God and Other Ultimates
What it takes to be ultimate is to be the most fundamentally real, valuable or fulfilling among all that there is or could be. Historically, philosophy of religion in the West has taken God to be ultimate. Over the past century, the field has become increasingly aware that ultimacy is grasped under different concepts in the world’s religions, philosophies and quasi-religious philosophies—so not only as “God” but also as, e.g., “Brahman”, “the Dao”, and more. Moreover, people have thought to conceptualize each of these ultimates in numerous ways across cultures and times, so there are many models of Brahman, many models of God, many models of the Dao, and more; perhaps there is even a model of what is ultimate for each person who has thought hard about it. This entry presents a framework for understanding this vast landscape of models of God and other ultimates and then surveys some of its major sights. Familiarity with this landscape can clarify the long journey to deciding whether there is anything ultimate, among other benefits.
Section 1 defines “ultimate” and “models” of ultimates, discusses reasons to be interested in the project of modeling what is ultimate or alternatively to think it futile, and explains major categories that help organize the field of models. Section 2 uses these categories to relay over twenty models of Brahman, God and the Dao, both for their own sakes and as entrées into the landscape (the models are numbered as they surface to help the reader spot them and to show by example what a model is). Section 3 discusses the significance of the plurality of models once they are juxtaposed.
- 1. Conceptual Foundations and Motivations
- 2. Models of Brahman, God, and the Dao
- 3. Responses to the Diversity of Models of What Is Ultimate
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Conceptual Foundations and Motivations
1.1 Definition of “ultimate”
Brahman, the Dao, emptiness, God, the One, Reasonableness—there, in alphabetical order, are names of the central subjects of concern in what are commonly parsed as some of the world’s religions, philosophies and quasi-religious-philosophies. They are all names for what is ultimate, at least on some uses of the names (for instance, “God” is not always taken to be ultimate, more soon). But what is it to be ultimate, in this sense?
To answer in terms of its use, the term “ultimacy”, meaning the state or nature of being ultimate, has Brahman, the Dao, emptiness etc. as instances. To answer semantically, with a meaning, is difficult for at least two reasons. First, though there is abundant precedent in the literature for collecting these subjects as ideas of ultimacy, doing so presupposes they have some shared characteristic or family resemblance that makes them count as ultimate. But is there a shared core idea of being ultimate? “Particularists” among others argue no: the diverse range of cultural and historical contexts from which these subjects come, coupled with how hard it is to talk across such contexts, makes them all “separate cultural islands” (Hedges 2014: 206; see also Berthrong 2001: 237–239, 255–256). The second concern is related, and not far from one Tomoko Masuzawa (2005) among others has raised about religion: even if we found a substantive account of ultimacy visible in multiple traditions, such an account necessarily will be borne from a cultural conceptual context. Thus, far from delivering the notions at work in other traditions, such an account actually risks de-forming them.
Regarding the first concern, John H. Berthrong, among others, is far more optimistic than the particularists that concepts not only can be shared across cultures but in fact are
already comparative, having been generated by the interactions of people, texts, rituals, cultural sensibilities and the vagaries of history and local customs. (2001: 238)
Other theorists explore factors that could detail or add to Berthrong’s list—e.g., trade and conquests (Gayatriprana 2020), shared human evolutionary biology (Wildman 2017), and the evolution of moral development (Wright 2010). Still, most take the second concern about enculturation to stick and thus to temper the optimism: there is both a shared humanity and real cultural difference to own in reaching a global idea of ultimacy. Raimon Panikkar says it well:
Brahman is certainly not the one true and living God of the Abrahamic traditions. Nor can it be said that Shang-ti or kami are the same as brahman. And yet they are not totally unrelated. (Panikkar 1987 [2005: 2254])
The Cross-Cultural Comparative Religious Ideas Project, run by Robert C. Neville and Wesley Wildman from 1995–99, balanced the overlap and difference when they concluded that an account of ultimacy should be a “properly vague” category: it needs enough shared content to count as a category, but enough vagueness to cover the disparate instances generally taken to be ultimates. There are multiple contenders for such vague categories, including, e.g., Paul Tillich’s “object of ultimate concern” (1957a, e.g., 10–11), John Hick’s “the Real” (1989: 11ff); Keith Ward’s “the Transcendent” (1998); and the Project’s own proposal as “that which is most important to religious life because of the nature of reality” (Neville & Wildman 2001, see 151ff for an explanation of each part of the phrase).
Informed by the Project’s finding, this entry will “vague-ify” the content of John Schellenberg’s account of what is ultimate to use as a cross-cultural core idea of ultimacy and as an organizing principle. To paraphrase, Schellenberg takes being ultimate to mean being that which is (1) the most real, (2) the most valuable, and (3) the source of deepest fulfillment among all that is or perhaps could be. More carefully, and in Schellenberg’s words, being ultimate requires being ultimate in three ways: (1) metaphysically ultimate, i.e., the “most fundamental fact” about the nature of things (2016: 168), (2) axiologically ultimate, i.e., that which “has unsurpassably great value” (2009: 31), meaning greatness along all its categories of being, and (3) soteriologically ultimate, i.e., “the source of an ultimate good (salvific)” (2009: xii, also 2005: 15), meaning being the source of salvation or liberation of the kind practitioners of the world’s religions and philosophies ardently seek (e.g., nirvana, communing with God, moksha, ascent to the One, etc.), whether these all amount to the same salvation (e.g., Hick 1989: Ch. 14) or constitute radically distinct types of salvations (Heim 1995: Ch. 5). Schellenberg’s choice of these three terms is insightful: most extant takes on ultimacy per se and on Brahman, God and the Dao in particular are variations on a theme of Schellenberg, as scrutiny of even the brief definitions above as well as the models in Section 2 will bear out.
Schellenberg’s account of what it takes to be ultimate is already somewhat vague: he recommends no further precisification of his three terms in order to stay open about what counts as ultimate as our knowledge grows (2009: 31). This entry will loosen his account further by placing a disjunction between its terms instead of a conjunction. That is, Schellenberg takes metaphysical, axiological and soteriological ultimacy to be severally necessary and jointly sufficient for something to count as ultimate; he requires “triple ultimacy”, as James Elliott calls it, for ultimacy per se (2017: 103–04). Those who agree in principle include, e.g., Clooney 2001 and Rubenstein 2019, as well as, e.g., Aquinas, Leibniz and Samuel Clarke, who in fact argue that, given the entailments between the terms, there is triple ultimacy or none at all. Others take double or even single ultimacy to be not only possible but also sufficient for being ultimate. For example, Neville defines ultimacy in strictly metaphysical terms as “the ontological act of creation” (2013: 1); Elliott and Paul Draper each take soteriological ultimacy to be sufficient for ultimacy (Elliott 2017: 105–109; Draper 2019: 161); and John Bacon takes his understanding of God as “<Creator, Good>” to be metaphysically and soteriologically ultimate though a “let-down axiologically” (2013: 548). Moreover, requiring triple ultimacy stops some of the paradigmatic models of Brahman, God and the Dao from counting as ultimacy, as Section 2 will demonstrate (see also Diller 2013b). Thus, this entry will take some combinations of the three types of ultimacy to be sufficient for being ultimate, without settling which, provided nothing else in a system has more. Note that replacing Schellenberg’s conjunction with a disjunction makes the field of ultimates a family resemblance class.
Even disjunctivized, the Schellenbergian view adopted here is clearly an inheritance from Abrahamic perfect being theology, so two cautions about scope. First, when we look outward and find that some non-Abrahamic traditions have ultimacy in the sense here—as we will in Section 2 for Hinduism and Daoism—we should acknowledge that this result comes framed from the outside. Second, not all non-Abrahamic traditions will have ultimates in the sense just adopted. For instance, to offer just one example, Barbara Mann suggests that in non-colonized interpretations of Native American spiritualities there is nothing that is ultimate in Schellenberg’s sense (2010: 33–36). So ultimacy as just defined may be widespread in the world’s religions and spiritualities, but it is not universal.
Finally, three points of clarification about terminology. First, talking about ultimacy does not entail that anything ultimate exists. The concern that it might is related to “the problem of singular negative existential statements”, to which Frege and Russell offered solutions that in turn have been enshrined in predicate logic, though not without complaint (for more see Kripke 2013 and the SEP articles on existence and on nonexistent objects). Second, the term “ultimate reality” could be taken to mean how reality ultimately is—i.e., that which is metaphysically ultimate, perhaps a part of every complete ontology—instead of meaning the richer sense of “ultimacy” at issue here, which is not a part of every complete ontology. To avoid confusion, this entry will reserve the term “ultimate reality” for metaphysical ultimacy per se and use “ultimate” and variants for the combinations of the Schellenbergian disjunction. Thus framed, the distinction leaves open this central question: is ultimate reality ultimate? Lastly, regarding the choice of the term “ultimate” and its variants, there is a syntactic parallel to the semantic issue above: we need a sufficiently vague kind of speech to cover the diverse ontological kinds implicit in accounts of ultimacy, including concrete or abstract particular things (e.g., God or Brahman on some views); states of being (e.g., Existence-Consciousness-Bliss for Brahman, see Section 2.1); properties (e.g., everything is empty on Buddhism or divinely intentional for Karl Pfeifer, see Section 2.2); actions and events that things perform or undergo (D. Cooper models God as “a verb” as in “God-ing”, 1997: 70; cf. Bishop & Perszyk 2017); and grounds of being that are meant to be category-less (e.g., as in “the creative source of the categories themselves”, Vallicella 2006 , see also, e.g., Tillich in Section 2.2, the Dao in Section 2.3). Though no term is quite right given the diversity, this entry uses the adjective form of being “ultimate” as primary, to describe x as metaphysically, axiologically or soteriologically ultimate per above, whatever x’s ontological kind (cf. with the more familiar term from Abrahamic monotheism of “divine”). It also uses “ultimacy” as a noun for the nature or state of being ultimate (cf. “divinity”), the nouns “the ultimate”, “an ultimate” or “ultimates” to function flexibly both as a mass noun (such as “water” or “butter”) for the property or uncountable substance of being ultimate and as a count noun for things, events and grounds of being (cf. “God” or “gods”); and “to ultimize” as the verb form, if ever we need it.
1.2 Definition of “model”
A “model” of what is ultimate is a way it can be conceived. In general, a model is a representation of a target phenomenon for some purpose. For instance, R. Axelrod developed a computational model that represented a target of two “agents” caught in an iterated prisoner’s dilemma, with the purpose of solving the dilemma.
The term “model” in religious and philosophical contexts is related to but not identical with its use in scientific contexts, in ways Ian Barbour (1974) foundationally traced. Though there is some disagreement between the fields on whether models describe their target or not and what the point of modeling is, importantly, in both contexts, the term “model” (1) connotes that its target is somehow out of reach—not able to be directly examined—and, perhaps by force of this, (2) encodes a conceptual distance between the target and the model. In particular, the model is not a copy of the target but rather chooses revealing aspects of the target to relay by leaving out or distorting other aspects. Think of a model of a city that is by design not to scale, precisely so viewers can see the relationships between the city’s streets, buildings and neighborhoods. Models are thus simultaneously epistemically instructive and humble.
Thus understood, “model” captures well the ways people have thought about what is ultimate. Taking a model’s target to be obscured per (1) and the model itself to be fallible per (2) is not only apt but also crucial for thinking about what is ultimate given our necessarily limited knowledge of it (see Section 1.4). Moreover, among the choices on the linguistic menu, “model” is a middle way. It is more specific than “idea” understood in the Cartesian sense as “whatever is immediately perceived by the mind”, since a model is the more particular kind of idea just relayed. At the same time, “model” is general enough to cover the very diverse kinds of extant linguistic accounts of what is ultimate in the literature, including, e.g., “concepts” understood in the classic sense as necessary and sufficient conditions for being ultimate, such as Anselm’s idea of God as “that than which no greater can be conceived;” “conceptions” which are “more particular fillers” for more general concepts, such as Richard Swinburne’s verdict about what it would take to be that than which nothing greater can be conceived; sustained “metaphors” such as Ramanuja’s Brahman as the “Soul” of the cosmos (see Section 2.1) or Sallie McFague’s “God as Mother, Lover and Friend” (1987); and “indexical signs” that point to an indeterminate ultimate visible in Neville (2013). This entry will call all these linguistic types “models” of what is ultimate, given that they each in their own way represent or aim at a target of what is ultimate for various purposes, at least as much as language can (more in Section 1.4).
As Section 1.5 will detail, some models of what is ultimate nest, e.g., Shankara’s idea of Brahman is a species of Vedantic ideas of Brahman which in turn are species of Hindu ideas of Brahman. To simplify, this entry will use the term “model” for ideas of what is ultimate at all levels, and take a model’s target to be “the ultimate” if the modeler thinks what is ultimate is single or uncountable (as in models of e.g., Brahman, God and the Dao) or “ultimates” if multiple (as in polytheistic or perhaps communotheistic models).
Understanding the scope of the work on modeling what is ultimate is central in multiple ways for assessing claims about its existence. First, the meaning we have in mind for “x” can decide our take on whether x exists. For example, in the case of God, some are convinced by arguments from suffering that there is no God, but such arguments, even if they succeed, generally apply only to God conceived as an omnipotent, omniscient and omnibenevolent (“OOO”) person and as written do not apply to God conceived differently (“generally” since there are notable exceptions, e.g., Bishop 2007 and Bishop & Perszyk 2016). Further, the act of abandoning one model while being aware that there are alternative models can set up an exploration into the field of models of the ultimate or ultimates. For example, if one decides there is no OOO personal God, one might ask: are there any other models of God genuinely worth the name “God” without these properties? If not, are there perhaps any non-theistic (non-God) models of what is ultimate without these properties? In other words, for those who have a limited sense of what it takes to be ultimate (e.g., what is ultimate is a OOO God or nothing at all), a search of extant models can open up the range of options on their menu and position them to see whether any are philosophically palatable. In fact, such a search may be required in order to settle the question of whether anything ultimate exists, because it is invalid to conclude that there is nothing ultimate on the basis of arguments against specific models of ultimacy if there could still be genuine ultimacy of another kind (see Diller 2016: 123–124).
In addition to their pivotal role in deciding questions of existence, notions of what is ultimate profoundly impact questions about religious diversity, such as whether multiple religions can have simultaneously true core beliefs. For example, on “plenitude of being” models—where the ultimate is infinitely full of incommensurable content—multiple religions are taken to be grasping different aspects of it accurately. So multiple religions can have true beliefs about what is ultimate, even if each has only a part of the truth. Finally, models of what is ultimate are also intimately bound up with philosophical questions of meaning, e.g., in meaning’s “Cosmic” and “Ultimate” senses as Rivka Weinberg explains them, though she decides that even if there were something ultimate, it would not finally deliver meaning in either sense (2021).
Though some model what is ultimate, others object to the entire project of modeling it. There are three main kinds of concerns in the literature: about the existence of ultimacy, about the coherence of the very idea of ultimacy, and about whether talk and knowledge of ultimacy is humanly possible, even assuming the idea is coherent. The first concern is motivational: for those who think there is nothing ultimate, there seems no point worrying about how it has been conceived. However, as indicated in Section 1.3, it is invalid to conclude that there is nothing ultimate without having some sense of the range of what it might be. So even those who think there is nothing ultimate are thrown into the project of modeling it—at least enough to license the conclusion that this work is not worth doing.
To offer just one example of the second challenge, Stephen Maitzen (2017) argues against the concept of ultimacy on multiple fronts, including, e.g., that nothing can be metaphysically ultimate in Schellenberg’s sense because it would need to be simultaneously a se and concrete so that it can be metaphysically independent and explain concrete things, respectively. But no concrete thing can explain itself because (to shorten the argument considerably) even the necessity of such a thing is not identical to itself so it is not explaining itself (2017: 53). If Maitzen is right, nothing can be metaphysically ultimate in Schellenberg’s sense, and thus not metaphysically, axiologically and soteriologically ultimate at once.
The third kind of concern is more widespread—that it makes no sense for us to model what is ultimate because it is beyond human language (ineffable) or beyond human cognitive grasp (cognitively unknowable), or both. Why think this? To combine a few common arguments: what is ultimate (1) goes beyond the world, (2) is in a class by itself, and (3) is infinite, while our predicates are (1′) suited to describe things in the world, (2′) classify things with other things, and (3′) are limited (see, e.g., Wildman 2013: 770; Seeskin 2013: 794–795). Thus, for any P, a statement of the form “ultimacy is P” seems necessarily false, if it is meaningful at all. Ineffability and unknowability are related: if we can say nothing true about ultimacy, then we can know nothing about it—at least nothing that can be said in words.
That last hesitation—“at least not in words”—leaves room for, e.g., embodied ways of knowing by way of religious, mystical or spiritual experiences which are reported in the world’s religious traditions and more generally (whether such experiences actually happen or not, see, e.g., James 1902 ). Still, the combined arguments above and the gut intuition behind them represent an enormous challenge to the whole enterprise of modeling what is ultimate in words. There are those who opt for silence in the face of these arguments, and thus understandably but alas “literally disappear from the conversation” (Wildman 2013: 768, “alas” because they are missed). One main move of those who do keep talking is to distinguish what is ultimate as it is in itself, which they concede we can never talk about or know, from it as it affects our experience, which they think we can talk about and know. So some distinguish, e.g., the absolute from the relative Dao (Daodejing, chapter 1); the Godhead from God as revealed (Meister Eckhart, e.g., Sermon 97; Panikkar 1987 [2005: 2254]); the noumenal from the phenomenal Real (Hick 1989) etc. and talk or make knowledge claims only about the latter (see also, e.g., Paul Hedges 2020 [Other Internet Resources]).
Some also claim to make true statements about what is ultimate by restricting those statements to certain kinds of claims about it. One tactic is to talk about how ultimacy is related to us or to other parts of the natural (or non-natural) world instead of talking about how it is in itself, i.e., to talk about its extrinsic vs. intrinsic properties. For example, Maimonides suggests that one way to make “ultimacy is P” true is to make P an “attribute of action”, i.e., an “action that he who is described has performed, such as Zayd carpentered this door…” (The Guide of the Perplexed, I.52–3, italics added), an attribute which says nothing about Zayd’s intrinsic properties save that he has what it takes to carpenter this door. An analogue of this for ultimacy is, e.g., the Dao generated being, again an attribute which indicates only that the Dao, whatever it is or is not, can and has generated being. Other possible ways of speaking truly about ultimacy include famously the via negativa (“God is not P”, Shaffer 2013: 783), the via eminentia (“God is better than P”), the way of analogy (“God is perfectly P”, Copleston 1952: 351 on Aquinas, e.g., Summa Theologica I, 13 and Summa contra Gentiles I, 30, see also Kennedy 2013: 158–159), the way of super-eminence (“God is beyond P or not P”, Pseudo-Dionysius, Shaffer 2013: 786ff) and—though this seems doable in theory only—equivocal predication (“God is P*” where P* is a predicate outside of human language, Shaffer 2013: 783). What does all this really allow us to say, know, and do philosophically, though? More than one might think, says Neville: though ineffability might seem to stop metaphysics, it actually tells us how to do the metaphysics, e.g., “the dao…can be discussed mainly by negations and indirections” (2008: 43), or in these other ways.
1.5 Philosophical categories of ultimacy
For those who decide to model what is ultimate in the face of or informed by these challenges, there are several common categories, or “model types” as Philip Clayton once called them, which distinguish kinds of models of what is ultimate from each other. Knowing these categories can organize what might be an otherwise haphazard array of models, in something like the way knowing what an oak, maple and birch are can help sort the sights on a walk through a forest. The categories of ultimacy are best grasped by framing them with a question. For example, Hartshorne and Reese (1953) categorized models of God in particular as the logically possible variations on a theme of five questions, whose positive answers get symbolized by ETCKW:
- E: Is God eternal?
- T: Is God temporal?
- C: Is God conscious?
- K: Does God know the world?
- W: Does God include the world?
To use models that will be discussed in Section 2, Shankara’s pantheism is ECKW since he takes Brahman to be an “Eternal Consciousness, Knowing and including the World” but which is atemporal and never changes; Hartshorne and Reese’s own panentheism is ETCKW, etc. (see their 1953 [2000: 17] and Viney 2013 for more examples). Wildman (2017) has his own set of questions and entire system built out of them (more in Section 3), which adds another important question that ETCKW leaves out or perhaps merely implies: Is what is ultimate personal/anthropomorphic—i.e., is it aware and does it have intentions—or is it impersonal/non-anthropomorphic? One might also look for functional categories: is what is ultimate the efficient, material or final cause of the universe?, does it intervene in it?, does it provoke religious experience?, and more.
Another question that may be asked about a particular model is: How many ultimates does the model conceive ultimacy to be? Though the very idea of plural ultimates sounds contradictory—wouldn’t one thing need to beat out all competitors in order to satisfy the superlatives “most fundamental” fact, “highest” value, “deepest” source of fulfillment?—those who model “ultimate multiplicity” see a tie for first place. Some models of Zoroaster’s view, for instance, take there to be two ultimates, the good Ahura Mazda and the evil Angra Mainyu engaged in fundamental battle (though such models will have to explain why Ahura Mazda is not the true ultimate given his apparent axiological edge on Angra Mainyu). John Cobb and David Ray Griffin at least some of the time take there to be three distinct ultimates: the Supreme Being experienced in theistic experiences, Being Itself (or emptiness) experienced in acosmic experiences, and the Cosmos experienced in cosmic experiences (Griffin 2005: 47–49). Monica Coleman models what is ultimate in traditional Yoruba religion as a “communotheism”, in which “the Divine is a community of gods who are fundamentally related to each other but ontologically equal”, including Olódùmarè and the 401 òrìşà (2013: 345–349). All the models we will look at in Section 2 will be “ultimate unities” although there will be some diversity in the unity for the panentheisms in particular. George Mavrodes also cautions us to be wary of the unity/multiplicity distinction:
there are monotheisms that seem to include an element of multiplicity—e.g. Christianity with its puzzling idea of the divine trinity—and views of divine multiplicity—such as the African religions [have]—that seem to posit some sort of unity composed of a large number of individual divine entities. (2013: 660)
Probably the most frequently-used categories to sort models from each other are the logically exhaustive answers to the question: How does the ultimate or ultimates relate to the world? Though the answers (and question actually) are commonly framed with the word “God”, as the theos root in some of the category names below belies, their descriptions at least are framed here with “ultimacy” to include non-theistic ultimates, too:
- Monism (literally, one-ism): There exists just one thing or one kind of thing (the “One” or “Unity”), depending on how the monism is read: either ultimacy is identical to the world, or all there is is ultimacy, or all there is is the world. Pantheism is a species of monism in which the one thing or kind of thing is God, or as Linda Mercadante once said in conversation, it is a monism in which the emphasis is on the divinity of the world instead of on the worldliness of the divine. Baruch Spinoza’s view of “God, or Nature” (Deus sive natura) is often deemed a pantheism, though some experts deem it a panentheism (1677, Part IV.4; see, e.g., Edwin Curley 2013).
- Panentheism (all-in-God-ism): The world is a proper part of ultimacy. I.e., though the world is in ultimacy, ultimacy is more than the world. Panentheism is a wide tent since there is ambiguity in the “in”, but R. T. Mullins, for example, offers one disambiguated panentheism: take space and time to be attributes of God, and “affirm that the universe is literally in God because the universe is spatially and temporally located in God” (2016: 343).
- Merotheism (part-God-ism): Ultimacy is a proper part of the world. I.e., though ultimacy is in the world, the world is more than ultimacy. This type is rare, but see, e.g., Alexander 1920 and Draper 2019 (more soon).
- Dualism (two-ism): Ultimacy is not the world and the world is not ultimacy, so there are two fundamentally different things or kinds of things, depending on how the underlying ontology is read. Dualism includes both the view that ultimacy and the world are disjoint (they share no parts) and the view that they bear a relation of proper overlap (they overlap in part, but not in whole).
The various models of God, Brahman and the Dao in Section 2 taken together will instantiate all four of these categories.
2. Models of Brahman, God, and the Dao
This section turns to multiple models of three ultimates extant in living world traditions: Brahman in the Hindu traditions indigenous in India, God in the Abrahamic traditions (Judaism, Christianity and Islam) indigenous in the Middle East and the Arabian Peninsula, and the Dao in the Daoist and Ru (Confucian) traditions indigenous in China. The sections here are ordered historically, with the idea of Brahman surfacing first in the Rig Veda ca. 1000–1500 BCE, the idea of the Dao during the Warring States period ca. fifth century BCE, and the idea of God in the Jewish tradition shifting from a henotheistic to monotheistic deity somewhere in between.
A main point of looking at these models is to grasp some ways people across the globe have conceived and are conceiving of what is most real, most valuable or most fulfilling to them—knowledge worth having for its own sake. Looking at the models also deepens understanding of ultimacy in general, by seeing how it plays out in the specifics. Finally, studying the models is a window into how they relate. Specifically, as we go, look for (1) the wide intra-traditional disagreement about how to model what is ultimate (e.g., there are Hindu monisms, panentheisms and dualisms) and related (2) the significant inter-traditional agreement about it (e.g., there are Hindu, Christian, and Daoist panentheisms). The amount of disagreement within a tradition makes talk about “the idea of Brahman” or “the idea of God” ambiguous, and crucially so in some contexts, as indicated in Section 1.2. The amount of agreement between traditions creates strange bedfellows across the landscape of models—strange because the modelers disagree about their religious or philosophical tradition, but bedfellows all the same because they agree about which philosophical categories from Section 1.5 best suit what is ultimate (see Diller 2013a). The existence of such agreement at the very heart of diverse traditions is an important fact.
One perplexing issue before we encounter the models is the range of their connection to a lived religious tradition. The “religious models” purport to provide an understanding of reality as it is believed (or held by faith) to be in a particular tradition—as evidenced by their efforts to capture as much as they can of a tradition’s key texts, figures, practices, symbols etc.—while “philosophical models” do not do this. For example, the models of the Dao in Section 2.3 seem to be religious models given the regular citations of the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi and liturgical practices in explication and defense of the models. Some philosophical models include Aristotle’s Unmoved Mover or divine Nous (Physics Bk. VIII, Metaphysics Bk. XII), Plato’s Demiurge in the Timaeus (29–30) or Plotinus’ One in the Enneads. None of these modelers turn to traditional sources to explain or defend their views; indeed, it is not even clear what traditional sources would be germane. Perhaps there are intermediate “quasi-religio-philosophical models”, e.g., Spinoza 1677 or Hegel 1832, which have some salient connection with a religious tradition, either because of the model’s status as a revision of a traditional model or because they share some key features of ultimacy within a religious tradition.
The puzzle: are all these modelers modeling the same thing? This question may be just a rehash of the “God of Abraham Isaac and Jacob” vs. “God of the philosophers” issue (see Section 2.2). The answer to it is yes in the vague-categorial sense that both philosophical and religious models are talking about that which is fundamentally real, valuable or liberating, but no in the sense that philosophical models are about what is ultimate per se while the religious models are about what is ultimate as it appears in their tradition. In any case, nota bene: Section 2.3 (Models of God) houses several recent philosophical models because they use the term “God” to name the ultimate they are modeling. Perhaps they are misnamed and should be renamed models of “the ultimate” and housed in an entirely different section. Or perhaps they are rightly named “God” and God is not dead as Nietzsche had it, but is becoming increasingly unhinged from the lived religious traditions.
2.1 Models of Brahman
Though the term “Hinduism” and its variants was originally a foreign imposition during the British Raj in India, they have become widely used in the public realm to refer to forms of religiosity and spirituality that had their start in the Indus River valley at least since 2000 BCE and have endured with great internal diversification ever since.
The idea of Brahman was birthed in the Rig Veda (ca. 1000–1500 BCE), was defined in the Upanishads (ca. 500 BCE), came to full flower in the Bhagavad-Gita (ca. 200 BCE) and the Brahmasutras (400–450 CE), and has been refined in commentaries about them for over the past millennium, first by Adi Shankara (788–820 BCE) and then by many others after him which constitute the Vedanta system of Hindu philosophy (Vedanta = “end of the Vedas”). Vedanta has been dominant among the traditional six Hindu philosophical systems for at least the last 500 years.
All the Vedanta schools agree on three things about Brahman, or ultimacy (here is this entry’s first, very general model of an ultimate). First, Brahman’s nature is essentially sat-chid-ananda, “Existence-Consciousness-Bliss”, which means that the metaphysical rock bottom of reality is—surprise, given the phenomenal mess—a blissful consciousness. Second, most of the schools take Brahman to be what Jeffery D. Long calls a “theocosm”: (1) God and (2) a cosmos, meaning a universe/multiverse of all natural forms. The original Sanskrit in the Vedantic texts is conceptually precise and better than what we have in the God-world relations in Section 1.5 because there is a name for God and the world put together: the theocosm gets called “Brahman”, God is “Ishvara” (or “Narayana” or “Krishna” etc.), and the cosmos is “samsara”, and the whole thing and each part are eternal. Third, the Vedanta schools all agree that their view about Brahman is associated with (1) an epistemological license in direct experience, either in texts heard by spiritual adepts (sruti) or in proponents’ own firsthand spiritual experience (for much more, see Phillips 2019), and (2) a life expression that lives out such experience and the view so deeply that it is hard to know which came first, the life expression or the metaphysical commitments that enable it.
What the Vedanta schools disagree about is the kind of link between God and the cosmos in the theocosm. These disagreements spread them out in a range.
On one end is the Dvaita (dvaita = “two”) Vedanta school, which is dualistic in its ultimate-world relation and not far from the classical monotheistic views (model 2 in this entry). It reads the theocosm to be two really distinct things, viz., God and the cosmos, with no organic link between them. Though there is no creation ex nihilo in Dvaita or any other Vedanta school, Ishvara (God) is the Divine creator and sustainer of the distinct cosmos and ensouls it and resides within it. The ultimate is the two eternally co-existing, like an eternal dweller eternally content to live in an eternal house It built out of something other than Itself. Of the four traditional Hindu yogas, Dvaita is a deeply bhakti-oriented system (bhakti = “devotion”), generally practicing devotion to Vishnu/Krishna.
On the other end of the range is the Advaita Vedanta school (advaita = not two) which is well-known in the West but not as dominant in India. It reads the theocosm/Brahman as one/non-dual, and takes God and the cosmos not to be really distinct, i.e., God = the cosmos. The paradigmatic filling out of this view, often and perhaps mistakenly attributed to Shankara, is pantheistic and world-denying. Specifically (here is model 3), such classical Advaitans hold that since reality is one and the cosmos is many, the cosmos cannot be real. It looks as if there is a cosmos filled with many things, but the cosmos is merely an appearance (maya), and taking it to be reality is like taking a rope at dusk to be a snake (Shankara’s famous metaphor, see, e.g., Tapasyananda 1990: 34). With the cosmos out of the picture, the theocosm is just the “theo” part; to use the metaphor above, the ultimate is all dweller, no house. That move makes the terms “Brahman” and “God” interchangeable, and on it, God-Brahman is generally read as impersonal. The epistemological license in direct experience for this view is samadhi, a state of spiritual absorption in which all dualities vanish and one experiences just infinite bliss. Since the classical Advaitan view denies the world, Anantanand Rambachan, a contemporary Advaitan, takes its best life expression to be that of the renunciant (sannyasi) who lives out that denial (2006: 69).
In the middle range between Dvaita and Advaita are a dozen subtly distinct schools of mainstream Vedanta, often called the “Bhakti schools” given their emphasis on devotion (the distinctions between them make a dozen distinct models here). These schools are all panentheistic and world-affirming. Their best representative is Ramanuja (ca. 1017–1157), the first comprehensive critic of Shankara, who synthesized Advaita with bhakti in a system called Vishishtadvaita (meaning “non-duality of the qualified whole”, model 4 for this entry). Like classical Advaitans, Ramanuja takes the theocosm/Brahman to be non-dual because it is all God, but unlike them, he takes the cosmos and the many things within it to be real and distinct from Brahman. How can the ultimate be one but have parts? Ramanuja’s panentheistic answer: the cosmic parts form an “inseparable and integral union” (aprthaksiddhi) with Brahman, like the union of body and soul (sarira and sariri): Brahman is the cosmos’ soul, and the cosmos is Brahman’s body—a body which, to use Ramanuja’s illustration from a quote from the Upanishads,
“is born in, sustained by, and is dissolved in Brahman”….[just] as pearls strung on a thread…are held as a unity without impairing their manifoldness. (Tapasyananda 1990: 6)
So for Ramanuja, Brahman builds a house not out of something else as in Dvaita but out of Brahmanself, and eternally dwells in this eternal Brahman-house which (here is the mark of panentheism) depends on Brahman for its existence but not vice versa, i.e., (Brahman → the cosmos) but not (the cosmos → Brahman). Ramanuja also takes Brahman to be not impersonal but the Divine Person, known under different sacred names, e.g., “Vishnu”, “Narayana”, “Isvara”, etc. The moves to a real cosmos and divine personality have Ramanuja deciding that Brahman’s essential nature as sat-chid-ananda is filled out with countless extrinsic “auspicious properties” (“qualities manifested in him in relation to finite beings”), among them some of the classical perfections such as omnipotence, omniscience and immutability, as well as compassion, generosity, lordship, creative power, and splendor (1990: 36–37).The experiential epistemological licenses for Vishishtadvaita are the combination of samadhi (which justifies the non-dual piece) and darsan (visual contact with the divine through the eyes of images, which justifies the qualification to non-duality). Its best life expression is the practice of bhakti yoga, supported by the reality and personality of both devotee and devoted in Ramanuja’s metaphysics, and exemplified by the Alvars’ passionate devotion to Vishnu from the second to eighth century CE (Tapasyananda 1990: 33).
In the midst of this centuries-long dispute between the Dvaitans, Advaitans and Bhakti schools, a key modern figure arose: Ramakrishna (1836–86), sometimes called “the Great Reconciler” because he attempted to integrate all the schools into one pluralistic, non-sectarian approach. His major insight (birthing model 5 for this entry) is that “God is infinite, and the paths to God are infinite”, and the schools are among these infinite paths (Maharaj 2018: frontispiece). Ramakrishna came by this view firsthand when, after being in a state of samadhi for six months, which he said was “like reaching the roof of a house by leaving the steps behind”, he had a divine command to come down and stay in a state he called “vijñāna” (intimate knowledge), during which he could see the roof but also see that “the steps are made of the same material as the roof (brick, lime, brick dust)”. In other words, in vijñāna he saw that Brahman is both non-dual and dual, and thus began to affirm the “spiritual core” of both schools, and eventually of all the Hindu schools and Christian and Muslim ones, too (Long 2020: 166). He decided they all must be contacting different “aspects” of one and the same reality, and that this reality thus must be deeply, indeed infinitely complex in order to make such diverse experiences possible (Maharaj 2018: Chapter 1, part 3, tenets 1 and 3; see also interpretive principle 4 and K422/G423). Because he affirms the core of all schools, Ramakrishna is hard to classify, but his view is probably best read as panentheistic and world-affirming since he says over and over again that “all is Brahman” and that Brahman “has become everything”, i.e., Brahman → the cosmos but not vice versa (Long 2020, especially 163).
Contemporary Vedanta is alive and well. To offer just three examples: Long recently merged Ramakrishna’s thought with Whitehead’s to develop a Hindu process theology that offers an ultimate unity behind the God-world relations that was missing in both Whitehead’s and Griffin and Cobb’s interpretations (see Section 2.2 and Long 2013, our model 6). Ayon Maharaj has systematized Ramakrishna’s thought (no small task!) and put it into conversation with major Western philosophers to advance global philosophical work on the problem of evil, religious pluralism and mystical experience (2018). Finally, Rambachan, a present-day Advaitan, moves Advaita closer to Vishishtadvaita when he asserts that “not-two is not one” (2015): non-dualism is not pantheistic but rather panentheistic because Brahman is the cosmos’ material and efficient cause; Brahman intentionally self-multiplies to make the cosmos. The cosmos is thus not maya but rather a finite “celebrative expression of Brahman’s fullness” (Rambachan 2006: 79). This reading (model 7 here) opens up Advaitic theology to help heal a variety of human problems from low self-esteem to the caste system because there is real power in re-seeing people as infinite-conscious-bliss, so worthy of respect (Rambachan 2015).
Much of the explicit discussion among the schools is debate over metaphysical ultimacy in general and over the Brahman-God-cosmos relation in particular. Still, there is an implicit drumbeat in all the schools that one can find ultimate fulfillment in Brahman, whether that is in a state of samadhi, vijñāna or devotion (e.g., the “profound and mutual sharing in the life of God…creates unsurpassed bliss [for the devotee]”, Long 2013: 364). So Brahman seems to be soteriologically as well as metaphysically ultimate. What is less clear is whether Brahman is axiologically ultimate, especially in the moral category of being. There are suggestive phrases sprinkled through the texts in the affirmative, but as Alan Watts says:
reason and the moral sense rebel at pantheistic monism which must reduce all things to a flat uniformity and assert that even the most diabolical things are precisely God, thus destroying all values. (Hartshorne & Reese 1953 [2000: 325], quoting Watts 1947)
Though this sentiment is softened by the panentheistic readings in several of the schools since the world can take the fall, in the end, all the schools affirm that Brahman is everything, in some sense. And if Brahman is everything, and not everything seems to be good, then Brahman seems not to be good, at least not full stop. There is no question that Brahman is still the ultimate in Vedantic schools even if Brahman is not axiologically ultimate; as indicated at the start, metaphysical and soteriological ultimacy are sufficient for ultimacy when nothing else in a system has all three marks. But it is jarring and a real contribution to global thought about ultimacy to consider dropping axiological ultimacy from the trio: what is most deeply real may not be all good, though contact with it may still manage to fulfill us deeply all the same.
2.2 Models of God
As in Vedanta, the extant models of God disagree about the ultimate-world relation and those disagreements spread them out in a range, with dualisms on one end and monisms on the other, and panentheisms and—for the first time in this entry—merotheisms in between. The idea of God seems to be nothing if not flexible. Even the relatively common view that God is by definition a personal ultimate—an ultimate that is conscious and self-aware—has been on the move for millennia and is hotly debated today.
The most venerable model of God that is often read dualistically is known as “perfect being theology”, which bears traces of its origin in its name (this is model 8—a general model, species coming). The idea fully grown, as we have it today, defines God as that which is perfect (whether personal or not), where perfection is typically taken to entail being unsurpassable in power, knowledge, and goodness, and several models add being immutable, impassible, a se, eternal, simple and necessary in some sense. Most perfect being theologians take God to have created the universe out of nothing (ex nihilo), and that view can be taken to entail dualism for a variety of reasons. To offer one, as Brian Davies says, “God makes things to be, but not out of anything” (italics his), including not out of Godself, so the cosmos is entirely fresh stuff—a second kind of stuff, distinct from and radically dependent on God (2004: 3). Perfect being theology was birthed during the Hellenistic era from the fusing of the Jewish idea of a single God that acts in history (the theos in “perfect being theology”) with the Greek philosophical idea of perfect ultimacy (“perfect being”). From the very start, there were conceptual tensions in the combination: how can the God who led us out of Egypt, who hears our prayers and who intervenes in the world as the Jews say (Cohen 1987: 44) also be immutable, impassible and a se as the Greeks say (e.g., Guthrie 1965: 26–39, 272–279; Guthrie 1981: 254–263)? This question is sometimes framed: how can “the God of Abraham, Isaac and Jacob” be the “God of the philosophers?” Even after perfect being theology had passed for centuries from Judaism to Christianity to Islam—with an important handoff in the midst by Anselm who amped up the Greek perfection by taking God to be that than which no greater can be conceived—the great medieval theologians in all three faiths were still hitting up against the tensions and finding ways to tamp them down. For instance, on the issue of anthropomorphic descriptions of God in the Bible and the Quran, both Maimonides and Aquinas read them as negations and said that God “is not a body” (Dorff 2013: 113; Kennedy 2013: 158) and both Ibn Rushd (Averroes) and al-Ghazali parted with “theologians who took all these descriptions literally” because “beings that have bodily form…have characteristics incompatible with a perfect being” (Hasan 2013: 142).
The tensions continued into the modern era and are still felt in our time. Perhaps as early as 1644, perfect being theology split into two camps over them (see Davies 2004: chapter 1, and Page 2019). Both camps take God to be absolutely perfect, but disagree over what it takes to be perfect: “classical theists” deny or weaken God’s personhood to save the Greek perfections such as impassibility, immutability and simplicity, while “theistic personalists” (a species of “neoclassical theists”) conversely deny or weaken the Greek perfections to save God’s personhood. “Open theists” (model 9 in this entry), for example, are theistic personalists: they call for new readings of, e.g., omnipotence and omniscience and drop immutability and impassibility to comport with God’s desire “to be in an ongoing, dynamic relationship with us” (Basinger 2013: 264–268, see also, e.g., Clark 1992; Pinnock et al. 1994; Sanders 1998). Other neoclassical theists aim merely to resolve inconsistencies among the perfections, as in Nagasawa’s Maximal God Theism (2008, 2017; model 10). In addition to its old challenges, perfect being theology also hit new ones in the modern era from advances in science. When it met Newtonian mechanics (and more) during the Enlightenment, the combination spawned “deism”, the idea that God set the initial conditions of the universe and then left it to play out on its own (model 11). Deism is a dualism because it assumes God can leave the world behind and thus is neither “in” it as in panentheism nor identical with it as in pantheism. Picture all these theistic dualisms as close to Dvaita Vedanta’s image of the eternal builder building a house out of something different from itself and dwelling in it as it pleases, but make the house not necessarily eternal (it may have had a start and may end), and for classical theism, give the builder all the perfections; for neoclassical theisms, give it a few less and perhaps have it throw better parties in the house; and for deism, have the builder abandon the house altogether once it is built and leave it to its own devices, like an “absentee landlord” (Mitchell 2008: 169).
On the other end of the spectrum from these varieties of theistic dualism, we find pantheism, the species of monism that takes the One to be God (a general model, 13). All monisms face a problem of unity: how are the many things in the world integrated enough to call them One? But pantheisms face an additional problem of divinity: even if all is truly One, does the One have what it takes to be God? Here we will focus on two contemporary pantheisms, both in Buckareff & Nagasawa (2016): what we might call a “one-thing” pantheism by Peter Forrest (2016) (a specific pantheism, model 14), where the One is a count noun (as in “a walrus is sleeping over there”), so the cosmos as a whole is One thing, and a “one-stuff” pantheism by Karl Pfeifer (2016) where the One is a mass term (as in “that little lamb is made of butter”), so everything in the cosmos is made of the same kind of One-stuff (model 15). Unlike the Advaita pantheists who take the universe to be a mere appearance, Forrest and Pfeifer definitely take the universe to exist. So for them (and pantheists like them), the One will have to be identical to the universe, and the work is to show how the universe can be identical to God. In other words, this is not all builder no house as in Advaita; the builder is the house, and the builder-house is special enough to call it “God”. Forrest’s main move to effect this is to take the universe to be a conscious self, by way of a “properly anthropocentric” non-reductive physicalism: just as our brain processes correlate with our mental states, so also the universe’s physical processes correlate with universal mental states, which on the model involve a unity of consciousness and thus a sense of self. Forrest has a strong reply to the problem of unity here: the One is an integrated Self precisely because of what emerges from the processes of the many. But is the Self conscious in high enough ways to meet the problem of divinity, to count as God? Though Forrest does not argue like this, the resources for nascent perfections are here, such as omnipotence (the Self has all the power in the universe), omniscience (It could know the entire universe by biofeedback), good will for all (since to hurt any part of the universe is to hurt Itself) etc.—enough in theory to count as God in the classical or at least neoclassical sense. For Pfeifer’s view, instead of picturing the universe as a person, picture it as an “intentional field”, like an electromagnetic field except spread physical dispositional states across space instead of magnetic forces and electrons. Because those physical dispositional states have the same extension as intentional states, intentional states are effectively spread everywhere too. That spreading means there is a kind of “panintentionalism”, and if the intentions are divine enough, then a panGodism, i.e., pantheism. So if Forrest is right, the universe is God itself, and if Pfeifer is right, the universe is made of God-stuff, this field of divine intentional states—both strong thoughts. How plausible, though? On the plus side, Forrest’s view is an instance of “cosmopsychism” (“the cosmos as a whole is phenomenal”, i.e., the Cosmos as a whole has conscious states) and Pfeifer’s an instance of “panpsychism” (“everything in the cosmos is phenomenal”, every particular in the cosmos is conscious), both of which are receiving growing attention in philosophy of mind since, e.g., cosmopsychism may solve physicalism’s problem of strong emergence and panpsychism’s combination problem at once (Nagasawa 2019, for more on these views and their link with Hinduism and Buddhism see, e.g., Shani 2015, Albahari 2019, Mathews 2019). However, even if either the cosmo- or panpsychic aspect of Forrest’s or Pfeifer’s views turns out to be true, the divine part seems doubtful for a reason Pfeifer enunciates: the kind of intentionality the universe would have within it (on Pfeifer’s view) or that would supervene on it (in Forrest’s view) seems likely to be at best the consciousness of an animal, or a comatose or schizoid human, etc.—not even close to the kind of consciousness that would make it count as God (see Pfeifer’s footnote on 2016: 49).
In the middle, between the theistic dualisms and the pantheisms, stand the merotheisms and the panentheisms (two general kinds of models, 16 and 17, again, species coming). As indicated above, the merotheisms are rare, the “odd bird” idea that God is in the world, but the world goes beyond God. Though the term “merotheism” was coined only recently by Paul Draper for his own view (2019: 160), merotheisms have been around well before, for example, in divine emergence theories such as Samuel Alexander’s (1920, a specific model 18) on which the world is metaphysically ultimate and God arises in it. So on the metaphor, the house comes first, then God grows within it. Alexander, for instance, thinks the rock-bottom reality is space-time, and that when “patterns” or “groupings” of it become complex enough, matter comes to evolve in it, then life, then mind and then deity (257). The universe now is at mind, so we are waiting for deity to emerge, not from small “groupings” of things as with the other levels, but from the universe as a whole. Because things can think only about the things below themselves in the hierarchy, we cannot know what deity will be like when it comes (Thomas 2016: 258)—a nice way to explain why God is ineffable and unknowable, albeit one that gives no (other) content to say why Alexander’s “deity” should count as God. In contrast to the emergence merotheisms, Draper (2019) offers a sheer “meros” one (model 19), in which nature, instead of growing God, always has God as one proper part. Specifically, nature is composed of two parts which are both metaphysically ultimate: fundamental matter, and fundamental mind. So what there is not only all the familiar material stuff but also one and only one immaterial mind, i.e., God—“the single subject of all phenomenally conscious experiences”, located in and coextensive with space (2019: 163). Assuming that minds are the source of value, this one mind is the fundamental “source of all the value there is”, and hence is axiologically ultimate (2019: 163). Interestingly, just like prisms immersed in sunlight naturally diffract the electromagnetic spectrum (2019: 167, originally from William James), our brains, which are with everything else immersed in this omnipresent universal mind, naturally diffract what we might think of as the divine spectrum—displaying aspects of the universal consciousness by generating one of its “multiple streams”, “making use” of it for our own ends, tuning in to it in mystical experiences, etc. (2019: 163, 170). So brains don’t produce consciousness—they tap into it—and God doesn’t make the universe or emerge in it—God is the mental part of it that gives it value, and gives us a hope for a form of life after death because the consciousness that runs through our brains and that we mistakenly call our own continues to live on after the brain dies as the aspect of the enduring universal consciousness it always was. This hope secures some soteriological ultimacy: though it makes sense to mourn our deaths, we should “not despair” (2019: 170) since, if we ally ourselves with our consciousnesses, we are even after death still what we always were, an aspect of the mental fundamental reality, as Shankara and Ramakrishna and others would tell us.
Panentheistic models of God (on which the world is in God but God goes beyond the world) have been popular for millennia, to the point that John Cooper calls them “the other God of the Philosophers” in the title of his book on panentheism (Cooper 2006, a general model, #20 in this entry). There are literally too many panentheistic models of God to count, from a star-studded list of historical thinkers including Plato, Pseudo-Dionysius, Ibn Arabi, Meister Eckhart, Nicholas of Cusa, Kant, Hegel, Peirce and more, with a resurgence in the last decade owing at least in part to Yujin Nagasawa and Andrei Buckareff’s Pantheism and Panentheism Project (2017–19 [see Other Internet Resources]). Though some complain that the “in” in panentheism is so ambiguous it is not obviously a single view (see Gasser 2019), Chad Meister suggests that the recent appeal of panentheism is a direct result of (1) some of the neoclassical revisions to the idea of God (more immanent, more passible, etc.) which can be explained by the world’s being in God, as well as (2) the advent of emergentist theories in science which make room not only for the emergence merotheisms sketched above (on which God emerges from the world) but also for their converse, the emergence panentheisms (on which the world emerges from God), among other reasons (Meister 2017: section 4).
Hartshorne’s process theology is a great example of the first impulse Meister identifies (so it is a specific panentheism, model 21). Hartshorne’s process view begins with Whitehead’s metaphysics from Process and Reality—with the idea that the world is dynamic, not static, and indeed that the fundamental units are events, “actual occasions”, not substances, which
do not endure through a tiny bit of time unchanged but [take] a tiny bit of time to become…concrete (“concresence”, Cobb & Griffin 1976: 15)
and which are thus dynamic all the way down. Hartshorne then places this dynamic world of events in God, by taking a page from Ramanuja’s book and saying that all of it—this “totality of individuals as a physical or spatial whole is God’s body, the Soul of which is God” (Hartshorne 1984: 94, quoted in Meister 2017: section 5, italics added)—a move which cements his view as a panentheism, since the world is literally in God, but God, as Soul of the world, goes beyond the world. The practical pay dirt of the view is that, in the same way we feel our bodies, so also God as the Soul of the world feels the world—feels every last “drop of experience” as Whitehead says, every last bit of change happening in every last actual occasion. Moreover, just as we respond to what we feel in our bodies, so also God responds to each felt occasion, and in that instant does two things: runs through a catalog of all possible next occasions, next moves as it were, and then “lures the world forward” with suggestions for the best next moves to actualize in the next occasion. The world can “listen” or not to these suggestions as the next occasion concresces, and then God will regroup again, moment after moment after moment. This is the dynamic process of perfecting—from the world to God back to the world again—which gives process theology its name, and makes it a kind of “becoming-perfect-being” theology.
John Bishop and Ken Perszyk (2016, 2017) propose a panentheism they call a “euteleological conception of divinity” (model 22 here), on which (1) divinity is the property or activity of being the supreme good (“eu” in “euteleological”) and (2) realizing this property or activity is the point (“telos” or final cause) of the universe. In addition—inspired by an unusual kind of efficient causation called “axiarchism” on which final causes can function as efficient ones, an idea visible at least since Plato and having something of a revival in the last couple decades—Bishop and Perszyk (3) take concrete realizations of the supreme good to be the efficient cause of the universe. Thus, on (2) and (3), these realizations of the good are both the efficient and final cause of the universe, both alpha and omega. This model is, as its authors say, “prone to be met with incomprehension or blank incredulity” (2017: 613): how can effects in the universe be the cause the universe, and thus their own causes? Though Bishop and Perszyk do not answer this question in 2016 or 2017, they do point out the eerie precedent in the Christian tradition, the model’s home context, for efficient causes to double as final ones: Jesus is both the source and offspring of David, both “root and flower;” Mary “gives birth to her own creator;” the Divine word is both “without which was not anything made that was made” and “born late in time” (2017: 614). They also identify the supreme good in Christianity as perfect love, take Jesus to have instantiated it in his person and time and again in relationships, and take us to do so too when we “love one another as he has loved us” (2017: 613). Note such concrete occasions of love are per (1) literally divinity dotting (and hopefully eventually overrunning) the universe, and that they deserve to count as divinity because they are triply ultimate: metaphysically since they are the efficient and final cause of the universe; axiologically since they are the best of things, and soteriologically since they are deeply fulfilling (to quote the Beatles, “all you need is love”). Whether or not the axiarchism at its heart is a strike against euteleological theism, an enormous point in its favor is how profoundly it addresses the problem of evil: it makes God the force in nature that defuses evil instead of intending it.
This section would be incomplete without at least mentioning Tillich’s “ground of being theology” in closing (model 23). His view is not filed into the range of God-world relations above because it is famously difficult to categorize: Christopher Demuth Rodkey (2013) says Tillich has been read variously as a panentheist, deist (i.e., dualist), and pantheist, and that it is in fact best to characterize him as none of the above but rather as an “ecstatic naturalist”, where the Power of Being delivers the naturalism (since this Power is “the power in every thing that has power”) and the Depth of Being delivers the ecstasy (persons experience this Power of Being ecstatically, as holy). This interpretation tracks Tillich’s method of correlative theology in Systematic Theology I and II: ecstasy is a “state of mind” which is “an exact correlate” to the “state of reality” of the power of being which animates and transcends the finite world (see, e.g., Tillich 1957b: 13). So for Tillich, God is the power or energy that animates the world which, when truly encountered, provokes ecstatic response. This view is spare enough that it is not obvious how someone might work up an “ultimate concern” about God, another of Tillich’s central ideas mentioned at the start of this entry (1957a, e.g., 10–11). Tillich will have to hypothesize that the ecstasy provoked is, for believers, strong enough to rouse such a concern.
These are, then, several models of God, sorted mainly by how they see the relationship between God and the world. Is the God that is modeled in each of these ways metaphysically, axiologically and soteriologically ultimate, in Schellenberg’s terms? Interestingly, the answers differ dramatically for each model. To offer just two examples, on classical theism we get a yes, yes, yes: God as single-handed origin of the universe, making everything out of nothing, is metaphysically the fundamental fact; and, in Anselm’s hands, God as the greatest not only actual but also possible being in every category of being, is as axiologically ultimate as anything can be; and in Aquinas’ idea, God as our very telos, the point of our being, is soteriologically ultimate as well. In contrast, God on Alexander’s view gets a no, maybe, maybe. Alexander’s deity is not metaphysically the most fundamental fact in any of the ways collected in the models seen so far: it is neither the efficient cause of the universe (as in the dualisms), nor its material cause (as in the pantheisms and some panentheisms) nor its final cause (as in Bishop and Perszyk). Alexander also cannot say if deity will be axiologically or soteriologically ultimate when it arrives, since deity is by definition unknown for him. Thus, God as modeled in some ways is ultimate and in others is not.
2.3 Models of the Dao
The idea of the Dao (Way, Path, Guide) emerged during the Warring States period in China (fifth to second centuries BCE), when the reigning idea of Tian (Heaven) as a kind of personal god or God started to shatter along with the rest of the imperial structures of the Zhou Dynasty. Chinese thinkers faced their version of the problem of evil: “Why is Tian letting this chaos persist?” and added “Where is the dao to harmony?” (Perkins 2019; Miller 2003: 37). An extended debate arose among different schools of thought arguing for different answers (Zürn 2018: 300ff), including two schools that have endured: the early Ru (Confucian) thinkers who said the dao could be brought back into the human world by reestablishing right social relationships and customs, and the early or proto-Daoists who found a new focus in the dao in the impersonal, consistent patterns of the non-human natural world. The Daodejing (ca. sixth to fourth centuries BCE, hereafter “DDJ”) is the earliest Daoist text that reads these natural patterns as evidence of a single force or principle of all that there is—as a single metaphysical ultimate—and “tentatively”, as Perkins (2019) says well, names this ultimate “the dao” or in some translations “the Dao” or “Dao”. Though this entry will focus mainly on the Daoist tradition and use the word “Dao” (hereafter not italicized) to refer to it, the res in question runs under other important names and concepts in both the Daoist and Ru traditions, including Taiji (Great Ultimate or Grand One), Xuan Tian (Dark Heaven), Zhen (Truth or noumenal Reality) and conjoined with Tian as Tiandao in Ruism.
Gradually, the early Daoist thinkers took the Dao to have multiple functional roles—metaphysically, as the cosmos’ origin, its pattern or structure (ti), its functioning (yong); and soteriologically as a guide through the cosmos for humans, as Robin Wang says (DDJ ch. 25, Wang 2012: 47). Combining the Dao’s role as the origin of all things with its undeniable unitariness threw Daoist thinkers into the question of how the One became Many, and thus into a focus on cosmogony. The Daoist cosmogonists generally agreed, and agree now, on at least six things about the Dao (the last general model this entry will showcase)—though there is substantial diversity in interpretations of each which help constitute various thinkers’ models of the Dao.
First, in a seeming nod to the consistent patterns of the universe that encouraged postulation of the Dao in the first place, the Dao is taken to be immanent in everything. As the Zhuangzi says,
There’s no place [the Dao] doesn’t exist….It is in the panic grass….in the tiles and shards…in the piss and shit!…“Complete”, “universal”, “all-inclusive”—all point to a single reality. (Zhuangzi, sec. 22, Watson translation)
Second, because it is capable of singlehandedly originating everything, the Dao is taken to be necessarily ziran, meaning “self-so” or “spontaneous”, which is read as entailing something like the kind of necessity and aseity of being causa sui in the Thomist tradition (Perkins 2019). Wang explains the entailment in her explication of a famous passage (“Human beings follow earth, earth follows heaven, heaven follows dao, and dao follows ziran”): the Dao’s following ziran arrests the regress because “following” spontaneity is the opposite of following since spontaneity is making it up yourself on the fly (DDJ, ch. 25; Wang 2012: 51).
What is the nature of a ziran generator of all things, then? Zhuangzi answers in his inimitable way: “what things things is not itself a thing” (ch. 11, see Schipper 1982 [1993: 115]). In other words, the third commonly held claim is that the Dao is no thing, nothing, nonbeing (wu). Bin Song (2018) helpfully disambiguates several readings of nonbeing, including as (a) sheer nothingness, a great vacuum “before” time and things; or (b) abstract forms not yet made concrete, e.g., Zhu-Xi’s “pattern-principles” or Wang’s “patterns and processes of interrelatedness” (2018: 48) or, instead of nothingness or abstractness, (c) concrete no-thingness, i.e., a totally undetermined whole of being, stuff without form. Song and Poul Andersen favor option (c), translating a key phrase in DDJ 21 that describes the Dao as a “complete blend” and as having “murky indistinctness”, respectively (Song 2018: 224–230, Andersen 2019: 131–132). Another line in that chapter also tells against the Dao’s being sheer nothingness:
yet within it is a substance, within it is an essence, quite genuine, within it, something that can be tested. (DDJ, Lau translation)
On any of these readings of nonbeing, it is clear why the Dao is taken to be impersonal: the Dao is not only not anthropomorphic; it is not even thingmorphic. It is also clear why it is taken to be ineffable: it is not just because its being is beyond us; it is also because it is not a being at all, and most uses of words (to talk like Zhuangzi) thing it. So we find Daoist texts using the tricks of the ineffability trade to talk about the Dao, including famously, e.g., a use of the via negativa in the opening line of the DDJ: “the way that can be spoken of is not the constant way…” Also, in an expression that is perhaps less about the Dao’s ineffability and more about the futility of finding it intellectually, there is Zhuangzi’s dynamic semper negativa of “continuous self-negation” or “unsaying”, visible also in the Buddhist tradition and in Tillich millennia after and oceans away:
There is being, there is no-being, there is not yet beginning to be no-being, there is not yet beginning to be not yet beginning to be no-being. (Zhuangzi, sec. 2; on Tillich, Rodkey 2013: 491–493)
The fourth and fifth widely held views of the Dao are both about how nonbeing generates being, namely with wu wei (“non-action”), and in stages. Andersen describes wu wei more fully: “the Way does not cause [things] to come into being but provides a gap that allows things to emerge” (2019: 131). To reveal wu wei, Daoist literature frequently uses images of the female and infants, e.g., twice over in DDJ 10, where wu wei is likened first to “keeping the role of the female” who with no apparent (anyway) action naturally nurtures the fetus and then, to use Andersen’s words, provides a gap to allow it to emerge in birth; and second to “being as supple as a babe” who is the epitome of the wu wei ruler since a baby does not do anything but gets everyone else to act to please it (Zürn in conversation; see also Erkes and Ho-Shang-Kung1945: 128).
The Dao is also taken to generate in stages, and actually in four of them (DDJ 40, 42; Perkins 2019; Robson 2015: 1483; Wang 2012: 48; etc.). There are various readings of the sequence, but one prominent view takes 0 as nonbeing, the Dao; 1 as unity, Being; 2 as duality, yinyang; and 3 as multiplicity, namely heaven, earth and human beings. In a prescient recognition of how natural (heaven and earth) and social (human) constructions combine to make reality, 3 burgeons into 4, i.e., the 10,000 or myriad things that comprise the universe. Crucially, 4 returns to 0—to use the feminine imagery, returns to the womb where everything is possible and everything develops—and then the sequence repeats (Pregadio 2016 [2020: sec. 4], Wang 2012, 51 citing the Huainanzi). This world-to-Dao-and-back cycle is reminiscent of the occasion-to-God-and-back cycle in process theology, though on a grand vs. momentary scale.
Interestingly, in general, Daoists read the sequence as strictly cyclical (so 4 returns to 0, i.e., 0, 1, 2, 3, 4, 0, 1, …) while Ruists read it as an “endless advance to novelty” so that we never step into the same cycle twice (i.e., 0, 1, …, 0′, 1′, …, 0″, 1″, … etc.) (Song 2018: 230–232). Moreover, there is an open question whether the sequence is temporal or ontological (Song 2018: 225–226) which is sometimes crystallized into a debate about whether 0 is temporally (and thus ontologically) prior to 1 or merely ontologically so. If the move from 0 to 1 is temporal, then 0 happens before 1 and they are really distinct; as Andersen argues:
the One is a product of the Way, not the Way itself… [because] identity and stability as a thing in the world depends on being one. (Andersen 2019: 180)
If, on the other hand, 0 is only ontologically prior to 1, then nonbeing and being are always co-existing as two eternal aspects of what there is, with being still depending for its existence on non-being like a burning eternal candle depends for its existence on its eternal flame. The ontological-only reading seems licensed by DDJ 1 which talks about “the nameless [who] was the beginning of heaven and earth” and “the named [who] was the mother of the myriad creatures….these two are the same but diverge in name as they issue forth” (italics mine, for more see Pregadio 2016 [2020: sec. 4.1])—assuming that the passage implies that they diverge in name “only”. The dispute about how nonbeing and being relate is vexing enough that it is a relief, actually, when DDJ 81 throws up its hands and says: “their coexistence is a mystery”!
Grasping all this together—that the Dao is the origin of all, immanent in all, ziran, essentially nonbeing, generating forms of being by wu wei, generating stage by stage until we reach the roiling boil of being in the myriad things—we are able to catch the last and perhaps deepest thought of all about the Dao: that it is generative by nature, or as Neville says: “nonbeing is simply fecund from the perspective of being” (2008: 3). This idea hails back to the I Ching, which takes “the foundation of the changes” to be sheng sheng, literally meaning “life life” or “generating generating”, sometimes glossed with the phrase shengsheng buxi “generating generating never ceasing!”—held as the highest metaphysical principle by Ruists (especially neo-Ruists) and not far from Spinoza’s natura naturans (Gao Heng 1998: 388 cited in Perkins 2019). Thus, at the bottom of it all, there is just endless, unformed, spontaneous life stuff, which is generating increasingly formed spontaneous life stuff which, because it is shot through with the Dao, in turn generates even more, even further formed, spontaneous life stuff, and we are off and running to the 10,000 things, until, as yang wanes to yin, life life goes back to 0 (death death?), and all is still until it waxes to yang again. In spite of the cycle that always sends it back to yin, it is fitting to call the Dao “life life” because it always waxes to life again; the life force is irrepressible, no matter how many times it temporarily dies.
Though the Daoist literature does not use these philosophical distinctions much, and though occasionally it is read there as a monism in passing, the standard model of the Dao just recounted is best understood as an impersonal panentheism—as are the classical theisms and Bishop and Perszyk’s model of God (Section 2.2). The Dao-world relation has the asymmetry that defines panentheism: all the forms of being at 1–4 (or at least 2–4, if Being is read as identical to the Dao) depend for their existence on the Dao, but the Dao does not depend on them, or anything, for its existence. In addition, if we take the theme of immanence in a full-throated way so that really there is nowhere down the line of the stages that the Dao is not, then the Dao is both the efficient and material cause of the universe, as we saw in the Bhakti Vedanta views. So the view of the Dao traced here is close to the idea of Brahman as the builder of a house out of Brahmanself, who eternally dwells in this eternal Brahman-house which depends on Brahman for its existence but not vice versa. But “builder” is too intentional for the Dao, and, at least on the temporal reading of the sequence, there is no eternal house and thus no eternal dwelling in it. So try this: think of the Dao as an eternal seed for a house. The seed sprouts naturally in stages into a house filled with 10,000 things which depends on the seed but not vice versa, until the house dies back into the seed, which then lies dormant, pregnant with being, until it sprouts into being again, and so on, eternally.
After all that has been said, the Dao is clearly metaphysically ultimate in Schellenberg’s sense: it is “the most fundamental fact about the nature of things” (2016: 168). The Dao is soteriologically ultimate as well, but, as with Brahman, it is not clearly axiologically so. Regarding axiology, first, if we understand axiology as greatness along all the categories of being, we can see immediately that the Dao, at least understood as 0, has greatness along no category of being since it is not being at all (for more see Kohn 2001: 18). Moreover, if we narrow the idea of axiology just to the moral category of being, the Dao is still not axiologically ultimate. In multiple texts, the Dao is taken to be neither good nor bad; it is taken to be what is. Famous among them is DDJ, ch. 5 (“Heaven and earth are not kind, they treat the ten thousand beings as straw dogs”, see also chs. 18, 62). Interpreters take these passages to mean that the Dao is either amoral—as nonbeing, not the kind of thing that has moral interests in the first place; or “value-contrarian” (Hansen 2020); or, to add a thought, perhaps “ananthropocentric”, having moral concerns that are not human-centered (see Mulgan 2015 and 2017). Wang Bi’s commentary on the straw dogs passage suggests that these amoral or anti-moral moments spring from the Dao’s and the sage’s wu wei:
The one who is kind necessarily creates and erects, impacts and transforms. He shows mercy and acts. If someone creates and erects, impacts and transforms things, then these things lose their true reality. If he shows mercy and acts, then these things are not entirely there. (quoted in Andersen 2019: 130)
In other words, acting wu wei actually requires not being kind in the usual sense. But if Wang Bi is right, maybe there is an axiology after all to treating the myriad things like straw dogs: being kind in the traditional sense may not be being kind deeply since it destroys a thing’s power to be itself.
Regarding soteriology, it is agreed that a—or even the—central goal of Daoist practices such as inner alchemy, t’ai chi, etc. is to return to the Dao (fandao, huandao, DDJ 16 and 40; Andersen 2019: 126), and specifically to return to nonbeing, which is the Dao at its most creative, powerful and sublime, on the crest of becoming being (Song 2018: 234–5). If we can return to 0, we embody this power and sublimity in human form and, as Andersen says, also do our part to return the cosmos to the start for a new beginning (2019: 123). There are specific rituals Daoists do in communal contexts to return. In one of the important rites in Daoist liturgy called bugang (“walking along the guideline”), a Daoist high priest walks through the ritual space, with the audience making their own occasional movements too, to embody a complete motion of return with a successful arrival back to 0 by the end of the rite, when
the forces that animated the universe at the beginning of time may once again be channeled into the community on behalf of which the ritual is performed. (2019: 118–123)
Practitioners outside of ritual contexts also try to return by inwardly cultivating the skill of acting as the Dao does when it generates being: with wu wei. Miller reminds us that wu wei is not some loose form of letting go, but is rather a specific “spiritual technology” of intervening very gently at the right time, in the right place—as Neville says, with “a subtle infinitesimal dose” when there is a rare “opening for spontaneity [in the otherwise hard-to-beat] inertial forces of the Dao” (Miller 2003: 140; Neville 2008: 47–51). Andersen’s take on these efforts is haunting:
An accomplished Daoist resides in the gap between being and nonbeing. The fundamental truth of Daoism is in this gap, in the Way and its manifestation as true and real. (2019: 130)
This thought suggests an answer to the puzzle that surfaced about Brahman—about why contact with a metaphysical ultimate that is not axiologically so might still be fulfilling to us. At least for those seeking awareness of Brahman and harmony with the Dao, our whole desire looks like it is to be in the presence of what is true and real (Zhen), whether what is true and real is bad or good or neither or both. We are fans of unvarnished reality.
3. Responses to the Diversity of Models of What is Ultimate
After surveying these many models of Brahman, God, and the Dao, and recognizing that they are just a small sample of the range of options for modeling Brahman, God, and the Dao, which are in turn a small sample of the range of ultimates that could be modeled, one may wonder: What should one do with all this information?
People respond in various ways after grasping the diversity of the models. Some abandon the models altogether, either exhausted by their complexity (embodied in Watt’s wonderful phrase “the which than which there is no whicher”, 1972: 110), or convinced by their number and inconsistency that some models logically must be making a mistake, and it will be very hard to tell which ones. In other words, one response to the diversity is to decide more deeply that the nature of what is ultimate is indeed beyond us, if there is anything ultimate at all, so it is not worth thinking about it.
In sharp contrast, others actually embrace the diversity of models as part of the path to understanding what is ultimate. The comparative theologians, for example, study novel models in order to carry fresh insights from them back to their own tradition and re-see their own models more deeply (see Clooney 2010 for an introduction and, e.g., Feldmeier 2019 for the method applied to Buddhist and Christian models of the ultimate). An emerging movement, Theology Without Walls (TWW), draws on the models to understand the nature of a globally shared ultimate, one to which all the models may be intending to refer, reading the body of models as data and their number and inconsistencies as an interpretive challenge instead of a deal breaker (see, e.g., Martin 2020). Ramakrishna offers one such interpretation in the TWW spirit: he decides there is no need to choose between the models because each is a finite start on the “infinite paths to an infinite reality” (see Section 2.1)—each is news about an ultimate whose nature is so full that we actually need all the models to help us see it. Both TWW and Ramakrishna will have to explain how it is possible for many or all the models to deliver news of what is ultimate given their inconsistency, e.g., by relying on perspectivalism, a phenomenal/noumenal distinction, the models’ incommensurability, etc. (see Ruhmkorff 2013 for a survey of options).
Others fall somewhere between abandoning and embracing the plurality of models by recommending that we hold the models loosely somehow, that we attenuate our commitment to them. Kierkegaard for instance tells us to move our focus from the content of our model to our orientation to what we are attempting to model: it is better to pray to a false God truly than to a true God falsely (paraphrase of 1846, Part Two, Chapter II). Similarly, J.R. Hustwit cautions us to “balance engagement with non-attachment” to models to avoid ego-reinforcement and more (2013: 1003–1007)—not far perhaps from Zhuangzi’s and Tillich’s semper negativa of holding and letting go model after model, a view which converts the pile of models into grist for the mill of a spiritual practice. For his part, Schellenberg suggests that instead of having faith in a specific model of, e.g., Brahman, God or the Dao, we do better to have it in the more general thing (res) that underlies them all—the axiological, soteriological, and metaphysical ultimate which has been the organizing principle of this entry. One advantage of reading ultimacy in Schellenberg’s way is that the general ultimate is more likely to exist than any of the particular ultimates it covers, since it exists if any of them do. A second advantage is that Schellenberg’s general ultimate is by design the core, the overlooked “heart” of the many models—the same thing that the particular models it covers are about, just at a higher level of description. So faith in Schellenberg’s ultimate permits a “faith without details” (2009: ch. 2) in many of the world’s religions and philosophies at once.
For those who, after this long journey through the landscape of models and now these responses to them, still hope to discover which model is philosophically the best of them all, know that Wildman (2017) has a plan for “think[ing] our way through the morass” (2017: viii). In brief:
- identify the models worth your time;
- place them in a “reverent competition” that scores them on “comparative criteria” (2017: viii–ix, ff.), then
- adopt the winner, at least provisionally, since the entire inquiry is “fallibilist” (2017: 161 and elsewhere).
Wildman demonstrates his plan by following it himself (2017). Interestingly, he frames his options for step 1 in terms of “entire systems of thought” comprised of combinations of models of what is ultimate (which he calls “U types”) plus “ontological cosmologies” (“C types”)—an idea which may really do a better job of identifying our choices than the models per se do, given their fuller capture of an entire worldview. His U types include agential models on which the ultimate is personal, ground of being models on which it is impersonal, and “subordinate deity” models such as process theology on which it is “disjoint:” one or more personal deities operate in an impersonal ultimacy (2017: 13, 165, 182). His C types include supernaturalism, which involves disembodied agency; naturalism, which does not; and monism. Combining the U and C types produces nine U + C views, and to live out step 1 of his plan, he chooses his top three to place in competition: supernaturalist theistic personalism (God as a personal perfect being), naturalist ground of being (think, e.g., the panentheistic impersonal Dao), and Whitehead’s or Hartshorne’s process theism. For step (2), he then subjects these three views to his comparative criteria, which include coherence, ability to handle the problems of evil and the One and the Many, fit with the sciences, and most importantly non-anthropomorphism, his main criterion since he takes anthropomorphism to result from misapplying human cognitive structures that were naturally selected for mere survival purposes to ideas of ultimacy (2017: 217).
When Wildman ran his competitors against these criteria, the naturalist ground of being system won. But it is obviously up to each of us interested in such a project to run our own competitions on the models we take to be worth our time, with comparative criteria we think make a model truth-conducive, in order to light on the most philosophically satisfying model of what is ultimate that we can. That model would be the one to then subject to the best arguments for and against the existence of God and other ultimates, to discover in a fully researched and now clarified way, whether there is anything ultimate.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- All Things Cosmic, The Center for Process Studies, on process philosophy and theology
- The Analytic Theology Project (2010–2014), about the growing field of analytic theology.
- Interviews at Closer to Truth site:
- Comparative Theology, Harvard Divinity School
- Gifford Lectures, renowned lecture series on natural theology since 1888, some of which develop ideas of God or ultimacy, e.g., William James, Samuel Alexander, etc.
- Paul Hedges’ Weblog on comparative theology, e.g., “Critical Reflections on the Theology Without Walls Project”, in 21 December 2020.
- Nagasawa, Yujin and Andrei Buckareff, 2017–19, The Pantheism and Panentheism Project.
- The Panpsycast Philosophy Podcast, showcases in podcast form some of the fruits of Templeton’s Pantheism and Panentheism Project, see especially: Episode 57: ‘Pantheism, Personhood, Consciousness, and God’ with Sam Coleman, Episode 58: ‘The Idealism and Pantheism of May Sinclair’ with Emily Thomas, and Episode 63: ‘Alternative Concepts of God’ with Andrei Buckareff.
- Theology Without Walls, about an emerging movement to theologize with all religious texts as a starting point.
The author is indebted to Jeffery Long as well as Bin Song and Tobias Zürn for their indispensable assistance on the sections on Brahman and the Dao, respectively, and to John Bishop, Paul Draper, David Perry, and Samuel Ruhmkorff for reading preliminary drafts and many helpful conversations. The author is also grateful to Yujin Nagasawa for valuable comments as this entry took shape and to Edwin Curley and George Mavrodes for important formation on this topic.