First published Thu Oct 15, 2015; substantive revision Sat Dec 31, 2022

Imagine the following alternative history of the world: Things are qualitatively just as they actually are. There is no difference in anything like the shape, size, or mass of objects. There is no difference in the number of entities. Even so, there is a non-qualitative difference and it concerns you in particular. According to this alternative history, you fail to exist. In your place, there is a distinct individual, Double. Double has all the qualitative properties, whether mental or physical, you actually have, but, despite all these similarities, you and Double are distinct individuals. So, according to this alternative history, you do not exist.

Is this alternative history of the world a possible one? And what should we make of other alleged qualitatively indiscernible possibilities? For example, is it possible for a pair of siblings to “swap” their actual qualitative roles—i.e., where the actually firstborn twin is born second and vice versa—but where no qualitative features of the world are altered? In a similar vein, suppose, following Black (1952), that there could be a world containing only two qualitatively indiscernible iron spheres. Are there also other possible worlds where these spheres are “replaced” by numerically distinct yet qualitatively indiscernible doppelgängers?

An affirmative answer to these questions entails haecceitism, according to which the world could differ non-qualitatively without differing qualitatively. So, if the alternative history described above where Double replaces you is a genuine possibility, it is a maximal possibility—i.e., a total way the world could be—that differs haecceitistically from actuality. Similarly, if it is possible for twins to swap their birth orders while leaving all qualitative matters unchanged, that maximal possibility also differs haecceitistically from actuality.

According to anti-haecceitism, there are no haecceitistic differences between maximal possibilities. Anti-haecceitism therefore holds that the world could not be haecceitistically different without being qualitatively different. So, for anti-haecceitists, the alternative history of the world described above is not possible nor are there are distinct maximal possibilities that differ solely in terms of individuals “swapping” their qualitative roles or being “replaced” by non-actual individuals.

This entry is a general overview of the issues raised by haecceitism and anti-haecceitism. In Sections One through Three, various formulations of haecceitism are presented and the connections between haecceitism, haecceities, and essentialism are examined. In Sections Four and Five, arguments for and against haecceitism are surveyed. Section Six discusses the scope of haecceitistic differences and the prospects for accepting only certain kinds of haecceitistic differences. Finally, Section Seven briefly notes the significance of haecceitism and its denial within various areas of metaphysics.

1. Formulating Haecceitism

Haecceitism is a modal thesis. Like other modal theses, there are competing metaphysical frameworks in which it might be expressed. Some of these frameworks involve a commitment to possible worlds or maximal possibilities, while other frameworks aim to do without these commitments. To further complicate matters, some frameworks distinguish possible worlds from the maximal possibilities they represent while other frameworks collapse this putative distinction by identifying maximal possibilities with possible worlds. This section surveys some of the options for formulating and interpreting haecceitism but, as Skow (2008, 2011) argues, any formulation of haecceitism that employs the framework of possible worlds will tendentiously presuppose something about the nature of possibilities or possible worlds. For this reason, the proper formulation of haecceitism is itself a matter of controversy.

1.1 Possibilities and Possible Worlds

For modalists, the correct analysis of modality involves no quantification over possibilities or possible worlds. (On modalism, see Forbes (1992), Melia (2003: 81–98) and Peacocke (1999: 155–159).) Instead, modal notions are properly understood in terms of primitive modal operators like the box and diamond of modal logic. Since modalists do without quantification over possibilities or possible worlds, haecceitism and anti-haecceitism cannot be expressed in terms of differences between such entities. But, following Skow (2008), the modalist can nevertheless characterize anti-haecceitism as follows:

Modalist Anti-Haecceitism: Necessarily, the world could not be non-qualitatively different without being qualitatively different.

Within the modalist framework, haecceitism is therefore equivalent to the denial of Modalist Anti-Haecceitism.

Those who reject the expressive limitations of modalism can help themselves to richer ontological resources in characterizing haecceitism. For example, if quantification over possibilities is permitted, two distinctions among possibilities prove especially useful for formulating haecceitism. According to the first distinction, some possibilities are maximal: they are total ways the entire world could have been. So, for any possibility, a maximal possibility includes that possibility or its negation. (On some views, talk of possibilities including other possibilities is understood in terms of entailment. On other views, “inclusion” is understood in terms of set membership—e.g., membership relations between sets of propositions. Here, inclusion is taken as a neutral bit of terminology.) In contrast, non-maximal possibilities like the possibility that Obama is human are less than total ways things could have been.

A second distinction among possibilities divides non-qualitative possibilities, which are ways specific individuals like Napoleon or Nefertiti could have been, from qualitative possibilities, which are not tied to any specific individuals. So, for example, the possibility that Napoleon escapes Elba is non-qualitative, while the possibility that there are four red objects is a qualitative possibility. (On some views, the distinction between qualitative and non-qualitative possibilities can be identified with or analyzed in terms of the distinction between de dicto and de re possibilities.) Granted these two distinctions among possibilities, haecceitism can be characterized as follows:

Possibility Haecceitism: There are distinct maximal possibilities that differ only with respect to the non-qualitative possibilities they include.

According to Possibility Haecceitism, maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically include the very same qualitative possibilities and differ only in terms of the non-qualitative possibilities they include. So, while most everyone holds that there are maximal possibilities that differ qualitatively and non-qualitatively from actuality, haecceitistic differences are distinctive: they divide maximal possibilities that differ only non-qualitatively.

Although Possibility Haecceitism requires quantification over possibilities, it remains silent about possible worlds. But, for most realists about possible worlds, quantification over maximal possibilities requires or is simply equivalent to quantification over possible worlds. Typically, such realist views of possible worlds identify each maximal possibility with a unique possible world and non-maximal possibilities with sets of possible worlds. And, while views that reduce possibilities to possible worlds can employ Possibility Haecceitism to express haecceitism, some might be tempted to interpret haecceitism as a thesis about qualitatively indiscernible worlds. Such a view would attempt to formulate haecceitism as the following thesis:

World Indiscernibility: There are distinct possible worlds that are qualitatively indiscernible.

As Lewis (1986: 220–247) and Skow (2008) point out, however, World Indiscernibility is a misleading way to express haecceitism given certain views about possible worlds.

According to ersatzist views, which identify possible worlds with abstract entities like sentence-types, properties, propositions, or sets, the truth of World Indiscernibility will turn, not on whether there are distinctively haecceitistic possibilities, but on whether such entities are qualitatively indiscernible from one another. (Qualitatively indiscernible entities share all their qualitative properties, while qualitative duplicates share only their intrinsic qualitative properties.) So, if one holds that sets or propositions have no qualitative features, then World Indiscernibility is true, regardless of one’s views about what is and what is not possible. So, for many ersatzists, the status of World Indiscernibility does not depend upon any distinctive modal commitments, but is settled by apparently orthogonal questions regarding the nature of the abstract entities with which possible worlds are identified.

In light of disagreement about which entities play the role of possible worlds, no characterization of haecceitism that makes substantive assumptions about the nature of possible worlds will prove acceptable to all ersatzists. (On ersatzism, see Lewis (1986: 136–142), Divers (2002: 167–292), and Sider (2002).) Despite this, competing ersatzist views can employ their own distinctive resources to provide formulations of haecceitism. For instance, if possible worlds are identified with maximal consistent sets of propositions, haecceitism can be taken as the claim that there are distinct maximal consistent sets of propositions that include the same qualitative propositions but different non-qualitative propositions. For other versions of ersatzism, alternative strategies for formulating haecceitism that appeal to properties, sets, or other entities are available, but none have a plausible claim to being a metaphysically neutral expression of haecceitism.

Although formulations of haecceitism tailored to various ersatzist views differ significantly, they typically share a commitment to a one-one correspondence between possible worlds and maximal possibilities. This correspondence allows ersatzists to treat talk of maximal possibilities and possible worlds as largely interchangeable for most theoretical purposes. Ersatzists who accept Possibility Haecceitism therefore commonly endorse the following thesis:

World Haecceitism: There are distinct maximal possibilities that differ only haecceitistically and there is a one-to-one correspondence between possible worlds and the maximal possibilities they represent.

Erzatzists can, however, reject World Haecceitism, and, as we’ll see below, the resulting view is an analogue of the Lewisian modal realist’s “cheap haecceitism.” But, as should be clear from the preceding, whether a given formulation of haecceitism is an apt one crucially depends upon the background metaphysics of possibilities and possible worlds.

On issues that arise in formulating haecceitism, see Lewis (1986: 220–247), Russell (2013a), Skow (2008, 2011), and Stalnaker (2011). Kaplan (1975) is an importantly early contribution where, among other things, Kaplan attributes the use of the label ‘haecceitism’ to R.M. Adams. On the ways in which Kaplan’s use of ‘haecceitism’ departs from now-standard uses, see Stalnaker (2011: 54–62). For other issues in characterizing haecceitism, see Graff Fara (2009), Torza (2012) and Scarpati (2021).

1.2. Haecceitism and Modal Realism

While ersatzist views identify possible worlds with abstract entities, Lewisian modal realism identifies possible worlds with maximal sums of (analogically) spatiotemporally interrelated entities. According to Lewisian modal realism, for any way things could have been, there is some possible world that represents that possibility. Moreover, these possible worlds are no less “real” or concrete than our actual world. (Lewis characterizes these possible worlds as “concrete” only with reservation, given competing, non-equivalent conceptions of the abstract-concrete distinction.)

Within Lewisian modal realism, de re modality is analyzed in terms of Lewis’ distinctive and controversial counterpart theory. According to counterpart theory, ordinary individuals are not numerically identical or “bilocated” across possible worlds. Instead, possible individuals are worldbound, existing in only one world, and possess their de re modal properties in virtue of bearing counterpart relations to other possible entities. Roughly put, counterpart theory holds that an individual \(a\) is possibly \(F\) if and only if \(a\) has a counterpart that is \(F\), where counterpart relations are relations of qualitative resemblance between possible individuals. So, according to Lewis’ counterpart-theoretic treatment of de re modality, it is true that Obama could have been a doctor if and only if there is some possible individual that appropriately resembles Obama and is a doctor. De re modality is therefore a matter of resemblance relations between parts of possible worlds although the relevant resemblance relations vary from context to context. (Lewis’ views on counterpart theory and counterpart relations change over time, see Lewis (1968, 1986). On counterpart theory, see Graff Fara (2009), Fara and Williamson (2005), and Hazen (1979).)

Since Lewis analyzes de re representation—i.e., the way in which entities represent de re possibilities—in terms of qualitative resemblance, counterpart relations never divide qualitatively indiscernible entities. Therefore, for any qualitatively indiscernible entities \(x\) and \(y\) in a given context, \(x\) is a counterpart of \(z\) if and only if \(y\) is a counterpart of z. This commitment has serious consequences for the modal realist treatment of haecceitism. In particular, it guarantees that qualitatively indiscernible possible worlds do not differ in terms of what de re possibilities they represent. Lewis therefore endorses the following thesis about the connection between qualitative properties and what de re possibilities a world represents:

Qualitative Supervenience: Facts about what worlds represent de re supervene upon facts about the qualitative properties of worlds.

As Lewis uses “haecceitism”, it is the denial of Qualitative Supervenience and therefore the claim that non-qualitative features of worlds at least partially determine what worlds represent de re. (On the relation of supervenience, see the entry by McLaughlin and Bennett.) For modal realists who would reject Qualitative Supervenience, qualitatively indiscernible possible worlds can differ with respect to which de re possibilities they represent. Non-Lewisian modal realists of this sort can therefore hold qualitatively indiscernible possible worlds to represent maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically. But, since Lewis endorses Qualitative Supervenience, he claims that qualitatively indiscernible worlds represent the very same possibilities. Positing qualitative indiscernible worlds therefore provides Lewis with no additional resource for making sense of haecceitistic differences. (Lewis is officially agnostic about whether there are any qualitatively indiscernible worlds. See Lewis (1986: 224).) As a consequence, Lewis holds that we go wrong in assimilating questions of haecceitism to questions about qualitatively indiscernible worlds. For Lewis, haecceitism is an issue regarding how possible worlds represent de re possibilities. So, even if Lewis were to posit distinct yet qualitatively indiscernible worlds, they would differ non-qualitatively but not haecceitistically in the Lewisian sense.

Since qualitatively indiscernible worlds are no help to Lewis in accounting for haecceitistic possibilities—e.g., where two twins swap their qualitative roles—and Lewis does take these to be genuine possibilities, he offers an important modification to his earlier version of counterpart theory that seeks to accommodate such possibilities. Lewis’ modified counterpart theory permits individuals to have multiple counterparts within the actual world. (See Lewis (1967, 1983, and 1986).) So, in the case of our two twins, the firstborn twin has its second-born twin as one of its counterparts. In certain linguistic contexts, the second-born twin therefore represents a possibility for the firstborn—namely, the possibility of occupying precisely the qualitative role of the second-born twin. In this way, the actual world and its parts will, in suitable contexts, represent, not only the actualized maximal possibility, but also maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically from the actualized maximal possibility. Context permitting, each possible world can therefore represent a plurality of maximal possibilities each of which differ haecceitistically from one another. And, since Lewis’ modified counterpart theory holds a single possible world and its parts to represent distinct maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically, it accommodates the representation of such possibilities without multiplying possible worlds. Lewis describes this view as “haecceitism on the cheap.” Understood in terms set out above, this “cheap substitute for haecceitism” entails Possibility Haecceitism yet rejects World Haecceitism.

In denying World Haecceitism, Lewis forgoes a one-to-one correspondence between maximal possibilities and possible worlds. This feature proves significant in several discussions about the tenability of “cheap haecceitism.” Graff Fara (2009) argues that, by rejecting World Haecceitism, cheap haecceitism cannot satisfactorily interpret modal logic enriched with an actuality operator. Kment (2012) also argues that cheap haecceitism delivers an inadequate treatment of chances and counterfactuals, while Stalnaker (2008: 69–71) suggests that semantic considerations support World Haecceitism over cheap haecceitism. On early challenges to counterpart theory, see Kripke (1980) and Hazen (1979). On counterpart theory, actuality, and haecceitism, see Baltimore (2014), Cowling (2013), and Russell (2013a, 2013b).

2. Haecceities and Haecceitism

This section discusses the connection between haecceitism and haecceities as well as some of the central issues regarding haecceities and other non-qualitative properties.

Consider once again the haecceitistic possibility according to which you do not exist and a different individual, Double, instantiates all of your actual qualitative properties. A natural way to describe this possibility is as one where the distribution of qualitative properties is just as it actually is, but where non-qualitative properties are distributed differently. In particular, this alleged possibility is one according to which your haecceity goes uninstantiated and the haecceity of a non-actual individual, Double, is instantiated in its place.

Since haecceities like being Napoleon and being identical to Socrates are properties uniquely tied to specific individuals, haecceitistic differences are naturally explained in terms of differences in the distribution of haecceities. These properties, sometimes called “thisnesses” or “individual essences”, are typically thought to have the existence of the relevant individuals as a necessary and sufficient condition for their instantiation. So, for example, if Napoleon exists, then, necessarily, exactly one thing, Napoleon, instantiates being Napoleon and, if Napoleon does not exist, nothing instantiates being Napoleon. In addition, facts about the distribution of other non-qualitative properties—e.g., being five feet from Napoleon—are necessitated by the distribution of haecceities and qualitative properties. (Here, talk of ‘properties’ should be interpreted in the broad sense including monadic properties as well as \(n\)-adic relations.) Most haecceitistic differences will therefore involve differences in the distribution of haecceities as well as additional non-qualitative properties like being five feet from Napoleon.

While haecceitistic differences are commonly explained in terms of the distribution of haecceities, haecceitism is not merely the view that haecceities exist. To see why, notice that nominalists who deny the existence of properties might nevertheless accept the modal commitments of haecceitism, claiming that things could have been different non-qualitatively without being different qualitatively. In addition, those who affirm the existence of haecceities and other non-qualitative properties might still go on to reject the distinctive modal commitments of haecceitism (e.g., denying that things could differ non-qualitatively without differing qualitatively). So, although it is common for haecceitists to posit haecceities and employ them in characterizing haecceitistic differences, haecceitism is, in principle, independent of realism about haecceities given haecceitism’s ineliminable modal component.

Although haecceitism is not merely realism about haecceities, the metaphysics of haecceities and non-qualitative properties is still relevant for understanding haecceitism. Perhaps most importantly, some account of the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction is needed to interpret the thesis of haecceitism. Typically, this distinction is introduced by way of example with haecceities like being Napoleon taken as paradigmatic non-qualitative properties and properties like mass and charge taken as paradigmatic qualitative properties. When moving beyond these examples, other non-qualitative properties are usually held to share haecceities’ dependence upon specific individuals. For example, being five feet from Napoleon is plausibly thought to require the existence of Napoleon while a qualitative property like being five grams mass requires the existence of no specific individual. Terminologically, non-qualitative properties exhibiting this kind of dependence are sometimes labeled “impure properties”, “identity properties”, or “haecceitistic properties”, where “haecceity” is usually reserved properties like being Napoleon.

Attempts at a philosophical analysis of the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction often take the connection between non-qualitative properties and specific individuals as a starting point. For example, Hawthorne (2006: 8) says: “haecceitistic properties—such as being identical to John or being the daughter of Jim—are those which, in some intuitive way, make direct reference to a particular individual(s).” But, while rough characterizations of this sort leave the (non-)qualitative status of other kinds of properties indeterminate or unclear, reductive analyses have been proposed with the aim of providing a comprehensive account of the distinction. Adams (1979: 7–9) considers an account of the distinction that ties non-qualitative properties to certain kinds of linguistic items. Lewis (1986, 2002) endorses views on which qualitative properties supervene upon or are appropriately definable in terms of a distinctive class of “perfectly natural properties.” Still other views—e.g., Rosenkrantz (1979)—aim to analyze the dependence of non-qualitative properties on individuals and distinguish non-qualitative properties in terms of this dependence. In contrast, Diekemper (2009) and Cowling (2015) endorse primitivism about the distinction between qualitative and non-qualitative properties, taking it instead as irreducible or metaphysically fundamental. But, regardless of one’s preferred view of the distinction, some account is owed of the qualitative status of non-paradigmatic cases including modal properties like being possibly a statue, broadly logical properties like being self-identical, and, for those impressed by the analogies between individuals and species, certain kind properties like being a tiger. (See Cowling (2015), Hoffmann-Kolss (2018), Simmons (2020), and Plate (2022) on the distinction.)

Debates about the metaphysical status of haecceities are also bound up with more general debates about the nature of properties—e.g., whether properties are universals or tropes, in re or ante rem entities, sparse or abundant, and so on. But, regardless of one’s preferred view about the metaphysics of properties, haecceities do seem to have some distinctive features. Unlike most other properties, haecceities are not typically thought to be multiply instantiable—i.e., there is exactly one possible object that can instantiate being Napoleon—and, as commonly conceived, haecceities do not (without auxiliary assumptions) ground qualitative resemblance. So, if one holds that all properties must be multiply instantiable or ground qualitative resemblance, then one must either reject haecceities or opt for a disunified metaphysics of properties. (On some competing views of the metaphysical role of haecceities, see Diekemper (2015).)

Within leading views of properties, various options are available for developing a metaphysics of haecceities. For example, in an effort to assimilate haecceities into a class nominalist ontology where properties are identified with sets, Lewis (1986: 225) characterizes haecceities as follows: “So we get properties that are in no way qualitatively delineated, and some of these are haecceities of this- and other-worldly individuals. A unit set of an individual is one especially stringent haecceity. Also, for any individual and any counterpart relation, there is the set of that individual together with all its counterparts, and this is a less strict sort of haecceity.” The resulting view takes our talk of haecceities to slide between talk of properties distinctive to each worldbound individual and talk of properties shared by individuals unified by a common counterpart relation. (On the broader conception, haecceities are non-qualitative in nature, while, on the narrower conception, haecceities end up being qualitative, provided there are no qualitatively indiscernible worlds.) In contrast to this Lewisian view, other views attribute a more significant metaphysical role to haecceities, taking haecceities to individuate or determine the identity of entities and therefore figure into a metaphysical explanation of facts about identity and individuation. (Bowers and Wallace (2018) present an argument against certain conceptions of haecceities and their theoretical role. See Skiles (2019) for a response.)

Views that take haecceities to provide metaphysical explanations of the identity of individuals suggest a noteworthy connection between haecceitism and fundamentality. In particular, if we assume that the stock of the world’s fundamental properties (provided there are such properties) suffices to fix the distribution of absolutely all properties, then haecceitism guarantees that qualitative properties cannot, on their own, fix the distribution of non-qualitative properties like haecceities. As a consequence, haecceitism points toward the conclusion that some non-qualitative properties are fundamental. So, for those who hold that fundamental properties are exclusively qualitative, either the assumed conception of fundamentality or haecceitism must be rejected. For the committed haecceitist, a remaining option admits fundamental qualitative as well as fundamental non-qualitative properties. On the fundamentality of non-qualitative properties, see Bacon (2019) and Simmons (2021).

A further notable debate about the metaphysics of haecceities concerns their modal status. Some, like Plantinga (1974), take haecceities to exist necessarily. So, while being Napoleon goes uninstantiated in possible worlds without Napoleon, it nevertheless exists in such worlds. According to other views like that of Adams (1981), haecceities are contingent existents, existing only in those worlds where their bearers exist. So, although being Napoleon actually exists, it neither exists nor is instantiated at worlds without Napoleon. For discussion of this debate and cognate ones, see McMichael (1983) and Diekemper (2015).

On the general metaphysics of haecceities, see Adams (1979, 1981), Cover and O’Leary-Hawthorne (1997), Lewis (1986), Swinburne (1995), and Rosenkrantz (1993). On epistemological and metaphysical issues about haecceities—e.g., whether individuals can be acquainted with the haecceities of other individuals—see Rosenkrantz (1993). On haecceities and the identity of indiscernibles, see Robinson (2000). On haecceities of mathematical entities and their role in mathematical structuralism, see Shapiro (2006: 139) and Menzel (2018). See McDaniel (2017: 193–194) for discussion of how haecceities might be identified with individual ways of being.

3. Haecceitism and Essentialism

Haecceitism and essentialism are controversial theses about de re modality. This section briefly introduces essentialism and then examines its interaction with haecceitism.

The essential properties of an individual are properties it cannot exist without instantiating. In contrast, its accidental properties are those properties that are not essential to it. (According to the modal view of essence, this modal characterization of essential properties provides necessary and sufficient conditions for essentiality. On non-modal views, this characterization merely captures a necessary condition. See Fine (1994) for the case against the modal view.)

Essentialist theses claim that certain kinds of properties are essential to certain kinds of individuals. For example, according to origin essentialism, biological individuals have their biological origins essentially. Origin essentialism therefore requires that an individual like George W. Bush have his actual biological origins—in this case, Barbara and George H.W. Bush—in any possible world in which it exists. (On origin essentialism, see Kripke (1979) and Robertson (1998). On other essentialisms, see Cartwright (1968) and Mackie (2006). For a comprehensive discussion of varieties of essentialism, see Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri (2021).)

Essentialist theses come in “stronger” and “weaker” forms. Weaker, less interesting forms of essentialism require that all individuals instantiate indiscriminate properties like being self-identical or being such that \(2+2=4\). (Again, non-modalists like Fine (1994) deny these necessary properties are properly counted as essential to all entities even while being such that \(2+2=4\) might be essential to the number two.) Stronger, more interesting versions of essentialism like origin essentialism ascribe distinctive essential properties to individuals. The strongest form of essentialism is hyperessentialism, according to which each individual has all of its properties essentially. So, for any individual, there is only way that that individual can be.

Intuitively, essentialism limits the de re possibilities for individuals, while haecceitism extends the de re possibilities for individuals by admitting contentious possibilities—e.g., the possibility where you swap qualitative roles with Obama. It is important to note, however, that even the strongest versions of essentialism, hyperessentialism, do not rule out haecceitism. For, while hyperessentialism does rule out haecceitistic differences where you have different properties, it does not rule out a “mass replacement”—i.e., an alternative maximal possibility where wholly different individuals occupy each of the qualitative roles occupied in the actual world. These maximal possibilities differ haecceitistically even while there is no violation of essence, since no individual exists according to more than a single world. (Those who reject possibilities involving non-actual or “alien” individuals would, however, have the makings of an argument from hyperessentialism to anti-haecceitism.) Although essentialism provides no direct argument against haecceitism, hyperessentialism and other strong versions of essentialism do preclude certain kinds of haecceitistic differences where individuals “swap” qualitative roles. For example, just as hyperessentialism rules out any haecceitistic possibilities where you have a different qualitative role, origin essentialism rules out haecceitistic differences that involve organisms having anything other than their actual biological origins. For this reason, a commitment to strong versions of essentialism will constrain the range of admissible haecceitistic differences.

Weak forms of essentialism have few consequences for haecceitism. Moreover, the thesis that individuals have their haecceities essentially is often taken as a prerequisite for a commitment to haecceitism, since the thesis sometimes called “extreme haecceitism” holds that haecceities are the only essential properties of individuals aside from perfectly general properties instantiated by all entities (e.g., being self-identical). According to extreme haecceitists, not only could Napoleon have been a poached egg, the world could have been qualitatively just as it actually is but such that a poached egg and Napoleon swap their respective qualitative roles. Extreme haecceitism is therefore among the most permissive views about de re modality and admits possibilities where you occupy the qualitative roles of a poached egg. For this reason, extreme haecceitism is often (albeit confusingly) classified as a version of “anti-essentialism”, by virtue of denying that individuals have distinctive essences apart from their respective haecceities. (On anti-essentialism and extreme haecceitism, see Heller (2005), Stalnaker (1979), and Lewis (1986). See Mackie (2006) for a defense of “minimal essentialism”, according to which individuals have their haecceities and belong to their ontological categories like property or object essentially.) At the same time, extreme haecceitism is typically paired with a commitment to the necessity of identity and distinctness and therefore rules out possibilities according to which actually distinct objects are one and the same. A yet more permissive view about de re modality might abandon this commitment, taking even the identity and distinctness of individuals as accidental. (On whether anti-essentialism is best paired with the necessity of identity and distinctness, see Nelson (2006). On indvidual essences, see Losonsky (1987).)

Finally, while essentialism holds certain properties as necessary for being a specific individual, related “sufficiency” theses might hold certain properties to be sufficient for being a particular individual. If, for example, we take Obama’s actual qualitative role to be a sufficient condition for an object to be identical to Obama, we thereby rule out possibilities according to which some other individual occupies Obama’s qualitative role. (Sufficiency theses of this sort can be hammered into essentialist theses by holding individuals like Obama to have essential properties like occupying the qualitative role of the President in 2014 if the world is qualitatively as it actually is.) Theses of this kind play a notable role in certain essentialist arguments—e.g., in certain arguments for origin essentialism—but it remains unclear how such principles might be used to offer a non-question-begging argument against haecceitism. (For discussion of sufficiency principles, see McKay (1986) and Robertson (1998).)

As just noted, no familiar version of essentialism provides a direct argument against absolutely all haecceitistic differences, although strong versions of essentialism will limit the range of admissible haecceitistic differences. In addition, haecceitists typically assume at least a modest form of essentialism according to which individuals have their haecceities essentially.

4. Arguments for Haecceitism

This section surveys arguments for haecceitism. The most familiar of these are conceivability arguments, which appeal to the apparent conceivability or imaginability of maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically. Another line of defense takes the form of an argument usually called “Chisholm’s Paradox”, which exploits incremental modal variations in order to defend haecceitistic differences. In addition, one might endorse haecceitism, not on the strength of any distinctive argument, but by a more general appeal to modal intuition, according to which haecceitistic differences simply seem possible. This survey of arguments leaves aside the general issues in modal epistemology raised by appeals to modal intuition, focusing instead on conceivability arguments for haecceitism and Chisholm’s Paradox.

Note, also, that these arguments are most naturally taken as arguments for Possibility Haecceitism rather than, say, World Haecceitism. So understood, the Lewisian “cheap haecceitist” can, in principle, accept the conclusions of these arguments even while denying such arguments establish the existence of qualitatively indiscernible possible worlds.

4.1. Conceivability Arguments for Haecceitism

Conceivability arguments for haecceitism have two steps. The first step requires our success in conceiving or imagining certain states of affairs. The second step requires an inference from the relevant conceiving or imagining to the possibility of the states of affairs in question. Among the wide variety of conceivability arguments for haecceitism, some vary with respect to the kind of conceivability or imagination required, while others vary with respect to the kinds of states of affairs involved. (Cowling (2017) offers a taxonomy of these arguments.) This section sets out some conceivability arguments offered in the literature with some limited remarks about their salient differences.

Black (1952) offers a now-famous conceivability argument against the Identity of Indiscernibles, which appeals to the apparent conceivability of a world containing only two indiscernible iron spheres. In defending haecceitism, a natural strategy is to extend Black’s case by arguing that, not only can we conceive of a world containing only two indiscernible iron spheres, we can conceive of distinct worlds that differ only insofar as these spheres swap their spatial locations. (Jubien (1993: 41–42) discusses an argument of this sort.) A closely related argument holds that we can conceive of a pair of worlds in which some pair of spheres has been replaced by some other pair of spheres. Granted the conceivability of the states of affairs in question, haecceitism follows. (A related line of argument, owing to Adams (1979), is considered below.)

Other arguments appeal to similar states of affairs featuring qualitatively indiscernible objects or regions. For example, Melia (2003: 162) presents a conceivability argument that requires us to conceive of a world that contains a single cylinder on a qualitatively homogeneous plane. Intuitively, there are many possible directions in which the cylinder could fall, but, since there is no qualitative variation between these possibilities, they can be distinguished only haecceitistically—i.e., with respect to the identity of which regions of the plane are occupied by the fallen cylinder.

Unlike the preceding arguments, some conceivability arguments involve a kind of “inside” or “first-personal” imagination that requires imagining a state of affairs from the perspective of a specific conscious individual. Compare, for example, the act of imagining Napoleon defeated at Waterloo “from above” with the act of imagining being Napoleon defeated at Waterloo from the perspective of Napoleon. The distinction between these imaginative acts is commonly taken as a distinction between imagining from the outside and imagining from the inside. If we help ourselves to this distinction, it is plausible to view several conceivability arguments as relying upon imagination from the inside rather than imagination from the outside. (On the distinction between inside and outside imagination, see Nichols (2008), Ninan (2009), Peacocke (1985), and Velleman (1996).)

Lewis (1986: 227) offers an argument of this sort, which we can take to involve our imagining a world of one-way eternal recurrence where the history of the actual world repeats itself ad infinitum. Lewis then suggests that we can successfully imagine ourselves occupying different “epochs”—specific recurrences of history from the inside. And, since we can imagine ourselves occupying different epochs, he concludes that some possibilities differ solely with respect to whether one lives in, say, the seventeenth rather than the fortieth epoch. In addition, Lewis (1983, 1986: 239) suggests another conceivability argument that seems to require us imagining living as one of a pair of twins. (Whether Lewis thinks any robust imaginative undertaking is required here is unclear, but the general features of this particular kind of conceivability argument is our interest here.) And, since we can equally well imagine living as the firstborn twin and as the second-born twin while holding the qualitative character of the world fixed, it seems that we can successfully imagine possibilities that differ only haecceitistically.

Another kind of conceivability argument requires us to imagine our nonexistence in a world qualitatively indiscernible from actuality. Different views of imagination will deliver importantly different verdicts about how, if at all, we might succeed in this imaginative undertaking. (It is hard, for example, to see how we might successfully imagine our own nonexistence from the inside.) But, among others, Bricker (2007: 130) suggests that a plausible view of de re modality must accommodate the possibility of oneself failing to exist even while things are qualitatively just as they actually are. (On Bricker’s view, this requires only a sufficiently rich account of counterpart relations rather than, say, qualitatively indiscernible possible worlds. On imagining one’s own nonexistence, see Nichols (2007).)

A final conceivability argument usefully illustrates the intuitive difference between arguments that rely solely upon outside imagination and those invoking inside imagination. Adams (1979: 22) presents the following conceivability argument:

Consider, again, a possible world \(w_{1}\), in which there are two qualitatively indiscernible globes; call them Castor and Pollux. Being indiscernible, they have of course the same duration; in \(w_{1}\) both of them have always existed and always will exist. But it seems perfectly possible, logically and metaphysically, that either or both of them cease to exist. Let \(w_{2}\), then, be a possible world just like \(w_{1}\) up to a certain time \(t\) at which in \(w_{2}\) Castor ceases to exist while Pollux goes on forever; and let \(w_{3}\) be a possible world just like \(w_{2}\) except that in \(w_{3}\) it is Pollux that ceases to exist at \(t\) while Castor goes on forever. That the difference between \(w_{2}\) and \(w_{3}\) is real, and could be important, becomes vividly clear if we consider that, from the point of view of a person living on Castor before \(t\) in \(w_{1}\) and having (of course) an indiscernible twin on Pollux, it can be seen as the difference between being annihilated and somebody else being annihilated instead. But there is no qualitative difference between \(w_{2}\) and \(w_{3}\).

Adams explicitly marks the move from outside to inside imagination, noting that the haecceitistic difference “becomes vividly clear” when we imagine the relevant states of affairs from the perspective of the individuals involved. (See Melia (1999: 650) for a similar argument.)

In addressing these and other conceivability arguments for haecceitism, anti-haecceitists have two primary lines of defense. According to the first kind of response, the evidential connection between conceivability and possibility is rejected—e.g., by denying that conceivability of the relevant state of affairs is grounds for taking the state of affairs in question to be possible.

According to a second line of response, the apparent conceivability of the relevant states of affairs is merely apparent. To this end, the anti-haecceitist denies that individuals successfully conceive of or imagine the states of affairs required to establish haecceitism. Responses of this sort hold agents to be mistaken about the content of their imaginings and, as a consequence, mistaken in believing themselves to conceive of states of affairs that differ haecceitistically.

4.2. Chisholm’s Paradox

Chisholm’s Paradox, presented in Chisholm (1967), begins innocuously enough. Suppose that individuals are identical across possible worlds such that de re modal claims like “Fred could have been taller” are true only in case there is some possible world where the very same individual, in this case, Fred, is taller than he is in the actual world. Now, consider that two actual individuals, Adam and Noah, could have had slightly different qualitative properties. For example, Adam, instead of dying at age 930, could have died at age 931. Similarly, Noah, instead of dying at age 950, could have died at age 949. If Adam and Noah can tolerate these incremental “changes” to each of their qualitative profiles, it seems that had they been a different way than they actually are, they could have tolerated even further incremental changes.

Now, if we allow incremental possible changes to the ways that Adam and Noah could have been and accept the transitivity of identity, we are committed to a finite series of incremental changes that ends in a possible world where Adam has all the qualitative properties Noah actually has and Noah has all the qualitative properties that Adam actually has. This is because the relevant iterated modal claim “Adam could have been such that he could have been such that he could have been such” is, by our initial assumption, true in virtue of one and the same individual, Adam, existing at different possible worlds. So, if Adam and Noah could be incrementally different and the individuals they could have been could also be incrementally different, we must accept that Adam and Noah could “swap” their respective qualitative properties. And, if so, there is a maximal possibility that differs from actuality only in haecceitistic terms—that is, it differs only in terms of which individuals instantiate which qualitative profiles.

We can clarify Chisholm’s Paradox as a particular schema of modal inference. This schema involves a two-place predicate that relates an individual and either their actual qualitative properties (represented as \(p_{1})\) or their possible qualitative properties (represented as successors up to \(p_{n})\), where differences between \(p_{X}\) and \(p_{X+1}\) are small increments of qualitative properties. In this way, Chisholm’s Paradox purports to establish that a particular individual might have had different qualitative properties and, through iteration and the transitivity of identity, that it might have had precisely the qualitative properties some other individual actually has. Following Salmon (1986) and Forbes (1984), we can present Chisholm’s Paradox as follows:

  • (P1) \(M(a, p_{1})\)
  • (P2) \(\Box(M(a, p_{1}) \rightarrow \Diamond M(a, p_{2}))\)
  • (P3) \(\Box(M(a, p_{2}) \rightarrow \Diamond M(a, p_{3}))\)
  • (P\(n\)) \(\Box(M(a, p_{n-1}) \rightarrow \Diamond M(a, p_{n}))\)
  • (C1) \(\Diamond M(a, p_{n})\)

In the version presented in Chisholm (1967), \(M\) is the relation instantiates each member of; \(a\) is the individual Adam; \(p_{1}\) is the set of Adam’s actual qualitative properties; \(p_{n}\) is the set of Noah’s actual qualitative properties. Chisholm’s Paradox therefore involves

  1. a claim about the actual world, P1,
  2. a lengthy yet finite series of apparently innocuous claims about how individuals could have been slightly different than they are, and
  3. the conclusion that Adam could have all the actual qualitative properties instantiated by Noah.

If Chisholm’s Paradox is sound, the conclusion that Adam could occupy Noah’s qualitative role entails haecceitism. This is because Noah’s qualitative properties include, not only Noah’s intrinsic properties, but also Noah’s extrinsic properties (e.g., being such that there are seven continents), which suffice to fix the qualitative character of the world. As result, if Adam could instantiate Noah’s actual qualitative properties, then the world in which he does so must be qualitatively just like the actual world. Such a possibility therefore entails that some maximal possibilities differ haecceitistically.

If successful, Chisholm’s Paradox seems to establish not only haecceitism, but also an extreme form of “anti-essentialism” like extreme haecceitism. Since we can construct a “Chisholm-sequence” with any two individuals, unqualified endorsement of Chisholm’s Paradox guarantees that, for any individuals, there is a possible world where those individuals swap their qualitative profiles. For instance, there would be a possible world where Obama occupies the qualitative profile of the Eiffel Tower and vice versa. As a result, neither the Eiffel Tower nor Obama can have any distinctive qualitative properties essentially.

While some have taken haecceitism and this anti-essentialism (or “minimal essentialism”) to be a natural package, it is important to note that they are separate conclusions. One might reject certain instances of Chisholm’s Paradox that involve teacups swapping qualitative roles with tornadoes, but admit that other instances succeed in showing that distinct teacups might have swapped their qualitative roles. Despite this, responses to Chisholm’s Paradox are typically motivated by efforts to sustain a commitment to essentialism rather than avoid commitment to haecceitism. To this end, some follow Salmon (1986) in holding the assumption of an \(\mathbf{S5}\) modal logic that validates \(\Diamond P\rightarrow \Box \Diamond P\) as the underlying culprit. (Salmon (1989, 1993) rejects, not only \(\mathbf{S5}\), but \(\mathbf{S4}\) and \(\mathbf{B}\) axioms.) Such responses opt for a weaker logic that avoids (at least) the transitivity of the accessibility relation between possible worlds. Other responses turn on the finer points of de re representation. For example, while Lewis’ counterpart theory can, in non-standard contexts, accommodate anti-essentialism, the fact that our ordinary contextual standards rule out extreme de re possibilities is explained by the intransitivity of the counterpart relation between individuals. Another potential response to Chisholm’s Paradox would be akin to those offered in dealing with the sorites—e.g., holding that some premises of Chisholm’s Paradox are false even while we are in no position to specify precisely which ones. Yet another line of response takes Chisholm’s Paradox to deliver the correct verdict: there are no interesting qualitative essential properties of individuals. For example, some like Mackie (2006) take Chisholm’s Paradox to lend support to a minimal essentialist view, according to which any object might occupy any given qualitative role, provided it retains its non-qualitative haecceity. See Bassford (2020) and Dorr, Hawthorne, and Yli-Vakkuri (2021: 122-219) for additional discussion.

5. Arguments against Haecceitism

This section surveys arguments for anti-haecceitism. It is worth noting, however, that for many anti-haecceitists, the denial that any maximal possibilities differ haecceitistically issues from a broader commitment regarding ontology or modality. (Anti-haecceitists include Dasgupta (2009), Forbes (1985), and Robinson (1989: 400).) Consider, for example, generalism, according to which there are no individuals. Instead, the world is exhaustively general, comprising facts about the distribution of qualitative properties without any facts about individuals. Since haecceitism presupposes that there are maximal possibilities that differ solely regarding the identity of individuals, generalism thereby rules out haecceitism. (On generalism, see Dasgupta (2009), Turner (2017), and Russell (2018). For discussion of how generalists might accommodate haecceitism, see Diehl (2022).) Similarly, necessitarians hold that there are no non-actual maximal possibilities. Consequently, all truths are necessarily true, so there is only one way things could have been. And, since haecceitism requires that there are distinct maximal possibilities, necessitarianism rules out haecceitism.

Other broad metaphysical commitments have also been claimed to support anti-haecceitism. Armstrong (1989: 57–61) claims that anti-haecceitism best squares with his antecedent naturalist and combinatorialist commitments. And, just as modal intuition is commonly taken as the grounds for endorsing haecceitism, modal intuition is very often taken as grounds for endorsing anti-haecceitism. For example, while Hofweber (2005: 27) is officially neutral on haecceitism, he nicely summarizes the standard anti-haecceitist appeal to modal intuition:

After all, could it really be that after God specified what kinds of things there are and what purely qualitative properties and relations these things instantiate, he still had many options left open about which objects should exist in such a world? Could God have created a world exactly like ours in all qualitative respects, but with the only difference that the thing which actually is Bush would be Clinton and the other way round? And could God thus create infinitely many worlds that are qualitatively identical and differ only in which objects exist in them? It seems not.

Anti-haecceitists who appeal to modal intuitions in this way owe some response to the arguments set out in the previous section. Moreover, since modal intuitions of haecceitists and anti-haecceitists are at direct odds, assessing the evidential weight and proper assessment of these intuitions points towards deep methodological waters. But, rather than taking up these issues, it will be useful to focus on two direct lines of arguments for anti-haecceitism.

5.1. Against Bare Identities

One important argument against haecceitism turns on issues about the grounding of identity facts—i.e., facts about the identity of individuals. Set out in Forbes (1985: 128), this argument holds haecceitism to require what we can call bare identity facts, where such facts concern the identity of individuals but are not grounded in the qualitative features of the world. Since these identity facts can vary without any difference in qualitative character, they are alleged to resist metaphysical explanation. On this front, Forbes remarks as follows:

Consider the supposition that things could have been exactly as they are except that the steel tower in Paris opposite the Palais de Chaillot is different from the one actually there. To make sense of this supposition, it is not permitted to imagine that the tower is made of different metal from the metal which actually constitutes it, or that it has a different design, or designer, or history. The only respect in which the imagined situation is to differ from the actual world is in the identity of the tower. The extent to which such a difference seems unintelligible is some measure of the plausibility of the view that transworld differences must be grounded.

On one construal of Forbes’ argument, haecceitistic differences are unintelligible and therefore objectionable because all identity facts must be grounded in facts about the qualitative character of the world. Accordingly, Forbes’ argument requires a commitment to the sufficiency of qualitative facts to account for all facts about the identity of individuals. Such a commitment rules out haecceitistic differences, but raises questions about the tenability of the relevant constraint on identity facts. What, if anything, can be taken to ground the facts about the identity of qualitative properties? And, if there are at least some ungrounded identity facts, what precisely makes bare identity facts objectionable? (On Forbes’ argument, see Bricker (1988), Yablo (1988), and Mackie (2007).) Although the denial of bare identities is not strictly equivalent to the denial of haecceitism, it is a small step from the former to the latter. Accordingly, some commentators have raised concerns that an argument for anti-haecceitism premised upon objections to bare identities is at risk of begging the question. On the general question of whether identity facts admit of explanation, see Shumener (2020).

5.2. Arguments from the Identity of Indiscernibles

The Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (hereafter, PII) holds that, if any objects share all the same properties, these objects are identical. To avoid triviality, PII is typically interpreted with the domain of properties restricted to what are usually taken to be qualitative properties. (On PII, see Rodriguez-Pererya (2010, 2022), Hawley (2009) and Della Rocca (2005).)

Since haecceitistic differences concern qualitatively indiscernible possibilities, it is tempting to think that, since PII rules out the existence of qualitatively indiscernible objects, it thereby undermines haecceitism. Assessing this line of argument raises issues about the proper formulation of PII as well as radically different views about the nature of possible worlds. To see how these issues hang together, it is useful to first consider how PII might be used to argue against haecceitism within the context of Lewisian Modal Realism. In doing so, two versions of PII need to be distinguished.

According to the first version regarding objects within a given world, PII-Objects, there are no qualitatively indiscernible objects within a single possible world. PII-Objects therefore rules out states of affairs like those suggested in Black (1952) involving qualitatively indiscernible iron spheres. Although PII-Objects ensures that no object has a qualitatively indiscernible worldmate, it is neutral on whether or not there are qualitatively indiscernible worlds, leaving open whether there are distinct yet qualitatively indiscernible worlds.

A second version of PII, PII-Worlds, concerns possible worlds themselves rather than the individuals within them. It holds that there are no distinct yet qualitatively indiscernible worlds, but it is neutral on whether there are qualitatively indiscernible individuals within a single world. PII-Worlds therefore leaves open whether there are worlds like Blacks’ two-sphere scenario in which there are distinct qualitatively indiscernible objects.

Having now distinguished these principles, we can consider whether either provides an argument against haecceitism. As Lewis (1986: 224) notes, PII-Objects leaves haecceitism untouched, since it is compatible with the possibility of qualitatively indiscernible worlds that differ haecceitistically. And, while PII-Worlds rules out qualitatively indiscernible worlds rather than objects within worlds, Lewis’ cheap haecceitism still permits the representation of maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically even without positing qualitatively indiscernible worlds. It looks, then, like PII is not a plausible starting point for a case against Possibility Haecceitism within Lewisian Modal Realism.

Does an argument against haecceitism on the basis of PII fare any better within an ersatz view of possible worlds? It’s tough to say. As noted in Section One, different versions of ersatzism deliver different verdicts about whether possible worlds are qualitatively indiscernible from one another. For example, if one holds that all propositions are qualitatively indiscernible, an unrestricted application of PII will cause broad problems for such a view—e.g., by ruling out the existence of more than a single possible world. On other ersatzist views, according to which possible worlds have distinctive qualitative characters even while they represent maximal possibilities that differ haecceitistically, PII will not rule out a commitment to haecceitism. In light of these consequences, PII would need to be applied, not to the possible worlds of the ersatzist, but, rather, to the possibilities they represent. And, of course, if the ersatzist denies that there are maximal possibilities that differ without differing qualitatively, they reject haecceitism. But, since the relevant principle used to undercut haecceitism is not, strictly speaking, PII regarding objects or worlds but instead possibilities, it is unclear whether it merely collapses into the straightforward denial of haecceitism. A worry, then, is that the version of PII that suffices to undercut haecceitism is so close to the thesis of anti-haecceitism that any argument that proceeds from such a principle merely begs the question. In addition, it is unclear if such a principle can be plausibly motivated without leading to objectionable modal commitments by requiring one to reject the kinds of possibilities that Black (1952) notes. (On the case for Black-style possibilities involving qualitatively indiscernible objects, see Adams (1979: 17–19).)

6. Restricting Haecceitism

The preceding arguments aim to show that there are no haecceitistic differences of any kind between maximal possibilities. Other arguments are narrower in scope and aim to establish a weaker thesis: that certain kinds of haecceitistic differences are spurious. If successful, these arguments will rule out only some kinds of haecceitistic differences while falling short of providing a perfectly general case against haecceitism. To get a sense of restricted or domain-specific (anti-)haecceitisms, it will be useful to focus on one example where restricted, domain-specific theses of haecceitism or anti-haecceitism play a notable role in a core metaphysical debate.

Consider the kind of possibility exploited in a rough approximation of Leibniz’s shift argument against absolute space: If absolute space exists, then there is a non-actual possibility, according to which all actual objects are uniformly shifted five feet from their actual spatial positions. Such a possibility—let us suppose—differs only haecceitistically from actuality. (For more on haecceitism and spacetime, see Section 7 and the references therein. On Leibnizian shift arguments, see Russell (2014).)

In considering this alleged possibility, a range of responses are available: For those who believe realism about space requires accepting such possibilities, but find such possibilities incredible, the denial of absolute space is an available response. For other realists about absolute space unbothered by haecceitistic differences, the possibility in question poses no challenge. Still others might retain realism about absolute space yet deny this apparent possibility is a genuine one. The most natural strategy here is to claim that certain kinds of haecceitistic differences—specifically, those that involve merely a shift in spatial position—do not correspond to genuinely distinct possibilities. Importantly, this third strategy does not rule out haecceitistic differences per se, but requires at least a domain-specific anti-haecceitism, according to which there are no haecceitistic differences regarding regions of absolute space.

In response to arguments that broach the question of haecceitism in a limited domain, useful debate requires us to distinguish the scope of different versions of haecceitism and the distinctive motivations of domain-specific (anti-)haecceitisms. Naturally, one might accept certain kinds of haecceitistic differences while rejecting others. For example, while one might accept possibilities according to which two twins swap qualitative roles, one might deny that you and Obama could swap their respective roles. In addition, even those who accept these haecceitistic differences regarding humans can deny that you could have swapped qualitative roles with your singleton set or the Milky Way galaxy. The question that arises for those unswayed by blanket arguments against haecceitism is to determine which putative haecceitistic differences between possibilities are to be admitted. Characterizing this or that view as committed to haecceitism simpliciter can therefore prove unhelpful without a specification of the precise haecceitistic differences admitted.

7. Connections to Haecceitism

Haecceitism has consequences for a range of issues in metaphysics and the philosophy of language. This section provides a brief overview of some of the ways in which haecceitism proves most significant.

7.1 Haecceitism & Quidditism

Quidditism is the property-theoretic analogue of haecceitism. (Armstrong (1989: 59) seems to coin the term ‘quidditism.’) But, while distinctively haecceitistic possibilities involve individuals being “swapped” or “replaced” without any qualitative difference, distinctively quidditistic possibilities involve properties swapping or replacing one another in the world’s causal-nomic structure. If, for example, there is a maximal possibility, otherwise indiscernible from actuality, where mass and charge swap their respective causal-nomic roles (e.g., where objects resist acceleration in virtue of their charge), this maximal possibility would differ quidditistically from actuality. Similarly, if there is a maximal possibility according to which all actual causal-nomic facts are the same except that some actually uninstantiated property, schmass, occupies the causal and nomic role of mass, this maximal possibility would also differ quidditistically from actuality. (Typically, quidditism is taken as a thesis about fundamental or “sparse” properties like mass and charge rather than as a thesis about all properties whatsoever.)

Like haecceitism, quidditism’s proper formulation is contentious and depends heavily upon background metaphysical assumptions. Some formulations of quidditism invoke either maximal possibilities or possible worlds, while modalist formulations of quidditism do without either resource. Additionally, there is a quidditistic analogue of cheap haecceitism, according to which a given possible world represents various maximal possibilities that differ only quidditistically. (On formulations of quidditism and property counterpart theory, see Hawthorne (2002b) and Heller (2002, 2005).)

Arguments for quidditism have notable parallels with arguments for haecceitism. Some quidditists suggest that our pedestrian modal judgments support quidditism (see, e.g., Lewis (2009: 209), while other defenses of quidditism can appeal to the apparent conceivability of scenarios where properties swap their causal-nomic roles. Additionally, Bird (2007: 74–76) considers but rejects a property-theoretic analogue of Chisholm’s Paradox that, if successful, establishes quidditism. A different line of argument, which has no direct analogue in the case of haecceitism, appeals to combinatorial principles regarding the nature of modality. These combinatorial principles hold that various permutations of fundamental properties across, say, causal nomic roles, correspond to distinct maximal possibilities, which, if genuine, would differ only quidditistically. (See Lewis (2009: 209) for the combinatorial argument and Locke (2010), Schaffer (2005: 10), and Wang (2016) for discussion.)

Arguments against quidditism also appeal to modal intuitions. Black (2000: 94) says, for example, that quidditistic differences are “distinctions which my intuitions tell me are distinctions without differences… My intuition is that to play the nomological role of some colour or flavour is to be that colour or flavour, at that the idea of two qualities swapping nomological roles is thus unintelligible.” Other anti-quidditist arguments turn on its purported epistemological consequences. On this front, some anti-quidditists (as well as some quidditists) hold that quidditism entails that we are irremediably ignorant of the distribution of the world’s fundamental properties. (Lewis (2009) labels the resulting view, “Ramseyan Humility.” On quidditism and humility, see also Bird (2007: 79), Hawthorne (2002b), Locke (2009), Schaffer (2005), Shoemaker (1980), and Whittle (2006).) Additional complaints and concerns about quidditism are diverse in character. Locke (2012) discusses Ockhamist worries about the ontology of quidditism and, specifically, second-order quiddities. Whittle (2006) worries about the epiphenomenal intrinsic nature of properties, given quidditism’s alleged modal consequences. Black (2000) offers a cardinality argument against quidditism, which holds its modal commitments to demand the existence of proper class-many possible worlds. Hawthorne (2002b) considers whether quidditism might ultimately require a kind of “hyperstructuralism”, according to which absolutely any property might swap roles with any other property including the relation of causal necessitation itself. The resulting bizarre possibilities—e.g., where mass and causal necessitation swap roles—would deliver a reductio of quidditism should they prove unavoidable.

Although haecceitism and quidditism are independent theses, since neither strictly entails the other, their evidential relationship is an interesting one. Given the parallels between the arguments for and against them, it is unclear whether haecceitists ought to be quidditists and vice versa or if the metaphysical disanalogies between properties and individuals can justify endorsing one but not the other. (On the analogies and disanalogies between haecceitism and quidditism, see Schaffer (2005: 15–16).)

7.2 Haecceitism & Personal Identity

Debates about personal identity relate to haecceitism in diverse and complex ways. Perhaps most notably, some arguments for the “Simple View” of personal identity (alternatively, the “Further Fact view”), according to which facts about the identity of persons over time are irreducible and non-qualitative, are plausibly taken as arguments for haecceitism. (On anti-reductionism and the Simple View, see Parfit (1984: 210) and Olson (2012).) These arguments exploit so-called “fission cases”, which involve an individual that apparently splits into distinct individuals but without principled grounds for identifying one rather than another of the post-fission individuals with the pre-fission individual. According to some proponents of the Simple View, it seems possible that that the pre-fission individual be identical to one of the post-fission individuals while, in other physically and psychologically indiscernible worlds, the pre-fission individual is identical to an apparently different post-fission individual. If, however, these are each genuine possibilities, facts about the identity of persons over time do not supervene upon any physical or psychological facts. And, since these are the qualitative facts typically held to be relevant to personal identity over time, such cases suggest that facts about personal identity over time do not supervene upon qualitative features. In this way, the Simple View lends support to the more general claim that non-qualitative facts about the identity of persons do not supervene upon qualitative facts.

In addition to its connection to the Simple View, a broader methodological connection unites haecceitism and inquiries into personal identity: a focus on the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction. In debates about personal identity, appeal to exclusively qualitative properties and relations (e.g., having such-and-such psychological features) rather than non-qualitative properties and relations (e.g., having Bob’s memories) is commonly taken as a constraint on a genuinely reductive analysis of personal identity over time. So, just as haecceitism requires clarifying the nature of this metaphysical distinction, criteria for distinguishing the reductive and non-reductive approaches to personal identity also rely heavily on the idea that certain properties are uniquely tied to the identity of individuals. On the connection between haecceitism, the Simple View, and (anti-)reductionist approaches to personal identity, see Ninan (2009).

7.3 Haecceitism & Physicalism

The connection between haecceitism and physicalism is controversial. If we understand physicalism as the unqualified thesis that physical properties like mass and charge exhaustively fix all other properties, haecceitistic differences present a prima facie challenge. For, if some worlds differ haecceitistically but are alike with respect to the distribution of physical properties, then, contrary to physicalism, possible worlds or maximal possibilities can be physically indiscernible yet fail to be indiscernible simpliciter. Moreover, some follow Hofweber (2005) in taking the irreducibility of haecceities and other non-qualitative properties to physical properties to constitute a challenge to more sophisticated conceptions of physicalism. (See Daly and Liggins (2012) and Almotahari and Rochford (2012) on Hofweber’s argument. See Ninan (2009: 433) on haecceitism and its relation to physicalism.)

A different assessment denies that haecceitism and physicalism are in tension with one another by taking the scope of physicalism to be restricted to qualitative properties. So understood, haecceitism has no significance for the fate of physicalism, since haecceitistic differences are purely non-qualitative in character. For those who characterize physicalism as the thesis that worlds that are physical duplicates of one another are duplicates simpliciter, this response is especially plausible, since talk of “duplication” is typically restricted to qualitative properties. (See Stoljar (2010: 136) on the options for formulating physicalism.)

Given the complex interaction between haecceitism and physicalism, a natural strategy for circumventing this issue simply sets aside the question of haecceitism in investigating the status of physicalism. For example, in characterizing physicalism, Chalmers (1996: 367) says: “I will always be considering worlds ‘qualitatively’, and abstracting away from question of ‘haecceity.’ That is, I will count two worlds that are qualitatively identical as identical and will not be concerned with questions about whether individuals in those worlds might have different ‘identities.’” The merits of bracketing the uncertain compatibility of haecceitism and physicalism are significant, but, for views that do hold them to be incompatible, no such strategy will ultimately prove plausible.

7.4 Haecceitism & Spacetime

The Hole Argument against substantivalism purports to show that, given some auxiliary assumptions, substantivalism illicitly requires the truth of indeterminism. (See Norton’s entry on the Hole Argument.) Defenders of the Hole Argument take this commitment to indeterminism to be a consequence of accepting certain models of general relativity as genuinely distinct possibilities for substantival spacetime. The possible models in question are typically held to differ only haecceitistically, so, for substantivalists, anti-haecceitism provides a route for rejecting the possibilities that are alleged to require indeterminism. For committed haecceitists who endorse substantivalism, some alternative strategy is required. One available option is to revise the relevant conception of determinism by taking it as a thesis about qualitatively discernible possibilities rather than possibilities in general. On the resulting revision, indeterminism requires the availability of qualitatively discernible possibilities. As a consequence, admitting possibilities that differ only haecceitistically would have no implications for the status of determinism. Careful attention to the status and scope of haecceitism therefore proves crucial for assessing this argument against substantivalism.

In addition to Norton’s entry on the Hole Argument, see Pooley (2006) for a defense of anti-haecceitism. See Dasgupta (2017) and Russell (2013b) on anti-haecceitism about spacetime, and Brighouse (1994, 1997) and Melia (2009) on haecceitism and determinism.

7.5 Haecceitism & the Philosophy of Language

Haecceitism informs several issues in the philosophy of language primarily through its conventional connection to realism about haecceities. Since haecceities uniquely correspond to individuals, realists about haecceities have a distinctive metaphysical resource for the development of semantic theories. In addition, for realists about haecceities who believe that all properties exist necessarily, haecceities of nonexistent individuals provide an especially natural metaphysical surrogate when explaining the possibility of true and meaningful claims about the individuals in question. So, for example, if one holds that singular terms like ‘Obama’ contribute the haecceity being Obama to the singular proposition expressed by sentences that include ‘Obama’, one can make sense of the truth and meaningfulness of claims regarding Obama in worlds in which Obama does not exist. (On this strategy, see Plantinga (1978: 132).) The general strategy of using haecceities as metaphysical surrogates for individuals has surfaced in debates about the philosophy of time, where, e.g., Markosian (2004: 54–56), considers appropriating haecceities of non-present individuals to address objections to presentism.

Some appeals to haecceities in the philosophy of language are more limited and nuanced—e.g., Hawthorne and Manley (2012: 204) consider the deployment of haecceities and other non-qualitative properties in a semantics for demonstratives—while other applications are more general in scope—e.g., analyses of de re senses or individual concepts in terms of haecceities. (For discussion, see Chisholm (1976: 29).)


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Thanks to Phil Bricker, Ben Caplan, Ed Ferrier, Dan Giberman, Brad Rettler, Brad Skow, Kelly Trogdon, and Jenn Wang for helpful comments in preparing this entry.

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Sam Cowling <sam.cowling@denison.edu>

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