First published Thu Dec 5, 1996; substantive revision Wed Jun 14, 2023

Holes are an interesting case study for ontologists and epistemologists. Naive, untutored descriptions of the world treat holes as objects of reference, on a par with ordinary material objects. (‘There are as many holes in the cheese as there are cookies in the tin.’) And we often appeal to holes to account for causal interactions, or to explain the occurrence of certain events. (‘The water ran out because the bucket has a hole.’) Hence there is prima facie evidence for the existence of such entities. Yet it might be argued that reference to holes is just a façon de parler, that holes are mere entia representationis, as-if entities, fictions.

1. Problems

‘A hole?’ the rock chewer grunted. ‘No, not a hole,’ said the will-o’-the-wisp despairingly. ‘A hole, after all, is something. This is nothing at all’. —Ende (1974/1985: 24)

Hole representations—no matter whether veridical—appear to be commonplace in human cognition. Not only do people have the impression of seeing holes; they also form a corresponding concept, which is normally lexicalised as a noun in ordinary languages. (Some languages even discriminate different types of hole, distinguishing e.g. between superficial hollows, inner cavities, and see-through perforations.) Moreover, data from developmental psychology and the psychology of perception confirm that infants and adults are able to perceive, count, and track holes just as easily as they perceive, count, and track paradigm material objects such as cookies and tins (Giralt & Bloom 2000; Nelson & Palmer 2001; Horowitz & Kuzmova 2011). These facts do not prove that holes and material objects are on equal psychological footing, let alone on equal metaphysical footing. But they indicate that the concept of a hole is of significant salience in the common-sense picture of the world, specifically of the spatiotemporal world.

If holes are entities of a kind, then, they appear to be spatiotemporal particulars, like cookies and tins and unlike numbers or moral values. They appear to have a determinate shape, a size, and a location. (‘These things have birthplaces and histories. They can change, and things can happen to them’, Hofstadter & Dennett 1981: 6–7.) On the other hand, if holes are particulars, then they are not particulars of the familiar sort. For holes appear to be immaterial: every hole has a material “host” (the stuff around it, such as the edible part of a donut) and it may have a material “guest” (such as the liquid filling a cavity), but the hole itself does not seem to be made of matter. Indeed, holes seem to be made of nothing, if anything is. And this gives rise to a number of conundrums. For example:

  1. It is difficult to explain how holes can in fact be perceived. If perception is grounded on causation, as Locke urged (Essay, II-viii-6), and if causality has to do with materiality, then immaterial bodies cannot be the source of any causal flow. So a causal theory of perception would not apply to holes. Our impression of perceiving holes would then be a sort of systematic illusion, on pain of rejecting causal accounts of perception. (On the other hand, if one accepts that absences can be causally efficacious, as urged by Lewis 2004, then a causal account could maintain that we truly perceive holes; see Sorensen 2008 and 2015 along with Siegel 2009, Farennikova 2013, and Calabi 2019.)
  2. It is difficult to specify identity criteria for holes—more difficult than for ordinary material objects. If holes are immaterial, we cannot account for the identity of a hole via the identity of any constituting stuff. But neither can we rely on the identity conditions of the hole’s material host, for we can imagine changing the host—partly or wholly, gradually or abruptly—without affecting the hole. And we cannot rely on the identity conditions of its guest, for it would seem that we can empty a hole of whatever might partially or fully occupy it and leave the hole intact. (Indeed, both “host” and “guest” are relative notions. Doesn’t their proper application presuppose that we already know how to identify holes in the first place? See Meadows 2015.)
  3. It is equally difficult to account for the mereology of holes. Take a card and punch a hole in it. You have made one hole. Now punch again next to it. Have you made another hole? In a way, yes: now the card is doubly perforated. But what prevents us from saying that we still have one hole, though a hole that comes in two disconnected parts? After all, material objects can be disconnected: a bikini, your copy of the Recherche, a token of the lowercase letter ‘i’. Perhaps holes may be disconnected, too? If so, perhaps we have just punched a single, disconnected hole? (Casati & Varzi 2004, 2021)
  4. It is also difficult to assess the explanatory relevance of holes. Arguably, whenever a physical interaction can be explained by appeal to the concept of a hole, a matching explanation can be offered invoking only material objects and their properties. (That water flowed out of the bucket is explained by a number of facts about water fluidity, combined with an accurate account of the physical and geometric conditions of the bucket.) Aren’t these latter explanations enough?

Further problems arise from the ambiguous status of holes in figure-ground displays (Bozzi 1975). Thus, for example, though it appears that the shapes of holes can be recognized by humans as accurately as the shapes of ordinary objects, the area seen through a hole typically belongs to the background of its host, and there is evidence to the effect that background regions are not represented as having shapes (Bertamini & Croucher 2003; Bertamini & Casati 2015). So what would the shape of a hole be, if any?

2. Theories

These difficulties—along with some form of horror vacui—may lead a philosopher to favor ontological parsimony or revisionism over naive realism about holes. A number of options are available:

  1. One may hold that holes do not exist at all, arguing that all truths putatively about holes boil down to truths about holed objects (Jackson 1977: 132) or, more generally, that all sentences that seem to imply the existence of holes can be paraphrased by sentences that lack the implication but could in principle be used for all the same purposes as the original (van Inwagen 2014). This view calls for a systematic way of producing the relevant paraphrases. For instance, the sentence ‘There is a hole in the carpet’ can be treated as a mere grammatical variant of ‘The carpet is perforated’; the sentence ‘There are three round holes in that piece of cheese’ as a variant of ‘That piece of cheese is triply-roundly-holed’, etc. (Challenges: Can every quantification over holes be analyzed this way? Consider: ‘There are as many holes in my cheese as crackers on my plate’; Lewis & Lewis 1970: 207. Can a language be envisaged that contains all the necessary shape predicates? Consider: ‘There are two interlocking toroidal cavities in that piece of cheese’; Casati & Varzi 1994: 180. Can every hole-referring noun-phrase be de-nominalized? Consider: ‘The hole in the tooth was smaller than the dentist’s finest probe’; Geach 1968: 12.)
  2. One may hold that holes do exist, but they are nothing over and above the regions of spacetime at which they are found (Wake et al. 2007). Surely they are not just regions of space, for holes can move, as happens any time you move a donut, whereas regions of space cannot. But as regions of spacetime, holes can be said to move in virtue of having different temporal parts follow one another in different places. (Challenge: Take the doughnut and spin it clockwise. Take a wedding ring, put it inside the hole in the doughnut, and spin it the other way. The two holes are spinning in opposite directions, but the relevant temporal part of the little hole is a spatiotemporal part of the bigger one. Would it be spinning in both directions? See Lewis & Lewis 1970: 208.)
  3. One may hold instead that holes are qualified portions of spacetime (Miller 2007). There would be nothing peculiar about such portions as opposed to any others that we would not normally think of as being occupied by ordinary material objects, just as there would be nothing more problematic, in principle, in determining under what conditions a certain portion counts as a hole than there is in determining under what conditions it counts as a dog, a statue, or whatnot. (Challenge: What if there were truly unqualified portions of spacetime, in this or some other possible world? Would there be truly immaterial entities inhabiting such portions, and would holes be among them?)
  4. One might also hold that holes are ordinary material beings: they are neither more nor less than superficial parts of what, on the naive view, are their material hosts (Lewis & Lewis 1970; Mollica 2022). For every hole there is a hole-lining and for every hole-lining there is a hole; on this conception, the hole is the hole-lining. (Challenge: This calls for an account of the altered meaning of certain predicates or prepositions. Would holes surround themselves? Would filling a hole amount to filling space outside it? Would expanding the hole-lining amount to enlarging the hole?)
  5. Alternatively, one may hold that holes are “negative” parts of their material hosts (Hoffman & Richards 1985). On this account, a donut would be a sort of hybrid mereological aggregate—the mereological sum of a positive pie together with the negative bit in the middle. (Again, this calls for an account of the altered meaning of certain modes of speech. For instance, making a hole would amount to adding a part, and changing an object to get rid of a hole would mean to remove a part, contrary to ordinary usage.)
  6. Yet another possibility is to treat holes as “disturbances” of some sort (Karmo 1977). On this view, a hole is to be found in some object (its “medium”) in the same sense in which a knot may be found in a rope or a wrinkle in a carpet. (The metaphysical status of such entities, however, calls for refinements. Simons 1987: 308 suggested construing them as Husserlian moments that continuously change their fundaments, but this seems to suit knots and wrinkles better than holes.)
  7. Finally, it may be held that holes are not the particulars they seem to be. Perhaps they are properties, viz. spatial qualities of their owners (O’Shaughnessy 2000: 333), or ways things are (Meadows 2013), or relational entities whose fundamental mode of being is being-in (McDaniel 2010). Perhaps holes are ways the world is, viz. non-abstract, localized absences that can serve as truth-makers for negative existentials or false-makers for positive existentials (Martin 1996). Or perhaps holes are genuine negative facts, viz. anti-instantiations of material properties by material things: an absence of F-stuff constitutes a hole insofar as it is surrounded by the presence of F-stuff (Barker & Jago 2012).

On the other hand, the possibility remains of taking holes at face value, which is to say as bona fide immaterial particulars. Any such undertaking would have to account, not only for the general features mentioned in section 1, but also for a number of additional peculiarities (Casati & Varzi 1994). Among others:

  1. Holes are ontologically parasitic: they are always in something and cannot exist in isolation. (‘There is no such thing as a hole by itself’, Tucholsky 1931: 100; ‘Take away the thing, and the hole goes too’, Heath 1967: 524). This is why there cannot exist a world consisting only of holes (Coggins 2010: 71).
  2. Holes are fillable. You don’t necessarily destroy a hole by filling it up (except perhaps when the filling is homogeneous with the hole-lining); you don’t create a new hole by removing the filling.
  3. Holes are locationally gracious. When you fill or put something in a hole, the hole does not squeeze to the side; it shares its location with its guest (and if the guest has a hole, you get two co-located entities of the same kind).
  4. Holes are mereologically structured. They have parts and can bear part-whole relations to one another (though not to their hosts and not to their guests).
  5. Holes are topologically assorted. Superficial hollows are distinguished from internal cavities; straight perforations are distinguished from knotted tunnels.

As is often the case, the choice between all these alternatives—whether holes are to be subjected to Ockham’s razor, reduced to other entities, or taken at face value—will depend on one’s general metaphysical inclinations (Lewis & Lewis 1996). It may also depend on controversial details concerning the nature of space and spacetime, e.g. whether they are relational or substantival (Braddon-Mitchell & Miller 2015). It is, more generally, an instance of the sort of decision philosophers have to make when they scrutinize the ontology inherent in the common-sense picture of the world and the concepts, words, and purposes through which it is described and apprehended.


  • Barker, S., and Jago, M., 2012, ‘Being Positive About Negative Facts’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 85: 117–138.
  • Bertamini, M., and Casati, R., 2015, ‘Figures and Holes’, in J. Wagemans (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Perceptual Organization, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 281–293.
  • Bertamini, M., and Croucher, C. J., 2003, ‘The Shape of Holes’, Cognition, 87: 33–54.
  • Braddon-Mitchell, D., and Miller, K., 2015 ‘On Metaphysical Analysis’, in B. Loewer and J. Schaffer (eds.), A Companion to David Lewis, London: Wiley-Blackwell, pp. 40–59.
  • Bozzi, P., 1975, ‘Osservazioni su alcuni casi di trasparenza fenomica realizzabili con figure a tratto’, in G. B. Flores d’Arcais (ed.), Studies in Perception: Festschrift for Fabio Metelli, Milan/Florence: Martelli-Giunti, pp. 88–110; English translation by R. Davies and I. Bianchi: ‘Observations on Some Cases of Phenomenal Transparency Obtained with Line Drawings’, in R. Davies and I. Bianchi (eds.), Paolo Bozzi’s Experimental Phenomenology, London: Routledge, 2019, pp. 305–321.
  • Calabi, C., 2019, ‘The Eye of the Needle: Seeing Holes’, in R. Davies (ed.), Natural and Artifactual Objects in Contemporary Metaphysics, London: Bloomsbury, pp. 93–102.
  • Casati, R., and Varzi, A. C., 1994, Holes and Other Superficialities, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 2004, ‘Counting the Holes’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 82: 23–27.
  • –––, 2021, ‘Ballot Ontology’, in S. Bernstein and T. Goldschmidt (eds.), Non-Being: New Essay on the Metaphysics of Non-Existence, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 139–164.
  • Coggins, G., 2010, Could There Have Been Nothing?, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Ende, M., 1979, Die unendliche Geschichte: von A bis Z, Stuttgart: Thienemanns. English translation by R. Manheim: The Neverending Story, Garden City, NY: Doubleday, 1983; reprinted by Puffin Books, 1985.
  • Farennikova, A., 2013, ‘Seeing Absence’, Philosophical Studies, 166: 429–454.
  • Geach, P., 1968, ‘What Actually Exists’, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 42: 7–16.
  • Giralt, N., and Bloom, P., 2000, ‘How Special Are Objects? Children’s Reasoning about Objects, Parts, and Holes’, Psychological Science, 11: 503–507.
  • Heath, P. L., 1967, ‘Nothing’, in P. Edwards (ed.), The Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 5), London: Macmillan, pp. 524–525.
  • Hoffman, D. D., and Richards, W. A., 1985, ‘Parts of Recognition’, Cognition, 18: 65–96.
  • Hofstadter, D. R., and Dennett, D. C., 1981, The Mind’s I. Fantasies and Reflections on Self and Soul, New York: Basic Books.
  • Horowitz, T., and Kuzmova, Y., 2011, ‘Can We Track Holes?’, Vision Research, 51: 1013–1021.
  • Jackson, F., 1977, Perception. A Representative Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Karmo, T., 1977, ‘Disturbances’, Analysis, 37: 147–148.
  • Lewis, D. K., 2004, ‘Void and Object’, in J. D. Collins, N. Hall, and L. A. Paul (eds.), Causation and Counterfactuals, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 277–290.
  • Lewis, D. K., and Lewis, S. R., 1970, ‘Holes’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 48: 206–212; reprinted in D. K. Lewis, Philosophical Papers. Volume 1, New York: Oxford University Press, 1983, pp. 3–9.
  • –––, 1996, Review of Casati and Varzi 1994, Philosophical Review, 105: 77–79; reprinted as ‘Casati and Varzi on Holes’, in D. K. Lewis, Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999, pp. 183–186.
  • Martin, C. B., 1996, ‘How It Is: Entities, Absences and Voids’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 74: 57–65.
  • McDaniel, K., 2010, ‘Being and Almost Nothingness’, Noûs, 44: 628–649.
  • Meadows, P. J., 2013, ‘What Angles Can Tell Us About What Holes Are Not’, Erkenntnis, 78: 319–331.
  • –––, 2015, ‘Holes Cannot Be Counted as Immaterial Objects’, Erkenntnis, 80: 841–852.
  • Miller, K., 2007, ‘Immaterial Beings’, The Monist, 90: 349–371.
  • Mollica, L., 2022, ‘Argle Victorious: A Theory of Holes as Hole-Linings’, Synthese, 200 (457). doi:10.1007/s11229-022-03952-z
  • Nelson, R., and Palmer, S. E., 2001, ‘Of Holes and Wholes: The Perception of Surrounded Regions’, Perception, 30: 1213–1226.
  • O’Shaughnessy, B., 2000, Consciousness and the World, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Siegel, S., 2009, ‘The Visual Experience of Causation’, Philosophical Quarterly, 59: 519–540.
  • Simons, P. M., 1987, Parts. A Study in Ontology, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Sorensen, R., 2008, Seeing Dark Things. The Philosophy of Shadows, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sorensen, R., 2015, ‘Perceiving Nothings’, in M. Matthen (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Perception, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 542–563
  • Tucholsky, K., 1931, ‘Zur soziologischen Psychologie der Löcher’ (signed Kaspar Hauser), Die Weltbühne, March 17, p. 389; reprinted in K. Tucholsky, Gesammelte Werke (ed. by M. Gerold-Tucholsky and F. J. Raddatz), Reinbek: Rowohlt Verlag, 1960, Vol. 3, pp. 804–805; English translation by H. Zohn: ‘The Social Psychology of Holes’, in H. Zohn (ed.), Germany? Germany! The Kurt Tucholsky Reader, Manchester: Carcanet Press, 1990, pp. 100–101.
  • van Inwagen, P., 2014, ‘Alston on Ontological Commitment’, in his Existence. Essays in Ontology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 137–152.
  • Wake, A., Spencer, J., and Fowler, G., 2007, ‘Holes as Regions of Spacetime’, The Monist, 90: 372–378.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2023 by
Roberto Casati <casati@ehess.fr>
Achille Varzi <achille.varzi@columbia.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free