Since metaphysics is the study of what exists, one might expect metaphysicians to have little to say about the limit case in which nothing exists. But ever since Parmenides in the fifth century BCE, there has been rich commentary on whether an empty world is possible, whether there are vacuums, and about the nature of privations and negation.
This survey starts with nothingness at a global scale and then explores local pockets of nothingness. Let’s begin with a question that Martin Heidegger famously characterized as the most fundamental issue of philosophy.
- 1. Why is there something rather than nothing?
- 2. Is there at most one empty world?
- 3. Can there be an explanatory framework for the question?
- 4. The restriction to concrete entities
- 5. The contingency dilemma
- 6. The intuitive primacy of positive truths
- 7. The subtraction argument
- 8. Ontological neutrality
- 9. The problem of multiple nothings
- 10. Is there any nothingness?
- 11. Phenomenological aspects of nothingness
- 12. Animal Cognition of Absences
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Well, why not? Why expect nothing rather than something? No experiment could support the hypothesis ‘There is nothing’ because any observation obviously implies the existence of an observer.
Is there any a priori support for ‘There is nothing’? One might respond with a methodological principle that propels the empty world to the top of the agenda. For instance, many feel that whoever asserts the existence of something has the burden of proof. If an astronomer says there is water at the south pole of the Moon, then it is up to him to provide data in support of the lunar water. If we were not required to have evidence to back our existential claims, then a theorist who fully explained the phenomena with one set of things could gratuitously add an extra entity, say, a pebble outside our light cone. We recoil from such add-ons. To prevent the intrusion of superfluous entities, one might demand that metaphysicians start with the empty world and admit only those entities that have credentials. This is the entry requirement imposed by René Descartes. He clears everything out and then only lets back in what can be proved to exist.
St. Augustine had more conservative counsel: we should not start at the beginning, nor at the end, but where we are, in the middle. We reach a verdict about the existence of controversial things by assessing how well these entities would harmonize with the existence of better established things. If we start from nothing, we lack the bearings needed to navigate forward. Conservatives, coherentists and scientific gradualists all cast a suspicious eye on ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’.
Most contemporary philosophers feel entitled to postulate whatever entities are indispensable to their best explanations of well accepted phenomena. They feel the presumption of non-existence is only plausible for particular existence claims. Since the presumption only applies on a case by case basis, there is no grand methodological preference for an empty world. Furthermore, there is no burden of proof when everybody concedes the proposition under discussion. Even a solipsist agrees there is at least one thing!
A more popular way to build a presumption in favor of nothingness is to associate nothingness with simplicity and simplicity with likelihood. The first part of this justification is plausible. ‘Nothing exists’ is simple in the sense of being an easy to remember generalization. Consider a test whose questions have the form ‘Does x exist?’. The rule ‘Always answer no!’ is unsurpassably short and comprehensive.
In Les Misérables, Victor Hugo contrasts universal negation with universal affirmation:
All roads are blocked to a philosophy which reduces everything to the word ‘no.’ To ‘no’ there is only one answer and that is ‘yes.’ Nihilism has no substance. There is no such thing as nothingness, and zero does not exist. Everything is something. Nothing is nothing. Man lives more by affirmation than by bread. (1862, pt. 2, bk. 7, ch. 6).
As far as simplicity is concerned, there is a tie between the nihilistic rule ‘Always answer no!’ and the inflationary rule ‘Always answer yes!’. Neither rule makes for serious metaphysics.
Even if ‘Nothing exists’ were the uniquely simplest possibility (as measured by memorability), why should we expect that possibility to be actual? In a fair lottery, we assign the same probability of winning to the ticket unmemorably designated 4,169,681 as to the ticket memorably labeled 1,111,111.
Indeed, the analogy with a lottery seems to dramatically reverse the presumption of non-existence. If there is only one empty world and many populated worlds, then a random selection would lead us to expect a populated world.
Peter van Inwagen (1996) has nurtured this statistical argument. In an infinite lottery, the chance that a given ticket is the winner is 0. Van Inwagen reasons that since there are infinitely many populated worlds, the probability of a populated world is equal to 1. Although the empty world is not impossible, it is as improbable as anything can be!
For the sake of balanced reporting, van Inwagen should acknowledge that, by his reasoning, the actual world is also as improbable as anything can be. What really counts here is the probability of ‘There is something’ as opposed to ‘There is nothing’.
Is this statistical explanation scientific? Scientists stereotypically offer causal explanations. These are not feasible given the comprehensive reading of ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’. However, Elliott Sober (1983) argues that scientists also accept “equilibrium explanations”. These explain the actual situation as the outcome of most or all of the possible initial states. There is no attempt to trace the path by which the actual initial state developed into the present situation. It suffices that the result is invariant. Why do I have enough oxygen to breathe even though all the oxygen molecules could have congregated in one corner my room? The physicist explains that while this specific arrangement is just as likely as any other, the overwhelming majority of arrangements do not segregate oxygen.
Most philosophers would grant Peter van Inwagen’s premise that there is no more than one empty world. They have been trained to model the empty world on the empty set. Since a set is defined in terms of its members, there can be at most one empty set.
However, medieval philosophers differentiated empty worlds by the power of places within those worlds (Grant 1981). The Condemnation of 1277 forced Aristotelian philosophers to acknowledge the possibility of a void (to respect God’s omnipotence and the Christian doctrine of creation from nothing). Most thinkers retained Aristotle’s assumption that there was a unique center of the universe. If rocks were introduced into such a world, they would all head toward their natural location at the center of the universe. (Aristotle uses this point to provide a spectacular explanation of why there are not two earths; they would have collided!) However, Nicole Oresme imagined a world without any center. He predicted the rocks would head toward each other. Since air, fire, earth, and water each had their own places in Aristotle’s physics, fourteenth century philosophers could imagine worlds that differed as to which of these places to retain. The void was rarely pictured as homogeneous.
Aristotle’s world was self-governed. Objects have powers that collectively explain the order of the universe. Thinkers in the Abrahamic tradition replaced Aristotle’s invisible hand explanation with God’s hidden hand. God dictated laws of nature to which He made periodic adjustments (like clockmakers who regularly serviced their creations, correcting the accumulating errors). Reflection on God’s perfection eventually made these divine interventions seem like an impious slight against God’s foreknowledge. After the miracles were rescinded, God Himself was retired. What was left were the laws of nature. Since there was no longer any constraint on what laws had to be, the actual world looks highly contingent. At first blush, this vindicates van Inwagen’s probabilistic argument. But the contingency of laws also raises the possibility of individuating empty worlds by their laws (Carroll 1994, 64). For instance, Isaac Newton’s first law of motion says an undisturbed object will continue in motion in a straight line. Some previous physicists suggested that such an object will slow down and tend to travel in a circle. This empty world differs from the Newtonian empty world because different counterfactual statements are true of it.
If variation in empty worlds can be sustained by differences in the laws that apply to them, there will be infinitely many empty worlds. The gravitational constant of an empty world can equal any real number between 0 and 1, so there are more than countably many empty worlds. Indeed, any order of infinity achieved by the set of populated possible worlds will be matched by the set of empty worlds.
John Heil (2013) is bemused by this War of the Possible Worlds. Having given up the Law Maker, we should give up the laws. Once we return to a self-governed world, there will be no temptation to see the world as a lucky accident. After all, we do not literally see states of affairs as contingent. Contingency, unlike color or shape, is not perceptible. Nor is there any presumption for regarding states of affairs as contingent. According to Heil, ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ owes its urgency to a partisan background theory, not a neutral arbiter such as perception or methodology.
Although possible worlds became intensely popular among analytic philosophers after revolutionary advances in modal logic in the 1960s, they receive little attention from existentialists. Their discussion of objects is more in line with powers ontology advocated by Heil. Indeed, some existentialists picture nothingness as a kind of force that impedes each object’s existence. Since there is something rather than nothing, any such nihilating force cannot have actually gone unchecked. What could have blocked it? Robert Nozick (1981, 123) toys with an interpretation of Heidegger in which this nihilating force is self-destructive. This kind of double-negation is depicted in the Beatles’s movie Yellow Submarine. There is a creature that zooms around like a vacuum cleaner, emptying everything in its path. When this menace finally turns on itself, a richly populated world pops into existence.
Some cultures have creation myths reminiscent of Yellow Submarine. Heidegger would dismiss them as inappropriately historical. ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is not about the origin of the world. Increasing the scientific respectability of the creation story (as with the Big Bang hypothesis) would still leave Heidegger objecting that the wrong question is being addressed.
Some disagree with van Inwagen’s assumption that each possible world is as likely as any other (Kotzen 2013). There have been metaphysical systems that favor less populated worlds.
Indeed, the original purveyor of possible worlds, Gottfried Leibniz, pictured possible things as competing to become actual. The more a thing competes with other things, the more likely that there will be something that stops it from becoming real. The winners in Leibniz’s struggle for existence are cooperative. They uniquely fit the niche formed by other things. This key hole into existence implicitly conveys information about everything. The little bit that is not, tells us about all that there is.
On the one hand, this metaphysical bias in favor of simplicity is heartening because it suggests that the actual world is not too complex for human understanding. Scientists have penetrated deeply into the physical world with principles that emphasize parsimony and uniformity: Ockham’s razor, the least effort principle, the anthropic principle, etc.
On the other hand, Leibniz worried that the metaphysical bias for simplicity, when driven to its logical conclusion, yields the embarrassing prediction that there is nothing. After all, an empty world would be free of objects trying to elbow each other out. It is the world that requires the least effort to produce (Just do nothing!) and sustain (Continue doing nothing!). So why is there something rather than nothing?
Leibniz’s worry requires a limbo between being and non-being. If the things in this limbo state do not really exist, how could they prevent anything else from existing?
Leibniz’s limbo illustrates an explanatory trap. To explain why something exists, we standardly appeal to the existence of something else. There are mountain ranges on Earth because there are plates on its surface that slowly collide and crumple up against each other. There are rings around Saturn because there is an immense quantity of rubble orbiting that planet. This pattern of explanation is not possible for ‘Why is there something rather than nothing’. For instance, if we answer ‘There is something because the Universal Designer wanted there to be something’, then our explanation takes for granted the existence of the Universal Designer. Someone who poses the question in a comprehensive way will not grant the existence of the Universal Designer as a starting point.
If the explanation cannot begin with some entity, then it is hard to see how any explanation is feasible. Some philosophers conclude ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is unanswerable. They think the question stumps us by imposing an impossible explanatory demand, namely, Deduce the existence of something without using any existential premises. Logicians should feel no more ashamed of their inability to perform this deduction than geometers should feel ashamed at being unable to square the circle.
David Hume offers a consolation prize: we might still be able to explain the existence of each event even if it is impossible to explain everything all together. Suppose that the universe is populated with an infinite row of dominoes. The fall of each domino can be explained by the fall of its predecessor.
But what is responsible for the arrangement to begin with? Why is there anything in our domain of discourse? There is a tradition of denying that this kind of comprehensive questioning is coherent. Principles that apply within a system need not be applicable to the system itself.
Is there a world? Can worlds be counted in the way presupposed by modal metaphysics? Doubts about absolute generality can descend from logical theorizing about quantification (Rayo 2013). They can also bubble up from suspicions about abstraction (Maitzen 2012). A sortal such as KITTEN tells us the nature of a thing, thereby supplying criteria for counting and persistence. THING is a dummy sortal. How many things do you have when you have a capped pen? The question cannot be answered because you have not been given criteria governing whether the cap and the pen count as separate objects. All questions about existence must be relativized to sorts. Consequently, the question of why there is something rather than nothing is incomplete. Once we remedy the incompleteness with a sortal, the question will be answered by science.
Empiricists such as Hume deny that the existence of anything could be proved by reason alone. Rationalists have been more optimistic. Many have offered a priori proofs of God’s existence. Such a proof would double as an explanation of why there is something. If God exists, then something exists. After all, God is something.
But would God be the right sort of something? If we are only seeking an a priori proof of something (anything at all!), then why not rest content with a mathematical demonstration that there exists an integer between a square and a cube? There must exist such an integer because 25 is a square and 27 is a cube and only one integer can be between 25 and 27. Therefore, something exists. Why does this come off as a mathematical joke?
Van Inwagen’s answer is that we are actually interested in concrete things. A grain of sand, a camel, and an oasis are each concrete entities. They are part of the causal order. In contrast, abstract entities (numbers, sets, possible worlds) do not cause anything. Those who adopt the principle that only causes are real will become nominalists; everything is concrete.
A second characterization of concrete entities is in terms of locatability; a concrete entity has a position in space or time. Since concrete entities are situated, they have boundaries with their environment. (The only exception would be an entity that took up all space or all time, say Nature.)
Admittedly, points in space and time have locations. But concrete entities are only accidentally where and when they are. All concrete entities have intrinsic properties (which make their boundaries natural rather than conventional, say Efird and Stoneham (2005, 314)). Their natures are not exhausted by their relationships with other things. Max Black imagines twin iron spheres in an otherwise empty universe. The spheres are distinct yet have the same relationships and the same intrinsic properties.
All material things are concrete but some concrete things might be immaterial. Shadows and holes have locations and durations but they are not made of anything material. There is extraneous light in shadows and extraneous matter in holes; but these are contaminants rather than constituents. Cracks can spread, be counted, and concealed. Once we acknowledge the existence of cracks, we get an unexpected transcendental explanation of why there is something: If there is nothing then there is an absence of anything. Therefore, there exists something (either a positive concrete entity or an absence).
Ontological pluralists do not dismiss this proof as sophistry. Kris McDaniel (2013, 277) thinks the proof is trivially correct. To address a more interesting question, McDaniel follows Aristotle’s principle that there are many ways of being. From the pluralist’s perspective, debate over whether holes exist is equivocal. The friends of absences use a broad sense of being. The enemies of holes speak from a higher link in the chain of being. From this altitude, holes depend on their hosts and so cannot be as real. Alexius Meinong’s talk of subsistence alludes to the lowest level of being. “Why does anything subsist?” is a perfectly legitimate question, according to McDaniel.
If there are souls or Cartesian minds, then they will also qualify as immaterial, concrete entities. Although they do not take up space, they take up time. An idealist such as George Berkeley could ask ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ even though he was convinced that material things are not possible.
William James denied that his defense of parapsychology provided a resource for answering, ‘How comes the world to be here at all instead of the non-entity which might be imagined in its place?’ Philosophy, be it natural or supernatural, can make no progress on this issue “for from nothing to being there is no logical bridge” (1911, 40). James concludes: “The question of being is the darkest in all philosophy. All of us are beggars here, and no school can speak disdainfully of another or give itself superior airs” (1911, 46).
Although all concrete things are in space or time, neither space nor time are concrete things. Where would space be? When would time occur? These questions can only be answered if space were contained in another higher space. Time would be dated within another time. Since the same questions can be posed for higher order space and higher order time, we would face an infinite regress.
There is no tradition of wondering ‘Why is there space and time?’. One reason is that space and time seem like a framework for there being any contingent things.
Absolutists think of the framework as existing independently of what it frames. For instance, Newton characterized space as an eternal, homogeneous, three dimensional container of infinite extent. He believed that the world was empty of objects for an infinite period prior to creation (setting aside an omnipresent God). An empty world would merely be a continuation of what creation interrupted.
Others think the framework depends on what it frames. Like Leibniz, Albert Einstein pictured (or “pictured”) space as an abstraction from relations between objects. Consequently, space can be described with the same metaphors we use for family trees. Maybe space grows bigger. Maybe space is curved or warped or has holes. There is much room to wonder why space has the properties that it has. But since space is an abstraction from objects, answers to any riddles about space reduce to questions about objects. One can wonder why there is space. But this is only to wonder why there are objects.
All concrete things appear to be contingent beings. For instance, the planet Earth would not have existed had the matter which now constitutes our solar system formed, as usual, two stars instead of one. If no concrete thing is a necessary being, then no concrete thing can explain the existence of concrete things.
Even if God is not concrete, proof of His existence would raise hope of explaining the existence of concrete things. For instance, the Genesis creation story suggests that God made everything without relying any antecedent ingredients. The story also suggests that God had a reason to create. If this account could be corroborated we would have an explanation of why there are some concrete things.
This divine explanation threatens to over-explain the data. Given that God is a necessary being and that the existence of God necessitates the existence of Earth, then Earth would be a necessary being rather than a contingent being.
The dilemma was generalized by William Rowe (1975). Consider all the contingent truths. The conjunction of all these truths is itself a contingent truth. On the one hand, this conjunction cannot be explained by any contingent truth because the conjunction already contains all contingent truths; the explanation would be circular. On the other hand, this conjunction cannot be explained by a necessary truth because a necessary truth can only imply other necessary truths. This dilemma suggests that ‘Why are there any contingent beings?’ is impossible to answer.
Rowe presupposes that an answer would have to be a deductive explanation. If there are ‘inferences to the best explanation’ or inductive explanations, then there might be a way through the horns of Rowe’s dilemma.
There also remains hope that Rowe’s dilemma can be bypassed by showing that the empty world is not a genuine possibility. Then the retort to ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is ‘There is no alternative to there being something!’.
‘There might be nothing’ is false when read epistemically. (Roughly, a proposition is epistemically possible if it is consistent with everything that is known.) For we know that something actually exists and knowledge of actuality precludes all rival epistemic possibilities. But when read metaphysically, ‘There might be nothing’ seems true. So ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is, so far, a live question.
The question is not undermined by the a priori status of knowledge that something exists. (I know a priori that something exists because I know a priori that I exist and know this entails ‘Something exists’.) Knowledge, even a priori knowledge, that something is actually true is compatible with ignorance as to how it could be true.
Residual curiosity is possible even when the proposition is known to be a necessary truth. A reductio ad absurdum proof that 1 − 1/3 + 1/5 − 1/7 + … converges to π/4 might persuade one that there is no alternative without illuminating how it could be true. For this brute style of proof does not explain how π wandered into the solution. (Reductio ad absurdum just shows a contradiction would follow if the conclusion were not true.) This raises the possibility that even a logical demonstration of the metaphysical necessity of ‘Something exists’ might still leave us asking why there is something rather than nothing (though there would no longer be the wonder about the accidentality of there being something). This leads Andrew Brenner (2016) to deny that ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is restricted to contingent entities. Brenner argues the question is highly ambiguous. At best there is only a family resemblance between the questions under discussion. What appears to be disagreement is too often a verbal dispute.
Henri Bergson maintained that nothingness is precluded by the positive nature of reality. The absence of a female pope is not a brute fact. ‘There is not a female pope’ is made true by a positive fact such as the Catholic Church’s regulation that all priests be men and the practice of drawing popes from the priesthood. Once we have the positive facts and the notion of negation, we can derive all the negative facts. ‘There is nothing’ would be a contingent, negative fact. But then it would have to be grounded on some positive reality. That positive reality would ensure that there is something rather than nothing.
Human beings have a strong intuition that positive truths, such as ‘Elephants are huge’ are more fundamental than negative truths such as ‘Elephants do not jump’. The robustness of this tendency makes negative things objects of amusement. Consider the Professor’s remark during his chilly banquet in Lewis Carroll’s Sylvie and Bruno Concluded.
“I hope you’ll enjoy the dinner—such as it is; and that you won’t mind the heat—such as it isn’t.”
The sentence sounded well, but somehow I couldn’t quite understand it … (chapter 22)
How can we perceive absences? They seem causally inert and so not the sort of thing that we could check empirically. Negative truths seem redundant; there are no more truths than those entailed by the conjunction of all positive truths. The negative truths seem psychological; we only assert negative truths to express a frustrated expectation. When Jean Paul Sartre (1969, 41) arrives late for his appointment with Pierre at the cafe, he sees the absence of Pierre but not the absence of the Duke of Wellington.
Philosophers have had much trouble vindicating any of these intuitions. Bertrand Russell (1985) labored mightily to reduce negative truths to positive truths. Russell tried paraphrasing ‘The cat is not on the mat’ as ‘There is a state of affairs incompatible with the cat being on the mat’. But this paraphrase is covertly negative; it uses ‘incompatible’ which means not compatible. He tried modeling ‘Not p’ as an expression of disbelief that p. But ‘disbelief’ means believing that something is not the case. Is it even clear that absences are causally inert? Trapped miners are killed by the absence of oxygen. In the end Russell surrendered his intuition that reality is positive. In a famous lecture at Harvard, Russell concluded that irreducibly negative facts exist. He reports this nearly caused a riot.
Were it not for the threat to social order, one might stand the intuition on its head: Negative truths are more fundamental than positive truths. From a logical point of view, there is greater promise in a reduction of positive truths to negative truths. Positive truths can be analyzed as the negations of negative truths or perhaps as frustrated disbelief. Positive truths would then be the redundant hanger-ons, kept in circulation by our well-documented difficulty in coping with negative information. Think of photographic negatives. They seem less informative than positive prints. But since the prints are manufactured from the negatives, the negatives must be merely more difficult for us to process.
As difficult as negation might be psychologically, it is easier to work with than the alternatives suggested by Henry Sheffer. In 1913, he demonstrated that all of the logical connectives can be defined in terms of the dual of conjunction, now known as NAND (short for NOT AND). Sheffer translates ‘p NAND q’ as ‘either not p or not q’. ‘Not p’ is defined as ‘p NAND p’. Sheffer notes that the dual of disjunction, NOR (short for NOT OR), can also define all the connectives. Sheffer translates ‘p NOR q’ as ‘neither p nor q’. From a logical point of view, negation is dispensable. This raises hope that all of the paradoxes of negation can be translated away.
Bertrand Russell quickly incorporated NAND into Principia Mathematica. Sheffer’s functions have also been a great economy to the assembly line symbol manipulation of computers (as witnessed by the popularity of NAND gates and NOR gates). However, human beings have trouble achieving fluency with Sheffer’s connectives. Even Sheffer translates them negatively. Psychologically, the phrases ‘either not p or not q’ and ‘neither p nor q’ are each heard as a double dose of negation rather than as an alternative to negation.
But we could let computers do our metaphysics just as we let them do our taxes. The only serious objection is that the problems of negation do not really go away when we translate into artificial languages. For instance, the challenge posed by negative existential sentences such as ‘Pegasus does not exist’ persists when translated as ‘Pegasus exists NAND Pegasus exists’. Any desire to make ‘Pegasus does not exist’ come out true warrants a desire to make ‘Pegasus exists NAND Pegasus exists’ come out true. (Since classical logic does not permit empty names, the NAND existential sentence will not be true.)
The more general concern is that the problems which are naturally couched in terms of negation persist when they are translated into a different logical vocabulary. Given that the translation preserves the meaning of the philosophical riddle, it will also preserve its difficulty.
We engage in negative thinking to avoid highly complicated positive thinking. What is the probability of getting at least one head in ten tosses of a coin? Instead of directly computing the probability of this highly disjunctive positive event, we switch to a negative perspective. We first calculate the probability of a total absence of heads and then exploit the complement rule: Probability (at least one head) = 1 − Probability (no heads). An apt anagram of NEGATIVISM is TIMESAVING.
Some possible worlds are easier to contemplate negatively. Thales said that all is water. Suppose he was nearly right except for the existence of two bubbles. These two absences of water become the interesting players (just as two drops of water in an otherwise empty space become interesting players in the dual of this universe). How would these bubbles relate to each other? Would the bubbles repel each other? Would the bubbles be mutually unaffected? Deep thinking about gravity yields the conclusion that the bubbles would attract each other! (Epstein 1983, 138–9)
The hazard of drawing metaphysical conclusions from psychological preferences is made especially vivid by caricatures. We know that caricatures are exaggerated representations. Despite the flagrant distortion (and actually because of it) we more easily recognize people from caricatures rather than from faithful portraits.
For navigational purposes, we prefer schematic subway maps over ones that do justice to the lengths and curves of the track lines. But this is not a basis for inferring that reality is correspondingly schematic.
Our predilection for positive thinking could reflect an objective feature of our world (instead of being a mere anthropocentric projection of one style of thought). But if this objective positiveness is itself contingent, then it does not explain why there is something rather than nothing. For Bergson’s explanation to succeed, the positive nature of reality needs to be a metaphysically necessary feature.
Thomas Baldwin (1996) reinforces the possibility of an empty world by refining the following thought experiment: Imagine a world in which there are only finitely many objects. Suppose each object vanishes in sequence. Eventually you run down to three objects, two objects, one object and then Poof! There’s your empty world.
What can be done temporally can be done modally. There is only a small difference between a possible world with a hundred objects and a possible world with just ninety-nine, and from there …. well, just do the arithmetic!
Can the subtraction be completed if there necessarily are infinitely many things? Penelope Maddy (1990) claims that unit sets are concrete entities, sharing the location of their members. The existence of one concrete entity would guarantee the existence of infinitely many. Consequently, there would be no finite worlds.
Baldwin avoids this issue with a different definition. Concrete entities are violators of Leibniz’s principle of the identity of indiscernibles. Concrete things may have exact duplicates. For instance, Cameron Winklevoss could have a twin who PERFECTLY resembles him (unlike his homozygotic twin Tyler Winklevoss). In contrast, the unit set comprised of Cameron Winklevoss cannot have a perfect twin. All sets obey Leibniz’s principle of the identity of indiscernibles and so Baldwin counts them as abstract entities.
Geraldine Coggins (2010, chapter 4) objects that Baldwin’s definition of concreteness is inferior to the customary spatiotemporal definition. She deems the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties as too problematic to ground the distinction between concrete and abstract objects.
Another concern is that infinite proliferation can be precipitated by the constitution relation. Assume that each part of a concrete entity is itself concrete. Also assume that concrete entities are infinitely divisible (as seems natural given that space is dense). An infinitely complex object cannot be nibbled away with any number of finite bites.
Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (2013) suggests that we instead take big, infinite bites. Instead of subtracting entity by entity, subtract by the chunk (of infinitely composite entities).
Our metaphysical calculations are subliminally influenced by how we picture possible worlds (Coggins 2010, chapter 3). If possible worlds are envisaged as containers, then they can be completely emptied. Similarly, if possible worlds are pictured as stories (say maximally consistent ways things could have been), then our library will contain a tale lacking any concrete entities as characters. But if possible worlds are pictured mereologically, as giant conglomerates of concrete objects (Lewis 1986), our subtraction falters before we reach zero. Similarly, if possible worlds require an active construction (say, Ludwig Wittgenstein’s imaginary rearrangements of objects drawn from the actual world), then the very process of construction ensures that there are some concrete objects in every possible world.
Some kind of background theory of possible worlds is needed. For without this substantive guidance, the subtraction argument seems invalid. More specifically, from a metaphysically neutral perspective, the fact that it is possible for each object to not exist seems compatible with it being necessary that at least one object exists.
The founder of modal logic, Aristotle, has special reason to deny that ‘Necessarily (p or q)’ entails ‘Necessarily p or necessarily q’. Aristotle believed that all abstract entities depend on concrete entities for their existence. Yet he also believed that there are necessary truths. The existence of any particular individual is contingent but it is necessary that some individuals exist.
Science textbooks teem with contingent abstract entities: the equator, Jupiter’s center of gravity, NASA’s space budget, etc. Twentieth century mathematics makes sets central. Sets are defined in terms of their members. Therefore, any set that contains a contingent entity is itself a contingent entity. Any set that contains Cameron Winklevoss is an abstract entity that has no weight or color or electric charge. But it still depends on Winklevoss for its existence.
Mathematics can be reconstructed in terms of sets given the assumption that something exists. From Cameron Winklevoss, set theorists can derive the set containing him, then the set containing that set, then the set containing that larger set, and so on. Through arachnophilic craftiness, all of mathematics can be reconstructed from sets. But founding all of mathematics on Cameron Winklevoss would fail to reflect the necessary status of mathematical truth. Founding mathematics on a necessary being such as God would alienate atheists. So ecumenical set theorists instead spin this amazing structure from only the set that does not depend on the existence of anything: the empty set. This is the closest mathematicians get to creation from nothing!
This does not avoid all controversy. Early set theorists and an array contemporary metaphysicians reject the empty set. Yet the loveliness of the construction makes many of their colleagues receptive to Wesley Salmon’s ontological argument: “The fool saith in his heart that there is no empty set. But if that were so, then the set of all such sets would be empty, and hence it would be the empty set.”
E. J. Lowe (2013, 192) argues on behalf of the fool: Two sets are identical exactly if they have the same members. So the identity of a set is grounded on the identity conditions of its members. In the absence of members, the set is ill-defined. Mathematicians may wield it as a useful fiction. But utility should not be confused with truth. Since mathematical statements such as ‘The first prime number after 1,000,000 is 1,000,003’ are necessary truths and can only be rendered true by the existence of a contingent being, such as Cameron Winklevoss, Lowe concludes that there necessarily exists at least one contingent being. Consequently, the empty world is impossible even if there are no necessary beings.
There are other metaphysical systems that make the existence of some concrete entities necessary without implying that there are any necessarily existing concrete things. In his Tractatus phase, Ludwig Wittgenstein takes a world to be a totality of facts. A fact consists of one or more objects related to each other in a certain way. By an act of selective attention, we concentrate on just the objects or just the relations. But objects and relations are always inextricably bound up with each other. Since every fact requires at least one object, a world without objects would be a world without facts. But a factless world is a contradiction in terms. Therefore, the empty world is impossible.
Nevertheless, the persuasiveness of the subtraction argument is not entirely hostage to background theories about the nature of possible worlds. Even those with metaphysical systems that guarantee the existence of some concrete entities feel pressure to revise those systems to accommodate the empty world, or at least to look for some loophole that would make their system compatible with Baldwin’s thought experiment.
Consider the combinatorialist David Armstrong. He eventually acquiesced to the empty world by relaxing his account of truthmakers. A truthmaker is a piece of reality that makes a statement true. Armstrong believes that every contingent truth is made true by a truthmaker and has wielded the principle forcefully against analytical behaviorists, phenomenalists, nominalists, and presentists. Since there can be no truthmaker for an empty world, Armstrong appears to have a second objection to the empty world (supplementing the objection based on his combinatorial conception of a possible world). Yet Armstrong (2004, 91) instead claims that the empty world could borrow truthmakers from the actual world. His idea is that the truthmakers for possibilities are actual objects and that these actual objects could serve as the truthmakers for the empty world. David Efird and Tom Stoneham (2009) object that cross-world truthmakers would be equally handy to the analytical behaviorists, phenomenalists and their ilk. Whether or not Armstrong has contradicted himself, he has illustrated the persuasiveness of the subtraction argument.
Aristotle assumes that universal generalizations have existential import; ‘All gods are immortal’ implies that there are gods. Contemporary logicians agree that universal quantifiers have existential import: pantheism, ‘All is god’, entails theism, ‘There is a god’ . However, contemporary logicians differ from Aristotle in analyzing universal generalizations as conditionals. They think ‘All gods are immortal’ has the form ‘For each thing, if it is a god, then it is immortal’. So if there are no gods, the conditional is vacuously true. This explains why the atheist can consistently argue: All gods are immortal. Immortality is impossible. Therefore, there are no gods.
Contemporary logicians are also impressed by the intuitive equivalence between ‘All men are mortal’ and its contrapositive ‘All immortals are non-men’. This equivalence is predicted by the hypothesis that universal generalizations are conditionals.
Tolerance of vacuously true generalizations does not stop contemporary classical logic from precluding an empty world. Since its universal quantifier has existential import, each of its logical laws imply that something exists. For instance, the principle of identity, Everything is identical to itself entails There exists something that is identical to itself. All sorts of attractive inferences are jeopardized by the empty world.
Logicians do not treat their intolerance of the empty world as a resource for metaphysicians. They do not want to get involved in metaphysical disputes. They feel that logic should be neutral with respect to the existence of anything. They yearn to rectify this “defect in logical purity” (Russell 1919, 203).
The ideal of ontological neutrality has led some philosophers to reject classical logic. A direct response would be to challenge the existential import of the classical quantifiers.
Proponents of “free logic” prefer to challenge the existential presupposition of singular terms (Lambert 2003, 124). In classical logic, names must have bearers. Free logic lacks this restriction and so countenances empty names as in ‘Sherlock Holmes is a detective’ and negative existentials such as ‘Pegasus does not exist’. Proponents of free logic suggest that these departures are a necessary condition for not trivially implying an existential proposition. Jan Heylen (2017) agrees but contends that free logic trivially implies other existential sentences. He concludes that any deductive answer to the question will beg the question. The background logic will always intrude.
In any case, the changes recommended by free logicians would certainly undermine W. V. Quine’s (1953a) popular criterion for ontological commitment. Quine says that we can read off our ontology from the existentially quantified statements constituting our well-accepted theories. For instance, if evolutionary theory says that there are some species that evolved from other species, and if we have no way to paraphrase away this claim, then biologists are committed to the existence of species. Since philosophers cannot improve on the credentials of a scientific commitment, metaphysicians would also be obliged to accept species.
So how does Quine defend his criterion of ontological commitment from the menace looming from the empty domain? By compromise. Normally one thinks of a logical theorem as a proposition that holds in all domains. Quine (1953b, 162) suggests that we weaken the requirement to that of holding in all non-empty domains. In the rare circumstances in which the empty universe must be considered, there is an easy way of testing which theorems will apply: count all the universal quantifications as true, and all the existential quantifications as false, and then compute for the remaining theorems.
Is Quine being ad hoc? Maybe. But exceptions are common for notions in the same family as the empty domain. For instance, instructors halt their students’ natural pattern of thinking about division to forestall the disaster that accrues from permitting division by zero. If numbers were words, zero would be an irregular verb.
Many of the principles used to rule out total emptiness also preclude small pockets of emptiness. Leibniz says that the actual world must have something rather than nothing because the actual world must be the best of all possible worlds, and something is better than nothing. But by the same reasoning, Leibniz concludes there are no vacuums in the actual world: more is better than less.
Leibniz also targets the possibility of there being more than one void. If there could be more than one void, then there could be two voids of exactly the same shape and size. These two voids would be perfect twins; everything true of one void would be true of the other. This is precluded by the principle of the identity of indiscernibles: if everything true of x is true of y, then x is identical to y.
A second problem with multiple voids arises from efforts to paraphrase them away. From the time of Melissus, there have been arguments against the possibility of a void existing in the manner that an object exists: “Nor is there any void, for void is nothing, and nothing cannot be.” (Guthrie 1965, 104) If you say there is a vacuum in the flask, then you are affirming the existence of something in the flask—the vacuum. But since ‘vacuum’ means an absence of something, you are also denying that there is something in the flask. Therefore, ‘There is a vacuum in the flask’ is a contradiction.
Some react to Melissus’s argument by analyzing vacuums as properties of things rather than things in their own right. According to C. J. F. Williams (1984, 383), ‘There is a vacuum in the flask’ should be rendered as ‘The flask noths’. He does this in the same spirit that he renders ‘There is fog in Winchester’ as ‘Winchester is foggy’ and ‘There is a smell in the basement’ as ‘The basement smells’.
If this paraphrase strategy works for vacuums, it ought to work for the more prosaic case of holes. Can a materialist believe that there are holes in his Swiss cheese? The holes are where the matter is not. So to admit the existence of holes is to admit the existence of immaterial objects!
One response is to paraphrase ‘There is a hole in the cheese’ as ‘The cheese holes’ or, to be a bit easier on the ear, as ‘The cheese is perforated’. What appeared to be a wild existential claim has been domesticated into a comment on the shape of the cheese.
But how are we to distinguish between the cheese having two holes as opposed to one? (Lewis and Lewis 1983, 4) Well, some cheese is singly perforated, some cheese is doubly-perforated, yet other cheese is n-perforated where n equals the number of holes in the cheese.
Whoa! We must be careful not to define ‘n-perforation’ in terms of holes; that would re-introduce the holes we set out to avoid.
Can holes be evaded by confining ourselves to the process of perforation? Single-hole punchers differ from triple-hole punchers by how they act; singlely rather than triply.
The difficulty with this process-oriented proposal that the product, a hole, is needed to distinguish between successful and merely attempted perforation. Furthermore, the paraphrase is incomplete because it does not extend to holes that arise from processes such as looping. If the universe popped into existence five minutes ago, then most holes formed without any process.
Can we just leave expressions of the form ‘n-perforated’ as primitive, unanalyzed shape predicates? David and Stephanie Lewis (1983) note that this strands us with an infinite list of primitive terms. Such a list could never have been memorized. The Lewises do not see how ‘n-perforated’ can be recursively defined without alluding to holes.
The paraphrase prospects seem equally bleak for being ‘n-vacuumed’. Big meteorites pass through the atmosphere in about one second leaving a hole in the atmosphere—a vacuum in “thin air”. The air cannot rush in quickly enough to fill the gap. This explains why rock vapor from the impact shoots back up into the atmosphere and later rains down widely on the surface. During a meteorite shower, the atmosphere is multiply vacuumed. But this is just to say that there are many vacuums in the atmosphere.
The trouble sustaining multiple voids may push us to the most extreme answer to ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’, namely, ‘There must not only be something but there must not be any emptiness at all!’.
Parmenides maintained that it is self-defeating to say that something does not exist. The linguistic rendering of this insight is the problem of negative existentials: ‘Atlantis does not exist’ is about Atlantis. A statement can be about something only if that something exists. No relation without relata! Therefore, ‘Atlantis does not exist’ cannot be true. Parmenides and his disciples elaborated conceptual difficulties with negation into an incredible metaphysical monolith.
The Parmenideans were opposed by the atomists. The atomists said that the world is constituted by simple, indivisible things moving in empty space. They self-consciously endorsed the void to explain empirical phenomena such as movement, compression, and absorption.
Parmenides’s disciple, Zeno of Elea, had already amassed an amazing battery of arguments to show motion is impossible. Since these imply that compression and absorption are also impossible, Zeno rejects the data of the atomists just as physicists reject the data of parapsychologists.
Less radical opponents of vacuums, such as Aristotle, re-explained the data within a framework of plenism: although the universe is full, objects can move because other objects get out of the way. Compression and absorption can be accommodated by having things pushed out of the way when other things jostle their way in.
In the Timaeus, Aristotle’s teacher Plato attempted to combine atomism with plenism as a “likely story”. The atoms are the Platonic solids (regular, convex polyhedra), each having a distinctive role in the composition of objects. Like an irreverently intelligent school boy, Aristotle objects that the Platonic solids cannot fill space. Every arrangement of Platonic solids yields the sort of gaps that one can more readily predict in a universe composed solely of spherical atoms.
Aristotle agrees that atoms could fill space if they were all cubes. Pressing his luck, Aristotle goes on to claim that tetrahedra can also complete space. It is testament to Aristotle’s subsequent authority that this claim was accepted for seventeen hundred years—despite being easily refutable by anyone trying to snugly combine tetrahedral blocks. Almost any choice of shapes guarantees interstitial vacua. This geometrical pressure for tiny vacua creates a precedent for the cosmic void (which surrounds the material cosmos) and the intermediate empty spaces that provide a promising explanation of how motion is possible.
Yet Aristotle denied the void can explain how things move. Movement requires a mover that is pushing or pulling the object. An object in a vacuum is not in contact with anything else. If the object did move, there would be nothing to impede its motion. Therefore, any motion in a vacuum would be at an unlimited speed. This conflicts with the principle that no object can be in two separate places at the same time.
Aristotle’s refutation of the void persuaded most commentators for the next 1500 years. There were two limited dissenters to his thesis that vacuums are impossible. The Stoics agreed that terrestrial vacuums are impossible but believed there must be a void surrounding the cosmos. Hero of Alexandria agreed that there are no naturally occurring vacuums but believed that they can be formed artificially. He cites pumps and siphons as evidence that voids can be created. Hero believed that bodies have a natural horror of vacuums and struggle to prevent their formation. You can feel the antipathy by trying to open a bellows that has had its air hole plugged. Try as you might, you cannot separate the sides. However, unlike Aristotle, Hero thought that if you and the bellows were tremendously strong, you could separate the sides and create a vacuum.
Hero’s views became more discussed after the Church’s anti-Aristotelian condemnation of 1277 which required Christian scholars to allow for the possibility of a vacuum. The immediate motive was to preserve God’s omnipotence. God could have chosen to create the world in a different spot. He could have made it bigger or smaller. God could have also chosen to make the universe a different shape. This possibilities entail the possibility of a vacuum.
A second motivation is a literal reading of Genesis 1:1. This opening passage of the Bible describes God as creating the world from nothing. Such a construction seems logically impossible. Commitment to an illogical miracle jeopardized the Christian’s overarching commitment to avoid outright irrationality. If creation out of nothing were indeed a demonstrable impossibility, then faith would be forced to override an answer given by reason rather than merely answer a question about which reason is silent.
All Greek philosophy had presupposed creation was from something more primitive, not nothing. Consistently, the Greeks assumed destruction was disassembly into more basic units. (If destruction into nothingness were possible, the process could be reversed to get creation from nothing.) The Christians were on their own when trying to make sense of creation from nothing. (Ancient Chinese philosophers are sometimes translated as parallel believers in creation from nothing. JeeLoo Liu (2014) cautions that both the Daoist and Confucians are speaking about formlessness rather than nothingness.)
Creation out of nothing presupposes the possibility of total nothingness. This in turn implies that there can be some nothingness. Thus Christians had a motive to first establish the possibility of a little nothingness. Their strategy was to start small and scale up.
Accordingly, scholars writing in the aftermath of the condemnation of 1277 proposed various recipes for creating vacuums (Schmitt 1967). One scheme was to freeze a sphere filled with water. After the water contracted into ice, a vacuum would form at the top.
Aristotelians replied that the sphere would bend at its weakest point. When the vacuists stipulated that the sphere was perfect, the rejoinder was that this would simply prevent the water from turning into ice.
Neither side appears to have tried out the recipe. If either had, then they would have discovered that freezing water expands rather than contracts.
To contemporary thinkers, this dearth of empirical testing is bizarre. The puzzle is intensified by the fact that the medievals did empirically test many hypotheses, especially in optics.
Hero was eventually refuted by experiments conducted by Evangelista Torricelli and Blaise Pascal. In effect, they created a barometer consisting of a tube partially submerged, upside down, in bowl of mercury. What keeps the mercury suspended in the tube? Is there an unnatural vacuum that causes the surrounding glass to pull the liquid up? Or is there no vacuum at all but rather some rarefied and invisible matter in the “empty space”? Pascal answered that there really was nothing holding up the mercury. The mercury rises and falls due to variations in the weight of the atmosphere. The mercury is being pushed up the tube, not pulled up by anything.
When Pascal offered this explanation, Descartes wrote Christian Huygens (8 December 1647) that the hasty young man had the vacuum too much on his mind. (A more amusing translation of the letter has Descartes complaining that Pascal had too much vacuum in his head; alas, Descartes’ writing loses something in the original.) Descartes identified bodies with extension and so had no room for vacuums. If there were nothing between two objects, then they would be touching each other. And if they are touching each other, there is no gap between them.
Well maybe the apparent gap is merely a thinly occupied region of space. On this distributional model, there is no intermediate “empty object” that separates the two objects. There is merely unevenly spread matter. This model is very good at eliminating vacuums in the sense of empty objects. However, it is also rather good at eliminating ordinary objects. What we call objects would just be relatively thick deposits of matter. There would be only one natural object: the whole universe. This may have been the point of Spinoza’s attack on vacuums (Bennett 1980). (Indian philosophers associate nothingness with lack of differentiation. They may prefer to describe Spinoza’s world as a realm of nothingness dominated by a single overarching unity.)
Descartes was part of a tradition that denied action at a distance. This orthodoxy included Galileo. He was distressed by Johannes Kepler’s hypothesis that the moon influences the tides because the hypothesis seems to require causal chains in empty space. How could the great Kepler believe something so silly? After Isaac Newton resurrected Kepler’s hypothesis he eventually capitulated to orthodoxy and stuffed the space between the moon and the Earth with ether.
Indeed, the universality of Newton’s law of gravitation seems to require that the whole universe be filled with a subtle substance. How else could the universe be bound together by causal chains? Hunger for ether intensified as the wave-like features of light became established. It is tautologous that a wave must have a medium.
Or is it? As the theoretical roles of the ether proliferated, physicists began to doubt there could be anything that accomplished such diverse feats. These doubts about the existence of ether were intensified by the emergence of Einstein’s theory of relativity. He presented his theory as a relational account of space; if there were no objects, there would be no space. Space is merely a useful abstraction.
Even those physicists who wished to retain substantival space broke with the atomist tradition of assigning virtually no properties to the void. They re-assign much of ether’s responsibilities to space itself. Instead of having gravitational forces being propagated through the ether, they suggest that space is bent by mass. To explain how space can be finite and yet unbounded, they characterize space as spherical. When Edwin Hubble discovered that heavenly bodies are traveling away from each other (like ants resting on an expanding balloon), cosmologists were quick to suggest that space may be expanding. “Expanding into what?” wondered bewildered laymen, “How can space bend?”, “How can space have a shape?”, ….
Historians of science wonder whether the ether that was loudly pushed out the front door of physics is quietly returning through the back door under the guise of “space”. Quantum field theory provides especially fertile ground for such speculation. Particles are created with the help of energy present in “vacuums”. To say that vacuums have energy and energy is convertible into mass, is to deny that vacuums are empty. Many physicists revel in the discovery that vacuums are far from empty.
Frank Wilczek (1980), Stephen Hawking and Leonard Mlodinow (2010, 180) as well as Lawrence Krauss (2012) explicitly claim that this answers the question of why there is something rather than nothing. The basic idea goes back to an issue raised by the symmetry of matter and anti-matter. Given that the symmetry implies equality, matter and anti-matter should have annihiliated each other. Creation should have been aborted. Why is there NOW something (particles) rather than nothing (mere energy in a quantum field)? This question was answered by calculations suggesting that there was about a billionth more matter than anti-matter. Although it is still possible for the universe to be without particles, the slight numeric imbalance biases the universe toward states in which there are many particles. A small random change can trigger a phase transition analogous to the transformation of very cold liquid beer into solid beer when the cap of the bottle is popped (suddenly reducing the pressure in the bottle).
A proud physicist is naturally tempted to announce these insights through the bullhorn of metaphysics. But philosophers interested in the logic of questions will draw attention to the role of emphasis in framing requests for explanations. ‘Why did Eve eat the apple?’, ‘Why did Eve eat the apple?’, and ‘Why did Eve eat the apple?’ are different questions because they specify different contrast classes (van Fraassen 1980, 127–130). Philosophers read ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ tenselessly as in ‘Why is π an irrational number?’. The philosophers also read ‘something’ as a quantifier ranging over any concrete entity. The quantum vacuum is a concrete entity (in the sense described in sections 4 and 7) and so is in the philosopher’s domain of discourse. But for rhetorical effect, physicists anachronistically back-date their domain of discourse to the things of nineteenth century physics. Thus the physicists wind up addressing ‘Why is there some thing rather than nothing?’.
Philosophers complain of misleading advertising. They asked one question and the proud physicists answered a different question. Lawrence Krauss defends the switch as an improvement. Often scientists make progress by altering the meaning of key terms. Why stick with an intractable (and arguably meaningless) question? We should wriggle free from the dead hand of the past and rejuvenate our curiosity with the vocabulary of contemporary cosmology.
The physicist turned philosopher, Rudolf Carnap (1950), recalls how thermodynamicists explicated “heat” into the more precise concepts of temperature, thermal energy, and heat transfer. Although the new terms are not synonymous with the old, they bear enough similarity to disarm the objection that the physicists are merely changing the topic. Our questions, like our children, can mature without losing their identity over time. (The idea of there being two different questions being asked is pursued in Carroll 2012, Other Internet Resources.)
David Albert is open to the possibility of old questions being improved by new interests and discoveries. However, he denies that Lawrence Krauss’s particular change of meaning constitutes an improvement (2012, Other Internet Resources):
Relativistic-quantum-field-theoretical vacuum states—no less than giraffes or refrigerators or solar systems—are particular arrangements of elementary physical stuff. The true relativistic-quantum-field-theoretical equivalent to there not being any physical stuff at all isn’t this or that particular arrangement of the fields—what it is (obviously, and ineluctably, and on the contrary) is the simple absence of the fields! The fact that some arrangements of fields happen to correspond to the existence of particles and some don’t is not a whit more mysterious than the fact that some of the possible arrangements of my fingers happen to correspond to the existence of a fist and some don’t. And the fact that particles can pop in and out of existence, over time, as those fields rearrange themselves, is not a whit more mysterious than the fact that fists can pop in and out of existence, over time, as my fingers rearrange themselves. And none of these poppings—if you look at them aright—amount to anything even remotely in the neighborhood of a creation from nothing.
After a mystical experience in 1654, Blaise Pascal’s interest in nothingness passed from its significance to science to the significance of nothingness to the human condition. Pascal thinks human beings have a unique perspective on their finitude. His Pensées is a roller coaster ride surveying the human lot. Pascal elevates us to the level of angels by exalting in our grasp of the infinite, and then runs us down below the beasts for wittingly choosing evil over goodness. From this valley of depravity Pascal takes us up again by marveling at how human beings tower over the microscopic kingdom, only to plunge us down toward insignificance by having us dwell on the vastness of space, and the immensity of eternity.
He who regards himself in this light will be afraid of himself, and observing himself sustained in the body given him by nature between those two abysses of the Infinite and Nothing, will tremble at the sight of these marvels; and I think that, as his curiosity changes into admiration, he will be more disposed to contemplate them in silence than to examine them with presumption.
For in fact what is man in nature? A Nothing in comparison with the Infinite, an All in comparison with the Nothing, a mean between nothing and everything. Since he is infinitely removed from comprehending the extremes, the end of things and their beginning are hopelessly hidden from him in an impenetrable secret; he is equally incapable of seeing the Nothing from which he was made, and the Infinite in which he is swallowed up. (Pensées sect. II, 72)
Pascal’s association of nothingness with insignificance and meaninglessness was amplified by the Romantics. Their poetry de-emphasized salvation, seeking to immerse the reader in a raw apprehension of nature, unmediated by reason. Kant further obscured God by casting Him into the noumenal abyss, available only through practical faith rather than theoretical reason.
As among the first forthright atheists, Arthur Schopenhauer faced the full force of ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’. According to Schopenhauer, religion and rationalism aim to reassure us that the universe has a design. Our astonishment that there is anything betrays awareness that it is all a meaningless accident.
Readers of Schopenhauer were presented with the awesome contingency as an actuality rather than a terrible possibility. The experience captured the attention of William James (who had experimented with nitrous oxide to understand the oceanic philosophy of Georg Hegel and, in 1882, published the phenomenological investigation in Mind). James provides a simple recipe for eliciting the emotion:
One need only shut oneself in a closet and begin to think of the fact of one’s being there, of one’s queer bodily shape in the darkness … of one’s fantastic character and all, to have the wonder steal over the detail as much as over the general fact of being, and to see that it is only familiarity that blunts it. Not only that anything should be, but that this very thing should be, is mysterious! (1911, 39)
Another close reader of Schopenhauer, Ludwig Wittgenstein, characterizes the phenomenology as exhausting the thrust of the riddle of existence. Instead of expressing a well-formed question, ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is an expression of the mystical wonder
6.44 It is not how things are in the world that is mystical, but that it exists.
6.45 To view the world sub specie aeterni is to view it as a whole—as a limited whole. Feeling the world as a limited whole—it is this that is mystical.
6.5 When an answer cannot be put into words, neither can the question—the riddle does not exist. (From Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus)
This emotional characterization persists into Wittgenstein’s later philosophy. In Lectures on Ethics, Wittgenstein uses the language of seeing-as. ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is a prompt to see the world as a miracle. This gestalt switch is not a mistake. Nor is it an insight. Even the logical positivists were willing to grant the question has emotive meaning (just not cognitive meaning).
The characteristic phenomenology of the question has also been suggested as a resource in explaining why we fail to recognize the radical ambiguity of the question. Andrew Brenner (2016, 1319) conjectures that the multiplicity of interpretations is masked by the emotional unity.
Thinkers in the tradition of Phenomenology retained Schopenhauer’s conviction that the emotion harbors a metaphysical insight. Instead of tossing the question into the emotivist waste basket, like the logical positivists, or lapsing into quietism, like Wittgenstein, existentialists provide detailed treatments of the awe expressed by the ultimate question. They built on Schopenhauer’s literary approach to philosophy, depicting the emotion in plays and novels such as Sartre’s Nausea.
In The Concept of Dread, Søren Kierkegaard (1844) claims that nothingness wells up into our awareness through moods and emotions. Emotions are intentional states; they are directed toward something. If angered, I am angry at something. If amused, there is something I find amusing. Free floating anxiety is often cited as a counterexample. But Kierkegaard says that in this case the emotion is directed at nothingness.
According to Heidegger, we have several motives to shy away from the significance of our emotional encounters with nothingness. They are premonitions of the nothingness of death. They echo the groundlessness of human existence.
Some have hoped that our recognition of our rootlessness would rescue meaning from the chaos of nothing. But Heidegger denies us such solace.
Heidegger does think freedom is rooted in nothingness. He also says we derive our concept of logical negation from this experience of nothing. This suggests a privileged perspective for human beings. We differ from animals with respect to nothing.
Since Heidegger thinks that animals do not experience nothingness, he is committed to skepticism about animal reasoning involving negation. Consider the Stoic example of a dog that is following a trail. The dog reaches a fork in the road, sniffs at one road and then, without a further sniff, proceeds down the only remaining road. The Stoics took this as evidence that the dog has performed a disjunctive syllogism: “Either my quarry went down this road or that road. Sniff—he did not go down this road. Therefore, he went down that road.” Heidegger must discount this as anthropomorphism.
Many biologists and psychologists side with the Stoic’s emphasis on our continuity with animals. They deny that human beings have a monopoly on nothingness. A classic anomaly for the stimulus-response behaviorist was the laboratory rat that responds to the absence of a stimulus:
One rather puzzling class of situations which elicit fear are those which consist of a lack of stimulation. Some members of this class may be special instances of novelty. An anesthetised chimpanzee could be described as a normal chimpanzee with the added novelty of ‘no movement’; solitude could be the novelty of ‘no companions’. This is not simply quibbling with words; for there is very good evidence (see Chapter 13) that the failure of a stimulus to occur at a point in time or space where it usually occurs acts like any other kind of novel stimulus. However, the intensity of the fear evoked by the sight of a dead or mutilated body is so much greater than that evoked by more ordinary forms of novelty that we perhaps ought to seek an alternative explanation of the effects of this stimulus. Fear of the dark is also difficult to account for in terms of novelty, since by the time this fear matures darkness is no less familiar than the light. (Gray 1987, 22)
These anomalies for behaviorism fill rationalists with mixed emotions. On the one hand, the experiments refute the empiricist principle that everything is learned from experience. On the other hand, the experiments also constitute a caution against over-intellectualizing absences. A correct explanation of emotional engagement with absences must be more general and cognitively less demanding than rationalists tend to presuppose. Even mosquito larvae see shadows. Doubts about whether they have consciousness do not make us doubt that they see shadows. So the perception of absences cannot depend on consciousness or any other advanced mental state. Perhaps the earliest form of vision was of these absences of light. So instead of being a pinnacle of intellectual sophistication, cognition of absences may be primal.
Existentialists tend to endorse the high standards assumed by rationalists. Their disagreement with the rationalists is over whether the standards are met. The existentialists are impressed by the contrast between our expectations of how reality ought to behave and how it in fact performs.
This sense of absurdity makes existentialists more accepting of paradoxes. Whereas rationalists nervously view paradoxes as a challenge to the authority of reason, existentialists greet them as opportunities to correct unrealistic hopes. Existentialists are fond of ironies and do not withdraw reflexively from the pain of contradiction. They introspect upon the inconsistency in the hope of achieving a resolution that does justice to the three dimensionality of deep philosophical problems. For instance, Heidegger is sensitive to the hazards of saying that nothing exists. Like an electrician who must twist and bend a wire to make it travel through an intricate hole, the metaphysician must twist and bend a sentence to probe deeply into the nature of being.
Rudolf Carnap thinks Heidegger’s contorted sentences malfunction. To illustrate, Carnap quotes snippets from Heidegger’s What is Metaphysics?:
What is to be investigated is being only and—nothing else; being alone and further—nothing; solely being, and beyond being-nothing. What about this Nothing? … Does the Nothing exist only because the Not, i.e. the Negation, exists? Or is it the other way around? Does Negation and the Not exist only because the Nothing exists? … We assert: the Nothing is prior to the Not and the Negation…. Where do we seek the Nothing? How do we find the Nothing…. We know the Nothing…. Anxiety reveals the Nothing…. That for which and because of which we were anxious, was ‘really’—nothing. Indeed: the Nothing itself—as such—was present…. What about this Nothing?—The Nothing itself nothings. (Heidegger as quoted by Carnap 1932, 69)
This paragraph, especially the last sentence, became notorious as a specimen of metaphysical nonsense.
The confusion caused by Heidegger’s linguistic contortions is exacerbated by separating them from their original text and herding them into a crowded pen. There is a difference between a failure to understand and an understanding of failure. The real test for whether Heidegger’s sentences are meaningless is to see what can be made of them in action, applied to the questions they were designed to answer.
Carnap also needs to consider the possibility that Heidegger’s sentences are illuminating nonsense. After all, Carnap was patient with the cryptic Wittgenstein. In the Tractatus, Wittgenstein speaks like an oracle. He even characterized his carefully enumerated sentences as rungs in a ladder that must be cast away after we have made the ascent and achieved an ineffable insight. And Wittgenstein meant it, quitting philosophy to serve as a lowly schoolmaster in a rural village.
Other critics deny that What is Metaphysics? suffers from an absence of meaning. Just the reverse: they think Heidegger’s passages about nothing involve too many meanings. When Heidegger connects negation with nothingness and death, these logicians are put in mind of an epitaph that toys with the principle of excluded middle: Mrs Nott was Nott Alive and is Nott Dead. According to these critics, Heidegger’s writings can only be understood in the way we understand the solution to equivocal riddles:
What does a man love more than life?
Hate more than death or mortal strife?
That which contented men desire,
The poor have, the rich require,
The miser spends, the spendthrift saves,
And all men carry to their graves?
(Leeming, 1953, 201)
The answer, Nothing, can only be seen through a kaleidoscope of equivocations.
Some of the attempts to answer ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ equivocate or lapse into meaninglessness. The comedic effect of such errors is magnified by the fundamentality of the question. Error here comes off as pretentious error.
Those who ask the question ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ commonly get confused. But the question itself appears to survive tests for being merely a verbal confusion.
In any case, the question (or pseudo-question) has helped to hone the diagnostic tools that have been applied to it. As the issue gets shaped and re-shaped by advances in our understanding of ‘is’, quantification and explanatory standards, it becomes evident that the value of these diagnostic tools is not exhausted by their service in exposing pseudo-questions. For genuine questions become better understood when we can discriminate them from their spurious look-alikes.
- Armstrong, David, 1989, A Combinatorial Theory of Possibility, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2004, Truth and Truthmakers, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- Albert, David, 2012, “On the Origin of Everything, review of L. Krauss, A Universe from Nothing, in New York Times, March 23.
- Carroll, Sean, 2012, “A Universe from Nothing?, Cosmic Variance blog post, Discover Magazine, April 28.
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- Heidegger on Nothingness (from Philosophy Pages by Garth Kemerling, a site which “offers helpful information for students of Western philosophical tradition.”)
- John Wilmot’s poem Upon Nothing