued that the Ockhamist solution requires the rejection of presentism, the view that only the present is real.
It seems to me that it is very difficult to give an account of the necessity of the past that preserves the intuition that the past has a special kind of necessity in virtue of being past, but which has the consequence that God’s past beliefs do not have that kind of necessity. The problem is that God’s past beliefs seem to be as good a candidate for something that is strictly past as almost anything we can think of, such as an explosion that occurred last week. If we have counterfactual power over God’s past beliefs, but not the past explosion, that must be because of something special about God’s past beliefs that is intuitively plausible apart from the attempt to avoid theological fatalism. If it is not independently plausible, it is hard to avoid the conclusion that the Ockhamist solution is ad hoc.
2.4 The Molinist solution
The doctrine of Middle Knowledge was vehemently debated in the 16th century, with the version of Luis de Molina getting the most attention in the contemporary literature. Recently the doctrine has received strong support by Thomas Flint (1998) and Eef Dekker (2000). Unlike the other compatibilist solutions we are considering, which aim only at showing that infallible foreknowledge and human freedom are compatible, Molinism provides an account of how God knows the contingent future, along with a strong doctrine of divine providence. Middle knowledge is called “middle” because it is said to stand between God’s knowledge of necessary truths and his knowledge of his own creative will. The objects of Middle Knowledge are so-called counterfactuals of freedom:
If person S were in circumstances C, S would freely do X.
Middle knowledge requires that there are true counterfactuals of this form corresponding to every possible free creature and every possible circumstance in which that creature can act freely. These propositions are intended to be contingent (a claim that has been disputed by some objectors), but they are prior to God’s creative will. God uses them in deciding what to create. By combining his Middle Knowledge with what he decides to create, God knows the entire history of the world.
There are a number of objections to Middle Knowledge in the contemporary literature. Robert Adams (1991) argues that Molinism is committed to the position that the truth of a counterfactual of freedom is explanatorily prior to God’s decision to create us. But the truth of a counterfactual to the effect that if I were in circumstance C I would do A is strictly inconsistent with my refraining from A in C, and so my refraining from A in C is precluded by something prior in the order of explanation to my act in C. And that is inconsistent with my acting freely in C.
There are a number of other objections to Middle Knowledge in the literature, as well as replies by its defenders. William Hasker (1989, 1995, 1997, 2000) has offered a series of objections and replies to William Craig, who defends Middle Knowledge (1994, 1998). Other objections have been proposed by Walls (1990) and Gaskin (1993). Recent critical discussions of Molinism appear in Fischer (2008), Guleserian (2008), and False (2010). Defenses of Molinism appears in Kanzian (2011) and Kosciuk (2010) and a critique in Shieber (2009). Perszyk (2011) is a collection of essays examining Molinism and its future direction. Perszyk (2013) is a survey of the recent literature.
Let us assume that the doctrine of Middle Knowledge is defensible. How does that avoid the conclusion of the argument for theological fatalism? Middle Knowledge does not entail the falsehood of any premise of the basic argument. Flint (1998) rejects some of the steps of the fatalist argument in addition to defending Middle Knowledge, and more recently blends of Ockhamism and Molinism have been defended (Kosciuk 2010), which suggests that even though the theory of Middle Knowledge is a powerful theory of divine knowledge and providence, it is neither necessary nor sufficient to avoid theological fatalism by itself.
2.5 The Frankfurtian/Augustinian solution
Let us now look at premise (9). This is a form of the Principle of Alternate Possibilities (PAP), a principle that has become well-known in the literature on free will ever since it was attacked by Harry Frankfurt (1969) in some interesting thought experiments. The point of Frankfurt’s paper was to drive a wedge between responsibility and alternate possibilities, and to thereby drive a wedge between responsibility and libertarian freedom. In general, those defending libertarian freedom also defend PAP, and those attacking PAP, like Frankfurt, defend determinism, but some philosophers have argued that PAP is false even if we have libertarian free will. Such arguments have been given by Zagzebski (1991) and Hunt (1999). Hunt (1996b, 1999) argues that the rejection of PAP from the perspective of a defender of libertarian freedom can be found in Augustine, although it is not a position historically associated with Augustine. The literature that clearly distinguishes the claim that free will requires alternate possibilities from the claim that free will requires the falsehood of determinism is contemporary. The former is a thesis about events in counterfactual circumstances, whereas the latter is a thesis about the locus of causal control in the actual circumstances. Aside from the foreknowledge literature, support for the rejection of PAP from the perspective of an incompatibilist about free will and determinism can be found in Stump (1990, 1996), Zagzebski (2000), and Pereboom (2000). This view was originally called hyper-incompatibilism by John Martin Fischer, but has recently been called source incompatibilism. For a recent critique of this version of incompatibilism for solving the foreknowledge problem, see Werther (2005) and Talsma (2013).
Here is an example of a typical Frankfurt case intended to show that an agent can act freely even when she lacks alternate possibilities:
Black, an evil neurosurgeon, wishes to see White dead but is unwilling to do the deed himself. Knowing that Mary Jones also despises White and will have a single good opportunity to kill him, Black inserts a mechanism into Jones’s brain that enables Black to monitor and to control Jones’s neurological activity. If the activity in Jones’s brain suggests that she is on the verge of deciding not to kill White when the opportunity arises, Black’s mechanism will intervene and cause Jones to decide to commit the murder. On the other hand, if Jones decides to murder White on her own, the mechanism will not intervene. It will merely monitor but will not affect her neurological function. Now suppose that when the occasion arises, Jones decides to kill White without any “help” from Black’s mechanism. In the judgment of Frankfurt and most others, Jones is morally responsible for her act. Nonetheless, it appears that she is unable to do otherwise since if she had attempted to do so, she would have been thwarted by Black’s device. (Adapted from an example by John Fischer, 1982).
Most commentators on examples like this agree that the agent is both morally responsible for her act and acts freely in whatever sense of freedom they endorse. They differ on whether she can do otherwise at the time of her act. Determinists generally interpret the case as one in which she exercises compatibilist free will and has no alternate possibilities. Most libertarians interpret it as one in which she exercises libertarian free will and has alternate possibilities, contrary to appearances. As mentioned above, some philosophers have interpreted it as a case in which she exercises libertarian free will but does not have alternate possibilities. If Frankfurt cases can be successfully interpreted in this third way, then they can be used to show the compatibility of infallible foreknowledge and libertarian freedom.
But there is another way Frankfurt cases can be used to argue for the compatibility of foreknowledge and freedom. There is an important disanalogy between a Frankfurt case and infallible foreknowledge that supports the intuition that an agent retains alternate possibilities even when her act is infallibly foreknown. A crucial component of the standard Frankfurt case is that the agent is prevented from acting freely in close possible worlds. That aspect of the case is not in dispute. Black’s device is counterfactually manipulative even if it is not actually manipulative. In contrast, infallible foreknowledge is not even counterfactually manipulative. There is no close possible world in which foreknowledge prevents the agent from acting freely. Of course, if theological fatalism is true, nobody ever acts freely, but the point is that there is no manipulation going on in other possible worlds in the foreknowledge scenario. The relation between foreknowledge and human acts is no different in one world than in any other. But it is precisely the fact that the relation between the Frankfurt machine and Mary’s act differs in the actual world than in other close worlds that is supposed to make the Frankfurt example work in showing the falsity of PAP.
To make this point clear, let us look at how the standard Frankfurt case would have to be amended to make it a close analogy to the situation of infallible foreknowledge. As Zagzebski has argued (1991, chap. 6, sec. 2.1), the device implanted in Mary’s brain would have to be set in such a way that no matter what Mary did, it never intervened. It is not even true that it might have intervened. Any world in which Mary decides to commit the murder is a world in which the device is set to make her commit the murder should she not decide to do it, and any world in which she does not decide to commit the murder is a world in which the device is set to prevent her from deciding to do it if she is about to decide to do it. Now of course this might be an impossible device, but it would have to be as described to be a close analogy to the foreknowledge scenario. And our reactions to this amended Frankfurt case are very different from typical reactions to the standard Frankfurt case. In the standard case it at least appears to be true that the agent cannot do otherwise, whereas in the case amended to be parallel to the foreknowledge case there is a very straightforward sense in which the agent can do otherwise because her will is not thwarted by Black in any reasonably close possible world. The machine is ready to manipulate her, but it does not manipulate her, nor might it have manipulated her since it does not even manipulate her in counterfactual circumstances. We might think of the machine as a metaphysical accident—an extraneous addition to the story that plays no part in the sequence of events in any possible world. Possibly it is not clear in the amended story whether or not Mary has alternate possibilities. What the story shows, then, is that alternate possibilities are not always relevant to the possession of libertarian freedom.
2.6 The necessity of the past and the causal closure of the past
A crucial premise of the basic argument for theological fatalism is premise (2), the principle of the necessity of the past. We have already discussed the Ockhamist response to this premise, which accepts (2) as applied to what is strictly past, but rejects it as applied to that part of the past that is not wholly or strictly past. It is worth asking, however, whether there is any such thing as the necessity of the past at all. What do we mean when we say that the past, the strict past, is necessary? When people say “There is no use crying over spilled milk,” they presumably mean that there is nothing anybody can do now about the spilled milk; the spilling of the milk is outside the realm of our causal control. But it is not at all clear that pastness per se puts something outside the realm of our causal control. Rather, it is pastness in conjunction with the metaphysical law that causes must precede their effects. If we decided that effects can precede their causes, it is likely that we would no longer speak of the necessity of the past.
So the necessity of the past may simply be the principle that past events are outside the class of causable events. There is a temporal asymmetry in causability because everything causable is in the future. But some of the future is non-causable as well. Whether or not determinism is true, there are some events in the future that are causally necessary. If a future event E is necessary, it is causable, and not E is not causable. But if the necessity of the past is the non-causability of the past, it would be odd to pick out the class of propositions about the past as possessing an allegedly distinct kind of necessity since some of the future has that same kind of necessity.
This leads to a deeper problem in the idea of the necessity of the past. Zagzebski (2014) argues that the interpretation of the necessity of the past as a purely temporal modality is confused. What people generally mean by the necessity of the past is that the past is causally closed, meaning the past is neither causable nor preventable. Understood that way, the necessity of the past is not a purely temporal modality, and it is not a form of necessity. The categories of causability and non-causability do not correspond to the standard modal categories of the necessary, possible, and impossible. The attempt to assimilate the causal categories to modal categories is a mistake.
Let us see what happens to the argument for theological fatalism if the necessity of the past is understood as the causal closure of the past.
Let us begin with a definition of causal closure:
E is causally closed =df There is nothing now that can cause E, and there is nothing now that can cause not E.
To use this principle in an argument for fatalism, the principle of the necessity of the past will need to be replaced with the following principle:
Principle of the Causal Closure of the Past:
If E is an event in the past, E is causally closed.
We will then need to replace the transfer of necessity principle by the following:
Transfer of Causal Closure Principle:
If E occurs and is causally closed, and necessarily (if E occurs then F occurs), then F is causally closed.
To recast the argument for theological fatalism, let us again consider the proposition that you will answer the telephone tomorrow at 9am and call it T:
- (1) Yesterday God infallibly believed T. [Supposition of infallible foreknowledge]
- (2) If E is an event in the past, E is causally closed (Principle of the causal closure of the past).
- (3) God’s believing T yesterday is now causally closed. [1, 2]
- (4) Necessarily, if yesterday God believed S will answer the telephone tomorrow at 9am, then S will answer the telephone tomorrow at 9am. [Definition of infallibility]
- (5) If E occurs and is causally closed, and necessarily (if E occurs then F occurs), then F is causally closed. [Transfer of causal closure principle]
- (6) S’s act of answering the telephone tomorrow at 9am is now causally closed. There is nothing now that can cause S to answer the telephone tomorrow and there is nothing now that can cause S not to answer the telephone tomorrow. [1, 4, 5]
But (6) denies that there are causes of the future. Certainly we believe that something now, whether agents or events, can cause future events, and the fatalist does not deny that. What the fatalist denies is that we can cause something other than what we cause. So the relevant half of the principle of the causal closure of the past is as follows:
Principle of the Unpreventability of the Past:
If E is an event in the past, nothing now can cause not E.
To use this principle in a fatalist argument, we need the following:
Transfer of Unpreventability Principle:
If E occurs and it is not now causable that E does not occur, and necessarily (if E occurs, then F occurs), then it is not now causable that F does not occur.
This principle is virtually identical to the transfer of unpreventability principle proposed by Hugh Rice (2005), and is similar to a strengthened form of the well-known principle Beta first proposed by Peter van Inwagen (1983).
Using this principle, we get the following argument for theological fatalism:
- (1) Suppose that yesterday God infallibly believed T.
From the Principle of the unpreventability of the past we get:
- (2) There is nothing now that can cause God not to have believed T yesterday.
From the definition of divine infallibility we get:
- (3) Necessarily, if God believed yesterday that S will answer the telephone at 9am tomorrow, then S will answer the telephone at 9am tomorrow.
From 2,3, and the transfer of unpreventability principle we get:
- (4) There is nothing now that can cause S not to answer the telephone at 9am tomorrow.
From a variation of the Principle of Alternate Possibilities, we get:
- (5) If nothing can cause S not to answer the telephone at 9am tomorrow, then S does not answer the telephone freely.
From (4) and (5), we get:
- (6) S does not answer the telephone freely.
This argument for theological fatalism is better than the standard argument if a purely temporal necessity is problematic. The second premise of the above argument is only the principle that the past is unpreventable, not a questionable premise that the past has a special kind of necessity distinct from the causal structure of the universe simply in virtue of being past. But since the unpreventability of the past is not a form of necessity in the formal sense, then the transfer principle licensing the crucial inference to (4) is not a transfer of necessity. Unlike the transfer of temporal necessity principle in our original argument, it is not a variation of an axiom of logic, and is far from indisputable. It appears that the idea of the necessity of the past is confused. On the one hand, we have inherited from Ockham the idea that the past has a kind of necessity for which we can formulate an analogue of the formal principles of logical necessity. But the intuitions supporting such a form of necessity are intuitions about causability, and the modalities of causability/non-causability do not parallel necessity, possibility, and impossibility. If there is a true transfer of causability or non-causability principle, it is not because it is like logical necessity in its formal structure. The problem, then, is that the fatalist argument needs a kind of necessity that the past has and which is also transferred to the future via a valid transfer of necessity principle. In section 5 we will look at how this is a general problem that extends beyond the issue of fatalism.
3. Incompatibilist responses to the argument for theological fatalism
Ever since the dilemma of this article was identified, there have been philosophers who thought that something like our basic argument succeeds in demonstrating that infallible foreknowledge is incompatible with human free will. If they are incompatible, one of them must be given up. One might give up both, of course, but the dilemma has attracted so much attention in the history of philosophy because both the belief in a being with infallible foreknowledge and belief in the existence of libertarian free will are strongly entrenched in the world view of many philosophers. To give up one of these beliefs is difficult and often has many ramifications for one’s other beliefs.
The denial of libertarian freedom has always had many supporters. The idea of making causal determinism the focal point of discussions of free will is modern in origin, and some philosophers think that the modern framing of the issue is confused. Philosophers who deny libertarian freedom may affirm a type of free will compatible with determinism, or they may instead simply accept the consequence that human beings lack free will.
The other incompatibilist position is to affirm libertarian free will along with the principle of alternate possibilities (premise 9), and to deny the possibility of infallible foreknowledge. This position has recently become well-known in the view called “open theism.” (Pinnock et al. 1994). These theorists reject divine timelessness and immutability, along with infallible foreknowledge, arguing that not only should foreknowledge be rejected because of its fatalist consequences, but the view of a God who takes risks is more faithful to Scripture than the classical notion of an essentially omniscient and foreknowing deity. See Rhoda et al (2006) for an argument that the key issue in the open theism debate is the nature of the future. For a review of arguments for open theism, see Tuggy (2007). Craig and Hunt (2013) give a reply to Rhoda et al and Tuggy. For an argument that open theism necessitates the view that propositions about the future lack truth value, see Arbour (2013). Todd (2016a) defends the mutability of the future and argues that future contingents are all false (2016b). The true futurist theory (“the thin red line”) is defended by Øhrstrøm (2009) and by Malpass and Wawer (2012).
One influential argument that open theists use against defenders of foreknowledge who do not also accept Molinism is that foreknowledge without middle knowledge is useless for divine providence. In a number of papers, David Hunt has defended the providential utility of foreknowledge without middle knowledge. See Robinson (2004a) for a challenge to Hunt’s defense of the providential usefulness of simple foreknowledge, Hunt’s rebuttal (2004), and Robinson’s rejoinder (2004b), all in the same journal. See also Hasker (2009) for another attack on the usefulness of foreknowledge without middle knowledge and Hunt’s rebuttal (2009) in the same journal. See also Zimmerman (2012) and a rejoinder by Smith (2012). A related objection to foreknowledge without middle knowledge is that prophecy requires middle knowledge. See Pruss (2007) for a defense of a foreknowledge-only account of prophecy.
Another issue related to divine providence is the efficacy of past-directed prayers. Kevin Timpe (2005) argues that adherents of simple foreknowledge or timeless knowledge and Molinists have the resources to explain the efficacy of prayers about the past, but open theism does not.
4. Logical fatalism
A form of fatalism that is even older than theological fatalism is logical fatalism, the thesis that the past truth of a proposition about the future entails fatalism. Aristotle discusses this form of fatalism in his famous Sea Battle Argument, mentioned in section 2.1 above. A clearer and more sophisticated form of the argument was proposed by Diodorus Cronus, whose argument is remarkably similar in form to our basic argument for theological fatalism. The logical fatalist argument parallel to our basic argument is as follows:
Argument for logical fatalism
Let S = the proposition that there will be a sea battle tomorrow.
- (1L) Yesterday it was true that S. [assumption]
- (2L) If some proposition was true in the past, it is now-necessary that it was true then. [Form of the Necessity of the Past]
- (3L) It is now-necessary that yesterday it was true that S. [1, 2]
- (4L) Necessarily, if yesterday it was true that S, then now it is true that S. [omnitemporality of truth]
- (5L) If it is now-necessary that p and if necessarily (p then q), then it is now-necessary that q. [Transfer of Necessity Principle]
- (6L) Therefore, it is now-necessary that now it is true that S. [3L, 4L, 5L]
- (7L) If it is now-necessary that now it is true that S, no alternative to the truth of S is now-possible. [definition of “necessary”]
- (8L) So no alternative to the truth of S is now-possible [6L, 7L]
- (9L) If no alternative to the truth of a proposition about the future is now-possible, then what the proposition is about will not be brought about by free human choice. [Version of Principle of Alternate Possibilities]
- (10L) Hence, the sea battle tomorrow will not be brought about by free human choice. [8L, 9L]
Unlike the argument for theological fatalism, the argument for logical fatalism has few defenders. One reason is that (2L) is less plausible than (2). But recently Warfield (1997) has argued for the equivalence of the two forms of fatalism if God is necessarily existent and essentially omniscient. Responses have been given by Hasker (1998) and Brueckner (2000), and there is a rejoinder to both by Warfield (2000). Peter Graham (2008) argues that Warfield’s argument is question-begging because the consensus to which Warfield appeals emerged against the backdrop of an assumption that there is no necessarily existent being.
5. Beyond fatalism
Zagzebski has argued that the dilemma of theological fatalism is broader than a problem about free will. The modal or causal asymmetry of time, a transfer of necessity principle, and the supposition of infallible foreknowledge are mutually inconsistent. (1991, appendix). If there is a distinct kind of necessity that the past has qua past, and which is not an implicit reference to the lack of causability of the past, then it is temporally asymmetrical. The past has it and the future does not. The necessity of the past and the contingency of the future are two sides of the same coin. To say that the future is contingent in the sense of temporal modality does not imply that we have causal control over the entire future, of course. We lack control over part of the future because part (or even all) of it is causally necessary. But if the necessity of the past is distinct from the lack of causability, and is a type of necessity the past has just because it is past, the future must lack that particular kind of necessity.
The idea that there is temporally asymmetrical modality is inconsistent with the transfer of necessity principle and the supposition of infallible foreknowledge of an essentially omniscient deity. The inconsistency can be demonstrated as follows:
Dilemma of Foreknowledge and Modal Temporal Asymmetry
Again, let T = the proposition that you will answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am.
- (1f) There is (and was before now) an essentially omniscient foreknower (EOF) [Assumption for dilemma]
(1f) and the Principle of the Necessity of the Past tells us that
- (2f) Either it is now-necessary that the EOF believed T before now or it is now-necessary that the EOF believed not T before now.
From (1f) and the definition of an EOF it follows that
- (3f) Necessarily (The EOF believed before now that T → T), and necessarily (The EOF believed before now that not T → not T).
By the Transfer of Necessity Principle (TNP), (2f) and (3f) entail
- (4f) Either it is now-necessary that T or it is now-necessary that not T.
(4f) is logically equivalent to
- (5f) Either it is not now-possible that T or it is not now-possible that not T.
From the Principle of the Contingency of the Future we get
- (6f) It is now-possible that T and it is now-possible that not T.
But (6f) contradicts (5f).
The inconsistency shown in this argument has nothing to do with free will or fatalism. In fact, the problem is even more general than this argument illustrates. The reason essential omniscience conflicts with temporal modality and the transfer principle is that the existence of an EOF requires that a proposition about the past entails a proposition about the future. But it straightforwardly follows from TNP that a proposition that is now-necessary cannot entail a proposition that is not now-necessary. So if the past is now-necessary and the future is not, a proposition about the past cannot entail a proposition about the future. The conclusion is that if asymmetrical temporal modality is coherent, it can obey TNP, or it can permit a proposition about the past to entail a proposition about the future, but not both.
The root of the problem, then, is that it is impossible for there to be a type of modality that has the following features:
- (a) The past and future are asymmetrical in that the past qua past is necessary with respect to this type of modality, whereas the future qua future is contingent with respect to this type of modality.
- (b) There are propositions about the past that entail propositions about the future.
- (c) TNP obtains.
So the problem of the alleged incompatibility of infallible foreknowledge and free will is a special case of a more general problem about time and necessity. It was suggested in section 2.6 that the problem may be (a) above. There is no temporally asymmetrical necessity. But regardless of what one thinks of fatalist arguments, the general problem in the logic of time and causation needs to be addressed. Both the alleged modal asymmetry of time and the causal asymmetry should be examined in more detail.
As this entry shows, the literature on foreknowledge and fatalism is enormous, and it continues to grow. Some of the papers mentioned here are collected in a recent book edited by Fischer and Todd (2015). Todd (2014) reviews the main debates concerning logical and theological fatalism and the truth of future contingents.
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