Moral Responsibility and the Principle of Alternative Possibilities

First published Thu Jul 9, 2020

Suppose you harm, offend, or otherwise wrong another person. Confronted with the possibility of sanction, you might say any of the following in an attempt avoid blame: “I couldn’t help it.” “Someone made me do it.” “I had no choice.” “It was unavoidable.” “There was no other option.” There’s a natural reading of such defenses on which they appeal to the principle at the center of this entry, the “Principle of Alternative Possibilities” (cp. Frankfurt 1969):

Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP): a person is morally responsible for what she has done only if she could have done otherwise.

Although its precise form and interpretation have varied, this principle has enjoyed broad support in the history of philosophy. PAP was a standard—even if not universal—presupposition of Greek, medieval, and early modern thought (Irwin 1999: 225; Pasnau 2003: 226; Rowe 1987: 43). And until about fifty years ago, it was usually taken for granted by both sides in debates on whether moral responsibility is compatible with determinism.

No doubt the principle’s appeal can in part be traced to ordinary moral practice. One day at the cafeteria, Kurt steals John’s lunch. Under normal circumstances, we hold Kurt responsible for his act. But now add that he had to act as he did. Suppose, for example, that Kurt was coerced by a bully to steal John’s lunch; or he is suffering from a neurological disorder compelling him to act; or he was brainwashed. These are some of the many ways in which his alternatives can be closed off. But however this happens, once the alternatives are gone—once Kurt must act as he does—blaming him no longer seems appropriate.

PAP presents one requirement for moral responsibility. There are others. For example, we often excuse those who act out of ignorance. Suppose it turns out that, contrary to initial reports, Kurt reasonably mistook John’s lunch for his own; it was this innocent mistake that resulted in the “theft”. Here too we should be much less inclined to blame Kurt, for in the relevant sense, he didn’t know what he was doing. Such examples suggest that in addition to PAP, there is an epistemic condition for responsibility. And there are still other candidate requirements. But while some of them are closely related to the ability to do otherwise, for the most part they will, like the epistemic condition, be set to one side in this entry: the focus will be on PAP.

1. Background

Like most important philosophical claims, PAP is more complex than it first appears. It’s useful for now to suppress many of these complexities. But a few of them should be mentioned at the outset, if only to make some simplifying assumptions and bracket certain controversies. We begin, however, with some reasons to think this topic is worth the effort.

1.1 The Importance of PAP

We are both moral and embodied agents, persons and organisms. We move in the space of reasons, answerable to rules of morality and rationality, as well as a space of causes, governed by the laws of nature. How are these two aspects of our lives linked? This question is too big to answer here. But PAP, if true, is one piece of the puzzle. Our status as persons is enabled by a kind of power we exercise in the world of causes, namely, the power to choose among alternative courses of action. In this way, our principle links a normative feature of our lives to a causal feature.

But with this abstract promise comes a concrete threat. The principle tells us that when alternatives are blocked, when only one course of action is available, you are not responsible for what you do. As noted earlier, there are some extreme conditions, such as coercion, that can preclude responsibility by blocking alternatives. But suppose it turns out that even under standard conditions, no one has alternatives. Given PAP, no one is morally responsible for anything. Universal alternative-blockers have frequently appeared in the philosophical literature. They include bivalence, divine foreknowledge, divine sovereignty, mechanism, psychological determinism, and causal determinism. If, due to any of these, none of us can act otherwise than we actually act, then PAP will join in to produce a disturbing conclusion: we are never responsible for what we do. A less global but equally worrisome threat is that our principle will combine with some thesis entailing the widespread reduction of abilities, even if not their elimination. For example, situational, genetic, or socio-economic influences, while not universally blocking alternatives, could so severely limit them in particular cases that, with PAP in the background, moral praise and blame are no longer appropriate. (On the threat of “situationism”, see Nelkin 2005; McKenna & Warmke 2017.)

Another reason PAP is important is that it intersects with the philosophy and practice of law. Even if moral and legal responsibility do not coincide, there is a region of overlap (Duff 2009; Brink & Nelkin 2013) where PAP and its attendant literature can inform legal reasoning, especially when it aims at the just punishment of wrongdoers. A necessary condition of criminal responsibility is that the conduct included a voluntary act (Sinnott-Armstrong 2012), one that the accused had a “reasonable opportunity to avoid” (Kelly 2017). If Mark was sleepwalking or hypnotized when he broke into Ken’s house, this could be excused, both morally and legally, on the grounds that in his condition, Mark could not have done otherwise. If, due to delusion, an accused murderer could not avoid forming the intention to kill his victim—and acting accordingly—this also could be exculpating.

That said, standards applied by the law may not match what in moral contexts we think of as avoidable action. Imagine that a mild provocation, one that a reasonable person could ignore, compels an emotionally disturbed man to murder. Criminal law evaluates his abilities according to the reasonable person standard—thereby convicting him of murder rather than manslaughter—even if moral reasoning would take into account the emotional state severely restricting his alternatives (Kelly 2017). The relation between PAP and the law is further complicated by the fact that criminal law does not seem especially concerned with causal determinism (Morse 2013), a thesis widely thought to limit us to exactly one future. That said, if the irrelevance of determinism in the law reflects some degree of indifference toward alternatives in assigning responsibility, this could be part of a case against PAP in moral matters as well (see also §3.1).

1.2 What is Moral Responsibility?

Start with what a person is morally responsible for. As formulated above, PAP is about responsibility for what a person “has done”. For most of this entry this will be interpreted to mean her actions (see entry on action), here construed broadly to include both overt actions, such as walking to the store or shooting a gun, and mental actions, such as choosing to go to law school or calculating a move in chess. In addition to being responsible for actions, a person can be responsible for the consequences of her actions. By putting salt in Sean’s tea, Meghan is responsible, not just for ruining Sean’s tea (what she did), but for his tea’s being ruined (the consequence of what she did). A politician’s opponents may claim she is responsible for an economic downturn, a result of her decisions and policies. Finally, a person can be responsible for failures to act, sometimes known as refrainings or omissions, and the consequences of such. Luke the indifferent lifeguard is accountable for not saving the drowning swimmer, and thus for the death as well. PAP has a different cast depending on whether responsibility for actions, consequences, or omissions is at issue. The focus for most of this entry is on actions, but responsibility for consequences and omissions will appear again in §5.3.

What is it to be morally responsible? This entry adopts a broadly “Strawsonian” view in the tradition of P.F. Strawson’s “Freedom and Resentment” (P. F. Strawson 1962; cp. Fischer & Ravizza 1998, 6–8). To be morally responsible is to be the proper object of the “reactive attitudes,” such as respect, praise, forgiveness, blame, indignation, and the like. If Marija is responsible for adopting a stray cat, it’s proper to praise her for this act. If it turns out Meghan is not responsible for ruining Sean’s tea, then this means it’s not appropriate, for Sean or anyone else, to blame or resent her for what she did. There are other theories of moral responsibility (see entry on moral responsibility). What our principle looks like under these alternative accounts will remain open, though one can expect that problems similar to those considered below will arise on any but the most radically revisionary ways of thinking of responsibility.

One final note on responsibility: In the literature one sometimes finds the notion of true or ultimate moral responsibility (Klein 1990; G. Strawson 1994; Kane 1996). It’s not always clear how this is related to what PAP calls, simply, moral responsibility (M. Bernstein 2005; Boxer 2013). On one reading, ultimacy is an additional condition on ordinary responsibility to be listed alongside epistemic and other requirements alluded to earlier. On the other hand, if talk of ultimacy is intended to signal a higher grade of responsibility, there will be a corresponding version of our principle to be evaluated on its own terms:

PAP-ultimate: a person is ultimately morally responsible for what she has done only if she could have done otherwise.

This enhanced version, if it’s distinct from PAP, will not appear in what follows. But the discussion below could be relevant to PAP-ultimate. In particular, it’s likely that PAP entails PAP-ultimate, so that arguments considered below for the former (§2) could be brought in favor of the latter. What’s less clear is whether PAP-ultimate entails PAP. If it doesn’t, then objections to the latter (§3) needn’t damage the former.

1.3 What is the Ability to Do Otherwise?

When a person, S, does something, what is it for her to have the ability to do otherwise? For help we might look to alternative locutions: S can do otherwise; S has the power to do otherwise; this is possible for S; the world in which S does otherwise is accessible to S; doing so is up to S; this is open to S. But without further elaboration, these aren’t much more than synonyms for what’s to be explained. No theory of ability is adopted here, and for the most part we will rely on judgments about ability in particular cases. But a few general issues are worth flagging. (See also §4.2.1 and the entry on abilities.)

S’s being able to do otherwise is distinct from its merely being possible that S do otherwise. Once Lisa the skydiver jumps out her plane, it is (logically) possible that she float in midair rather than fall. But it’s not in her power to do so: the world in which Lisa floats is not accessible to her. And if Kurt is brainwashed to steal John’s lunch, then while it’s possible that he refrain, he nevertheless can’t. Something must be added to S’s possibly doing something else to ensure it’s within S’s power to do so.

As Hume (1748 [1999: 158]) and others have argued, adding that it seems to S as if there are alternatives doesn’t seem to help here (Chisholm 1967; Ginet 1990, 90–1). While the phenomenology of having alternatives—and more generally, of agency—is an important topic in its own right (Nagel 1986: ch. 7; Horgan, Tienson, & Graham 2003), it does not secure the ability in question. Fred feels he can overcome the temptation to smoke, then decides to smoke anyway. But it turns out that he could not have resisted his craving. Nor is seeming to have alternatives necessary for having them. Fred’s sister Fanny feels she is too weak to overcome the temptation at noon to smoke, and in fact she does smoke at that time. But she was wrong about her own capacities: with just a bit of effort, she would have been able to resist.

What these agents can or cannot do is relative to a set of facts, not all of which need be conscious. In the cases of Fred and Fanny, the facts concern, among other things, the strengths of their cravings and their respective degrees of will-power. These are held fixed to evaluate their abilities. But what other facts are salient? There is no consensus on this issue, though it does seem that which facts are held fixed can vary depending on context (Lewis 1976; Horgan 1979; Unger 1984). Such context-sensitivity is relevant to the proper application of PAP. Keyne is confronted by a “your money or your life” mugger, and hands over his wallet. According to PAP, whether Keyne is responsible for doing so turns, in part, on whether he could have refused. So could he have? Considering the example in one sort of context, we will say Yes: his arm was under his control and he was fully aware of what noncompliance involved and how to achieve it. But in another sort of context we might say No: Keyne was rational and valued his life far more than the money in his wallet, as would any reasonable person such circumstances; fix this cognitive background, and the mugger’s demand left him no other option. So in handing over his wallet, has Keyne met PAP’s requirement on responsibility or not? There seems to be no clear answer to this question. Complicating matters still further is that ability—and in particular, the ability to do otherwise—varies along a continuum. The motive power of a threat, mental disorder, or hypnotic suggestion varies from mild to overwhelming. Where along this continuum does its influence becomes so strong as to preclude alternatives? There is no non-arbitrary line to draw here—nor, apparently, has science settled on one (Graham 2013: 186, citing Morse 2011).

These points can make it difficult to test or apply PAP in particular cases. However, they do not by themselves entail that PAP is false, so long as judgments of moral responsibility show a similar context-sensitivity and gradation. (On degrees of responsibility, see Zimmerman 1988: ch. 3; Coates & Swenson 2013; Nelkin 2016.)

1.4 A Note on Freedom

A final preliminary point concerns acting freely. A principle closely related to PAP is the following (Audi 1974; van Inwagen 1983: 161; Widerker & McKenna 2003: 2):

Freedom Condition: a person is morally responsible for what she has done only if she did it freely.

This principle raises many of the issues that will come up below. But it’s stronger than PAP if, as is plausible, freedom requires more than alternatives (see entry on free will). Being the source of one’s action may be one such requirement; having properly functioning faculties could be another; agent-causing one’s action may be yet another. Investigating the Freedom Condition would thus bring in additional topics that cannot be explored here. So the discussion to follow will skirt the problems of free action (and free will) and instead focus on PAP’s weaker requirement. But at least this much is worth noting: if PAP is false, then so is the Freedom Condition, assuming that one must have alternatives to act freely (see also Warfield 2007; McKenna 2008: 353).

2. Arguments for PAP

Much of the literature on PAP consists of arguments against it, followed by replies to those arguments, and so on. Perhaps this pattern is due to the strong prima facie plausibility the principle enjoys: it should be accepted unless there are good reasons not to. That said, there are a few positive arguments to advance in favor of PAP; it’s best to begin with those before turning to objections in §3.

2.1 Is the Principle Self-Evident?

One quick argument is that PAP is self-evident; alternatively, it is immediately known a priori, intuitively obvious, or analytic. Those who deny it are thereby convicted of confusion about moral responsibility, the ability to do otherwise, or both. If PAP does enjoy such a high epistemic status, this explains its wide acceptance in the major historical periods of philosophy, a discipline not usually known for producing even approximate consensus. But in spite of this agreement, the principle has turned out not to be so obvious, and in fact appears to make a substantive, controversial claim about responsibility. Witness some notable dissenters, including the Stoics, Augustine, Aquinas, and Hobbes (see, respectively, §3.2; Hunt 1999; Stump 1997; Martinich 2005). Moreover, PAP has come under sustained attack in recent decades due in large part to the early efforts of Frankfurt (1969), Fischer (1982), and Dennett (1984a,b). This is enough to show that, however plausible PAP might first appear, it requires more than this quick defense.

2.2 Ordinary Judgments about Responsibility

PAP is supported by a wide range of cases in which we judge that without alternatives, we are not responsible for acting—not responsible, it seems, because we lack alternatives.

Consider persons with mental disorders such as kleptomania or agoraphobia. When these disorders are considered severe enough to compel behavior, blame and resentment no longer seem warranted. (It is the reasoning employed in ordinary judgment that’s relevant here, but for scientific evidence against the compulsion of some mental disorders, see Schroeder 2005; Vranas 2007; Pickard 2015.) Similarly, we may be less inclined to condemn a criminal when we discover that his illegal acts were the result of a brain tumor (Sinnott-Armstrong 2012), or to praise the generosity of person who is compelled to give things away (Bennett 2008). Those who, whether pathologically or not, act from overwhelming stress, fear, or guilt are not praised or blamed for what they do. And while young children may have a limited capacity for self-control (Duckworth, Gendler, & Gross 2014), among the many reasons we don’t hold them morally responsible is that we think they are often powerless to resist their impulses.

Similar lessons can be drawn from cases of manipulation, in which agents are influenced through physical or psychological means. Examples of the latter include brainwashing, hypnosis, and duress. One might also include more high-tech examples in which the manipulation occurs via direct control of the victim’s brain. (Such examples are usually science-fiction, but see Krug, Salzman, & Waddell 2015.) The extent to which manipulation involves removing, rather than merely reducing, alternatives depends on the mechanism at work. But insofar as we take such examples to involve the blocking of alternatives, we take them to rule out responsibility as well.

In reply, an opponent of PAP may concede that in all such cases, both responsibility and alternatives are diminished or absent, yet still deny that we can generalize from these to PAP, for in addition to lacking alternatives, these agents are missing other important moral or psychological capacities. It could be the absence of these, not the lack of alternatives, that explains why these agents aren’t responsible (cp. Wallace 1994: ch. 5). Put another way: perhaps having alternatives is merely correlated in ordinary circumstances with the true requirements for responsibility, whatever those might be. A more refined test of PAP needs to look at more exotic scenarios in which these other conditions are present while alternatives are not (§3.4; see §4.1 for more on “ordinary circumstances”).

2.3 The Nature of Agency

Among the goals of action theory is to distinguish what we do from what merely happens to us (see, e.g., Davidson 1980: ch. 3). Suppose that on the best way to draw this distinction, action (agency) requires alternatives. Some event in your life, that is, doesn’t count as something you did unless an alternative was within your power. For example, when you’re awakened by a noise, this is not an event you could have avoided, and so it was not an action, not an exercise of your agency. Similarly, events such as stumbling, sweating, and blushing aren’t things you (strictly) do: they happen to you. To this list we could add mental events such as obsessive thoughts: when such thoughts are, in the relevant sense, unavoidable, they belong to the sufferer only in the sense that the person is their subject, the arena in which they occur, not their agent. Given this view of action, PAP follows immediately: if action requires alternatives, then a fortiori, action for which one is morally responsible requires them.

This line of defense finds a home in some versions of agent-causalism, on which, not just free action, but action simpliciter requires agent causation (Taylor 1966; Steward 2012b; Brent 2017). On this picture, the difference between what I do and what merely happens to me is that I am the (or a) cause of the former, not the latter. Now add a second, logically independent premise that agent causation requires alternatives. If someone is necessitated, either internally or externally, it is the compelling factor, not the agent, that causes the resulting event, which thus is not an action. Not all agent causalists endorse both premises (Clarke 1993 and O’Connor 2000 deny that action simpliciter requires agent causation; Taylor 1966 and Markosian 2012 deny that agent causation requires alternatives). But joining the premises entails that action—and thus morally responsible action—requires alternatives.

This approach to defending PAP will have to say something about apparent actions that do not involve alternatives. When an addict takes a drug due to an irresistible urge to do so, it seems this is something the addict does, even if the addict can’t resist. (For a reply to such examples, see Alvarez 2013.) Similarly, the view entails that if causal determinism or some other universal block of alternatives is in place, no one ever acts; whether this is an acceptable consequence is disputed (Shabo 2011; Steward 2012a).

2.4 Moral Arguments

A broader concern about the previous defense is that it grounds our principle in the metaphysics of agency rather than in the nature of moral responsibility. Morality, the thought goes, should be more directly engaged in defense of PAP, a principle that explicitly constrains our practices of praise and blame. It’s not surprising, then, that a number of arguments supporting PAP start from moral premises.

A straightforward moral argument says it’s not fair to praise or blame a person for doing something that was, for her, unavoidable (for discussion see, e.g., Glover 1970: 70–3; Watson 1996; Nelkin 2011: ch. 2). A responsible agent is a proper target of the reactive attitudes, and unfairly or unjustly blaming someone, however expedient, would not be morally proper. One challenge for this defense of PAP is that fairness is itself entangled with the reactive attitudes (P. F. Strawson 1962; cp. Wallace 1994: 4.3). Thus, those who wonder whether praise and blame require alternatives are unlikely to be persuaded by the claim that fair targeting by the reactive attitudes requires alternatives—at least not without further argument. Someone questioning PAP, that is, is unlikely to be swayed by a moral appeal that seems only to reassert the principle.

Another line appeals to the principle, often associated with Kant (1785), that “ought” implies “can” (OIC). You cannot be morally obligated to do something that’s impossible for you. While it would be good for you to eradicate world hunger, you are under no obligation to do so for the simple reason that you can’t. (You may, however, be obligated to relieve hunger to the extent you can.) Perhaps OIC is not, as Reid thought, “as self-evident as the axioms of mathematics” (Reid 1788: IV.v), but it is nevertheless very plausible.

Now return to PAP. Suppose Kristin robs a bank. A first try at the argument runs as follows (here we take refraining from doing something to be a way doing something else; for a bit more on this, see §4.2.2):

If Kristin is blameworthy for robbing the bank, then she ought not to have done so.
If Kristin ought not to have robbed the bank, then she could have refrained from doing so.
Therefore, if Kristin is blameworthy for robbing the bank, then she could have refrained from doing so.

P1 looks safe, assuming that the moral sense of blame is in play (but see Capes 2012; Haji 2019). P2 is an instance of OIC. However, the conclusion, even when generalized, stops short of PAP, as it claims merely that alternatives are necessary for actions for which one is morally blameworthy; it is silent on actions for which one is morally praiseworthy, and it’s harder to see how OIC could be leveraged to cover such actions (Frankfurt 1983). After all, when you do something praiseworthy, you act as you should, so OIC can’t get a grip on alternative courses of action. That said, if some version of the above argument were sound, this would be a major victory for proponents of PAP. (Compare C. A. Campbell 1951: 451; van Inwagen 1983: 161; Widerker 1991; Copp 1997; critics include Yaffe 1999, 2005; see also Widerker 2003; Speak 2005.)

A third moral argument for PAP is closely related to the first two. It is the “What-should-he-have-done defense,” or “W-defense” for short (Widerker 2003). Like the argument in the previous paragraph, the W-defense is designed to apply to actions for which an agent is morally blameworthy. If Trent is to be blamed for loudly coughing during Maggie’s lecture, it’s morally reasonable to expect him to have refrained from coughing. But the central thought is that this expectation is not morally reasonable if he couldn’t help himself due to, say, a bug’s flying into his mouth. “What would you have had me do?,” he might ask a peeved Maggie. Without any satisfactory answer to such a question, blame seems inappropriate.

3. Arguments against PAP

Like most of the important conceptual claims of philosophy, PAP has proved to be a tempting target, especially to philosophers wanting to avoid its potential threat to responsibility (§1.1).

3.1 The Irrelevance of Determinism

As noted earlier (§2.2), it looks as if PAP is supported by our ordinary practices of praise and blame. In particular, those who could not avoid what they’ve done are excused. But despite these initial appearances, ordinary practices might end up undermining the principle.

Consider again causal determinism, a thesis often thought to rule out alternatives. Determinism is a substantive empirical claim, and no one, certainly no ordinary person, knows whether it’s true (see entry on causal determinism). It appears, then, that if we presuppose PAP in ordinary life, we should for the time being withhold judgment on whether any person is responsible for her actions, cautiously awaiting a verdict from scientists on the question of determinism. But, the argument goes, it would be absurd to think we have to wait for scientific progress to decide whether, say, Kevin should be grateful to Denise for picking up his mail when he was on vacation, or a victim of fraud should blame the con artist. These and similar reactions are justified however things turn out in the recherché domain of micro-physics. Determinism’s threatened block of alternatives is irrelevant to whether someone should be praised or blamed (P. F. Strawson 1962; Dennett 1984b: ch. 6; Fischer 2006: 5).

In reply, PAP’s defenders might take a cue from contextualists and say that in ordinary contexts, determinism is routinely (and properly) ignored. This would explain why micro-physics never appears in ordinary thinking about responsibility, but in a way compatible with our recognizing PAP’s truth: if determinism were to become salient—as it is in philosophical and scientific contexts—its block of alternatives would cause us to retract our ordinary judgments (cp. Hawthorne 2001). Another option is to say that we ordinarily assume—even if we don’t yet know—that determinism is false (Wiggins 1973: §8), and with this we normally take ourselves to have alternatives. Perhaps if we became determinists, we would stop our practices of praise and blame, or at least stop thinking they were justified, precisely because we endorse PAP or some closely related principle. There is a growing experimental literature on whether we would attribute moral responsibility under the explicit assumption of determinism, but the results so far seem to be mixed (Sommers 2010; Nichols 2015: ch. 4).

3.2 Compelled but Willing Action

The previous section tried to undermine PAP by arguing that our practices of praise and blame are neutral on whether we have alternatives. A more direct line of attack—to explored in this and following sections—tries to produce cases in which we properly praise or blame agents even while knowing they lack alternatives.

One sort of example is from the Stoics (Inwood & Gerson 1988: 134). Imagine a dog happily running behind a cart to which he is chained. The cart makes the dog’s running inevitable—he cannot do otherwise—yet he nevertheless runs willingly. Whatever exactly the Stoics meant by this example (Sauvé Meyer 1999; Hankinson 2014), an opponent of PAP may be inspired to argue by analogy that necessity or “fate” doesn’t preclude responsibility. Even if Kurt is fated to steal John’s lunch, he’s still responsible for doing so if he acts willingly: even if fate “pulls” him along like the cart, he could be a happy and contributing participant. Similarly, imagine a drug user whose addiction compels him to take a drug, but who doesn’t mind being addicted, and thus indulges willingly. The addict is responsible for taking the drug, even if he couldn’t do otherwise (Frankfurt 1971; cf. Wallace 1994: 172–5; the irresistible addiction, while perhaps useful for making such conceptual points, appears not to match actual cases of addiction: see Levy 2006; Pickard 2015.)

That said, the power of such examples against PAP is limited, as they involve the sorts of compulsion usually thought to preclude responsibility (cp. Lamb 1993). At best these are examples of overdetermination: responsibility-undermining factors are at work, even if the agent’s own character and values play a (redundant) role in producing the action. A kind of case to be considered next, however, may be more effective.

3.3 Volitional Necessity

Brought before Charles V and ordered to recant, Luther refused, saying (according to tradition), “Here I stand. I can do no other”. If we can take his word for it, Luther was compelled by his conscience. Yet we still praise him for refusing, in spite of his inability to do otherwise. Indeed, his being compelled by conscience may enhance our moral admiration. Such cases of “volitional necessity” (Frankfurt 1982) are prima facie counterexamples to PAP. Sometimes when we act, alternatives are “unthinkable”: if a normal person is offered money to torture someone, that person will have no option but to refuse (Dennett 1984a). Again, this lack of alternatives is compatible with, and even enhances, moral praise. (See also Wolf 1980; Nelkin 2011, in which the goodness of the determined act plays an important role.) Such cases are similar to the compelled actions considered in the previous section, but there’s at least this difference: in those earlier cases, what compels is something “alien” to the agent: a cart, fate, an irresistible desire for a drug. But here, compulsion comes only from the agent’s own internalized system of values. This might explain why praise is more forthcoming.

Nevertheless, a defender of PAP could question whether such agents are responsible in the sense we’re concerned with here. Reid notes that Cato was said to be “good because he could not be otherwise”. Reid replies:

this saying, if understood literally and strictly, is not the praise of Cato, but of his constitution, which was no more the work of Cato, than his existence. (Reid 1788, IV.1; quoted in Chisholm 1966)

Praising Cato’s character, we conflate this with moral credit and thereby hold him responsible. Carefully avoid this mistake, and cases of volitional necessity no longer appear to be counterexamples to PAP.

But a more common reply to such examples is to clarify our principle by allowing the relevant alternatives to occur before the time of acting. Insofar as Luther should be praised for his refusal, it’s because the character compelling the action was itself the result of Luther’s past choices in which he could have done otherwise. This important qualification to PAP, sometimes called “tracing”, has been standard since Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics iii.v; cp. John Locke 1689: II.xxi.56; C. A. Campbell 1957; Lamb 1993; Kane 1996: 39–40). Only by moral struggle, choosing a certain path among the many available, did Luther finally arrive at a point in which his character and conscience necessitated his actions. In light of this, let us formulate PAP with an additional clause (closely following Mele 1999: 282):

PAP-historical: a person is morally responsible for what she has done at time t only if (i) she could have done otherwise at t, or (ii) even though she could not have done otherwise at t, the psychological character on the basis of which she acted at t is itself partially a product of an earlier action (or actions) of hers which was performed at a time when she could have done otherwise.

This less demanding version of PAP was needed all along, even for more ordinary cases. Tom, who becomes violent when drunk, couldn’t help himself when he punched someone: Tom’s intoxication put him at the mercy of his anger. Yet, assuming other conditions on responsibility are met, we should blame him, especially when learning that he willingly drank beforehand. It’s the prior act of drinking for which Tom had alternatives, and it’s these alternatives, not those at the time of action, that satisfy our new condition.

Henceforth let PAP and similar principles have such a historical rider, at least implicitly (so “PAP” below can be read as short for “PAP-historical”). The principle’s defenders can then allow a wide range of cases—willing incapacitation, moral saintliness, confrontation with the “unthinkable”—in which a person is responsible for acting without, at the time, having alternatives. To test PAP, then, one must go to “the source” and look at cases in which the historical clause is not relevant to the agent’s moral responsibility. Stipulate that the actions to be considered below, unless otherwise stated, are those for which, if the agent is responsible at all, she is “directly” responsible (Zimmerman 1988: ch. 3). Perhaps such actions are what Kane (1996) calls “self-forming willings”, foundational choices that shape the characters that later constrain, or even fix, future action (cp. Klein 1990: 58).

3.4 Inevitability without Causation

According to Frankfurt (1983: 322),

[c]onstructing counterexamples to PAP is not difficult. It is necessary only to conceive circumstances which make it inevitable that a person will perform some action but which do not bring it about that he performs it.

Frankfurt himself proposed examples of this sort, and they have inspired a massive literature, a portion of which is discussed below. But before we get to Frankfurt’s own examples, others in the same neighborhood are worth looking at.

3.4.1 Divine Foreknowledge

As noted earlier (§1.1), PAP threatens to join with divine foreknowledge to rule out moral responsibility. The reasoning starts like this:

If God knew a billion years ago that Kurt would steal John’s lunch, then Kurt could not have done otherwise.
If Kurt could not have done otherwise than steal John’s lunch, then he was not morally responsible for doing so.
Therefore, if God knew a billion years ago that Kurt would steal John’s lunch, then Kurt was not morally responsible for doing so.

Adding the thesis of divine foreknowledge as a premise would let us complete the argument, but this initial stage is what matters here. The conclusion looks false. After all, God’s foreknowledge didn’t cause Kurt to act as he does. God merely saw ahead of time that Kurt would do this on his own, for his own reasons. By analogy, my covertly observing Kurt as he steals John’s lunch does not affect his responsibility for the theft. Why then should God’s being aware of that same act (albeit ahead of time) make any difference to whether he should be blamed?

Suppose this case against C is convincing. The above argument is valid, so either P1 or P2 must be rejected. P1, however, is supported by a venerable line of reasoning, which goes roughly as follows: Supposing that God foreknew Kurt’s action, if Kurt had the power to refrain from stealing John’s lunch, he would thereby have the power to change what God knew a billion years ago. But Kurt has no such power, as the past is fixed. If this argument for P1 is sound, then P2 is the culprit. But P2 is entailed by PAP, so PAP is false as well.

This case against PAP follows Frankfurt’s recipe for constructing counterexamples (Hunt 1996, 1999; but cf. Zagzebski 1991: ch. 6; Widerker 2000: 187–8). God’s foreknowledge makes it “inevitable” that Kurt will steal John’s lunch, but does not “bring it about” that he does so: Kurt steals on his own, without divine interference. Evaluating this proposed counterexample would lead us beyond this scope of this entry into the topic of divine foreknowledge (see entry on divine foreknowledge and free will). But some of the moves one might make here will come up later when replies to Frankfurt’s own proposed counterexamples are considered.

3.4.2 Locke’s Content Prisoner

In the Essay Locke asks us to imagine that

a man be carried, whilst fast asleep, into a room, where is a person he longs to see and speak with; and be there locked fast in, beyond his power to get out: he awakes, and is glad to find himself in so desirable company, which he stays willingly in, i.e., prefers his stay to going away. (J. Locke 1689: II.xxi.10)

Locke says the man remains in the room voluntarily, even if he is not free to leave. If the man is responsible for staying, this is a counterexample to PAP. Like the previous example, this one also appears to follow Frankfurt’s recipe. What makes the man’s staying in the room unavoidable—namely, the room’s being locked—plays no role in his staying: he remains willingly, for his own reasons (see Zimmerman 1988: 120–6 for a similar example).

While Locke’s example shaped later discussions of moral responsibility, it appears that—whatever Locke intended—it’s not decisive against PAP. Distinguish two of the man’s actions: (A1) staying in the room, and (A2) deciding (agreeing, willing) to stay in the room (Lowe 1995: 131). It’s not at all clear that he should be blamed for A1; the room is, after all, locked. On the other hand, it seems he can be blamed for A2. But he could have done otherwise than A2: he could have protested or tried to get out. Whatever apparent pressure the example puts on PAP derives from conflating A1 and A2. There is no action of the man that’s both unavoidable (for him) and one for which we should hold him morally responsible.

3.4.3 Frankfurt-Style Cases

So far we’ve looked at two sorts of proposed counterexample to PAP that follow Frankfurt’s recipe. Frankfurt’s own examples, and those they inspired, have come to be known as “Frankfurt-Style Cases” (FSCs). Here is one:

…let us say that a person decides to take and does take a certain drug, just in order to enjoy the euphoria he expects it to induce. Now suppose further that his taking the drug would have been made to happen in any case, by forces which were in fact inactive but which would have come into play if he had not on his own decided and acted as he did. Let us say that, unknown to himself, the person is addicted to the drug and would therefore have been driven irresistibly to take it if he had not freely gone about doing so. His dormant addiction guarantees that he could have avoided neither deciding to take nor taking the drug, but it plays no role in bringing about his decision or his act. As the actual sequence of events develops, everything happens as if he were not addicted at all. The addiction is clearly irrelevant in this case to the question of whether the person is morally responsible for taking the drug. (Frankfurt 1983: 322–3)

This person resembles the willing addict considered earlier (§3.2), except in this case the addiction remains dormant. He takes the drug on his own, for his own reasons. He thus seems morally responsible for deciding to take the drug and for taking it. Yet both decision and action were inevitable, for the addiction would have forced him had he not chosen on his own to do so.

A more well-known FSC comes in an earlier paper (Frankfurt 1969; Frankfurt credits Robert Nozick’s unpublished lectures for similar examples). In what follows, it will be useful to consider a version of Frankfurt’s example from Fischer:

Black is a nefarious neurosurgeon. In performing an operation on Jones to remove a brain tumor, Black inserts a mechanism into Jones’s brain which enables Black to monitor and control Jones’s activities. Jones, meanwhile, knows nothing of this. Black exercises this control through a computer which he has programmed so that, among other things, it monitors Jones’s voting behavior. If Jones shows an inclination to decide to vote for [the Democrat], then the computer, through the mechanism in Jones’s brain, intervenes to assure that he actually decides to vote for [the Republican], and does so vote. But if Jones decides on his own to vote for [the Republican], the computer does nothing but continue to monitor—without affecting—the goings-on in Jones’s head.

Suppose Jones decides to vote for [the Republican] on his own, just as he would have if Black had not inserted the mechanism into his head. Then Frankfurt claims that Jones is responsible for voting for [the Republican], regardless of the fact that he could not have done otherwise. (Fischer 1982: 26; cp. Frankfurt 1969: 835–836)

Complicating details will come in later sections, but for now it’s worth noting two advantages of this kind of example. First, unlike some of the earlier attempts to undermine PAP, there is no factor, internal to the agent or otherwise, compelling the action. What makes an action inevitable—the dormant addiction in one case, Black and his computer in another—in no way brings about the action, which the agent does for his own reasons. This makes praise or blame more natural. Second, unlike the case of Locke’s prisoner, FSCs do not invite us to conflate decision and overt action, for it is the decision itself (as well as the action) that is both inevitable and that for which the agent is morally responsible.

4. Objections to Frankfurt-Style Cases

Not everyone is impressed by Frankfurt’s proposed counterexamples and the FSCs he inspired. Some critics concede that PAP is false, but insist that some neighboring principle—one that will serve many of the same purposes as PAP—is immune to Frankfurt’s examples. Others attack FSCs directly, arguing that the examples fail to show even that PAP is false. The critical literature is too large to cover in detail here, but this section outlines a few broad themes. (Among the many useful surveys are Fischer 1999, 2011; Sartorio 2017; and the pertinent chapters of Beebee 2013; Griffith 2013; Timpe 2013.)

4.1 The Cases are Too Unusual

FSCs are philosophical thought-experiments, often involving science fiction and covert figures with mysterious powers and unlikely obsessions. The growing literature on FSCs continues this pattern (for a sampling, see Widerker & McKenna 2003). As the cases get increasingly “strange and esoteric” (Kane 2007: 168), achieving “dizzying degrees of development” (Speak 2002: 98), we might start to wonder whether we’ve lost sight of the goal, which is to understand concepts originating, not in philosophical fantasy, but in everyday life and ordinary circumstances. However things look in the distant possible worlds of FSCs, our natural practices and judgments of moral responsibility require alternatives.

This suggestion could play out in a few ways. One is to concede that FSCs have refuted PAP, but to insist that the principle—much like Newtonian theory in the domain of physics—is still good enough for our ordinary practices of assigning praise and blame (Stump 1990). Or one might just abandon PAP as formulated but replace it with a principle explicitly restricted to ordinary, non-Frankfurt cases:

PAP-ordinary: in ordinary circumstances, a person is morally responsible for what she has done only if she could have done otherwise.

Such a principle appears Frankfurt-proof, yet is designed to be just as useful to assigning praise and blame as the original (O’Connor 2005; Glatz 2008; Perry 2010; Whittle 2016). Finally, one could say that this sort of restriction was part of PAP all along, as the principle gets its content from—and is restricted to—our ordinary practices. In that case, PAP-ordinary just is the original PAP, so FSCs were never a threat to begin with.

In reply, a defender of FSCs could note that not all such cases are so far removed from everyday life. There is nothing especially bizarre about Locke’s content prisoner (an early kind of FSC) or Frankfurt’s own example of the dormant addiction. And there is no fantastic technology or malevolent being in another FSC, the “driver instruction vehicle” with dual controls: Sally steers her car to the right, which the instructor is happy to allow. But

if Sally had shown any inclination to cause the car to go in some other direction, the instructor would have intervened and caused the car to go to the right (just as it actually goes). (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 32; cp. Naylor 1984)

It’s worth noting as well that if traditional theism is true, and if divine foreknowledge is an FSC (Hunt 2003), then FSCs, far from being unusual, are commonplace. That said, all of these more “ordinary” FSCs still violate background assumptions usually in place when persons are praised or blamed. Those favoring PAP-ordinary could claim that these examples do not fall within the principle’s scope.

In any case, there is a more fundamental reply to the general strategy of this section: if FSCs, strange as some of them are, are at least coherent, they do point to a conceptual divide between moral responsibility and alternatives. Even if alternatives are needed for responsibility in ordinary circumstances, FSCs, if successful, show that this is a contingent fact. Fallback principles such as PAP-ordinary reveal, at best, that alternatives are usually correlated with responsibility, and tell us little about what it is to be responsible. FSCs could thereby serve an important theoretical role in directing attention away from alternatives to what makes someone responsible for their actions (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 30; Ekstrom 2000: 184–5).

4.2 Frankfurt Agents Could Have Done Otherwise

A central feature of all FSCs is that the agent could not have done otherwise. Due to the presence of the (counterfactual) intervener, all options but one are closed. But some have objected that the agent in fact can do otherwise, and that it’s this ability that, in accordance with PAP, explains why the agent is responsible (assuming that other conditions of responsibility are met). Below are two ways Frankfurt agents could turn out to have alternatives after all.

4.2.1 General Abilities

Wilderness Tim finds himself stranded in the middle of nowhere, miles from any automobile. Can Tim drive a car? Yes and No (§1.3). He is (for now) healthy, and has not lost any of the skills needed to drive. So in that sense he can. But there are no cars available, so in that sense he cannot. Say then that Tim has the general ability (capacity, skill, competence) to drive, but he can’t drive in a more inclusive all-in sense, that is, when his particular circumstances are also taken into account. This distinction between kinds of ability is a staple of action theory (e.g., Austin 1956; Goldman 1970: ch. 7; D. Locke 1974; Mele 2003). Here we look briefly at its relevance to FSCs.

As the interveners in FSCs are merely counterfactual, they leave the general abilities of their agents intact. Black’s device, for example, merely monitors Jones’ brain: as things turn out, because matters proceed as Black wishes, he does nothing to affect how Jones deliberates, decides, or acts. Jones thus retains all of the general abilities he would have had if Black had never been present. (Stipulate that the device Black places in Jones does not interfere with any relevant processes in Jones’ brain: Black is a supremely talented neurosurgeon.) Assuming Jones is otherwise normal, we can suppose that among his general abilities is that he can vote for the Democrat. So while Jones cannot in a more inclusive sense choose otherwise than to vote for the Republican (that is, when the presence of Black and his device are held fixed), Jones can choose to vote for the Democrat in the general sense, and this is ability enough for responsibility, thus rescuing PAP from such examples. (Variations on this theme include J. K. Campbell 1997, 2005; Smith 2003; Vihvelin 2004; Fara 2008.)

In light of this defense, let us for now formulate our principle explicitly in terms of general abilities, allowing that this might have been what PAP was saying all along:

PAP-general: a person is morally responsible for what she has done only if she had the general ability to do otherwise.

This version appears to be immune to FSCs. And it has the added virtue of explaining standard cases in which agents are blameless (§2.2), so long as these can plausibly be construed as involving absent or diminished general abilities. Moreover, compatibilists will note that causal determinism is no longer the threat to moral responsibility it first appeared to be (§1.1; but see also §5.2). After all, determinism does not rob us of our unexercised general abilities. For example, even in a deterministic world, during periods of silence one typically still has the competence to speak. Why, then, should determinism deprive anyone of the ability—that is, the general ability—to do otherwise? The point is ancient (Sorabji 1980: 78), but it has received new life and sophisticated defense in the hands of the “new dispositionalists” or “dispositional compatibilists,” so-called because general abilities can be equated with dispositions (see entry on compatibilism §4.1.5).

One question this defense raises is whether PAP, now construed as PAP-general, is subject to counterexamples similar to FSCs (Cohen & Handfield 2007; Whittle 2010). Another is whether this revised principle reflects the kind of alternatives traditionally thought needed to explain responsibility (McKenna 1998; Kane 2002; Clarke 2009; Whittle 2010; Fischer 2018; cp. entry on abilities §5.2). There’s a set of moral practices, and with it a version of PAP, on which responsibility requires more than just the general ability to do otherwise. It’s apparently this reading of PAP that FSCs are targeting. Even if Frankfurt agents have the relevant general abilities, they seem to lack the ability to do otherwise in the sense traditionally—but wrongly, according to Frankfurt and his allies—required for responsibility.

4.2.2 Flickers of Freedom

The previous section assumed that agents in FSCs cannot do otherwise in the more inclusive all-in sense. But a more ambitious line of response rejects this, insisting that Frankfurt agents can do otherwise even when their peculiar circumstances are taken into account. Or rather, they have an all-in alternative, one that, however minor, is enough satisfy PAP’s requirement on moral responsibility. These are “little alternatives” (Rowe 2006) or “flickers of freedom” (Fischer 1994).

There are several versions of this strategy. Here’s one: Black remains inactive only because his device detects in Jones no inclination to vote for the Democrat. But then it looks as if Jones had an alternative after all: he could have been inclined to vote for the Democrat. This alternative would not have issued in a choice, but it is an alternative for all that. But this sort of flicker is not especially useful in defense of PAP. For one thing, it seems to locate the alternative at the wrong time, and regarding the wrong action (if indeed an inclination can be considered an action at all). For another, there may be FSCs in which Black does not rely on any such prior sign before the moment of choice (§4.3.2).

There are, however, more promising versions of the flicker strategy: early attempts include van Inwagen 1978; Naylor 1984; Rowe 1987. Take Naylor’s version to be representative. Black remains inactive because he sees that Jones will decide on his own to do what Black wishes, namely, vote for the Republican. Black would have intervened otherwise. But doesn’t this mean there’s something Jones could have refrained from doing, namely voting for the Republican on his own, i.e., without Black’s intervention? This is an all-in ability, and it’s because Jones had this alternative open to him that he is rightly held responsible.

Frankfurt’s allies may concede there are such flickers of freedom, but deny that they are sufficiently “robust” to ground our judgments of moral responsibility (Fischer 1994: 140–7; 1999). Grant that Jones could do otherwise than choose to vote for the Republican on his own. But this alleged alternative is one in which Jones doesn’t choose at all: rather, in this counterfactual scenario, it is Black who, by activating the neural implant, causes a “choice” to vote for the Republican. How, then, could an alternative in which Jones doesn’t act—one in which he is merely Black’s puppet—be relevant to Jones’s responsibility in the actual scenario? Put another way: the alternative in question is merely one in which something else happens to Jones; it is not one in which he does anything. This cannot be the kind of alternative PAP requires for responsibility. The existence of flickers, it seems, cannot save PAP from FSCs.

In reply, some of PAP’s defenders have asked whether alternatives need to be robust in this sense. Perhaps Jones’ alternative, however small, can ground his responsibility, not by being an alternative action, but by indicating that Jones was not determined to act as he did (Mele 1996; Della Rocca 1998; Ekstrom 2000: 190). A more ambitious response notes that even if Black intervenes in the alternative scenario, Jones has there refrained from choosing—at least he’s refrained from the particular choosing we see in the actual scenario. If we can consider such refrainings as “doings” in some broad sense of the term, then this is a sense in which Jones does otherwise in the alternative scenario. “Robust” or not, this may be the only kind of alternative that flicker theorists need (cp. Alvarez 2009; Steward 2009; 2012a; §5.3.1; see also Speak 2002; Capes & Swenson 2017).

4.3 A Dilemma for Frankfurt-Style Cases

An influential criticism of FSCs is in the form of a dilemma, one that becomes clear when we look more closely at how FSCs are supposed to work. Below is one version of this dilemma, followed by two broad categories of response.

4.3.1 The Dilemma Stated

Although it is not always explicit in FSCs, the counterfactual intervener appears to reply on some prior sign of what the agent is about to do (Blumenfeld 1971). Black’s device, for example, is sensitive to Jones’ inclination: if it detects an inclination (call it “Pro-D”) to choose the Democrat, Black will intervene; if it detects an inclination (“Pro-R”) to choose the Republican, Black will remain idle. As matters turn out, Pro-R appears, Black does nothing, and Jones votes for the Republican on his own. The dilemma is this: either Pro-R determines (or is associated with something that determines—a qualification to be left out for simplicity) that Jones will vote for the Republican, or it doesn’t. Either way, the FSC fails as a counterexample to PAP.

Suppose first that Pro-R determines Jones’ choice. In that case, it’s no longer clear that Jones is responsible, for he’s been locked into his choice by a prior cause. Certainly PAPs defenders—who tend to be libertarians about free will and moral responsibility—will balk at attributing responsibility to an agent whose actions are causally determined. Lost, then, is the initially powerful appearance that Jones is morally responsible. On the other hand, suppose Pro-R does not determine Jones’ later choice. In that case, Jones could have chosen otherwise, for the sign—the only thing that stays Black’s hand—leaves open that Jones will vote for the Democrat. Jones thus has an alternative, and a robust one at that: this is no mere flicker.

The upshot is that there is no way of spelling out the details of this FSC in a way that preserves both the responsibility of the agent and the lack of alternatives. Yet both are need for it to be a successful counterexample. If all FSCs are structurally similar to this one, they are powerless against PAP. (Versions of this “dilemma defense” include Kane 1985: 51; 1996: 142–3, 191–2; Widerker 1995; Ginet 1996; Wyma 1997; cp. Ekstrom 2000: 197 for a similar dilemma; and see Haji & McKenna 2004 for a critical overview. Vihvelin 2000 presents a different dilemma for FSCs, one that nevertheless engages some of issues that will come up below; for an exchange on that alternative dilemma, see Fischer 2008; Vihvelin 2008.)

4.3.2 Responses to the Dilemma

Start with the first horn and stipulate that Pro-R is a deterministic cause of Jones’ subsequent choice. But to prevent the libertarian from objecting immediately, let us suppose that Jones’ responsibility for his choice is not clear; indeed, we can suppose—even if initially shocking to Frankfurt’s allies—that he’s not responsible for it. Nevertheless, his being blameless is not due to something, namely Black and his device, that rules out alternatives. In the actual scenario, Black remains passive, merely monitoring Jones’ brain without interfering. The central idea here is that any factor causally isolated from an agent cannot be relevant to that person’s moral responsibility. So even if Jones isn’t responsible, this isn’t entailed by his lacking alternatives; this would be enough to refute PAP. (Fischer 1999: 113; cp. Frankfurt 2003. This is just a first pass at what turns out to be a much more complex argument. For further refinement and criticism, see Goetz 2005; Fischer 2010; Widerker & Goetz 2013; Fischer 2013; Palmer 2014.)

Frankfurt’s defenders more often take on the second horn, on which Pro-R is not causally sufficient for Jones’ choice. This makes his responsibility clearer, especially for libertarians. But now it seems as if he could choose otherwise.

Pereboom (2001: ch. 1; see also Hunt 2005) replies that even with an indeterministic sign, we can construct a successful FSC in which Jones lacks alternatives. For variety, switch for a moment to Pereboom’s “Tax Evasion,” though one could construct the Black-Jones case to make similar points. Joe is an agent with libertarian freedom who is considering whether to claim an illegal tax deduction. He’s inclined to do so, and as he deliberates, the only factor that could potentially change his mind is a strong moral reason. Whether such a reason occurs to Joe is not determined (cp. Mele 1995: ch. 12), and even if it does occur to him, it may not change his mind. But at least a necessary condition of his choosing not to evade taxes is the occurrence of such a reason (thereby entering a “mental buffer zone”—these are thus called “buffer cases”). Now add the counterfactual intervener, who wants Joe to break the law:

… to ensure that [Joe] chooses to evade taxes, a neuroscientist now implants a device which, were it to sense a moral reason occurring with the specified force, would electronically stimulate his brain so that he would choose to evade taxes. In actual fact, no moral reason occurs to him with such force, and he chooses to evade takes while the device remains idle (Pereboom 2001: 19).

Joe seems responsible for his choice—even by the libertarian’s lights—but he could not have chosen otherwise, for that would have required a moral reason, one that would have triggered the intervention. In this FSC, the only overt sign is in the counterfactual sequence, but one might nevertheless worry that the absence of this sign in the actual sequence is, contrary to the constraints of the second horn, causally sufficient for Joe’s deciding to take the illegal deduction. So add that at any moment leading up to the decision, a moral reason could occur to Joe. As Jones deliberates, then, there’s no point at which the absence (up to that time) of a moral reason determines his deciding to evade taxes. (Critics of this buffer case include Ginet 2002; Goetz 2002; Widerker 2006.)

Another way to avoid a causally sufficient sign of Jones’ choice is simply to excise the sign itself, a feature, by the way, not always explicit in Frankfurt’s own FSCs. Suppose there is no sign or anything else causally sufficient for Jones’ choice, and stipulate that the causal processes leading up to it are as the libertarian sees fit. The question then is how to make Jones’ choice inevitable, as a successful FSC requires. Filling in the details, Hunt (2000; 2003) imagines that the neural processes leading up to Jones’ choice proceed without any outside interference. But while these processes are indeterministic, it turns out that all of the alternative neural pathways—those that might have realized a decision to vote for the Democrat—have been blocked. Such “blockage” (Fischer 1999) gives Jones no alternative but to vote for the Republican, yet he still makes the decision on his own—the blockage never plays a role in his deliberations—and is thus morally responsible for it. In a related FSC (Mele & Robb 1998), Black has set up in Jones’ brain a process that will, at the time of the decision, cause Jones to vote for the Republican, unless Jones decides at that time to do so on his own. The process set up by Black does not interfere with Jones’ own deliberations which are assumed, as before, to satisfy the libertarian. Nor does Black’s process look for a sign of what Jones will decide. When, at the relevant time, Jones decides on his own to vote for the Republican, it seems he is responsible for the decision, even though the process Black has set up ensures that Jones could not have decided otherwise. (It turns out that this example too involves blockage, as the process set up by Black has also “neutralized” the neural realization of any alternative decision.)

Among the reasons to worry about blockage cases is that they may, contrary to what’s intended, render Jones’ choice causally determined, again putting his responsibility into question. After all, the objection goes, there seems little if any difference between saying (i) that structures and processes set up in Jones’ brain block off all alternatives other than choosing to vote for the Republican, and (ii) that Jones’ choice is causally determined by those same structures and processes. (For further critical discussion of such cases, see, e.g., O’Connor 2000: 83–84; Ekstrom 2002; Ginet 1996 [2001 addendum]; 2003; Kane 2003; Timpe 2013: ch. 6. An important response to the dilemma defense not considered here is Stump 1996; see also Goetz 1999; Stump 1999.)

5. Beyond PAP

So far not much consensus has emerged from the literature on PAP. Optimists will still see progress of a sort: a principle taken for granted through much of philosophy’s history is now considered more complex than it initially appeared, worth discussing, and possibly false. In any case, in this this final section, assume for a moment that for some reason or other PAP should be rejected. What then?

5.1 Compatibilism Re-energized?

§1.1 noted that combining PAP with some universal block of alternatives—such as causal determinism—rules out moral responsibility. Here is a sketch of this kind of argument:

If determinism is true, then Kurt could not have done otherwise than steal John’s lunch.
If Kurt could not have done otherwise than steal John’s lunch, then Kurt was not morally responsible for doing so.
Therefore, if determinism is true, then Kurt was not morally responsible for stealing John’s lunch.

The first premise is supported by the Consequence Argument (see entry on arguments for incompatibilism §5): Given determinism, Kurt’s theft was a necessary consequence of the distant past plus the laws of nature. Kurt has no power over either of these, so he couldn’t avoid stealing John’s lunch. The second premise is an instance of PAP. And the conclusion can be generalized to apply to any action: if determinism is true, no one is responsible for anything they do.

Compatibilists about determinism and moral responsibility reject this conclusion, so they must reject at least one of the premises. One traditional sort of compatibilist accepts PAP (and P2), and targets P1 and with it the Consequence Argument. This entangles the compatibilist in questions about the ability to do otherwise (§1.3 and §4.2.1). However, if PAP is false, the compatibilist can avoid these difficulties and reject P2 as unsupported. Without PAP in the way, compatibilism receives new energy (see entry on compatibilism §4).

But this route to compatibilism isn’t straightforward. Even without the help of PAP, determinism may still preclude responsibility due to the way it blocks alternatives (Frankfurt 1969; Blumenfeld 1971; Fischer 1982; Speak 2007). In FSCs, what makes the action inevitable doesn’t interfere with the agent’s own deliberative processes or actions: the “intervention” in these examples is merely counterfactual. By contrast, if determinism is true, its intervention is actual. After all, determinism entails that every detail of how we choose and act is fixed by factors in the distant past. As one might put it: in a deterministic world, we act as we do because determinism has put us on the single track, because we could not do otherwise. So even if FSCs show that the mere blocking of alternatives does not preclude moral responsibility, determinism’s distinctive way of blocking alternatives is still a threat. (In light of this point, one could reformulate the above incompatibilist argument explicitly in terms of the particular way determinism blocks alternatives. The modified P2 would not require PAP, though it would need a weaker principle.)

This move shifts the burden back to compatibilists, who need to explain why determinism, in spite of the way it blocks alternatives, doesn’t undermine responsibility. A traditional compatibilist reply points out that determinism—unlike compulsion and other threats to responsibility—does not disrupt the normal operation of our faculties; in that sense, its “invasiveness” is benign (cp. §3.1). A more ambitious line defends this point by developing an independently plausible compatibilist account of moral responsibility. Here, briefly, are two such attempts (see entry on compatibilism for a detailed treatment of these and other compatibilist options).

One is from Frankfurt (1971) and others, who say the morally responsible agent is one who identifies with the motives that cause him to act. Consider volitional necessity (§3.3): While Luther is compelled by his conscience, he identifies with these moral motives. Similarly, even if the willing addict can’t help but take the drug, he endorses the addiction. Such cases appeared earlier as attempted counterexamples to PAP. Now they are treated as cases of benign necessitation, ways of blocking alternatives, that, while operating through an agent’s own deliberative processes, are compatible with moral responsibility. As long as the agent endorses (or at least does not reject) these processes, they needn’t preclude responsibility. If an account along these lines can be independently defended, a compatibilist can claim to have met the above demand, as identification, and thus responsibility, is compatible with determinism.

Another influential account is from Fischer and Ravizza (1998; see also Fischer 1994). One lesson of FSCs is that the explanation of moral responsibility should be found in the actual sequence leading up to an agent’s choice and action. In the Black-Jones case, what happens in the alternative sequence, in which Black intervenes, is not relevant to Jones’ responsibility. It’s not even clear that Jones does anything in the alternative sequence (§4.2.2). His moral responsibility, then, must be grounded in what actually happens when Jones chooses on his own to vote for the Republican. Fischer and Ravizza argue that the relevant portion of the actual sequence includes a “reasons-responsive mechanism” producing Jones’ choice. As Jones deliberates, his deliberative faculties are sensitive to reasons to vote for the Democrat as well as reasons to vote for the Republican. As it turns out, the latter outweigh the former, but there is still a scenario in which the reasons to vote for the Democrat to outweigh those to vote for the Republican, Jones’ deliberative faculties are sensitive to this fact, and he votes accordingly. In this sense, his deliberative faculties can respond to competing reasons. (This Democratic-friendly scenario needn’t be accessible to Jones; we can thus preserve Frankfurt’s constraints.) Supposing that, given the appropriate background conditions, reasons-responsiveness secures moral responsibility, the compatibilist has met the earlier demand, for having a reasons-responsive mechanism looks compatible with determinism.

Fischer and Ravizza’s account allows that control of a sort is required for moral responsibility. One kind of control over one’s choices and actions is a matter of having alternatives: in this sense, the control condition is equivalent to the rejected PAP; Fischer and Ravizza call this “regulative control”. But there’s another kind, “guidance control,” that doesn’t require that the agent has alternatives available, and it’s this that the reasons-responsiveness account attempts to capture. Jones guides his action in the relevant sense, and for this reason can be responsible for what he does, even if, due to Black and his computer, Jones lacks regulative control.

5.2 Incompatibilism without PAP

In spite of compatibilist theories developed in the wake of FSCs, some philosophers have remained convinced that even if PAP is false, determinism precludes responsibility. A compatibilist will challenge such philosophers to explain why this is so, if not because determinism blocks all alternatives.

One response to this challenge was in the previous section. Another modifies the Consequence Argument so that it doesn’t rely on PAP. This is the “Direct Argument”, direct because it doesn’t go through PAP. It can be reconstructed along the following lines (a formal version is in van Inwagen 1980):

If determinism is true, then Kurt’s stealing John’s lunch is an inevitable consequence of factors (namely, the distant past and laws) for which Kurt is not morally responsible.
If a person is not morally responsible for X, and Y is an inevitable consequence of X, then that person is not morally responsible for Y.
Therefore, if determinism is true, then Kurt is not morally responsible for stealing John’s lunch.

The first premise P1 follows from the definition of determinism as well as some auxiliary claims about moral responsibility. P2 is the “transfer of blamelessness”; whatever else might be said about this premise, it does not require PAP. And the conclusion, which can be generalized, follows from P1 and P2. But while this argument does not appeal to PAP, it appears that FSCs can be used against P2, the transfer of blamelessness. The presence of Black, for which we can hardly blame Jones, makes the choice to vote Republican inevitable, but Jones is for all that morally responsible for so-choosing (see Fischer’s introduction to his 1986; Fischer & Ravizza 1998: ch. 6; and for more discussion, Stump 2000; McKenna 2008).

A related answer to the compatibilist challenge is from the “source incompatibilist” or “causal history incompatibilist” (Stump 1990; Klein 1990; Pereboom 1995, 2001; Zagzebski 2000). Under determinism, you are not the source—at least not the ultimate source­—of your actions. Rather, the sources of your actions are found in the distant past. This point seems to undermine your responsibility, at least one desirable form of it (Mele 1996). Whatever the merits of source incompatibilism, it addresses the compatibilist challenge, for it says why determinism threatens moral responsibility—namely, by ruling out sourcehood—but without appealing to its blocking of alternatives, and thus without PAP. In this way, FSCs shift the dispute away from alternatives to the nature and importance of sourcehood. (Some source incompatibilists accept PAP or a closely related principle—see, e.g., Kane 1996; Timpe 2013: ch. 9—but we are for now assuming PAP is false.)

5.3 Replacement Principles

One of the results of FSCs has been a long list of principles similar to PAP, but intended to improve on it. Some of these keep PAP’s focus on action, while others switch to responsibility for consequences or omissions (§1.2). This final section samples a few of these replacement principles.

5.3.1 Responsibility for Actions

This entry assumes that PAP’s proposed condition is intended to be explanatory, not merely necessary for responsibility. (Not all necessary conditions are explanatory, as any Euthyphro-style problem will show.) That is, the intent of the principle is that when a person lacks alternatives, it is at least in part in virtue of this that she is not morally responsible (Fischer 1994: 140; Pereboom 2001: 25). As formulated, however, PAP seems too weak for this purpose, as it appears to allow any alternative action to meet its requirement. Suppose that when Kurt stole John’s lunch, he had an alternative, but it was so remote from his mind, so irrelevant to his circumstances, that he never considered it: Kurt could have sat down and whistled a tune. Although this is an alternative to stealing John’s lunch, it is not the sort that could potentially explain his responsibility. Thus finding PAP too weak, McKenna strengthens its requirements:

PAP-significant: a person is morally responsible for A-ing only if she could have performed some alternative action B such that (i) B-ing was in her control; (ii) B-ing is less morally bad than A-ing; and (iii) it would have been reasonable by her lights for her to consider B-ing as an alternative to A-ing. (simplified from McKenna 2003: 209)

Condition (i) brings to mind the earlier discussion of robustness (§4.2.2), but (iii) is the focus at the moment, as it shows why Kurt’s sit-and-whistle alternative is not enough to ground his responsibility: it was not reasonable for him to consider this as an option. McKenna rejects PAP as “too inclusive”, favoring instead a principle with these more significant constraints. Having said that, he argues that even this improved principle falls to an FSC, one that, however, leaves open plenty of insignificant alternatives to assuage libertarian concerns (see Robinson 2014 for critical discussion).

One apparent lesson from PAP-significant is that, contrary to the simplifying assumption adopted at the outset of this entry, one cannot cleanly separate PAP’s condition on moral responsibility from epistemic requirements (cp. Mele 2010). In particular, in order for alternatives to count as explanatory in the relevant sense, they must be reasonable from the point of view of the agent. Similar entanglements arise when one considers PAP’s historical clause (§3.3; see, e.g., Ginet 1996; Ekstrom 2000: 211). Luther is responsible for his defiant act even if he could not have at the time done otherwise. His responsibility can be “traced” to past self-forming choices in which he could have done otherwise. If these are to help explain his responsibility when brought before Charles V, it seems as if Luther must in the past have known, at least in broad outline, how those choices would shape his future actions. But if there are such epistemic conditions in PAP’s historical rider, there may be problems looming, ordinary cases (not FSCs) in which a person is responsible for her action at t, cannot at t do otherwise, and yet whose responsibility cannot be traced to choices in the past with the appropriate epistemic credentials. (See Vargas 2005, and for discussion, Fischer & Tognazzini 2009; Shabo 2015.)

There are other action-focused replacements for PAP worth considering. But because action has been in play for most of this entry, the concluding sub-sections look at responsibility for something other than action: consequences and omissions.

5.3.2 Responsibility for Consequences

It seems clear that sometimes we are responsible for the consequences of our actions (for dissent, see Frankfurt 1983). Recall that Meghan is responsible, not just for ruining Sean’s tea by putting salt in it (an action), but for Sean’s tea being ruined (a consequence). Call this consequence a “state of affairs”. Perhaps one can also be responsible for states of affairs that aren’t the consequences of action. A homeowner is responsible for the dangerous sink hole developing in her back yard, not because of anything she did, but due simply to negligence. However one is to treat such cases, they are here set aside to focus on states of affairs that are more clearly the consequences of actions. And not surprisingly, there is a replacement for PAP explicitly about these (this principle and much of what follows is adapted from van Inwagen 1978; cp. Ginet 1996: 403):

PAP-consequences: a person is morally responsible for a consequence of what she has done only if she could have prevented it.

This has as much initial appeal as PAP. If the result of what Meghan did would have happened anyway—if it was, for her, inevitable—then it’s hard to see how she could be praised or blamed for it. Indeed, the examples that support PAP (§2.2) could also be adapted to support this new principle. If it’s inappropriate to praise a person’s “generous” donation to a charity when it’s caused by a compulsion to give things away, it is also inappropriate to praise that person for the consequence of this act, namely the charity’s windfall. And the reason is that the donor could not have prevented this state of affairs from obtaining.

More relevant to present concerns, however, is that this replacement may not be vulnerable to the examples that plague PAP. Return to our central FSC: It seems as if Jones is responsible for voting Republican (an action) because he does so on his own, for his own reasons. But now consider a resulting state of affairs, say, the Republican’s having one more vote. This would have obtained no matter what Jones did, or failed to do, on his own. Due to Black, the obtaining of the state of affairs is not (as Jones’ action is) sensitive to how things proceed with Jones’ own deliberative processes. One thus loses any sense in which Jones is the author of the consequence, and with it any sense in which he is responsible. This creates some space between PAP-Consequences and PAP, permitting the former to stand when the latter falls.

Here a state of affairs is a universal: whether Jones votes for a Republican on his own or because of Black’s intervention, one and the same consequence obtains. In this way, the object of moral appraisal (the state of affairs) doesn’t turn on how things actually go for Jones. But matters look different if the consequence is instead construed as a concrete particular, something produced by Jones in the actual scenario. In that case, PAP-consequences looks vulnerable to FSCs in just the same way PAP is. When Jones votes for the Republican, the particular consequence—that event of one vote’s being cast for a Republican—seems to be something Jones produced on his own, and is thus responsible for. (Whether numerically the same event would have obtained in the counterfactual scenario is a controversial issue, one whose resolution could yield a version of the “flicker” strategy considered in §4.2.2.) Let us in any case continue to assume that a consequence is a (universal) state of affairs.

Even under this assumption, might this replacement fall to FSCs? The above defense suggests not, but this has not prevented philosophers from trying, and with a variety of examples (e.g., Heinaman 1986; Rowe 1989; Klein 1990: ch. 2; Fischer & Ravizza 1998: ch. 4). Here is one thought to motivate such a project: Even if a consequence of an agent’s action was inevitable, we can still make sense of her causing that state of affairs to obtain, which thus looks like the result of something she did, even if it would have obtained anyway. Perhaps this is enough to make the state of affairs sensitive to the actual sequence by which it was produced, grounding the agent’s moral responsibility, as an FSC requires. Rowe (1989), for example, imagines you are on a train headed down Track 2, a track that leads to a safe stopping point. If you throw a switch, the train will go onto another track, Track 1, on which a dog is tied. Unbeknownst to you, there is someone (Peter) who is poised to throw that switch if you don’t. As it turns out, you throw the switch on your own—Peter doesn’t act at all—and the train goes down Track 1, killing the dog. Rowe says you caused the dog’s death and are in fact morally responsible for it. (As usual, assume other standard requirements are met.) Yet that consequence, the dog’s death, was inevitable: there was nothing you could have done to prevent it. (For a successor to PAP-consequences, one that may handle potential counterexamples more easily, see Sartorio 2012.)

5.3.3 Responsibility for Omissions

Sometimes a person is responsible for not acting: Blame Luke the indifferent lifeguard for failing to save the drowning swimmer. Credit Emily for not cheating on a test. Let us formulate one more replacement for PAP, using “omission,” broadly, for any failure to act:

PAP-omissions: a person is morally responsible for what she didn’t do only if she could have done it.

According to this new principle, if the waters were too treacherous for a rescue, Luke is blameless for his failure. (He may still be responsible for failing to try, or for failing to call for help.) Similarly, Emily is responsible for not cheating only if she could have done so. If, due to a fear of being caught, she was unable to cheat, or if the means to cheat were simply unavailable to her, she could not be credited for her omission, at least not on that occasion. PAP-omissions is here treated as its own stand-alone principle, though there is some metaphysics behind such an assumption (Clarke 2012; S. Bernstein 2015). The present question is whether it can survive the demise of PAP.

It appears not, for this replacement looks vulnerable to many of the same arguments (§3). But to test this alleged symmetry, focus in particular on whether an FSC can be constructed as a counterexample to PAP-omissions (van Inwagen 1978, 204–5): Bob sees a man being robbed and beaten outside of his house. After considering whether to call the police, Bob decides not to get involved, calculating that it wouldn’t be worth the trouble. For his own reasons, then, Bob refrains from calling the police. What Bob didn’t know, however, is that the due to a technology disaster, all of the phones in the city are out of order and will be for hours. It seems then that Bob isn’t responsible for failing to call the police. And plausibly, PAP-omissions explains why he’s off the hook: due to the telephone disaster, he could not have called the police. (He might still be responsible for failing to try to call the police, but trying is something he could have done.) Given the present assumption that PAP is false, what emerges from such examples is, contrary to initial appearances, an important asymmetry:

moral responsibility for an action does not require the freedom to refrain from performing the action, whereas moral responsibility for failure to perform an action requires the freedom to perform the action. (Fischer & Ravizza 1991: 262, with similar examples; they later retract the asymmetry claim)

Here’s one try at explaining this asymmetry (Fischer 1985–86: 267–268): moral responsibility for anything—action, consequence, omission—requires a certain kind of control, though what kind of control is needed may vary depending on the case. Now grant that FSCs show, contra PAP, that regulative control (§5.1) isn’t required for responsibility for actions: guidance control is enough (assuming other conditions on moral responsibility are met). When omissions are in play, however, there is no potential object of guidance control, for there is nothing to guide. For omissions, the only kind of control available to satisfy the control requirement is regulative control. No wonder then that FSCs fail to refute PAP-omissions, as these cases remove the only sort of control one could have over an omission.

That said, not everyone grants the claimed asymmetry. Both PAP and PAP-omissions should fall together (Frankfurt 1994; Glannon 1995; Fischer & Ravizza 1998: ch. 5; or stand together: Swenson 2016). Consider one final FSC, this time bringing the omission inside to the “locus of responsibility”: a choice (or in this case, the lack of one). Luke the indifferent lifeguard fails to save the swimmer, and indeed fails even to try, for reasons entirely his own: he’s lazy and indifferent. But now add that unbeknownst to Luke, had he even considered saving the swimmer, he would have been paralyzed by an overwhelming fear, compelling him to remain inactive, not even choosing or trying to save the swimmer. Here there is no overdetermination, for the fear and the underlying pathology remain dormant in the actual scenario: the only causal factors relevant to the omission are Luke’s own cognitive states and values, which appear to exert a kind of responsibility-relevant control over his failure. This looks like a genuine FSC, and, if so, a counterexample to PAP-omissions. (For more on the considerable complexities involved with PAP-omissions, see McIntyre 1994; Sartorio 2005; Clarke 2014; Fischer 2017.)


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