The Possibilism-Actualism Debate

First published Mon Nov 28, 2022

Actualism is a widely-held view in the metaphysics of modality that arises in response to the thesis of possibilism. To understand the motivations for possibilism, consider first that most everyone would agree that things might have been different than they are in fact. For example, no one has free soloed the Dawn Wall route up El Capitan in Yosemite National Park and, given the almost superhuman physical ability and mental strength the feat would require and, more importantly, the massive risk it would entail, it is exceedingly unlikely that anyone ever will. But it is surely possible that someone pulls it off—the Dawn Wall has, after all, been successfully free climbed, so a free solo is not beyond sheer human capacity.[1] Thus, the following assertion (expressed in a somewhat stilted but unambiguous logical form for purposes here) is true:

(1)
Possibly, there is someone who free soloes the Dawn Wall.

Again, the current Pope (as of November 2022) Jorge Bergoglio, although childless, might have well have had children; instead of the priesthood, he could have chosen, say, tango dancing as his profession and married his longtime dance partner. So it is true that

(2)
Possibly, there is someone who is Bergoglio’s child.

Possibilism emerges from the question of the truth conditions for such possibilities, the question of what it is about reality that accounts for their truth value. The assertion that there are tigers, for example, is true because reality, in fact, contains tigers; the assertion that someone has free soloed the Dawn Wall or is Bergoglio’s child is false because reality, in fact, contains no such things. But what accounts for their possibility? That is, what is it about reality that accounts for the truth of (1) and (2)?

In the case of (1), the answer is easy: there are, in fact, many people who could free solo the Dawn Wall—notably, Tommy Caldwell and Kevin Jorgeson, the two who first free-climbed it. But it is at least logically possible that any human being do so—for any given person, it is easy to imagine perfectly consistent (if perhaps idealized and utterly improbable) scenarios in which they are massively healthier, stronger, and more skilled than they actually are and, so endowed, free solo the Dawn Wall. Thus, (1) is true because:

(3)
There is someone such that, possibly, they free solo the Dawn Wall.

A bit more generally (and philosophically) put, (1) is true in virtue of the modal properties of actually existing things, that is, equivalently put, in virtue of properties they could have had and, indeed, would have had if only things had been different in certain ways. Crucially, the same appears not to be so in the case of (2). For on the reasonable assumption that

  1. no one could have had different parents than the ones they in fact have[2] and
  2. no non-human thing could have been human,

it follows straightaway that no actually existing thing could have been Bergoglio’s child. Hence, the parallel to (3), viz.,

(4)
There is someone (or something) such that, possibly, they are Bergoglio’s child.

appears to be false. Unlike (1), then, it appears that we cannot provide truth conditions for (2) of the same satisfyingly straightforward sort as (3).[3]

Possibilists claim that we can: we must simply broaden our understanding of reality, of what there is in the broadest sense, beyond the actual, beyond what actually exists, so that it also includes the merely possible. In particular, says the possibilist, there are merely possible people, things that are not, in fact, people but which could have been. So, for the possibilist, (4) is true after all so long as we acknowledge that reality also includes possibilia, things that are not in fact actual but which could have been; things that do not in fact exist alongside us in the concrete world but which could have. Actualism is (at the least) the denial of possibilism; to be an actualist is to deny that there are any possibilia. Put another way, for the actualist, there is no realm of reality, or being, beyond actual existence; to be is to exist, and to exist is to be actual. In this article, we will investigate the origins and nature of the debate between possibilists and actualists.

1. The Focus of the Debate

The debate between possibilists and actualists is at root ontological. It is not—fundamentally, at least—a debate about meaning, or the proper linguistic primitives of our modal discourse, or the model theory of certain formal languages, or the permissibility of certain inferences. It is a disagreement over what there is, about the kinds of things that reality includes. Characterizing the nature of the debate precisely, however, is challenging. As noted in the preceding introduction, the debate centers around the question of whether, in addition to such things as you and me, reality includes possibilia, such as Bergoglio’s merely possible children, the children he does not actually have but could have had if only things had gone rather differently. Clearly, if there are such things in some sense, they differ from us rather dramatically: a merely possible child is not actually anyone’s child and indeed, we are inclined to say, does not actually exist at all and, hence, is not actually conscious but only could have been, does not actually have a body but only could have had one, and so on. As we will see in more detail in the following section, in many historical and more contemporary discussions, this alleged difference is characterized in terms of distinct ways, or modes, of being, and it will be useful, for now, to continue to frame the debate in these terms. Specifically, on this bi-modal conception of the debate, on the one hand, there is the more substantial and robust mode of actuality (or, often, existence) that you and I enjoy. And, on the other hand, there is the more rarefied mode (sometimes called subsistence) exhibited by things that fail to be actual.[4] While (as we will see) there has been some disagreement over the location of abstract objects like the natural numbers in this scheme, what uniquely distinguishes possibilia on the bi-modal conception is that, for the possibilist, they are contingently non-actual:

Poss:
There are possibilia, that is, things that are not actual but could have been.

It is clarifying to represent matters more formally. Accordingly, where \(\sfA!\) is the actuality predicate, we have:

Poss\(_{\sfA!}\):
\(\exists \sfx(\neg \sfA!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfA!\sfx)\)

As noted in the above introduction, in its simplest form, actualism is just the denial of possibilism: there are no mere possibilia. However, the actualist’s denial is meant to be stronger: that possibilism is false is not a mere historical accident; rather, for the actualist, not only are there not in fact any possibilia, there couldn’t be any:

Act:
There could not have been any possibilia, that is, any things that are not actual but could have been

or, again, more formally:

Act\(_{\sfA!}\):
 \(\neg\Diamond\exists \sfx(\neg \sfA!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfA!\sfx)\)

For the actualist, then, the possibilist’s purported mode of contingent non-actuality, or mere possibility, is empty: necessarily, anything that could have been actual already is actual. Otherwise put, necessarily, there are no contingently non-actual things.[5]

Actualism is quite clearly the preferred common sense position here: on a first hearing, the idea that the Pope’s unborn children dwell in some shadowy corner of reality is to most ears ludicrous on its face—and defending against this common sense intuition remains arguably the central challenge facing the possibilist. But the motivations for possibilism are surprisingly strong. We have already noted what is perhaps the strongest of these: possibilism yields a straightforward, unified semantics for our modal discourse. By appealing to possibilia, the possibilist can provide satisfying truth conditions for otherwise semantically problematic modal statements like (2) along the lines of those for (1) that ground their intuitive truth in the modal properties of individuals. As we might also put it: possibilism provides truthmakers for such statements as (2) that actualism is apparently unable to supply. But a powerful second motivation is that possibilism falls out as a consequence of the most natural quantified modal logic. In particular, in that logic, (4) is an immediate logical consequence of (2). (We will spell out these motivations further in the following two sections.) These motivations in turn present a twofold challenge for the actualist:

  1. to provide a systematic and philosophically satisfying account of truth conditions for the likes of (2); and
  2. to develop a robust quantified modal logic that invalidates such inferences as the one from (2) to (4).

What makes the possibilism-actualism debate so interesting is that, while actualism is the overwhelming metaphysical choice of most philosophers, there is no easy or obvious way for the actualist to meet these challenges. We will explore a number of attempts in this essay.

2. The Origins and Nature of Possibilia

2.1 Possibilism and the Bi-Modal Conception of Being

To fully appreciate what is at issue in the possibilism-actualism debate, as well as its framing in those terms, it is important to see its origins—more generally, the origins of the bi-modal conception of being—in the ancient, and vexing, philosophical problem of non-existent objects. Inklings of the bi-modal conception arguably trace back to the dawn of western philosophy in the goddess’s enigmatic warning to Parmenides not to be deceived by the “unmanageable” idea “that things that are not are”.[6] It finds clearer expression in Seneca’s description of the Stoics, for whom being included both physical objects and “incorporeals” (ἀσώματα) that “have a derivative kind of reality” (de Harven 2015: 406):

The Stoics want to place above this [the existent] yet another, more primary genus…. Some Stoics consider “something” the first genus, and I shall add the reason why they do. In nature, they say, some things exist, some do not exist. But nature includes even those which do not exist—things which enter the mind, such as centaurs, giants, and whatever else falsely formed by thought takes on some image despite lacking substance. (Seneca, Letters 58:13–15, quoted in Long & Sedley 1987: 162; see also Caston 1999.)

The Stoics’ motivation for their bifurcation of “nature” was clearly to explain the intentionality of our thought and discourse, our apparent ability to think and talk as coherently about the creatures of mythology and fiction as about ordinary physical existents. Later variations broadened the Stoics’ realm of incorporeal intentional objects to include possibilia. In the early medieval period, the Islamic Mutazilite theologians distinguished between thing (shayʹ) and existent (mawjūd)) to comport with two passages of the Quʹran (16:40, 36:82) suggesting that God commands non-existent things into existence (Wisnovski 2003: 147). Avicenna (1926: 54-56) under the influence of the Mutazilates, was more explicit still that these non-existent things are possibilia:

It is necessary with respect to everything that came into existence that before it came into existence, it was in itself possibly existent. For if it had not been possibly existent in itself, it never would exist at all. Moreover, the possibility of its existence does not consist in the fact that an agent could produce it or that an agent has power over it. Indeed, an agent would scarcely have power over it, if the thing itself were not possible in itself.[7]

Similar ideas were espoused by a number of other prominent medieval philosophers including Giles of Rome, Henry of Ghent, John Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, and Francisco Suarez.[8]

Although the grounds of possibility and intentionality were prominent themes in the modern period,[9] the idea of explaining them in terms of any sort of bifurcation of being largely receded until the early nineteenth century beginning, notably, with the remarkable work of Bernard Bolzano. Specifically, in his work on the ground of possibility, Bolzano developed a sophisticated bi-modal account of being on which everything there is divides into those things (Dinge) with Wirklichkeit, usually rendered “actuality” by Bolzano’s translators,[10] and those with Bestand, typically rendered “subsistence”. Importantly, for Bolzano as well as for many of his successors, to be actual (wirklich) is to be part of the causal order and, hence, typically at any rate, to occupy a position in space and time—in a word (as commonly understood), to be concrete.[11] Subsistence, by contrast, is the mode of being shared by non-concrete objects, which in particular for Bolzano included both possibilia and abstracta like numbers and propositions. Unlike abstracta, however, Bolzano’s possibilia are only contingently subsistent, contingently non-concrete, and, hence, are capable of Wirklichkeit:

[I]n addition to those things that have actuality (Wirklichkeit)…there are others that have mere possibility (bloße Möglichkeit), as well as those that could never make the transition to actuality, e.g., propositions and truths as such (an sich). (Bolzano 1837: §483, pp. 184–5)

Motivated chiefly to provide a ground for intentionality, several decades later, Alexius Meinong (1904b [1960], 1907) famously postulated a rich class of non-existent objects to explain our apparent ability to conceive and talk about, not only creatures of myth and fiction, but impossible objects like the round square. Roughly, in Meinong’s theory, for any class of “ordinary” properties (konstitutorische Bestimmungen) there is an intentional object (Gegenstand) having exactly those properties.[12] Presumably, then, although he did not broach the issue of possible objects directly,[13] among these objects would be those having (perhaps among others) the property being a possible child of Bergoglio. However, importantly, although he broadly accepted Bolzano’s bi-modal division of being into concrete and subsistent objects,[14] Meinong ascribed no variety of being whatsoever to his intentional objects, not even the subsistence (Bestand) enjoyed by abstracta like mathematical objects and propositions.[15] Although strongly influenced by Meinong, the early Russell (1903) spurned the idea that intentional objects are being-less but not the objects themselves, save for impossibilia like the round square. Rather, he simply moved them all into the subsistent realm alongside the objects of mathematics, reserving the “world of existence” for “actual objects” in the spatio-temporal causal order:[16]

Being is that which belongs to…every possible object of thought….Numbers, the Homeric gods, relations, chimeras and four-dimensional spaces all have being, for if they were not entities of a kind, we could make no propositions about them. Thus being is a general attribute of everything, and to mention anything is to show that it is….Existence, on the contrary, is the prerogative of some only amongst beings….[T]his distinction [between being and existence] is essential, if we are ever to deny the existence of anything. For what does not exist must be something, or it would be meaningless to deny its existence; and hence we need the concept of being, as that which belongs even to the non-existent.

Russell’s thoroughgoing modal skepticism led him to exclude possibilia from his non-existent objects.[17] Nonetheless, were he to have admitted them into his ontology, the subsistent realm would be their natural place in his bifurcated ontology. Quine (1948: 22), in the voice of his fictional possibilist metaphysician Wyman—and undoubtedly influenced at the time by recent work of C. I. Lewis (1943) and Rudolf Carnap (1947)[18]—made exactly this move in a justly famous and widely-cited paper that played a pivotal role in both framing the philosophical issues and fixing modern terminology:

Pegasus…has his being as an unactualized possible. When we say of Pegasus that there is no such thing, we are saying, more precisely, that Pegasus does not have the special attribute of actuality. Saying that Pegasus is not actual is on a par, logically, with saying that the Parthenon is not red; in either case we are saying something about an entity whose being is unquestioned. (1948: 22)

To be a mere possibile, then, according to Wyman, is to be unactualized, i.e., it is, unqualifiedly, to be but to fail to exemplify “the special attribute of actuality”; it is to subsist rather than to exist (Quine 1948: 23).[19] But perhaps equally important for fixing the nature of the modern possibilism-actualism debate was Quine’s explicit break from his nineteenth and early twentieth century predecessors on the ontological status of abstracta; speaking now in his own voice, he says:

If Pegasus existed he would indeed be in space and time, but only because the word “Pegasus” has spatio-temporal connotations, and not because “exists” has spatio-temporal connotations. If spatio-temporal reference is lacking when we affirm the existence of the cube root of 27, this is simply because a cube root is not a spatio-temporal kind of thing, and not because we are being ambiguous in our use of “exist”. (1948: 23)

For Quine, that is, their necessary non-concreteness notwithstanding, abstract objects exist no less robustly than we and, hence, in the context of the possibilism-actualism debate, are fully actual.[20] A particular advantage of this view of abstracta for the debate is that, assuming that there could be no necessarily non-actual objects, possibilia are the only things lacking actuality in the possibilist’s universe and, hence, actualism can take a particularly common and familiar form:

Act*:
Necessarily, everything is actual.

That is, more formally put once again:

Act\(\astAbang\):
 \(\Box\forall \sfx\,\sfA!\sfx\)

But the most important consequence of this wholesale shift in the ontological status of abstracta is that it opened the door to perhaps the most prominent form of contemporary actualism—dubbed (rather tendentiously) ersatz modal realism by David Lewis (1986: §3.1)—on which modal phenomena are understood in terms of abstracta of various sorts and, hence, in terms of actually existing things only, as per Act*.[21] (Ersatz modal realism is discussed in more detail in §4.2 and §4.4 below and in §2.2 of the Encyclopedia’s entry on possible worlds.)

One final matter requires attention. Quine’s choice of Pegasus as his paradigmatic possibile in the above quote highlights the fact that even relatively modern discussions often conflate the two motivations for non-existent objects and, consequently, conflate fictional objects and possibilia, and this leads to an important confusion about the nature of possibilia that is important to avoid. It is particularly evident in another well-known Quinean passage. Returning to his own voice, in an attempt to show that possibilism is ultimately incoherent, Quine asks a series of rhetorical questions, beginning with the following:

Take, for instance, the [merely] possible fat man in that doorway; and, again, the [merely] possible bald man in that doorway. Are they the same possible man, or two possible men? How do we decide? How many possible men are there in that doorway? (1948: 23)

That is, on this characterization of possibilism, a merely possible F is something that (contingently) fails to be actual but, nonetheless, like a Meinongian intentional object, is actually an F—a merely possible man in that doorway has the property of being in the given doorway; hence the purportedly unanswerable questions about whether or not he is identical with the indefinitely many other merely possible but somewhat differently described men who can also be said to occupy the same space. However, as Linsky and Zalta (1994: 445) emphasize, a merely possible F needn’t (and indeed typically won’t) be an F. Rather, a merely possible F is (typically) something that is not in fact an F but rather only could be an F.[22] In particular, a merely possible bald man in that doorway is neither bald, nor a man, nor in that doorway—indeed, it has the complements of all those properties. Rather, it is only something that could have those properties.

With that problem corrected, this Quinean framing has by and large become the dominant conception of the possibilism-actualism distinction in the contemporary literature.[23]

2.2 Possibilism Without Bi-Modalism

We have characterized actualism as, first and foremost, the denial of possibilism, defined as the thesis (Poss) that there are things that contingently fail to be actual. Following the historical precedents just detailed, actuality has been depicted as the more robust of two purported modes of being. However, work by Linsky and Zalta (1994, 1996) and Williamson (1998, 2013) casts doubt upon the viability of the possibilism-actualism distinction under this bi-modal conception. Williamson questions its coherence: what, exactly, is the nature of the “robustness” that allegedly distinguishes actuality from the merely possible; as Williamson (2013: 23ff) puts it: “being actual had better be actually doing something harder than just being…. But what is that harder thing…?” Convinced there is no cogent answer to the question, Williamson proposes scotching the possibilism-actualism distinction entirely in favor of an allegedly much clearer distinction between necessitism and contingentism, that is, between the thesis that, necessarily, all things exist necessarily (\(\Box\forall \sfx \Box\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx\)) and its denial. (This distinction will be discussed in greater detail below.)[24]

Linsky and Zalta (1994: §4) do not so much question the coherence of the possibilism-actualism distinction (under the bi-modal conception) as dissolve it.[25] Specifically, they show that, for all that the thesis (Act*) that, necessarily, everything is actual tells us, there is nothing to prevent avowed possibilists like themselves[26] from simply rejecting the idea that Bergoglio’s merely possible children “have a [mode] of being that is less than the full-fledged existence” that we enjoy, and insisting instead that they too are fully actual and, hence, exist as robustly as we do.[27] It’s just that we, by sheer happenstance, are concrete and they are not; we, that is, happen to exist in the spatio-temporal causal order and they do not. But things might just as well have been the other way ’round: existence-wise, we are all on an ontological par. There are thus no possibilia in the sense of Poss at all; necessarily, everything is actual, as per Act*. On this telling, then, Linsky and Zalta and their ilk all turn out to be fully-fledged actualists, their ontological commitments notwithstanding.

Clearly, however, even if one is skeptical of the bi-modal conception, the core of the intended debate remains: whether or not to countenance the likes of Bergoglio’s possible children. In response to those who do, actualists define themselves simply as those who do not. The historical trajectory sketched above explains why the debate has often come to be framed in terms of distinct modes of being—actuality and mere possibility. But this bi-modal framing is inessential: when the intended debate is kept in the foreground, “actuality”, for the actualist, is best understood simply as a placeholder for whatever it is that allegedly distinguishes the likes of us (and abstract objects such as the numbers) from the likes of Bergoglio’s merely possible children. Linsky and Zalta (1994: §4) and Williamson (2013: §1.2) themselves, in fact, just re-introduce what is essentially Bolzano’s characterization of possibilia: they are contingently non-concrete. On this characterization, possibilism can take a form that clarifies the debate without any mention of modes of being and, hence, avoids the above critiques:

PossC:
There are possibilia, that is, things that are not concrete but could have been

or, more formally, where \(\sfC!\) is concreteness:

Poss\(_{\sfC!}\):
\(\exists \sfx(\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx)\)

Accordingly, actualism becomes:

ActC:
There could not have been any possibilia, that is, any things that are not concrete but could have been

or, more formally:

Act\(_{\sfC!}\):
\(\neg\Diamond\exists \sfx(\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx)\)

So on this framing, for the possibilist, what allegedly distinguishes the likes of us (and the likes of the natural numbers) from possibilia in the sense of PossC is: not being contingently non-concrete. Taking this, then, to be what “actuality” signifies, with a bit of propositional logic, we have:

A!Def:
\(\sfA!\tau \eqdf \sfC!\tau \lor \Box \neg \sfC!\tau,\) for any term \(\tau\)

That is, on this framing, to be actual is to be either concrete or necessarily non-concrete; or, more simply put, it is to be either concrete or abstract. It is a straightforward exercise to show that, under this definition of actuality, PossC is equivalent to the original definition Poss and that ActC is equivalent to the principle Act* that, necessarily, everything is actual.[28]

Of course, possibilists who are more inclined toward the bi-modal conception will still prefer the original framing of the debate in terms of a primitive notion of actuality as per Poss and Act. But even the most committed bi-modalist will agree that contingent non-concreteness is at least necessarily coextensive with mere possibility and, hence, its complement with actuality. So, for those skeptical of the original framing, nothing essential to the debate is lost if it is simply understood in terms of concreteness as per PossC and ActC.

Note on David Lewis. The influential and highly original late twentieth century philosopher David Lewis also rejected bi-modalism and famously defended a view that is often characterized as a variety of possibilism. In fact, Lewis’s possibilism is orthogonal to the classical possibilism-actualism debate under discussion in this entry. See the supplemental document Classical Possibilism and Lewisian Possibilism for details.

3. Possibilism and Possible World Semantics

Possibilism would almost surely not be taken as seriously as it is were it not for the dramatic development of possible world semantics for modal logic in the second half of the twentieth century. For it not only enables the possibilist to formulate truth modal conditions with particular clarity and cogency, it yields a natural and elegant quantified modal logic, known as SQML, in which possibilism’s fundamental metaphysical principles fall out as logical truths. In order to appreciate the cogency of possibilism, therefore, it is important to understand basic possible world semantics.

3.1 Basic Possible World Semantics

Possible world semantics is built upon Tarski’s (1936, 1944) epochal theory of truth in the first half of the twentieth century. Tarski’s theory provided a rigorous account of the fundamental semantic connections between the languages of classical logic and non-linguistic reality that determine the truth conditions for the sentences of those languages. By generalizing Tarski’s theory to modal languages,[29] possible world semantics promised an equally rigorous account of the semantic connections between those languages and modal reality, and thereby an equally rigorous account of modal truth conditions. It is illuminating therefore to start with an account of Tarskian semantics.

3.1.1 Tarskian Interpretations

Given a standard first-order language \(\scrL\) with the truth functional operators \(\neg,\,\to,\) a distinguished identity predicate \(=,\) and the universal quantifier \(\forall,\) a Tarskian interpretation \(\calI\) for \(\scrL\) specifies a nonempty set \(D\)—the universe of \(\calI\)—for the quantifiers of \(\scrL\) to range over and assigns appropriate semantic values to the terms (i.e., the (individual) constants and variables) and predicates of \(\scrL\). Specifically, to each term \(\tau\) of \(\scrL,\) \(\calI\) assigns a referent \(\tau^\calI \in D\) and, to each n-place predicate \(\pi\) of \(\scrL,\) \(\calI\) assigns a set \(\pi^\calI \subseteq D^n\) of n-tuples of members of \(D,\) often referred to as the extension of \(\pi\) in \(\calI\).[30] The extension \(=^\calI\) assigned to the identity predicate, of course, is always stipulated to be the “real” identity relation for \(D,\) i.e., the set \(\lbrace\langle a,a\rangle:a \in D\rbrace\). Those assignments to the terms and predicates of \(\scrL,\) in turn, completely determine the truth values of all the formulas of \(\scrL\) by means of a familiar set of recursive clauses. To facilitate the quantificational clause, let \(\calI[\frac{\nu}{a}]\) be the interpretation that assigns the individual \(a\) to the variable \(\nu\) and is otherwise exactly like \(\calI\). This apparatus then delivers a compositional theory of meaning for \(\scrL,\) that is, an account on which the meaning (in this case, the truth value) of a complex formula is determined by its grammatical structure and the meanings of its semantically significant parts and hence, ultimately, in the Tarskian case, by the semantic values assigned to the terms and predicates of the language:

  • An atomic formula \(\pi\tau_1\ldots \tau_n\) is true in \(\calI\)—true\(^\calI\), for short—if and only if \(\langle \tau_1^\calI,\ldots,\tau_n^\calI\rangle \in \pi^\calI.\)
  • A negation \(\neg\psi\) is true\(\calI\) if and only if \(\psi\) is not true\(_{\calI}\).
  • A conditional \(\psi \to \theta\) is true\(\calI\) iff \(\theta\) is true\(\calI\) if \(\psi\) is.
  • A universally quantified formula \(\forall\nu\psi\) is true\(^\calI\) if and only if, for all individuals \(a \in D,\) \(\psi\) is true\(^{\calI[\frac{\nu}{a}]}\).

Clauses for the other standard truth-functional operators and the existential quantifier under their usual definitions follow straightaway from these clauses. In particular, where

\(\exists\)Def:
\(\exists\nu\psi \eqdf \neg\forall\nu\neg\psi\)

it follows that:

  • An existentially quantified sentence \(\exists\nu\psi\) is true\(^\calI\) if and only if, for some individual \(a \in D,\) \(\psi\) is true\(^{\calI[\frac{\nu}{a}]}\).

A set \(\Sigma\) of formulas of \(\scrL\) is said to be satisfiable if there is an interpretation for \(\scrL\) in which every member of \(\Sigma\) is true. A formula \(\varphi\) is valid, or a logical truth—written \(\vDash\varphi\)—if it is true in every interpretation for \(\scrL\).

The above definitions yield a logic, in one standard sense: a class of formal languages for which we’ve provided a model theoretic semantics that determines a rigorous notion of logical truth.[31] And the logic they define is classical (first-order) predicate logic.

3.1.2 Truth Simpliciter

Strictly speaking, truth in an interpretation is a purely mathematical relation between the formulas of a formal language and rigorously defined mathematical objects of a certain type. However, in practice, most formal languages are applied languages and this will enable us to define an objective notion of truth simpliciter for classical predicate logic. More specifically, an applied formal language \(\scrL\) is designed to clearly and unambiguously formalize a range of discourse about some real world domain (e.g., the stars and planets, the US electorate on 6 November 2020, the natural numbers, etc)—call this the intended domain of \(\scrL\). Hence, each constant of \(\scrL\) symbolizes a name in the given discourse and each predicate of \(\scrL\) symbolizes a predicate of the discourse.[32] An interpretation \(\calI\) for \(\scrL\) will be intended, then, just in case its universe \(D\) comprises exactly the individuals in the intended domain of \(\scrL\) and \(\calI\) assigns to the constants and predicates of \(\scrL\) the actual semantic values of the names and natural language predicates they are meant to symbolize. The compositional truth condition of a sentence \(\varphi\) in an intended interpretation thus traces \(\varphi\)’s truth value down to the basic atomic facts on which it ultimately depends or, as we might put it, the atomic facts on which its truth value is grounded. Thus, a sentence \(\varphi\) of an applied language \(\scrL\) will be true just in case it is true\(^\calI,\) for some intended interpretation \(\calI\) for \(\scrL\).

3.1.3 SQML Interpretations

Intuitively, a Tarskian interpretation of an applied non-modal language represents a possible world, a way in which the properties and relations expressed by the predicates of the language might be exemplified by the things in the universe of the interpretation. The idea underlying possible world semantics is simply to interpret a modal language \(\scrL_\Box\) by bringing a collection of Tarskian interpretations together to represent a modal space of many possible worlds in a single interpretation of \(\scrL_\Box\).[33] So let \(\scrL_\Box\) be the result of adding the modal operator \(\Box\) to some standard first-order language \(\scrL\). As with a Tarskian interpretation of \(\scrL,\) an SQML interpretation \(\calM\) for \(\scrL_\Box\) specifies a nonempty set \(D\) to serve as its universe. Also as in Tarskian semantics, \(\calM\) assigns each term \(\tau\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) a semantic value \(\tau^\calM \in D\). Additionally, however, \(\calM\) specifies a nonempty set \(W\)—these are typically called the set of “possible worlds” of \(\calM\) but can be any nonempty set. One member \(w^\ast\) of \(W\) is designated as the “actual world” of \(\calM\). To give substance and structure to these “worlds”, \(\calM\) then assigns extensions to the predicates of \(\scrL_\Box\) relative to each world—that is, for every n-place predicate \(\pi\) of \(\scrL\) and each world \(w \in W,\) \(\calM\) assigns a set \(\pi_w^\calM \subseteq D^n\) of n-tuples of members of \(D,\) the extension of \(\pi\) at \(w\);[34] in particular, the extension \(=_w^\calM\) of the identity predicate at all worlds \(w\) is stipulated to be \(\lbrace\langle a,a\rangle:a \in D\rbrace\). In this way \(\calM\) represents the different ways that the properties and relations expressed by those predicates can change (or not) from world to world.

Given an SQML interpretation \(\calM,\) then, the Tarskian truth conditions above are generalized by relativizing them to worlds as follows: for any possible world \(w\) of \(\calM\) (the world of evaluation),

  • An atomic formula \(\pi\tau_1\ldots\tau_n\) is true at \(w\) in \(\calM\)—true\(_w^\calM\), for short—if and only if \(\langle \tau_1^\calM,\ldots,\tau_n^\calM\rangle \in \pi_w^\calM.\)
  • A negation \(\neg\psi\) is true\(_w^\calM\) if and only if \(\psi\) is not true\(_w^\calM\).
  • A conditional \(\psi \to \theta\) is true\(_w^\calM\) iff \(\theta\) is true\(_w^\calM\) if \(\psi\) is.
  • A universally quantified formula \(\forall\nu\psi\) is true\(_w^\calM\) if and only if, for all individuals \(a \in D,\) \(\psi\) is true\(_w^{\calM[\frac{\nu}{a}]}\).

Putting the clause for universally quantified formulas together with the clause for negated formulas and the definition ∃Def of the existential quantifier, we have

  • An existentially quantified formula \(\exists\nu\psi\) is true\(_w^\calM\) if and only if, for some individual \(a \in D,\) \(\psi\) is true\(_w^{\calM[\frac{\nu}{a}]}\).

And to these, of course, is added the critical modal case that explicitly interprets the operator \(\Box\) to be a quantifier over possible worlds:

  • A necessitation \(\Box\psi\) is true\(_w^\calM\) if and only if, for all worlds \(u \in W,\) \(\psi\) is true\(_u^\calM\).

The possibility operator \(\Diamond\) is defined as usual in terms of \(\Box\):

\(\Diamond\)Def:
\(\Diamond\psi \eqdf \neg\Box\neg\psi\)

That is, intuitively, to say that a statement is possible is just to say that its negation isn’t necessary. The structural similarity between \(\Diamond\textbf{Def}\) and ∃Def should be unsurprising given that, semantically, the necessity operator \(\Box\) is literally a universal quantifier over the set of worlds. Accordingly, it follows from \(\Diamond\textbf{Def}\) and the semantic clause for necessitations that

  • \(\Diamond\psi\) is true\(_w^\calM\) if and only if, for some world \(u \in W,\) \(\psi\) is true\(_u^{\calM}\).

We say that a formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) is true in an SQML interpretation \(\calM\) for \(\scrL_\Box\) if it is true\(_{w^\ast}^\calM\), i.e., true in \(\calM\) at the “actual world” \(w^\ast\) of \(\calM\). Satisfiability and logical truth are defined exactly as they are above for classical predicate logic, albeit relative to modal languages \(\scrL_\Box\) and the preceding notion of truth in an SQML interpretation; in particular, a formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) is logically true if it is true in every SQML interpretation. The logic so defined is, of course, SQML.

3.1.4 Modal Truth Simpliciter

The definition of truth simpliciter above for formulas of an applied non-modal language \(\scrL\) stems from the fact that a Tarskian interpretation \(\calI\) for \(\scrL\) can take the things in (some relevant chunk of) the actual world and represent how they actually exemplify the properties and relations expressed by the predicates of \(\scrL\). But if we can represent the actual world (or a relevant chunk of it) by means of an intended Tarskian interpretation, then there is no reason that we can’t represent a merely possible world in which those same things exist but have different properties and stand in different relations and, hence, define objective notions of truth at a world and of truth simpliciter for the formulas of a modal language as well, that is, notions of truth that are not simply relative to formal, mathematical interpretations but, rather, correspond to objective modal reality. So let \(\scrL_\Box\) be an applied modal language whose individual constants and predicates represent those in some ordinary range of modal discourse and let \(D\) be its intended domain. Say that \(\calM\) is an intended interpretation of \(\scrL_\Box\) if

  1. its set \(W\) of “possible worlds” is in fact a sufficiently comprehensive set of honest-to-goodness possible worlds,[35]
  2. its designated “actual world” is in fact the actual world,
  3. its universe is the intended domain \(D\) of \(\scrL_\Box,\) and
  4. the referents assigned to the constants of \(\scrL_\Box\) are the ones they actually refer to and the extensions assigned to the predicates of \(\scrL_\Box\) at each world \(w \in W\) are the ones they in fact have at \(w\).

Then, where \(\calM\) is an intended interpretation of \(\scrL_\Box,\) we can say that a formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) is true at a world \(w\)—true\(_w\)—just in case \(w \in W\) and \(\varphi\) is true\(_w^\calM\), and that \(\varphi\) is true just in case it is true\(_{w^\ast}\).

3.2 SQML: A Deductive System for SQML

Ideally, a logic \(\mathfrak L\) has a sound and complete proof theory, that is, an accompanying deductive system whose theorems—the formulas provable in the system—are exactly the logical truths of \(\mathfrak L\).[36] There is such a system for SQML—for convenience, we’ll refer to it by setting “SQML” in italics: SQML. (We will follow this convention for logics generally.)

“SQML” is an acronym for “simplest quantified modal logic”, and it is so-called because it is a straightforward amalgam of the most popular and semantically least complicated propositional modal logic S5 and classical first-order logic (with identity)—FOL, for short.[37] The deductive system SQML, accordingly, is an amalgam of the corresponding deductive systems S5 and FOL.[38] S5 builds on the foundation of classical propositional logic—PL, for short—whose deductive system PL takes every instance of the following schemas as its axioms and Modus Ponens as its inference rule:

  • Propositional Axiom Schemas
    P1:
    \(\varphi \to (\psi \to \varphi)\)
    P2:
    \((\varphi \to (\psi \to \theta)) \to ((\varphi \to \psi) \to (\varphi \to \theta))\)
    P3:
    \((\varphi \to \psi) \to ((\varphi \to \neg \psi) \to \neg \varphi)\)
  • Rule of Inference
    MP:
    \(\psi\) follows from \(\varphi\) and \(\varphi \to \psi\)

On top of this foundation the system S5 adds the rule of Necessitation and every instance of the following three schemas:

  • Modal Axiom Schemas
    K:
    \(\Box( \varphi \to \psi) \to (\Box \varphi \to \Box \psi)\)
    T:
    \(\Box \varphi \to \varphi\)
    5:
    \(\Diamond \varphi \to \Box\Diamond \varphi\)
  • Rule of Inference
    Nec:
    \(\Box\psi\) follows from \(\psi\)

K is a fundamental principle common to all the modal logics we will survey here: if a conditional is necessary, then its consequent is necessary if its antecedent is. T expresses that necessity implies truth, and 5 expresses that what is possible is not a mere matter of happenstance; no possibility could have turned out to be impossible; or again: what is possible in the actual world is possible in every world. The basic normal deductive system K is the result of adding (every instance of) K and the rule of Necessitation to PL; the system T is the result of adding all instances of T to K; and the system S5 is the result of adding all instances of 5 to T.[39]

Two important principles (that is, every instance of them) can be proved in S5:[40]

4:
\(\Box \varphi \to \Box\Box \varphi \)
B:
\(\varphi \to \Box\Diamond\varphi\)

4 says of necessities what 5 says about possibilities: necessity is not a matter of happenstance; the necessary truths of our world are necessary in every world. B says that anything that is in fact the case had to have been possible; the truths in our world are, at the least, possibilities in every other world.

Schemas T, 5, 4, and B all have common equivalent forms it is useful to note:

T:
\(\varphi \to \Diamond\varphi\)
5:
\(\Diamond\Box\varphi \to \Box\varphi\)
4:
\(\Diamond\Diamond \varphi \to \Diamond\varphi\)
B:
\(\Diamond\Box\varphi \to \varphi\)

We obtain the full deductive system SQML by adding the quantificational and identity axioms of FOL and the rule of Generalization to S5:

  • Quantificational Axiom Schemas
    Q1:
    \(\forall \nu ( \varphi \to \psi)\to(\forall \nu \varphi \to \forall \nu \psi)\)
    Q2:
    \(\forall \nu \varphi \to \varphi^\nu_\tau,\) where \(\tau\) is a term that is substitutable for \(\nu\) in \(\varphi\) and \(\varphi^\nu_\tau\) is the result of replacing every free occurrence of \(\nu\) in \(\varphi\) with an occurrence of \(\tau\)[41]
    Q3:
    \( \varphi \to \forall \nu \varphi ,\) if there are no free occurrences of \( \nu \) in \( \varphi \).
  • Identity Axiom Schemas
    Id1:
    \(\nu = \nu\)
    Id2:
    \(\nu = \nu'\to (\varphi \to \varphi'),\) where \(\nu'\) is substitutable for \(\nu\) in \(\varphi\) and \(\varphi'\) is the result of replacing some or all free occurrences of \(\nu\) in \(\varphi\) with occurrences of \(\nu'\)
  • Rule of Inference
    Gen:
    \(\forall\nu\psi\) follows from \(\psi\)

Proofs and Theorems
The notions of proof and theoremhood are defined as usual; we define them generally as they will apply to each of the deductive systems discussed in this entry. Specifically, for any deductive system S, a proof in S is a finite sequence of formulas of the language \(\scrL\) of S—\(\scrL_\Box,\) in the case of SQML—such that each formula is either an axiom of S or follows from preceding formulas in the sequence by a rule of inference of S. A proof is a proof of the formula occurring last in the sequence. A formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL\) is a theorem of S—\(\vdash_{S} \varphi\)—if there is a proof of it in S. And if \(\Gamma\) is a set of formulas of \(\scrL,\) then \(\varphi\) is a theorem of \(\Gamma\) (in S)—\(\Gamma \vdash_{S} \varphi\)—if, for some finite subset \(\{\psi_1,\ldots,\psi_n\}\) of \(\Gamma,\) \(\psi_1 \to (\ldots \to (\psi_n \to \varphi)\ldots)\) is a theorem of S.

As the role of an individual constant in a theorem of SQML is essentially indistinguishable from that of a free variable, it is useful to note the following:

Metatheorem: Let \(\psi\) be a formula of \(\scrL_\Box\) that contains an individual constant \(\kappa\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) and let \(\nu\) be a variable that doesn’t occur in \(\psi\). Then if \(\psi\) is a theorem of SQML, so is \(\forall\nu\psi^\kappa_\nu.\)[42]

The metatheorem justifies the following derived rule of inference, where \(\varphi,\) \(\kappa,\) and \(\nu\) are as indicated there:

Gen*:
\(\forall\nu\psi^\kappa_\nu\) follows from \(\psi.\)

That is, informally put, if a formula containing an individual constant is a theorem, we can effectively generalize on it as if it were a free variable.

3.3 Possibilism, Necessitism, and Logical Truth

In addition to the degree of clarity it brings to the issues, a compelling reason for expressing the possibilism-actualism debate in formal terms is how starkly it illustrates the inextricable link between logic and metaphysics, in particular, the dramatic impact our metaphysical choices have on quantified modal logic. Arguably the best known illustration of this is seen in the validity of the inference from (2) to (4) in SQML and, more generally, in the validity of the Barcan Formula:[43]

BF:
\(\Diamond\exists \nu \varphi \to \exists \nu \Diamond\varphi\)

That is, informally, if there could be something satisfying any given description \(\varphi,\) then there is something that could satisfy that description, a thing that is possibly \(\varphi.\) The validity of BF in SQML rests on two facts: first, that in the model theory of SQML (as in all varieties of possible world semantics), the possibility operator \(\Diamond\) is literally an existential quantifier ranging over all possible worlds; and second, that, in evaluating an existentially quantified formula \(\exists\nu\varphi\) at a possible world \(w,\) the initial occurrence of \(\exists\nu\) in the formula ranges unrestrictedly over all individuals. Hence, switching the order of adjacent occurrences of \(\Diamond\) and \(\exists\nu\) in a formula will not alter its truth value; to say that some world and some object are thus and so is to say no more and no less than that some object and some world are thus and so.[44] And this is what warrants, in particular, the inference from (2) to (4). Letting “\(\sfB\)” represent the predicate “is Bergoglio’s child”, the logical form of (2) is \(\Diamond\exists \sfx\, \sfB\sfx\). Expressed semantically in SQML: some world and some individual are such that, in that world, that individual is Bergoglio’s child. But that is to say no more and no less than that some individual and some world are such that, in that world, that individual is Bergoglio’s child, \(\exists \sfx\,\Diamond \sfB\sfx,\) i.e., (4).

In its validation of BF, then, SQML underwrites in general, and as a matter of logic, the possibilist’s thesis that de dicto modal truths like (2) asserting simply that there could be things that are thus and so are in fact grounded in de re modal truths about the modal properties of individuals, i.e., the properties they have at some or all possible worlds.[45] If, as in the case of (2), that appears to commit us to things like merely possible human beings, things that, for actualists anyway, intuitively do not in any sense exist, things that in no sense are, so much the worse for actualist intuitions; or so says the possibilist.

BF is not the only controversial logical truth of SQML or even, perhaps, the most controversial one. Another is its converse:

CBF:
\(\exists \nu \Diamond \varphi \to \Diamond\exists \nu \varphi\)

That is, informally, if there is, in fact, something that could satisfy a given description \(\varphi,\) then it is possible that something satisfy that description. CBF is valid for exactly the same reason that BF is: the order of adjacent occurrences of \(\exists\) and \(\Diamond\) in a formula does not alter its logical content.

To see why CBF is controversial, especially for typical actualists, note that most all of us believe that there are contingent beings, things that reality might just as well have lacked as to have contained, things like you and me that simply might have failed to be identical to anything:

CB:
\(\exists \sfx\, \Diamond \neg \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

However, CBF is incompatible with the existence of contingent beings! For, as an instance of CBF we have

CBF*:
\(\exists \sfx\, \Diamond \neg \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx \to \Diamond \exists \sfx\, \neg\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

Hence, by MP, we can infer

😱:
\(\Diamond \exists \sfx\, \neg\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

which says that there could be something that is distinct from everything (including, in particular, itself) and that, of course, is logically impossible. Hence, CB is logically false in SQML and so it is a logical truth of SQML that there are no contingent beings, i.e., that, rather, everything is necessarily identical with something:

N:
\(\forall \sfx\, \Box\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

Indeed, since logical truths in SQML are all necessary, N is itself a necessary truth:

\(\Box\)N:
\(\Box\forall \sfx \Box\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

So SQML yields not only possibilism (given BF and (2) and its ilk) but necessitism, that is, the thesis that everything there is and, indeed, everything there ever could be, is a necessary being;[46]—you, me, the Eiffel Tower, Bergoglio’s possible children, merely possible members of exotic species that never in fact evolved, merely possible suns that never formed, etc. Otherwise put: everything there could possibly be already is and, moreover, could not have failed to be.

Although it is a logical truth of SQML, necessitism is not analytically entailed by possibilism. There is, in particular, nothing in the idea of a mere possibile that demands its necessity, nothing that rules out worlds from which it might be altogether absent, worlds (in addition to those in which it is either concrete or non-concrete) in which nothing is identical to it. This might lead one to wonder whether SQML, by building necessitism into its logical foundations, has (from a possibilist perspective) gotten the logical cart before the philosophical horse. On reflection, however, it is clear that necessitism is, not only a natural complement to possibilism, but an essential component of it. For, as we’ve seen, the central justification for possibilism is that it provides truthmakers for modal propositions like (2); it grounds them in the modal properties of individuals. If the purported truthmakers for those propositions could fail altogether to be, if it could be that there are no such things, then, for all we know, it might just as well be that there are in fact no such things and, hence, that there are no truthmakers for (2) and its ilk after all; and with that, possibilism’s central philosophical justification collapses. Necessitism closes the door on this prospect: both possibilia and actually existing things alike are necessary beings.[47]

At first sight, of course, necessitism is a shocking philosophical doctrine. For, most compellingly, the urgent intuition of our own contingency—that at one time in the past we did not exist and that at another in the not too distant future we will forever cease to be—is a central element of our lived human experience. But by necessitism, not only have we always existed and will so continue forever into the future, we—no less than God and the number 17—could not have failed to be. The possibilist, however, will respond that the worry here has badly conflated existence in the sense of being, in the sense of mere identity with something, and existence in the sense of actuality. More specifically, the worry has confused two corresponding notions of contingency, viz., contingency as the possibility of absolute non-being, i.e.,

Cont:
\(\textsf{Contingent}_{\boldsymbol{\exists}}(\sfx) \eqdf \Diamond\neg\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

and contingency as the possibility of non-actuality, i.e.,

Cont\(_{\sfA!}\):
\(\textsf{Contingent}_{\sfA!}(\sfx) \eqdf \Diamond\neg \sfA!\sfx\)

As per SQML, says the possibilist, contingency is a logical impossibility. However, they continue, contingency\(\sfA!\) comports fully with our lived experience and, in fact, is all that our experience warrants: our sense of our own contingency is rooted in our possible, indeed imminent, non-actuality and, hence, in the fact that, in the not-too-distant future, we shall forever cease to be actual. We shall thus forever cease to be conscious, to be embodied, to love and be loved, etc.; nothing distinctive of our human existence will survive. That something identical to each of us—a mere possibile, a featureless point in logical space—remains at worlds and times where we are non-actual offers no existential solace. (See Williamson 2013: Ch. 1, esp section 3, 6, and 8 for related reflections on necessitism.)

The actualist, of course, in denying possibilism, i.e., in denying that there could be any contingently non-concrete objects, allows no daylight between being, existence, and actuality: to be is to exist and to exist to be actual. Hence, for the actualist, contingency, the possibility of non-being, is the only concept of contingency on the table. As contingency in this sense is a logical impossibility according to SQML, the actualist clearly needs an alternative quantified modal logic tuned to their metaphysical sensibilities.

SQML thus throws the twofold challenge that possibilism presents to actualism into stark relief. The notion of an intended SQML interpretation of an applied modal language, with its single domain of actual and merely possible individuals and its recursive account of truth at a world, vividly traces the semantic dependence of complex propositions down to the individuals on which their truth values are grounded. And the corresponding deductive system SQML provides the possibilist with a clean, complete framework in which to represent their reasoning. In the remaining sections of this entry we will look at prominent actualist responses to the two-fold possibilist challenge.

4. Actualist Responses to the Possibilist Challenge

There are any number of representatives of, and variations on, actualism. For brevity, I will focus on several particularly important accounts. We will begin with a close look at the extraordinarily influential work of Saul Kripke. Although Kripke himself does not appear to have been particularly motivated by any great commitment to actualism, both his version of possible world semantics and its corresponding deductive system capture important elements of the actualist perspective.

4.1 Kripke Semantics and Its Logic

Given the controversial consequences of SQML, it seems clear that actualists need an alternative quantified modal logic on which BF, CBF, and \(\Box\textbf{N}\) fail to be logically true; ideally, it will also have a sound and complete deductive system in which, consequently, those principles are not derivable as theorems. The system of Kripke 1963b satisfies both of these desiderata and, hence, meets the second element of the possibilist’s two-fold challenge; as we will see, whether it meets the first—a satisfying account of the truth conditions for modal propositions like (2)—is a more delicate matter.

4.1.1 Kripke Interpretations

Just as necessitism is not analytically entailed by possibilism, its denial—i.e., that there at least could be contingent (i.e., henceforth, contingent) beings—is not analytically entailed by actualism. An actualist could consistently maintain that, necessarily, everything is necessarily identical with something and hence in particular, given their rejection of contingent non-concreta, that, necessarily, every concrete thing is necessarily identical to some concrete thing—put another way, that, necessarily, if something is concrete at any time at all, it is necessarily and eternally concrete. (Spinoza might be ascribed such a view, insofar as God-or-Nature is taken to be concrete and is, ultimately, the only concrete thing.) For typical actualists, however, it is fundamental to their view that there are in fact many contingent beings, many things that could have failed to be identical with anything; reality could have altogether lacked many things that just happen to exist. A natural (if, as we’ll see, not entirely unproblematic) way of expressing this is to say that there are possible worlds where at least some things in the actual world are simply absent; more generally, it is to say that what exists—that is, for the actualist, what there is in the broadest sense—varies from world to world. This fundamental actualist intuition is at the heart of Kripke’s semantics for quantified modal languages.

Recall that an SQML interpretation \(\calM\) for a first-order modal language \(\scrL_\Box\) specifies nonempty sets \(D\) and \(W\)—the “individuals” and “worlds” of \(\calM\)—along with a distinguished element \(w^\ast\) of \(W,\) the “actual” world of the interpretation; it then assigns a denotation \(\tau^\calM \in D\) to each term \(\tau\) and an extension \(\pi_w^\calM \subseteq D^n\) to each n-place predicate \(\pi\) at each world \(w\). A Kripke interpretation \(\calK\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) is exactly like an SQML interpretation except for one modification that reflects the fundamental actualist intuition noted above, viz., the addition of a function \(\textit{dom}\) that assigns to each world \(w\) of \(\calK\) a subset \(D_w\) of \(D\)—intuitively, of course, the individuals that exist in \(w\). No restrictions are placed on the domain of any world; any set of individuals, including the empty set, will do, although it is required that \(D = \bigcup\{\textit{dom}(w):w \in W\},\) i.e., that \(D\) consists of exactly the individuals that exist in some world.[48]

The definition of truth at a world in a Kripke interpretation \(\calK\) is defined exactly as it is for an SQML interpretation \(\calM\) except for the quantified clause, where the difference between Kripke interpretations and SQML interpretations just noted comes to the fore. Specifically, when a quantified formula \(\forall\nu\varphi\) is evaluated at a world \(w,\) the quantifier ranges only over \(\textit{dom}(w),\) the set of objects in the domain of \(w\). Thus, the modal clause in the definition of truth at a world is revised as follows:

  • A universally quantified formula \(\forall\nu\psi\) is true\(_w^\calK\) if and only if, for all individuals \(a \in \textit{dom}(w),\) \(\psi\) is true\(_w^{\calK[\frac{\nu}{a}]}\).

And, accordingly:

  • An existentially quantified formula \(\exists\nu\psi\) is true\(_w^\calK\) if and only if, for some individual \(a \in \textit{dom}(w),\) \(\psi\) is true\(_w^{\calK[\frac{\nu}{a}]}\).

The definitions of truth, satisfiability and logical truth are unchanged. Call the logic determined by Kripke semantics KQML.

A Note on “Serious” Actualism. KQML takes over the semantics of predicates from SQML without modification: by the above condition \(\pi_w^\calK \subseteq D^n,\) the extension \(\pi_w^\calK\) that a Kripke interpretation \(\calK\) assigns to a predicate at a world consists of arbitrary n-tuples of individuals in \(D.\) However, as Kripke himself (1963b, p. 86, fn 1) notes,

[i]t is natural to assume that [a predicate] should be false in a world…of all those individuals not existing in that world….

Many actualists strongly agree, for the following reason: predicates express properties and relations. Hence, if a (1-place) predicate \(\pi\) is true of an individual \(a\) at a world \(w,\) it means that \(a\) exemplifies the property that \(\pi\) expresses at \(w\). But (these actualists continue) it is surely an undeniable metaphysical principle—dubbed serious actualism by Plantinga (1983)—that an object must exist, must be identical with something, in order to exemplify properties; an object cannot both be utterly absent from a world and yet have properties there. To rule this prospect out in Kripke’s model theory, then, rather than allowing an n-place predicate’s extension at a world to contain arbitrary n-tuples of individuals, we need to restrict \(\pi\)’s extension at \(w\) to n-tuples of individuals in \(w\). More formally put, we need to replace the offending condition \(\pi_w^\calK \subseteq D^n\) with the more felicitous condition \(\pi_w^\calK \subseteq \textit{dom}(w)^n.\)

However, others (notably Pollock (1985) and Fine (1985)) respond that, while most properties and relations obviously entail existence—being a horse, say, or being taller than—it is far from clear that all do. Notably, if I fail to exist at a world, then that in some sense clearly seems to characterize me at that world and what else is characterization than property exemplification? Thus (these philosophers continue), it seems entirely reasonable to say that, at worlds in which I fail to exist, I have the property non-existence, as well as the complements of all the distinctly human properties noted above—non-consciousness, non-embodiment, etc., my nonexistence notwithstanding.[49] So for these philosophers, the condition \(\pi_w^\calK \subseteq D^n\) on the assignment of extensions to predicates is fine as it stands.

Serious actualism—also known as property actualism (Fine 1985), the (modal) existence requirement (Yagisawa 2005; Caplan 2007) and the being constraint (Williamson 2013: §4.1)—is a substantive logical and philosophical issue. However, as it is for the most part a domestic dispute among actualists, it is largely orthogonal to the possibilism-actualism debate proper. Consequently, it will not be pursued here in any greater depth. For further discussion in addition to the references above see Plantinga 1985 (which contains replies to Pollock and Fine), Salmon 1987, Menzel 1991 and 1993, Deutsch 1994, Bergmann 1996 and 1999, Hudson 1997, Stephanou 2007, Hanson 2018, and Jacinto 2019.[50]

4.1.2 KQML and the Controversial Logical Truths of SQML

All three of the controversial logical truths of SQML—BF, CBF, and \(\Box\textbf{N}\)—are invalid in KQML, that is, in KQML, they are not logically true. The key in each case is KQML’s modification of the way that quantified formulas are evaluated at worlds. As we saw in §3.3 above, the validity of BF in SQML—its truth in every interpretation—depends essentially on the fact that, in evaluating an existentially quantified formula \(\exists\nu\varphi\) at an arbitrary possible world \(w,\) the initial occurrence of \(\exists\nu\) in the formula ranges unrestrictedly over all individuals. In KQML, by contrast, the range of the initial quantifier \(\exists\nu\) is restricted to \(\textit{dom}(w),\) to the individuals that exist in \(w\). And, because what exists can vary from world to world, this renders BF invalid: from the fact that some world and some individual existing in that world are thus and so it certainly does not follow that some individual existing in the actual world and some world are thus and so. Notably, while in some worlds there are children of Bergoglio, nothing here in the actual world is a child of Bergoglio in any world, i.e., \(\Diamond\exists \sfx\, \sfB\sfx\) is true and \(\exists \sfx\Diamond \sfB\sfx\) is false. Hence, the BF instance

BF*:
\(\Diamond\exists \sfx\, \sfB\sfx \to \exists \sfx \Diamond \sfB\sfx\)

expressing the inference from (2) to (4) is false as well.[51] (See the preceding note for a more formal demonstration of the invalidity of BF.)

As we also saw in §3.3, CBF entails the principle N that everything (i.e., everything there happens to be) is necessarily identical to something. And, obviously, so too does the full necessitism principle \(\Box\)N. But N is clearly invalid in KQML: because world domains can vary, an individual \(a\) in the actual world might not exist in another world, i.e., it might be that nothing is identical to \(a\) in some worlds.[52] Hence, since N is invalid in KQML, so are CBF and \(\Box\)N.[53]

4.1.3 KQML: Kripke’s Deductive System for KQML

As noted in §3.2, the deductive system SQML is sound and complete for SQML—all and only the logical truths of SQML are provable in SQML, including the three controversial principles BF, CBF, and \(\Box\)N. Since, as we just saw in the previous section, those principles are all invalid in KQML, to formulate a sound and complete deductive system of his own, Kripke had to modify SQML rather severely to block the derivation of those principles without also blocking any of KQML’s valid formulas.

Kripke’s solution is nicely illustrated by means of a (somewhat compressed) proof in SQML of BF* (the structure of which will be shared by the proof of any non-trivial instance of BF):

1. \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx\) Q2
2. \(\Box(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\) 1, Nec
3. \(\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Diamond\Box \neg \sfB\sfx\) 2, K[54]
4. \(\Diamond\Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \neg \sfB\sfx\) B
5. \(\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \neg \sfB\sfx\) 3, 4, PL
6. \(\forall \sfx(\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \neg \sfB\sfx)\) 5, Gen
7. \(\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \forall \sfx \neg \sfB\sfx\) 6, Q1, Q3, and PL[55]
8. \(\Box(\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \forall \sfx \neg \sfB\sfx)\) 7, Nec
9. \(\Box\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box\forall \sfx \neg \sfB\sfx\) 8, K and MP
10. \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx\) B
11. \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box\forall \sfx \neg \sfB\sfx\) 9, 10, PL
12. \(\Diamond\exists \sfx \sfB\sfx \to \exists \sfx \Diamond \sfB\sfx\) 11, \(\exists\)Def, \(\Diamond\)Def, and PL

It is clear where the problem lies: the universal instantiation schema Q2 is invalid in KQML! To see this in the particular case of line 1, suppose that \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx\) is true in (i.e., true at the “actual world” of) a given Kripke interpretation \(\calK\) with individuals \(D\) and worlds \(W\). Then, by the quantificational clause in the definition of truth at a world in Kripke’s semantics, everything that exists in the “actual world” \(w^\ast\) of \(\calK\) is not in the extension of \(\sfB\) at any world \(u\) in \(W,\) i.e., for all \(a \in \textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) and for all \(u \in W,\) \(a \notin \sfB^\calK_{u}\). Recall, however, that the value \(\sfx^\calK\) assigned to \(\sfx\) can be anything in the set \(D\) of individuals of \(\calK\); in particular, \(\sfx^\calK\) might not exist in \(w^\ast\) and, hence, might well be in the extension of \(\sfB\) at some other world of \(\calK,\) in which case \(\Box\neg \sfB\sfx\) will be false in \(\calK.\)[56]

Here we begin to see the logical challenge that confronts the actualist: a logically valid principle of SQML—in this case, a standard principle of classical logic—is rendered invalid when we attempt to revise our modal semantics so as to accommodate actualist intuitions. The challenge is then how (or whether) to revise the principle in question, and this in turn often requires a choice between several competing possibilities, each of which may require further revisions still. Kripke himself avoids several options that might suggest themselves in light of the invalidity of Q2 in KQML. For instance, taking a lead from Prior (1957: 33–35), an actualist might argue that terms—individual constants and variables (when they occur freely)—are directly referring expressions like proper names and demonstratives and, hence, that an accurate model theoretic representation of actualism should require that the value \(\tau^\calK\) that \(\calK\) assigns to an arbitrary term \(\tau\) should be restricted to the domain of the actual world \(w^\ast\) of \(\calK\)—one cannot, after all, refer to individuals that don’t actually exist. This modification of KQML would indeed preserve the validity of Q2 but at the cost of invalidating Nec—notably, it would render the inference from line 1 to line 2 in the above proof invalid. For, while line 1 might now be true at the actual world \(w^\ast\) of an arbitrary interpretation \(\calK\) because we’ve stipulated that \(\sfx^\calK\) exist in \(w^\ast,\) that very fact could well render line 1 false at some other world \(u\): \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx\) might be true at \(u\) but our actually existing individual \(\sfx^\calK,\) although not in the extension of \(\sfB\) in the actual world, might well be in its extension at \(u\). So, under the proposed modification, the question for the actualist instead becomes how to modify Nec—perhaps by limiting how it applies to formulas involving individual constants and free variable occurrences in some way.[57]

The most common actualist response to the invalidity of Q2, rather than to try to preserve it by modifying the semantics of KQML, is simply to replace it with its free logical counterpart (see, e.g., Fine 1978, Menzel 1991):

FQ2:
\(\forall\nu\varphi \to (\exists \nu\,\nu=\tau \to \varphi^\nu_\tau),\) where \(\tau\) is any term other than \(\nu\)

That is, what is true of everything—i.e., everything that actually exists—will be true of anything in particular if it is actual. Unlike Q2, FQ2 is valid in KQML as it stands and, moreover, every instance of it is necessary: what is true of everything in a given world will be true of anything in particular if it is identical with something in that world. Hence, FQ2 raises no problems for Nec. And, critically, outfitted with FQ2 instead of Q2, it is no longer possible to prove BF.[58]

However, Kripke (1963b, p. 89, note 1) is loath to adopt a solution that, like the ones just suggested, involves “revising quantification theory or modal logic”. So instead Kripke opts for another that he borrows from Quine. In his account of quantification, Quine (1951: §15) points out that any occurrence of a name in an ordinary logical truth is inessential to its truth: what is said of the referent of the name could just as well be said of anything. Thus, it is not in virtue of any distinctive properties of God or Socrates that the following proposition is true:

(\(*\))
If God created everything, then God created Socrates

or, more formally:

(\(*\))
\(\forall \sfx\, \sfK\sfg\sfx \to \sfK\sfg\sfs\)

(\(*\)), that is, would have been true no matter what “God” and “Socrates” refer to. If anything, then, names obscure the grounds of logical truth. Hence, the discerning logical eye sees name occurrences in the likes of (\(*\)) as implicitly quantified variables and, hence, sees the completely general logical form that underlies it:[59]

(\(**\))
\(\forall \sfz \forall \sfy(\forall \sfx\, \sfK\sfz\sfx \to \sfK\sfz\sfy)\)

The same goes for free variable occurrences—semantically, variables are essentially names, so free variable occurrences in logical truths should also be seen as implicitly universally quantified. Hence, properly expressed, the axioms of a logical system, a system designed to have all and only logical truths as its theorems, should be purely general and, hence, should be purged of individual constants and free variable occurrences. In particular, universal instantiation, properly expressed, will replace the instantiated term \(\tau\) in the consequent of Q2 with a universally quantified variable:

KQ2:
\(\forall \nu'(\forall\nu\varphi \to \varphi^\nu_{\nu'}),\) where \(\nu'\) is substitutable for \(\nu\) in \(\varphi\)

Accordingly, line 1 of the proof of BF* requires an initial universal quantifier to bind the free occurrence of \(\sfx\):

1.*
\(\forall \sfx(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\)

Application of Nec to line 1* now yields only

2.*
\(\Box\forall \sfx(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\)

and the intended proof to BF* stalls out. To continue along the lines of the SQML proof above we would need to be able to swap the initial necessity operator \(\Box\) in line 2* with the universal quantifier to infer

 
\(\forall \sfx\Box(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\)

That is, we would need to be able to prove the relevant instance of

CBF:
\(\Box\forall \nu \varphi \to \forall \nu \Box \varphi\)

But, as the label indicates, this is just an equivalent form of CBF and, as Kripke (1963b, 88–9) notes, attempting to prove it under the proposed revision KQ2 of Q2 stalls out for the same reason.[60]

The necessitism principle \(\Box\)N meets a similar fate. A standard proof of \(\Box\)N in SQML begins with an instance of Q2 and proceeds as follows:

1. \(\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfx=\sfy \to \neg \sfx=\sfx\) Q2
2. \(\sfx=\sfx \to \exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) 1, \(\exists\)Def, PL
3. \(\sfx=\sfx\) Id1
4. \(\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) 2, 3, MP
5. \(\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) 4, Nec
6. \(\Box\forall \sfx \Box\exists \sfy\, \sfx=\sfy\) 5, Gen, Nec

But with KQ2 replacing Q2, critically, we are unable to wedge the necessity operator in between the two quantifiers; we can only get the likes of the following:

1. \(\forall \sfx(\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfx=\sfy \to \neg \sfx=\sfx)\) KQ2
2. \(\forall \sfx(\sfx=\sfx \to \exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy)\) 1, \(\exists\)Def, PL
3. \(\forall \sfx\,\sfx=\sfx \to \forall \sfx\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) 2, Q1, MP
4. \(\forall \sfx\,\sfx=\sfx\) Id1, Gen
5. \(\forall \sfx\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) 3, 4, MP
6. \(\Box\forall \sfx\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) 5, Nec

and line 6 is unproblematically valid in KQML: it is simply the innocuous triviality that everything in a given world is identical to something in that world—not, as \(\Box\)N would have it, in every world.

Two further important modifications to the framework of SQML follow from Kripke’s Quinean conception of the purely general nature of logical truth. First, individual constants have no place; since there are no individual constants in any axioms, there are none in any theorems. Hence, it is not possible to reason with them in Kripke’s system. Consequently, Kripke restricts his semantics to languages with no individual constants.[61] Second, under the Quinean conception, the manner in which quantifiers and modal operators are introduced into proofs needs serious revision. For example, the proposition \(\forall \sfx(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) is valid in KQML. In SQML, it is proved by deriving the tautology \(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx\) and applying the rule of Generalization:

1. \(\sfF\sfx \to ((\sfG\sfx \to \sfF\sfx) \to \sfF\sfx)\) P1
2. \((\sfF\sfx \to (\sfG\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)) \to (\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) 1, P2, MP
3. \(\sfF\sfx \to (\sfG\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) P1
4. \(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx\) 2, 3, MP
5. \(\forall \sfx(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) 4, Gen

But axioms can’t have free variables under the Quinean conception and, hence, that proof is not available. Likewise, the de re validity \(\forall \sfx\,\Box(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) is proved in SQML by applying the rule of Necessitation to the T instance \(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx\) and then generalizing:

1. \(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx\) T
2. \(\Box(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) 1, Nec
3. \(\forall \sfx\, \Box(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) 2, Gen

But again, for the same reason, this proof is also unavailable.

Kripke’s solution here—once again borrowing from Quine (1951)—jettisons both Gen and Nec and cleverly incorporates the desired effects of both rules directly into his specification of the logical axioms of his deductive system—which, of course, we will call KQML. To express the solution clearly, say that a formula is closed if it contains no free variable occurrences, and define a closure of a formula \(\varphi\) to be any closed formula resulting from prefixing a (possibly empty) string of universal quantifiers and necessity operators, in any order, to \(\varphi\). Then, given a language \(\scrL_\Box\) without any individual constants, any closure of any instance of any of the following schemas is an axiom of KQML:

  • Propositional Axiom Schema
    Taut: \(\varphi,\) where \(\varphi\) is a propositional tautology[62]
  • Modal Axiom Schemas
    K, T, and 5
  • Quantificational Axiom Schemas
    Q1, KQ2, and Q3
  • Identity Schemas
    Id1, Id2

Should the serious actualism constraint be enforced, we add:

  • Serious Actualism Schema
    SA: \(\pi\nu_1\ldots\nu_n \to \exists \nu\,\nu = \nu_i,\) for \(1 \leq i \leq n\) and where \(\nu\) is a variable other than \(\nu_i\)

As noted, KQML’s sole rule of inference is MP, Modus Ponens. Accordingly, a proof in KQML is a finite sequence of formulas of \(\scrL_\Box\) such that each is either an axiom of KQML or follows from preceding formulas in the sequence by MP.

Crucially, then, with regard to such KQML validities as \(\forall \sfx(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) and \(\forall \sfx\,\Box(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) that are derivable in SQML by applications of Gen and Nec, instances of the above schemas can contain free variable occurrences. So, in particular, \(\forall \sfx(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) is a closure of the propositional tautology \(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx,\) and \(\forall \sfx\,\Box(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\) is a closure of the T instance \(\Box \sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx\) and, hence, both validities are axioms (hence theorems) of KQML.

With these modifications in place, Kripke is able to demonstrate that his deductive system KQML is sound and complete for closed formulas relative to his semantics. Soundness, in particular, tells us that no invalid formula is provable in the system. Hence, since BF, CBF, and \(\Box\textbf{N}\) are all invalid in KQML, soundness guarantees that they are all unprovable in KQML.

4.1.4 Is KQML a Genuinely Actualist Logic?

On the face of it, KQML provides the actualist with a powerful alternative to SQML. However, one might well question its actualist credentials. Specifically, despite the invalidity of the actualistically objectionable principles BF, CBF, and \(\Box\)N, it is questionable whether KQML has escaped ontological commitment to possibilia, for the following reason. KQML provides us with a formal semantics for (constant-free) modal languages \(\scrL_\Box\) and, in particular, an account of how the truth value of a given formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) is determined in an interpretation by the meanings assigned to its semantically significant component parts, notably, the meanings of its predicates. As noted above in our exposition of SQML, truth-in-a-model is not the same as truth simpliciter. However, given an applied modal language \(\scrL_\Box,\) we were able to define a notion of modal truth simpliciter for formulas of \(\scrL_\Box\) in terms of truth in an intended interpretation, an interpretation \(\calM\) for \(\scrL_\Box\) comprising the very things that the language is intuitively understood to be “about”. Thus, when \(\calM\) is an intended SQML interpretation, the things it is about are the honest-to-goodness actual and merely possible individuals in the domain \(D\) of \(\calM\) and the honest-to-goodness possible worlds of \(W\). In particular, if our applied language is one in which \(\Diamond\exists \sfx\, \sfB\sfx\) is meant to express that Bergoglio might have had children, \(D\) will include at least some of his merely possible children and \(W\) will contain a world in which some of them are, in fact, his children and hence concrete and, hence, in which they are actual in the sense of A!Def. There is thus, more generally, for each world \(w \in W,\) the set \(D_w\) of things in \(D\) that are actual in \(w\). Note, however, that, in light of this, we can transform \(\calM\) into a KQML interpretation \(\calK_\calM\) simply by defining a function \(\mathit dom\) that, for each world \(w \in W,\) returns exactly the set \(D_w\). However, that is simply a formal modification that affects the evaluation of quantified formulas at worlds; it does not alter \(\calK_\calM\)’s ontological commitments, which are still exactly those of \(\calM\). But there seems no other way to construct a notion of an intended Kripke interpretation that will yield the right truth values for propositions like (2). From this perspective, the invalidity of BF, CBF, and \(\Box\)N in KQML—in particular, their falsity in an intended Kripke interpretation \(\calK_\calM\)—results from a simple adjustment of the semantical apparatus with no substantive change in the metaphysics. So instead of a genuinely actualist alternative to the possibilist commitments of SQML, KQML appears to remain no less steeped in them—the denizens of other worlds that are not in the domain of the actual world simply fail to be actual in the sense of A!Def. Of course, this metalinguistic fact cannot be expressed in \(\scrL_\Box\)—even if one adds the actuality predicate to \(\scrL_\Box,\) due to the quantifier restrictions in the semantics of KQML, the assertion that there are things that aren’t actual, \(\exists \sfx\, \neg \sfA!\sfx,\) will be false in \(\calK_\calM\) at every world. But that does not make the possibilist commitments of \(\calK_\calM\) disappear.[63]

An option for the actualist here, perhaps, is simply to deny that Kripke interpretations have any genuine metaphysical bite. Rather, the role of Kripke’s possible world semantics is simply to get the intuitive validities right; soundness and completeness proofs for KQML then demonstrate that the system preserves those intuitive validities and, hence, that it is a trustworthy vehicle for reasoning directly about the modal facts of the matter. The formal semantics proper is just a useful device toward this end. However, on the face of it, anyway, this instrumentalist take on Kripke’s semantics is an uncomfortable one for the actualist. Consider ordinary Tarskian semantics for classical first-order logic FOL. Intuitively, this semantics is more than just a formal instrument. Rather, an intended interpretation for a given applied language \(\scrL\) shows clearly how the semantic values of the relevant parts of a formula of \(\scrL\)—the objects, properties, relations, etc. in the world those parts signify—contribute to the actual truth value of the sentence. The semantics thus provides insight into the “word-world” connection that explains how it is that sentences of natural language can express truth and falsity, how they can carry good and bad information. The possibilist is able to generalize this understanding of the semantics of first-order languages directly to modal languages \(\scrL_\Box\). The embarrassing question for the actualist who would take the proposed instrumentalist line on Kripke’s semantics is: what distinguishes Kripkean semantics from Tarskian? Why does the latter yield insight into the word-world connection and not the former? Actualists owe us either an explanation of how Kripke’s semantics can be understood non-instrumentally without entailing possibilism or a plausible instrumentalist answer to the possibilist challenge. The former option is explored in §4.2, the latter in §4.3 and §4.4.

4.2 Haecceitism

One of the best known responses to the possibilist challenge was developed by Alvin Plantinga (1974, 1976). Plantinga’s response (more or less as fleshed out formally by Jager (1982)) requires no significant modifications to KQML beyond explicitly adopting the serious actualism condition discussed at the end of §4.1.1.[64] Rather, his response has almost entirely to do with the metaphysics of intended interpretations, or what he calls applied semantics. More specifically, he claims to provide an actualistically acceptable ontology for constructing intended interpretations for applied languages.

4.2.1 Worlds and Essences

To appreciate Plantinga’s account, note first that a challenge to actualism that we have not focused on hitherto is the nature of possible worlds themselves. The main reason for this is simply that the basic semantic argument for possibilia laid out in the Introduction to this entry does not assume or require them. If, however, one takes possible world semantics of some ilk seriously, so that possibility and necessity are correlated in some manner with truth at some or all possible worlds, then, insofar as possibilia are said to exist in non-actual possible worlds, such worlds are themselves reasonably classified as some variety of possibilia themselves, some variety of merely possible, non-existent object. Hence, because Plantinga takes possible world semantics seriously, the first task he sets for himself is to define possible worlds in an actualistically acceptable way.

Plantinga defines a possible world to be a state of affairs of a certain sort. A state of affairs for Plantinga is an abstract, fine-grained, proposition-like entity characteristically referred to by sentential gerunds like the earth’s being smaller than the sun.[65] Some states of affairs obtain and others do not: the earth’s being smaller than the sun obtains; seven’s being the sum of three and five does not.[66] Importantly, all states of affairs are necessary beings irrespective of whether or not they obtain. A state of affairs \(s\) is possible if it possibly obtains; \(s\) includes another state of affairs \(s'\) if, necessarily, \(s\) obtains only if \(s'\) does and \(s\) excludes \(s'\) if it is not possible that both \(s\) and \(s'\) obtain; \(s\) is maximal if, for any state of affairs \(s',\) \(s\) either includes or excludes \(s'\). A possible world, then, is a maximal possible state of affairs; and the actual world is the possible world that, in fact, obtains. It is easy to show that, under those definitions, a state of affairs is a possible world just in case it possibly includes all and only the states of affairs that obtain. Since worlds are states of affairs and, for Plantinga, states of affairs are all actually existing abstract entities, their existence is consistent with actualism, as desired.

The core of Plantinga’s answer to the possibilist challenge is the notion of an (individual) essence, an idea that traces back clearly at least to Boethius.[67] Plantinga defines the essential properties of an object to be those properties that it couldn’t possibly have lacked without simply failing to exist altogether.[68] A bit more formally put: \(P\) is essential to \(a\) just in case, necessarily, if \(a\) exists (i.e., for an actualist like Plantinga, if something is identical to \(a\)), then \(a\) has \(P\). Intuitively, the essential properties of an object are the ones that make the object “what it is”. For example, on at least some conceptions of human persons, being human is essential to Bergoglio while being Catholic isn’t—there is (on these conceptions) no possible world containing Bergoglio in which he fails to be human but many in which he, say, becomes a Buddhist monk or is a lifelong atheist. A property is an essence of an object \(a,\) then, just in case (i) it is essential to \(a\) and (ii) nothing but \(a\) could have exemplified it; and a property is an essence simpliciter just in case it is possibly an essence of something.

A critical, and distinctive, element of Plantinga’s account is that there are many unexemplified essences, i.e., essences that are not, in fact, the essences of anything, specifically, those he dubs haecceities. Haecceities are “purely nonqualitative” properties like being Plantinga, or perhaps, being identical with Plantinga, that do no more than characterize an object \(a\) as that very thing. Pretty clearly, haecceities are essences: Plantinga, for example, could not have existed and failed to have the property being Plantinga and it is not possible that anything else have that property. And, importantly, qua abstract property, like all essences, being Plantinga exists necessarily, whether exemplified or not—although, of course, had it not been exemplified, it wouldn’t have had the name “being Plantinga”, or any name at all, for that matter.

4.2.2 Intended Haecceitist Interpretations

As we saw in §4.1.3 above, the problem with KQML for actualists is that an intended Kripke interpretation for an applied modal language \(\scrL_\Box\) appears to involve commitment to possibilia no less than SQML—to get the truth values of propositions like (2) right, an intended Kripke interpretation \(\calK\) for \(\scrL_\Box\) will still have to include mere possibilia like Bergoglio’s merely possible children; indeed, but for the addition of the domain function \(\textit{dom}\) on worlds tacked on to invalidate the problematic validities of SQML, \(\calK\) will be indistinguishable from an intended SQML interpretation of \(\scrL_\Box\). Plantinga’s diagnosis, roughly put, is that Kripke’s semantics gets the structure of the modal universe right but that it needs his worlds and haecceities to realize that structure in an actualistically acceptable way. Specifically, an intended haecceitist interpretation \(\calH\) for an applied modal language \(\scrL_\Box\) is a Kripke interpretation that specifies sets \(D\) and \(W\) as usual, but \(W\) is a sufficiently expansive set of Plantinga’s maximal possible states of affairs and \(D\) a corresponding set of haecceities. The domain function \(\textit{dom}\) as usual will map each possible world \(w\) to a subset of \(D,\) i.e., to a set of haecceities that Plantinga refers to as the essential domain of \(w\). This is the set of haecceities that are exemplified in \(w,\) where a haecceity \(h\) is exemplified in \(w\) just in case \(w\) includes the state of affairs \(h\)’s being exemplified. Otherwise put, the essential domain \(\textit{dom}(w)\) of \(w\) consists of those haecceities that would have been exemplified if \(w\) had obtained. Since, as noted above, haecceities are necessary beings that exist even if unexemplfied, they can serve as actually existing “proxies” for the individuals there would have been had \(w\) obtained (Bennett 2006). In this way, Plantinga’s haecceitist interpretations can represent the possibilist’s non-actual worlds and their merely possible inhabitants without incurring any possibilist commitments.

Because an intended haecceitist interpretation \(\calH\) for an applied language \(\scrL_\Box\) is a Kripke interpretation (with the serious actualism constraint enforced), every variable \(\nu\) is, as usual, assigned a member \(\nu^\calH\) of the set \(D\) of individuals of \(\calH,\) i.e., a haecceity, and every predicate \(\pi\) is assigned a set \(\pi_w^\calH\) of n-tuples of haecceities in the essential domain of \(w,\) for each world \(w \in W\). Monadic atomic formulas, in particular, are evaluated as usual: \(\pi\nu\) is true\(_w^\calH\) just in case \(\nu^\calH \in \pi_w^\calH\). However, although the formal truth conditions in \(\calH\) for atomic formulas do not differ from those defined for atomic formulas in an intended SQML interpretation \(\calM,\) it is important to understand that, in these different contexts, those formally identical truth conditions represent starkly different metaphysical conditions. Specifically, in an intended SQML interpretation \(\calM,\) that \(\nu^\calM \in \pi_w^\calM\) indicates that, at \(w,\) the (perhaps merely possible) object \(\nu^\calM\) exemplifies the property \(P_\pi\) expressed by \(\pi\). By contrast, in an intended haecceitist interpretation \(\calH,\) that \(\nu^\calH \in \pi_w^\calH\) indicates, not that \(h\) exemplifies \(P_\pi\) at \(w,\) but that it is coexemplified with \(P_\pi\) at \(w\). Thus, for example, the truth condition for (2)—formalized as \(\Diamond\exists \sfx\, \sfB\sfx\)—in an intended haecceitist interpretation \(\calH\) is obviously not that there is a possible world in which some haecceity \(h\) is one of Bergoglio’s children—haecceities are properties and, hence, necessarily non-concrete—but, rather, that

(5)
There is a possible world in which some haecceity \(h\) is coexemplified with being a child of Bergoglio.

Likewise for n-place atomic formulas generally: \(\rho\nu_1\ldots\nu_n\) is true at \(w\) just in case the haecceities \(\nu_1^\calH, \ldots, \nu_n^\calH,\) respectively, are coexemplified with the relation \(R_\rho\) that \(\rho\) expresses in \(w\). Plantinga’s haecceitism thus delivers the same sort of systematic, compositional account of the truth conditions for modal propositions as possibilism but without the commitment to unactualized possibilia.

It is important to be clear on the fact that coexemplification at a world is primitive here, and not definable in terms of exemplification. Of course, if a (monadic) atomic formula \(\pi\nu\) is in fact true in an intended haecceitist interpretation \(\calH,\) i.e., if it is true at the actual world \(w^\ast,\) then there is an object that exemplifies both \(\nu^\calH\) and \(P_\pi\)—notwithstanding the fact that this implication is not itself represented in \(\calH,\) since \(\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) only contains haecceities, not the objects that exemplify them. However, it is critical not to generalize this implication and take the coexemplification of two properties—notably, a haecceity \(h\) and some property \(P\)—at a world \(w\) to imply that there is something that exemplifies them at \(w\). For if that were so, then the truth conditions for the likes of (2) would once again entail that there are possibilia, and Plantinga could rightly be accused of being committed to them—he simply ignores them in his haecceitist model theory. But the correct implication is this: if \(\pi\nu\) is true\(_{w}^\calH\), so that \(\nu^\calH\) is coexemplified with \(P_\pi\) at \(w,\) then, had \(w\) obtained, there would have been an individual that would have exemplified both \(\nu^\calH\) and \(P_\pi\). Importantly, though, the fact that \(\nu^\calH\) is coexemplified with \(P_\pi\) at \(w\) stands on its own; it does not hold in virtue of the corresponding counterfactual. Indeed, the dependency goes in the other direction: that there could have been an individual with \(P_\pi\) (and would have been had \(w\) obtained) is true in virtue of the fact that some (actually existing) haecceity is possibly coexemplified with \(P_\pi\).

4.2.3 Modalism

Plantinga’s haecceitist account illustrates an important point about most forms of actualism that is sometimes a source of confusion, namely, that most actualists are also modalists. That is, most actualists take the English modal operators “necessarily”, “possibly”, and the like, collectively, to be primitive and, hence, not to be definable in terms of non-modal notions. On the face of it, however, insofar as the formal operators \(\Box\) and \(\Diamond\) are taken to symbolize their English counterparts, defining the modal operators would appear to be exactly what possible world semantics purports to do. For, unlike the classical connectives and quantifiers, in basic possible world semantics the modal operators are not interpreted homophonically. That is, they are not interpreted with the very natural language operators they are intended to represent—a necessitation \(\Box\psi,\) in particular, is not defined to be true in an interpretation just in case \(\psi\) is necessarily true in it. Rather, in basic possible world semantics, the necessity operator is interpreted as a restricted universal quantifier: a necessitation \(\Box\psi\) is true in an interpretation \(\calM\) just in case \(\psi\) is true at every possible world of \(\calM\). However, whether or not that proves to be a definition of the necessity operator depends on what one takes a possible world to be. David Lewis famously defined possible worlds to be (typically) large, scattered concrete objects similar in kind but spatio-temporally unconnected to our own physical universe. Under such an understanding of possible worlds, possible world semantics arguably provides a genuine definition of the modal operators on which the truth conditions assigned to modal formulas do not themselves involve any modal notions.[69] As it is sometimes put, such a definition is “eliminative” or “reductive”—modal notions are eliminated in the semantics in favor of quantification over (non-modal) worlds.

Plantinga’s haecceitist semantics is decidedly not of this sort. Recall, in particular, that Plantinga defines a possible world to be a maximal possible state of affairs. Spelling this definition out explicitly in the truth condition for necessitations (under an intended haecceitist interpretation \(\calH\)) then yields:

\(\Box\psi\) is true if and only if \(\psi\) is true at all states of affairs \(w\) such that (i) for all states of affairs \(s,\) either, necessarily, \(w\) obtains only if \(s\) does or, necessarily, \(w\) obtains only if \(s\) doesn’t, and (ii) possibly, \(w\) obtains.

Clearly, the truth condition here interprets the modal operator \(\Box\) homophonically and, hence, on pain of circularity, cannot be taken to provide any kind of eliminative analysis of the modal operator \(\Box.\) But, as we’ve detailed at length, such an analysis is not Plantinga’s goal. Rather, his account is meant to show how the truth conditions for atomic formulas in an intended interpretation serve to ground propositions like (2) in the modal properties of haecceities. (His truth conditions are thus perhaps better thought of as grounding conditions.) Given such an interpretation, then, the truth conditional clauses of Plantinga’s theory yield non-eliminative but philosophically illuminating equivalences that reveal the connections between the statements expressible in a basic modal language \(\scrL_\Box\) and the deeper metaphysical truths of his theory.[70]

Haecceities are thus the key to Plantinga’s answers to both prongs of possibilism’s twofold challenge to actualism. First, Plantinga’s haecceitist semantics delivers a compositional theory of truth conditions that grounds general de dicto modal propositions like (2) systematically in the modal properties of individuals of a certain sort—specifically, coexemplification relations that haecceities stand in with other properties at possible worlds. Second, his haecceitist semantics enables him to adopt KQML (with the serious actualism constraint) without modification and, hence, to have a robust quantified modal logic that has no possibilist commitments.

4.3 Strict Actualism

As robust as the haecceitist solution is, many actualists find that it grates against some very strong intuitions, especially about the nature of properties. But there is a deeper issue dividing the haecceitists from other actualists. To clarify, consider that many propositions are singular in form. That is, unlike general propositions like all whales are mammals, some propositions are “directly about” specific individuals—for example, the proposition Marie Curie was a German citizen. Call the individuals a singular proposition is directly about the subjects of the proposition. Singular propositions are typically expressed by means of sentences involving names, pronouns, indexicals, or other devices of direct reference. As we’ve seen, possibilists believe that there are singular propositions whose subjects are not actual, viz., propositions about mere possibilia: for the possibilist, recall, (2) is grounded in singular propositions of the form \(a\) is Bergoglio’s child, for possibilia \(a\). Similarly, haecceitists like Plantinga, although actualists in the strict sense, also believe there are singular possibilities that are in a derivative but clear sense directly about things that don’t exist, viz., those possibilities involving unexemplified haecceities like \(h\) is coexemplified with being Bergoglio’s child. Say that a strict actualist is an actualist who rejects the idea that there are, or even could be, singular propositions that are directly about things that do not exist in either the possibilist’s or the haecceitist’s sense. It follows that, had some actually existing individual \(a\) failed to exist, there would have been no singular propositions about \(a\); or, as Prior puts it, there would have been no facts about \(a,\) not even the fact that \(a\) fails to exist (see, e.g., Prior 1957: 48–49); or again: singular propositions supervene on the individuals they are about. For the strict actualist, then, necessarily, all propositions are either wholly general or, at most, are directly about existing individuals only.

So understood, the strict actualist rejects the intuition that drives both possibilism and haecceitism, viz., that de dicto modal propositions like (2) are grounded ultimately in the modal properties of, and relations among, individuals of some ilk. Rather, our illustrative statement (2) is, ultimately, brute; it is true simply because it is possible that (or there is a world at which) something is Bergoglio’s child, full stop, as there is nothing to instantiate the quantifier; there is nothing such that, possibly (or, at some world), it is Bergoglio’s child.

How then do things stand for the strict actualist with respect to the first element of the possibilist’s two-fold challenge? The answer of course depends entirely on what one takes to be a “systematically and philosophically satisfying” account of the truth conditions for modal assertions like (2). Possibilists (and their haecceitist and eliminitivist counterparts) clearly consider preservation of Tarski-style compositionality (formalized in an appropriate notion of an intended interpretation) to be essential for meeting this element of the challenge: one must ultimately be able to ground the truth of complex modal statements in the modal properties of (perhaps nonactual, perhaps abstract) individuals. But it is not at all clear that the strict actualist must agree. They might well rather simply reject this demand and insist instead that (2) and its like stand on their own and do not need the sort of grounding that possibilists insist upon. Since this is simply a consequence of the rejection of possibilia and their actualist proxies, from the strict actualist perspective, it is a philosophically satisfying result. The apparent loss of Tarski-style compositionality is, for the strict actualist, a price worth paying.[71] From this perspective, possible world semantics can with some justification be seen as nothing more than a useful but ontologically inert formal instrument, an evocative but ultimately dispensable philosophical heuristic.[72] In that case, the only serious challenge that possibilism raises for the strict actualist is the formulation of an actualistically kosher quantified modal deductive system whose basic principles intuitively reflect strict actualist sensibilities. We turn now to two of the best known accounts. (We will follow common practice and refer to a deductive system with or without a corresponding formal model theory as a logic.[73])

4.3.1 Prior’s Quantified Modal Logic \(Q\)

It was Arthur Prior who, in 1956, first proved that BF is a theorem of SQML (without identity). Clearly aware of its possibilist and necessitist implications, Prior sought to develop a logic consistent with strict actualism and, hence, a logic in which BF, CBF, and \(\Box\)N all fail. The result was his deductive system \(Q\). The first installment—the propositional component (Prior 1957: chs. IV and V[74])—arrived only a year later; quantification theory with identity was added a decade later (Prior 1968b, 1968c).

Recall that the central intuition driving strict actualism is that, necessarily, a singular proposition supervenes on the individuals it is about—call these individuals the subjects of the proposition—and, hence, that, necessarily, there is simply no information, no singular propositions, about things that fail to exist; if \(p\) is a singular proposition about \(a,\) then, necessarily, \(p\) exists only if \(a\) does. Conversely, necessarily, if all the individuals \(p\) is about exist, then so does \(p\). Prior expressed this connection between singular propositions and their subjects in terms of formulas and their constituent singular terms, i.e., their constituent individual constants and free variables. And, in formulating \(Q\), instead of the existence or nonexistence of propositions, Prior typically spoke of the “statability” or “unstatability” of the formulas that express them.[75] Specifically, let \(\varphi\) be a formula and \(p_\varphi\) the singular proposition \(\varphi\) expresses. Intuitively, then, for Prior, \(\varphi\) is statable, or formulable, at a world \(w\) if and only if \(p_\varphi\) exists at \(w\) and, hence, if and only if all of \(p_\varphi\)’s subjects exist at \(w\). Thus, where \(a_\tau\) is the denotation of a singular term \(\tau\):

S:
A formula \(\varphi\) containing exactly the singular terms \(\tau_1,\ldots,\tau_n\) is statable at a world \(w\) if and only if \(a_{\tau_1},\ldots,a_{\tau_n}\) all exist at \(w\).

Hence, in particular, if any of the \(a_{\tau_i}\) fails to exist at \(w,\) then \(\varphi\) is unstatable there.

So far, there is little for any strict actualist to take issue with in Prior’s framing of the issues here. However, Prior makes a critical inference about unstatability that distinguishes his logic starkly from other varieties of strict actualism (call it Prior’s Gap Principle):

Gap:
If a statement \(\varphi\) is unstatable at a world \(w,\) then \(\varphi\) is neither true nor false at \(w.\)

The logical implications of Gap are dramatic. Note first that the usual interdefinability of necessity and possibility fails. To see this for the particular case of SQML’s \(\Diamond\textbf{Def}\), consider, say, the obvious truth that Bergoglio is not a subatomic particle—say, a proton, \(\neg \sfP\sfb\). Since Bergoglio is a contingent being, there are worlds where he doesn’t exist. Hence, there are worlds where \(\neg \sfP\sfb\) fails to be statable and thus, by Gap, where it is neither true nor false and thus in particular where it is not true. It follows that \(\neg \sfP\sfb\) is not necessary, \(\neg\Box\neg \sfP\sfb.\) But, obviously, \(\Diamond \sfP\sfb\) does not follow; assuming that Bergoglio is essentially human, it is not possible that he is a proton. So \(\Diamond\textbf{Def}\) will not do. By the same token, if Bergoglio is essentially human, it is impossible that he fail to be human, \(\neg\Diamond\neg \sfH\sfb\). For \(\neg \sfH\sfb\) is obviously not true in worlds where he exists, and in worlds where he doesn’t, it is not statable and hence, by Gap again, neither true nor false and thus again not true. But \(\Box \sfH\sfb\) does not follow; for \(\sfH\sfb\) is also not statable, hence not true, in Bergoglio-free worlds. So necessity cannot be defined as usual in terms of possibility—impossible falsehood does not imply necessary truth. Rather, necessity is impossible falsehood plus necessary statability. Otherwise put: if a statement \(\varphi\) couldn’t be false, then in order for it to be necessarily true, the proposition it expresses must necessarily exist.

To capture this implication of Gap formally, and to axiomatize the logic of strict actualism (under Gap) generally, Prior makes basically two changes to the language \(\scrL_\Box\)—call this language \(\scrL_{Q}\). First, for reasons that will become evident shortly, he takes \(\Diamond\) rather than \(\Box\) as a primitive operator. Secondly, he adds a new sentential operator \(\text S\) for necessary statability (“n-statability”) to \(\scrL_\Box\). It is also useful to think of impossible falsehood as a sort of weak necessity signified by its own operator:

\(◼\)Def:
\(◼\varphi \eqdf \neg\Diamond\neg\varphi\)

Necessity proper—or strong necessity—is then definable in \(\scrL_Q\) as indicated in terms of weak necessity and n-statability:

\(\Box\)Def\(_Q\):
\(\Box\varphi \eqdf \rS \varphi \land ◼\varphi\)

Axiom Schemas for Necessary Statability

Prior’s first axiom for n-statability is that it is not a property a statement \(\varphi\) could lack if it could have it all; otherwise put: if the proposition that \(\varphi\) expresses could exist necessarily, then it does exist necessarily:

S1:
\(\Diamond\rS \varphi \to \rS \varphi\)

Prior’s next two axioms for n-statability express principle S above. The first captures the left-to-right direction that, intuitively, expresses the supervenience of propositions on their subjects: a statement \(\varphi\) is n-statable only if the things referred to in \(\varphi\) are necessary beings. Prior could in fact express that the object signified by an individual constant \(\sfa\) is necessary in the usual fashion as \(\Box\exists \sfx\,\sfx=\sfa\) but, given \(\Box\)Def\(_Q\), this unpacks rather cumbersomely to \(\rS \exists \sfx\,\sfx=\sfa \land ◼\exists \sfx\,\sfx=\sfa\). However, as we will see, in the context of \(Q\) this is equivalent simply to \(\rS \exists \sfx\,\sfx=\sfa.\) For convenience, Prior shortens this to \(\rS \sfa\); more generally:[76]

SDef:
\(\rS \tau =_{\textit df} \rS \exists\nu\,\nu=\tau,\) where \(\nu\) is a variable distinct from \(\tau.\)

Now say that a term \(\tau\) occurring in a formula \(\varphi\) is free in \(\varphi\) if \(\tau\) is either an individual constant or a variable with a free occurrence in \(\varphi,\) and say that \(\varphi\) is singular if some term is free in it and wholly general otherwise. Given this, Prior axiomatizes the left-to-right direction of principle S as follows:

S2:
\(\rS \varphi \to \rS \tau,\) for terms \(\tau\) that are in free in \(\varphi\).

That is, a singular assertion \(\varphi\) is n-statable only if each individual that it names is a necessary being.

Prior’s final axiom for n-statability is essentially the converse: if all the individuals that \(\varphi\) names are necessary, then \(\varphi\) is n-statable. A simple convention enables us clearly to express this axiom (and others below) schematically. Let \(\theta\) be any formula of \(\scrL_{Q}\); then, for any \(n \ge 0,\)

SDef*:
\(\rS \tau_1\ldots\tau_n \to \theta =_{\textit df} \rS \tau_1 \to (\ldots \to (\rS \tau_n \to \theta)\ldots)\)

It is useful to note that, under this convention, when \(n \gt 0,\) \(\rS \tau_1\ldots\tau_n \to \theta\) is equivalent to \((\rS \tau_1\,\land\,\ldots\,\land\,\rS \tau_n) \to \theta,\) and that, when \(n=0,\) \(\rS \tau_1\ldots\tau_n \to \theta\) is just \(\theta.\)[77] Given this, we can express Prior’s final axiom for n-statability as follows:

S3:
\(\rS \tau_1\ldots\tau_n \to \rS \varphi,\) where \(\tau_1, \ldots, \tau_n\) are all of the terms that are free in \(\varphi\)

Note in particular that it follows from S3—specifically, from the case \(n=0\)—that every wholly general formula is n-statable.

By S2 and S3 together, then, a formula \(\varphi\) is n-statable if and only if all of its component free terms are. Or, more informally put: the proposition that \(\varphi\) expresses exists necessarily if and only if all of its subjects do.

Given the axioms for \(\text S\) we can lay out the rest of Prior’s system \(Q\). For its non-modal foundations, \(Q\) takes every propositional tautology (not just its closures, as in KQML) to be an axiom and follows SQML in adopting standard classical axioms for quantification and identity. However, the non-modal fragment of the system itself is not quite classical. For reasons we will discuss below, it includes a modified version of modus ponens that renders some classical first-order validities unprovable.

  • Propositional Axiom Schema
    Taut
  • Quantificational Axiom Schemas
    Q1, Q2, and Q3
  • Identity Axiom Schemas
    Id1, Id2
  • Rules of Inference
    MP\(_Q\):
    \(\rS \tau_1\ldots\tau_n \to \psi\) follows from \(\varphi\) and \(\varphi \to \psi,\) where \(\tau_1, \ldots, \tau_n\) are all of the terms that are free in \(\varphi\) but not in \(\psi.\)
    Gen:
    \(\forall\nu\psi\) follows from \(\psi\)

\(Q\) also has its own version of Gen*, which, recall, allows us to universally generalize on constants as if they were free variables:

  • Gen\(\astQ\):
    Suppose \(\psi\) is a formula of \(\scrL_{Q}\) that contains an individual constant \(\kappa\) of \(\scrL_{Q}\) and that \(\nu\) is a variable that is substitutable for \(\kappa\) in \(\psi\). Then if \(\psi\) is a theorem of \(Q\), so is \(\forall\nu\psi^\kappa_\nu.\)

\(Q\) preserves the classical assumption that all names denote something: for any term \(\tau\) other than the variable \(\nu,\) \(\exists \nu\,\nu =\tau\) is a theorem; in the special case where \(\nu\) is \(\sfy\) and \(\tau\) is \(\sfa\):

1. \(\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfa \to \neg \sfa=\sfa\) Q2
2. \(\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfa\ \to \neg \sfa=\sfa) \to ( \sfa=\sfa \to \neg\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfa)\) Taut
3. \(\sfa=\sfa \to \neg\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfa\) 1, 2, MP\(_{Q}\)
4. \(\sfa=\sfa \to \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfa\) 3, ∃Def
5. \(\sfa=\sfa\) Id1
6. \(\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfa\) 4, 5, MP\(_{Q}\)

However, because of the qualification in MP\(_{Q}\), the intuitively weaker classical theorem that something exists—more exactly, that something is self-identical, \(\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfy\)—is not provable. The usual proof in classical predicate logic runs along the above lines:

1. \(\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfy\ \to \neg \sfa=\sfa\) Q2
2. \((\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfy\ \to \neg \sfa=\sfa) \to (\sfa=\sfa \to \neg\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfy)\) Taut
3. \(\sfa=\sfa \to \neg\forall \sfy\,\neg \sfy=\sfy\) 1, 2, MP\(_{Q}\)
4. \(\sfa=\sfa \to \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfy\) 3, \(\exists\)Def
5. \(\sfa=\sfa\) Id1

In classical logic, of course, \(\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfy\) is immediate from lines 4 and 5 by MP. However, MP\(_{Q}\) only yields

6. \(\rS \sfa \to \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfy\) 4, 5, MP\(_{Q}\)

That is, in \(Q\), that something exists only follows from the self-identity of some particular object if that object is a necessary being, an object that exists in every possible world. We will be able to appreciate Prior’s motivations here (explained below) once Q’s underlying propositional modal logic is in place.

\(Q\)’s propositional modal axiom schemas are structurally identical to those of SQML, but with weak necessity in place of strong necessity:[78]

  • Modal Axiom Schemas
    KQ:
    \(◼(\varphi \to \psi ) \to (◼\varphi \to ◼\psi )\)
    TQ:
    \(◼\varphi \to \varphi\)
    5Q:
    \(\Diamond \varphi \to ◼\Diamond \varphi\)

Likewise its rule of necessitation; because some logical truths are not n-statable and, hence, not true in every world—notably, singular logical truths like Prior, if a logician, is a logician, \(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\)—we can only infer that an arbitrary logical truth is weakly necessary, false in no world:

  • Rule of Inference
    Nec\(_{Q}\):
    \(◼\psi\) follows from \(\psi.\)

4.3.2 \(Q\), Contingency, and the Controversial Logical Truths of SQML

Prior touted \(Q\) as a “modal logic for contingent beings” (1957: 50). It is therefore a rather awkward theorem of \(Q\) that there are no contingent beings in the strong, actualist sense of Cont\(_{\exists}\): since, for any term \(\tau\) other than \(\sfy,\) \(\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\tau\) is a theorem of \(Q\), by Nec\(_{Q}\) (and \(◼\)Def) it is weakly necessary, \(\neg\Diamond\neg\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\tau,\) and the problematic theorem

\(\forall \sfx\, \neg\textsf{Contingent}_{\exists}(\sfx)\)

follows directly by Gen\(\astQ\) and Cont\(_\exists\). However, Prior (1967: 150) argues that there is still a robust way of expressing the intuitive contingency of an object \(x,\) viz., that \(x\)’s existence is not (strongly) necessary, i.e. (where \(\sfx\) denotes \(x\)), that \(\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\) is not true in all worlds: \(\neg\Box\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\). But in the context of \(Q\) this is equivalent to saying simply that \(\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\) is not n-statable, \(\neg\rS \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\). Accordingly, given SDef, we have:

Cont\(_Q\):
\(\textsf{Contingent}_{Q}(\sfx) \eqdf \neg\rS \sfx\)

As noted above, for Prior, the prospect of logical truths that are not necessarily statable renders the general principle of necessitation unsound. Rather, strong necessity only follows for those logical truths that are n-statable; this is usefully expressed as a derived rule of inference:[79]

Nec\(\astQ\):
\(\rS \psi \to \Box\psi\) follows from \(\psi\).

Since wholly general formulas are all n-statable, another important derived rule is immediate:

Nec\(^{**}_{Q}\):
\(\Box\psi\) follows from \(\psi,\) if \(\psi\) is wholly general.

Of course, if in fact there is a (strongly) necessary being—Allah, say—then, by S3, some singular logical truths—e.g., something exists if Allah exists, \(\exists \sfx\,\sfx=\sfa \to \exists \sfx\,\sfx=\sfx\)—will be n-statable and, hence, (strongly) necessary. But no such truths are provably n-statable in \(Q\), as \(\rS \tau\) is not a theorem of \(Q\), for any term \(\tau\) and, hence, by S2, neither is \(\rS \varphi\) for any formula \(\varphi\) in which \(\tau\) is free. Thus, not only are all wholly general theorems provably necessary as per Nec\(^{**}_{Q},\) they are the only provably necessary logical truths of \(Q\).

The unprovability of \(\rS \tau\) in \(Q\) and, hence, more generally, \(Q\)’s inability to prove the existence of any necessary beings is the key difference between \(Q\) and SQML and, more specifically, it is what justifies the inapplicability of the full necessitation principle Nec to formulas containing free terms, since some of those terms might refer to contingent beings. This is, in particular, the key to blocking the controversial theorems of SQML, as their proofs all depend essentially on such an application of Nec.[80] Indeed, \(Q\) is essentially just SQML shorn of its necessitism. If, as Prior (1967: 155) observed, we restore it by ruling out the prospect of contingent beings explicitly,

N\(_Q\):
\(\forall \sfx\, \rS \sfx\)

\(Q\) simply collapses into SQML.[81] (The reader can quickly verify that N\(_Q\) and the necessitist principle \(\Box\)N are equivalent in \(Q\).) More exactly put: for any formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_\Box,\) \(\varphi\) is a theorem of SQML if and only if it is a theorem of \(Q\) + N\(_{Q}\) and hence if and only if \(\forall \sfx\rS\sfx \to \varphi\) is a theorem of \(Q\). In particular, both BF and CBF fall out as entirely unproblematic theorems under the assumption of necessitism:

BF\(_Q\):
\(\vdash_{Q}\forall \sfx\rS\sfx \to (\Diamond\exists \nu \varphi \to \exists \nu \Diamond\varphi)\)
CBF\(_Q\):
\(\vdash_{Q}\forall \sfx\rS\sfx \to (\exists\nu\Diamond \varphi \to \Diamond\exists\nu\varphi)\)

It is important to emphasize the profound philosophical difference between Prior’s \(Q\) and the necessitist’s SQML that is reflected in the preceding observations. As we’ve seen, \(Q\) was deeply motivated by Prior’s strict actualism; this is most clearly seen in his introduction of the n-statability operator \(\rS\) and the axioms S1S3 expressing the necessary ontological dependence of propositions on their subjects. But, in stark contrast to the necessitist’s SQML, Prior’s metaphysical predilections are not baked into \(Q\)—unlike the necessitist, he has only made them consistent with his logic; his axioms for \(\rS\) and his distinction between strong and weak necessity only have purchase if N\(_{Q}\) is explicitly denied. For Prior, both necessitism and strict actualism are substantive philosophical theses and, hence, the choice between them—i.e., whether or not to adopt N\(_{Q}\) as a proper axiom of a philosophical theory—is left as a matter for pure metaphysics, not logic, to decide.

This sentiment also lies behind Prior’s restricted version MP\(_{Q}\) of MP. As noted above, MP\(_{Q}\) prevents the derivation of \(\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfy\) from the likes of \(\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfa\). But if \(\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfy\) were provable, then, since it is wholly general, it would follow by Nec\(^{**}_{Q}\) that it is strongly necessary, \(\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfy,\) that is, informally put, it would be a theorem of \(Q\) that, in every possible world, there is at least one thing. Again, though, that there couldn’t be an empty world, that it couldn’t have been the case that nothing exists, is a substantive metaphysical thesis that logic is better off leaving undecided. Prior’s restriction in MP\(_{Q}\) ensures that this is in fact the case in \(Q\).

4.4 Perspectivalism

Despite the fact that Prior was able to provide a notion of contingency—contingency\(_Q\)—for his logic \(Q\), it is difficult to downplay the awkwardness of the fact that the most natural expression of contingency—contingency—is unavailable to him; it is, recall, a theorem of \(Q\) that, necessarily, there are no contingent beings—\(\Box\neg\exists \sfx\, \Diamond\neg \exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\). Thus, although seemingly well-motivated by his strict actualist metaphysics, the fact that Prior cannot consistently assert that he himself might not have existed, that he himself is a contingent being, arguably throws strict actualism into doubt: as Deutsch (1990: 92–93) observes,

…surely there is a sense in which “Prior exists” might have been false; [but] there is no way to express this in Prior’s system.

Robert Adams (1974, 1981) developed an important and influential strict actualist account of possible worlds that provides an intuitive notion of modal truth on which Prior is a contingent being and which, more generally, provides a strong justification for modifications that temper at least some of the more severe elements of Prior’s logic.

Because of the centrality of contingency in Adams’ account, it will be useful to introduce a distinct predicate \(\sfE!\) to express the property of being identical with something:

DefE!:
\(\sfE!\tau \eqdf \exists \nu\,\nu=\tau,\) where \(\tau\) is any term other than \(\nu\)

The contingency of an object \(x\) is then simply expressed as \(\Diamond\neg \sfE!\sfx\).

For actualists like Adams, of course, the property of being identical with something is necessarily coextensive with the property of existing and, hence, \(\sfE!\) is often called the existence predicate. It is important to note the stark contrast between the existence predicate \(\sfE!\) and the actuality predicate \(\sfA!\). As we have seen, \(\sfA!\) is a non-logical predicate introduced in the context of the possibilism-actualism debate to (purportedly) signify a distinguished non-logical property: the property (however understood) that, according to the possibilist, distinguishes the likes of us (and abstracta like the numbers) from possibilia. \(\sfE!,\) by contrast, is a purely logical predicate that does not presuppose any particular metaphysical baggage—actualists and possibilists alike (at least, those that accept classical logic) will agree that, as a simple matter of logic, necessarily, everything is identical to something, \(\Box\forall \sfx \sfE!\sfx.\) However, given (as argued above) that possibilists are also committed to necessitism, \(\Box\forall \sfx\Box \sfE!\sfx,\) they will disagree with the typical actualist over whether or not there are any contingent beings, i.e., over whether or not \(\exists \sfx\, \Diamond\neg \sfE!\sfx.\)

4.4.1 World Stories

The most fundamental notion in Adams’ account is that of a proposition, by which he means an abstract entity that is expressed by a declarative sentence and which can be either true or false, depending on how the world is. (As in the discussion of Prior, we will continue to use logical formulas ambiguously, sometimes as names for themselves, sometimes as names for the propositions they are meant to express, trusting context to disambiguate.) Particularly important for Adams’ account is the notion of a singular proposition introduced in §4.3, i.e., a proposition that “involves or refers to an individual directly” (1981: 6). Crucially, as a strict actualist, Adams follows Prior in holding that a singular proposition is ontologically dependent on the individuals it is about—the “subjects” of the proposition—and, hence, that, necessarily, a singular proposition exists if and only if all of its subjects exist. Beyond this, Adams does not provide a rigorous theory of propositions but, rather, takes the notion to be sufficiently well-understood for his purposes.

Adams’ account centers around his notion of a world story, his own “actualistic treatment of possible worlds” (1981: 21). The intuitive idea is that a world story is a complete description of things as they are or could be. Adams’ (1974) initially spells this idea out as follows. Say that a set \(S\) of propositions is maximal if for any proposition \(p,\) \(S\) contains either \(p\) or its negation \(\neg p,\)[82] and that \(S\) is consistent if it is possible that all the members of \(S\) be (jointly) true; \(S,\) then, is a world story if it is both maximal and consistent, and a proposition \(p\) is true in a world story w just in case \(p\) is a member of \(w\). And a world story is true, or obtains, if all the propositions that are true in it are, in fact, true. (Henceforth in this section we will use “world” and “possible world” as synonyms for “world story”; and by “the actual world” we will mean the true world story.[83])

However, Adams came to realize that his 1974 definition did not properly reflect strict actualist principles and subsequently (1981) offered a more subtle definition.[84] According to strict actualism, no singular propositions are in any sense “about” mere possibilia and, hence, there are no such propositions in the actual world, i.e., the true world story. For Adams, possible worlds generally ought to reflect this fact about the actual world. That is, following Prior, a singular proposition \(p\) about some (actually existing) individuals \(a_1,\ldots,a_n\) should be true in a world \(w\) only if those individuals—hence, \(p\) itself—would have existed if \(w\) had obtained. As Prior would put it: a proposition can be true in a world \(w\) only if is statable in \(w\). Thus, just as there are in the actual world no singular propositions about individuals that could have existed but do not, likewise, in every other world \(w\) there should be no singular propositions about (actual) individuals that would not have existed had \(w\) obtained. To reflect this in his conception of worlds, Adams alters his definition so that a set \(S\) of propositions is a world only if it could be be maximal with respect to the actually existing propositions that would exist if it obtained. As Adams puts it:

Intuitively, a world-story should be complete with respect to singular propositions about those actual individuals that would still be actual if all the propositions in the story were true, and should contain no singular propositions at all about those actual individuals that would not exist in that case. (1981: 22)

A world, then, is a set of propositions that could be both maximal in this sense and such that all of its members are true. Equivalently put: a set of propositions is a world just in case, possibly, its members are exactly the true propositions that actually exist.[85] It follows in particular that the proposition \(\neg \sfE!\sfa\) that Adams doesn’t exist is not true in any world story; for, by strict actualism, since it is a singular proposition about Adams, it couldn’t be true without Adams existing—in which case, of course, it would be false. Very much unlike Prior, however, it does not follow for Adams that his non-existence is not possible, \(\neg\Diamond\neg \sfE!\sfa\).

4.4.2 Truth at a World

Adams’ break with Prior on this point is semantic, not metaphysical. Specifically, over and above the notion of truth in a world defined above, Adams identifies a second notion of truth relative to a world that he calls truth at a world. The difference between the two is one of perspective, a difference in what we might call the evaluative standpoint. The propositions that are true in a world \(w,\) recall, are those that are members of \(w\); hence, intuitively, they would all have existed had \(w\) obtained. They are thus the propositions that can be recognized as true from a standpoint “within” \(w\)—since they would have existed if \(w\) had obtained, an agent with sufficient cognitive powers (we can imagine) that might have existed if \(w\) had obtained could have grasped and evaluated them. However—and this is Adams’ crucial insight—from her perspective in \(w,\) that same agent can also evaluate propositions in \(w\) with respect to other worlds \(u\)—notably, for any individual \(x\) in \(w,\) she can see that the proposition \(\neg \sfE!\sfx\) that \(x\) doesn’t exist rightly characterizes any \(x\)-free world \(u,\) the absence of the proposition in question in \(u\) notwithstanding. The proposition is thus, from the standpoint of \(w,\) said to be true at, but not in, \(u\). As Adams, here in the actual world, puts it with regard to the proposition \(\neg \sfE!\sfa\) that he doesn’t exist:

A world story that includes no singular proposition about me … represents my possible non-existence, not by including the proposition that I do not exist but simply by omitting me. That I would not exist if all the propositions it includes … were true is not a fact internal to the world that it describes, but an observation that we make from our vantage point in the actual world, about the relation of that world story to an individual of the actual world. (1981: 22)

If, therefore, we take a proposition to be possible if it is true at, rather than in, a world, since the proposition \(\neg \sfE!\sfa\) that Adams doesn’t exist is true at some worlds, his non-existence is possible after all, \(\Diamond\neg \sfE!\sfa,\) contrary to Prior. This change in perspective thus paves the way for a logic that is consistent with the existence of contingent beings. Recall also that Adams is a serious actualist: to have a property is to exist. Hence, at worlds where a given object fails to exist, it has no properties. Thus, in particular, at a world \(w\) where Prior fails to exist, he also fails to be a logician, that is, it is true at \(w\) that he is not a logician, \(\neg \sfL\sfp\). Hence, the conditional proposition that he is, if a logician, a logician—\(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\)—is also true at \(w\) and so true at all worlds, not just those in which he exists. It is therefore not just weakly necessary, i.e., unable to be false, \(\neg\Diamond\neg(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp),\) but strongly necessary, \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp).\) By taking truth at, rather than in, a world to be our guiding semantic intuition, then, it appears that, without compromising the metaphysics of strict actualism, we can restore at least some of the familiar logical connections between (im)possibility and necessity that were lost in Prior’s \(Q\) and, in particular, restore the modal status of at least some logical truths to full necessity.

Two things are worth mentioning here. First, it is important to note that, while most philosophers will welcome these results, there is still a clear choice that is being made here. Adams has identified two intuitive notions of truth with respect to a world \(w\) within a strict actualist metaphysics that, as we’ve just seen, appear to yield dramatically different logical truths. Both, however, are coherent. Prior built his logic \(Q\) on the one; Adams proposes to build one on the other—at least, in part (see §4.4.4 below).

Second, it needs to be emphasized that these are intuitive semantic notions only. For not only are there well-known, formidable challenges to the notion of a world story that he does not address,[86] because Adams is a strict actualist, a formal, compositional semantics is simply unavailable to him, for the reasons noted in the introduction to §4.3. Hence, Adams’ talk of propositions being true in or at possible worlds cannot themselves be considered literally true but, as with similar talk from Prior, must simply be viewed as an evocative heuristic whose primary purpose is to motivate the basic logical principles underlying his variety of strict actualism.

4.4.3 A Quantified Modal Logic for Perspectivalists

Unlike Prior, Adams does not develop a rigorous deductive system. Rather, in his 1981, he simply identifies a number of informal semantic principles (labeled C1–C9). However, a clear set of axioms and rules requiring only a bit of supplementation can in fact be derived from those principles.[87] We will call the resulting system A.

Adams assumes classical propositional logic (principle (C3)), which can be incorporated into A via the basic propositional schemas P1-P3 and the rule MP of modus ponens. For the rest, it is illuminating to start with the axioms of SQML—albeit with both modal operators as primitive—and then focus on additions and modifications required by Adams’ informal principles.

Adams’ first modally significant principle (C2) (1981: 23) is one expressing serious actualism, the principle that an individual cannot have a property or stand in a relation without existing. For reasons that will become clear below, we will use a somewhat more general schema than schema SA introduced in the context of Kripke’s system KQML:[88]

GSA:
\(\pi\tau_1\ldots\tau_n \to \sfE!\tau_i,\) for terms \(\tau_1, \ldots, \tau_n\) (\(1 \leq i \leq n\))

Thus, in particular, for any property \(F,\) by GSA and Nec we have that, necessarily, Adams has \(F\) only if he exists: \(\Box(\sfF\sfa \to \sfE!\sfa)\). The problem here is that Adams (reasonably) considers identity to be a relation; identity statements are thus simply a variety of atomic formula and, hence, it is also an instance of GSA that Adams is self-identical only if he exists, \(\sfa=\sfa \to \sfE!\sfa\). As Adams accepts the usual laws of identity Id1 and Id2, we appear to have the following simple argument to Adams’ necessary existence:

1. \(\sfa=\sfa\)   Id1
2. \(\sfa=\sfa \to \sfE!\sfa\)   GSA
3. \(\sfE!\sfa\)   1, 2 MP
4. \(\Box \sfE!\sfa\)   3 Nec

However, if identity is a relation, then, given serious actualism, one is not self-identical at worlds in which one fails to exist. This might suggest restricting necessitation to theorems provable without any instance of Id1, which would block not only the inference from line 3 to line 4 but also the proof of the more general necessitist principle \(\Box\)N that, necessarily, everything necessarily exists, \(\Box\forall \sfx \Box\exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\). However, that would still not be enough for, as we saw above, necessitism also follows immediately from the instance CBF* of the converse Barcan formula, whose proof involves no instance of Id1.

Adams (1981: 25) lays the blame for such problems on the classical quantification schema Q2. Following Fine (1978: §3), he adopts the solution mentioned above in our discussion of KQML, namely, replacing Q2 with its free logical counterpart (which we rewrite here with \(\sfE!\)):

FQ2:
\(\forall\nu\varphi \to (\sfE!\tau \to \varphi^\nu_\tau),\) where \(\tau\) is any term that is substitutable for \(\nu\) in \(\varphi\)

It is a simple exercise to show that, with only FQ2 at one’s disposal instead of Q2, one can only prove that CBF holds (innocuously) under the assumption that everything exists necessarily, which of course the typical actualist roundly rejects:

CBFA:
\(\vdash_{A} \forall \sfx \Box \sfE!\sfx \to (\exists\nu\Diamond \varphi \to \Diamond\exists\nu\varphi)\)

\(\Box \sfE!\sfa\) and \(\Box\)N can then be blocked simply by replacing Id1 with its generalization:

\(\boldsymbol{\forall}\)Id1:
\(\forall\nu\,\nu = \nu\)

which, together with FQ2, only allows one to prove modally innocuous conditional identities of the form \(\sfE!\tau \to \tau=\tau.\)

In general, the strategy of giving up the classical schema Q2 in favor of its free counterpart solely to make room for contingent beings in one’s quantified modal logic is a bit fraught for the actualist. For, according to actualism, there are no possibilia and, hence, constants and free variables cannot but denote actually existing things. Consequently, instances of both Q2 and Id1 are still logical truths; they are simply logical truths of the actual world that fail at some possible worlds. Ideally, then, as Adams puts (1981: 30), in a proper quantified modal logic, they should be “contingent theorems”, that is, provable but not subject to necessitation. This idea can in fact be preserved in A simply by adding a schema expressing the actualist view that all terms denote existing things:

E!\(_{A}\):
\(\sfE!\tau,\) for all terms \(\tau\)

and modifying necessitation accordingly:

Nec*:
\(\Box\psi\) follows from \(\psi,\) so long as \(\psi\) is provable without any instance of E!\(_{A}\).

Given E!A and a bit of propositional logic, all instances of Q2 follow immediately from FQ2, and all instances of Id1 follow from FQ2 and \(\boldsymbol{\forall}\)Id1.[89] But, because of the restriction in Nec*, their necessitations do not.

Perspectivalism and De Re Modality

As we’ve seen, Adams’ notion of truth at a world promises to restore at least some of what was arguably lost in Prior’s \(Q\), notably the logical equivalence between necessary truth and impossible falsehood:

\(\Box\Diamond\):
\(\Box\varphi \leftrightarrow \neg\Diamond\neg\varphi\)

But the gains are rather marginal, given the profound implications of Adams’ take on perspectivalism for propositional modal logic. Matters here turn on Adams’ understanding of what it is for a modal proposition \(\Diamond\varphi\) or \(\Box\varphi\) to be true at a possible world \(w\). Just as in the actual world, from a standpoint within another possible world \(w,\) a proposition \(\varphi\) that exists in \(w\) can be true at worlds where it doesn’t exist. \(\Diamond\varphi\)/\(\Box\varphi\) will thus be true from a standpoint in \(w\) if, from that perspective, \(\varphi\) is true at some/all worlds. But if \(\varphi\) does not exist in \(w\)—if, for example, \(\varphi\) is \(\neg \sfE!\sfa\) and \(w\) is Adams-free—then it is not available to be evaluated from a standpoint within \(w\) and, hence, from that standpoint, is neither true nor false at any world and, hence, neither possible nor necessary. For Adams, this means that, from our standpoint in the actual world, both \(\neg\Diamond\varphi\) and \(\neg\Box\varphi\) are true at \(w\):

[F]rom an actualist point of view…there are no possibilities or necessities de re about non-actual individuals. So if I were not an actual individual there would be none about me. The singular propositions that I exist and that I do not exist would not exist to have the logical properties, or enter into the relations with some or all world-stories, by virtue of which my existence or non-existence would be possible or necessary. I therefore say that “\(\Diamond\)(I exist),” “\(\Diamond\)~(I exist),” “\(\Box\)(I exist),” and “\(\Box\)~(I exist)” are all false, and their negations true, at worlds in which I do not exist. Neither my existence nor my non-existence would be possible or necessary if I did not exist. (1981: 29)

Thus, according to Adams, de re modal propositions are existence entailing: an (actually existing) modal proposition \(\Box\varphi\) or \(\Diamond\varphi\) can be true at a world only if it exists there and, hence, only if its subjects do as well. This idea can be axiomatized by a modalized version of the serious actualism principle GSA (see Adams’ principles (C6) and (C7)[90]):

MSA:
\(\triangle\varphi \to \sfE!\tau,\) where \(\triangle\) is either \(\Box\) or \(\Diamond\) and \(\tau\) is free in \(\varphi\).

An immediate consequence of MSA is to render many instances of \(\Box\Diamond\) contingent. For, at an Adams-free world \(w,\) \(\neg \sfE!\sfa,\) for example, is true so, by MSA both \(\neg\Diamond\neg \sfE!\sfa\) and \(\neg\Box\neg \sfE!\sfa\) are true at \(w\). So, given MSA, it appears that the equivalence between necessary truth and impossible falsehood holds at a world only for the propositions that exist there, i.e., in Prior’s terminology, the propositions that are statable there. Because, for the strict actualist, necessarily, a proposition exists if and only if all of its subjects exist, no new sentential operator is needed to express propositional existence; a simple counterpart to SDef* will do:

E!Def*:
\(\sfE!\varphi \to \theta =_{\textit df} \sf\sfE!\tau_1 \to (\ldots \to (\sf\sfE!\tau_n \to \theta)\ldots),\) where \(\tau_1,\ldots,\tau_n\) are all of the terms that occur free in \(\varphi\)

That is, \(\sfE!\varphi \to \theta\) says that \(\theta\) holds if all of \(\varphi\)’s subjects exist—hence, for the strict actualist, if the proposition (expressed by) \(\varphi\) itself exists. Note that, when \(\varphi\) is wholly general, \(n=0\) and so \(\sfE!\varphi \to \theta\) is just \(\theta\).

Given E!Def*, the observation above—that the equivalence of necessity and impossible falsehood at a world only holds for the propositions that exist there—can now be expressed axiomatically in the schema:

\(\Box\Diamond_A\):
\(\sfE!\varphi \to (\Box\varphi \leftrightarrow \neg\Diamond\neg\varphi)\)

Much like the instances of Q2, then, because \(\sfE!\tau\) is an axiom of A for any term \(\tau,\) singular instances of \(\Box\Diamond\) fall out as contingent theorems of A. By the observation above, wholly general instances of \(\Box\Diamond_A\) are simply instances of \(\Box\Diamond\) and, hence, their necessitations are provable.

Implications for Necessitation, 4, B, and 5

MSA’s impact reverberates throughout the modal propositional base of Adams’ logic. Recall that the truth-in/truth-at distinction appeared to have restored the necessity of singular logical truths like Prior, if a logician, is a logician, \(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\). The addition of MSA, however, leads quickly to necessitism, as it becomes possible to reason to Prior’s existence, \(\sfE!\sfp,\) without any instances of E!A:

1. \(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\) PL
2. \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) 1, Nec*
3. \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp) \to \sfE!\sfp\) MSA
4. \(\sfE!\sfp\) 2,3, MP
5. \(\Box \sfE!\sfp\) 4, Nec*
6. \(\Box\forall \sfx\Box \sfE!\sfx\) 5, Gen*, Nec*

Clearly, as Adams (1981: 30) notes, a “suitable restriction” on necessitation (beyond Nec*) is called for. Adams himself does not specify, but it is clear what it must be. Singular logical truths like \(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\) are indeed true at all worlds and, hence, necessary—but only contingently so; for, by MSA, \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) is false at Prior-free worlds. More generally, just as the equivalence of necessity and impossible falsehood only holds at a world for the propositions that exist there, the necessity of a proposition at a world will only hold for the propositions that exist there. Nec* thus requires a qualification similar to \(\Box\Diamond_A\)’s:

NecA:
\(\sfE!\psi \to \Box\psi\) follows from \(\psi,\) so long as \(\psi\) is provable without any instance of E!A.

\(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\) is now still provably necessary:

1. \(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\) PL
2. \(\sfE!\sfp \to \Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) 1, NecA
3. \(\sfE!\sfp\) E!A
4. \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) 2, 3, MP

But, because \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) depends essentially on E!A, its necessitation is not provable. And if one soldiers on in an attempt to replicate the reasoning in the above proof to derive necessitism:

5. \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp) \to \sfE!\sfp\) MSA
6. \(\sfE!\sfp\) 4,5, MP

one can proceed no further, as the proof of \(\sfE!\sfp\) in line 6 depends on \(\sfE!\sfp\) qua instance of E!A in line 3.

The modal schemas K and T, with their simple modalities, are unaffected by MSA but not so for the schemas 4, B, and 5, all three of which involve nested modalities. The example of \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) above motivating NecA has already shown that singular necessities might not themselves be necessary and, hence, serves as well to illustrate the invalidity of 4: \(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp\) is true at all possible worlds, and hence, necessary, \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\); but \(\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\) fails to be true at Prior-free worlds and, hence, is not itself necessary, i.e., \(\neg\Box\Box(\sfL\sfp \to \sfL\sfp)\). B’s invalidity is illustrated by any contingent singular truth; that Prior is a logician, say, \(\sfL\sfp\). By MSA, \(\sfL\sfp\) is not possible at Prior-free worlds, and, hence, it is not necessarily possible, \(\neg\Box\Diamond \sfL\sfp\). And, of course, since it is also in fact possible that Adams is a philosopher, \(\Diamond \sfL\sfp,\) the same example shows that 5 is invalid.

The natural fix for Adams, of course, is to qualify the nested modalities in each case with the condition that the proposition in question exists:[91]

4A:
\(\Box \varphi \to \Box(\sfE!\varphi \to \Box \varphi)\)
BA:
\(\varphi \to \Box(\sfE!\varphi \to \Diamond\varphi)\)
5A:
\(\Diamond\varphi \to \Box(\sfE!\varphi \to \Diamond\varphi)\)

As with KQML, only T and 5A are needed for A; 4A and BA are derivable from them. And, similar to what was observed with Q, it is easy to show that, if one extends A with the thesis of necessitism by replacing E!A with its necessitation,

\(\Box\textbf{E!}_A\):
\(\Box \sfE!\tau,\) for all terms \(\tau\)

the system simply collapses into SQML.

Summarizing, then: Adams’ distinction between truth in a world and truth at a world motivated a number of intuitive semantic principles that, when formalized, yield a “perspectivalist” modal logic A:

As noted, A restores a number of intuitively desirable logical features that were lost in Prior’s \(Q\), in particular, the logical equivalence of necessity and impossible falsehood, and the necessity of singular logical truths. Within modal contexts, however, properties similar to \(Q\) return, albeit in a milder form: where \(Q\) requires the necessary existence of a proposition in order for it to be possible or necessary in a modal context, A requires only de facto existence. The final approach that will be examined here argues that the strict actualist needn’t even concede that much.

4.4.4 Perspectivalism without MSA

A number of philosophers who are at least sympathetic to strict actualism have pointed out that, contrary to Adams, strict actualism does not entail MSA—in effect, the principle that a singular modal propositions cannot be true without existing—and, hence, that the still rather severe restrictions of A are unnecessary (Menzel 1990, 1993; Turner 2005; Einheuser 2012; Mitchell-Yellin & Nelson 2016; Masterman forthcoming). Moreover, they suggest that Adams’ own distinction between truth in a world and truth at a world provides the intuitive semantic foundation for this claim. Thus Menzel (1993: 132) notes that, just as we can consider a negated proposition to be true at a world where it doesn’t exist by considering it from our perspective in the actual world where it does, we can do the same for modal propositions. Turner spells out the idea as follows regarding an arbitrary de re modal proposition \(\Diamond \sfP\sfa,\) where \(a\) is an actually existing object that, in fact, has the property \(P\):

Return to the “picture thinking” that truth at a world is supposed to capture. We are standing outside of a world, looking into it, and using the propositions, objects, properties, and relations of our own world to describe what we see. It makes sense to think that which predications of \(a\) are true at a world is determined solely by things going on in that world—how could facts from other worlds ever get into the picture? But we tend to think that modal truths are not made true solely by what is going on in any one world but by what goes on in the entire space of possible worlds. Furthermore, on the model of “standing outside” of a world looking into it, it is not implausible to think that we should be able to “see” the entire space of possible worlds. We can say, of a non-\(a\) world \(W,\) that at that world it is possible that \(a\) is \(P,\) precisely because, standing outside of \(W,\) we can see other worlds – worlds where \(a\) exists and is \(P\). (2005: 205)

On this take, then, Adams fails to fully embrace his distinction between truth in a world and truth at a world. He evaluates negated propositions at worlds where they fail to exist from our perspective in the actual world, but does not extend the idea to modal propositions; instead, to evaluate a modal proposition \(\Box\varphi\)/\(\Diamond\varphi\) at a world \(w,\) he switches back to an internal perspective that requires the existence of \(\varphi\) in \(w,\) i.e., the evaluative perspective that Prior adopted across the board. It is unsurprising, then, that Adams’ logic A restores only some of the logical truths that were lost in Prior’s \(Q\). But, as Turner notes, a broader embrace of Adams’ perspectivalism would have us evaluate all propositions from our standpoint in the actual world. So “situated”, a modal proposition \(\Box\varphi\)/\(\Diamond\varphi\) can then be considered true at a world \(w\) simply if \(\varphi\) is (from our standpoint, not \(w\))’s) true at all/some worlds. As in the shift from Prior to Adams, then, there is no change to the metaphysics of strict actualism but only a shift in the underlying (intuitive) semantics.[92]

The logical implications of maintaining this fixed perspective in the actual world are quite dramatic. First and foremost, it undermines the motivation for MSA entirely and, with it, the arguments against the validity of the principles \(\Box\Diamond\), 4, B, 5, and the rule of necessitation Nec*. All of those can therefore be embraced without the existence qualifications of \(\Box\Diamond_A\), 4\(_A\), B\(_A\), 5\(_A\), and \(\textbf{Nec}_A\). Substituting the unqualified principles and the rule Nec* in their place results in what might be called a fully perspectivalist modal logic A* for the strict actualist that restores everything that was lost in Prior’s Q, and does so without the expressive restrictions of Kripke’s KQML.

A* (under the name “A”) is proved sound and complete in Menzel 1991.

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