Impossible Worlds

First published Thu Sep 17, 2009; substantive revision Thu Apr 27, 2023

According to David Hume, the impossible cannot be conceived. Moritz Schlick claimed that the logically impossible, such as an explicit inconsistency, is simply unthinkable. Yet Hegel complained that it is “one of the fundamental prejudices of logic as hitherto understood” that “the contradictory cannot be imagined or thought” (Hegel 1831: 430). On this approach, our representational capabilities are not limited to the possible: we are able to conceive, describe, and sometimes even believe, impossibilities.

This entry is about impossibilities. In order to read it fruitfully, you might also want to consult the entry on possible worlds. Many accounts of impossible worlds are best understood against the background of possible worlds theories — although symmetries and similarities can sometimes break down in important respects. (We will see one in section 4 below.) You might also want to look at the entry on modal logic to grasp some basic notions of worlds semantics.

We commonly speak of things being impossible in a relative sense. If you are stuck in a traffic jam in Paris Montparnasse at 2 PM, and your flight is leaving from airport Charles De Gaulle at 2:30 PM, you may moan: “There is no way that I can make it to the airport in time”. What you mean is that, given the timing, the means of transport available, and other circumstances, it is impossible for you to reach the airport in time. It is not absolutely impossible: if you had Star Trek’s transporter, you could make it.

This entry is about worlds that are not possible, with “possible” understood in an unrestricted sense. Start with the intuitive idea of the totality of possible worlds, which capture all and only the genuine possibilities. The worlds we are interested in are not in there. These worlds are often called logically impossible worlds, as logical laws such as the Law of Non-Contradiction or the Law of Excluded Middle are assumed to be the most general and topic-neutral: they are supposed to hold at all possible worlds. From now on, we are talking of impossible worlds simpliciter, meaning worlds that are not possible with respect to an unrestricted notion of possibility, however this is further characterized.

A look at the rapidly growing literature on impossible worlds (see Nolan 2013 for a survey) presents us with a number of definitions. These can be reduced to four main items:

Impossible Ways: just as possible worlds are often introduced intuitively by characterising them as ways things could have been, so are impossible worlds often characterized as ways things could not have been. The initial insight is that not everything is possible, that is, some things just (absolutely) cannot happen. Anything that just can’t happen must be an absolute impossibility; and these ways the world just couldn’t be are impossible worlds (see e.g. Salmon 1984; Yagisawa 1988; Restall 1997; Beall and van Fraassen 2003).

Logic Violators: another definition has it that impossible worlds are worlds where the laws of logic fail (where these may be theorems of the target logic, or its logical truths, or valid consequences, etc.). This depends on what we take the laws of logic to be. Given some logic L, an impossible world with respect to the L-laws is one in which some of those laws fail to hold (see e.g. Priest 2001, Chapter 9). An impossible world in this second sense will be an impossible world in the first sense, given that logical necessity is unrestricted. But not vice versa. Suppose it’s metaphysically necessary that the Mona Lisa (if it exists) was painted by da Vinci. Then a world in which the Mona Lisa was painted by Neil Buchanan on Art Attack is an impossible world in the first sense but not in the second, for it does not violate any logical law.

Classical Logic Violators: another definition has it that impossible worlds are worlds where the laws of classical logic fail (see e.g. Priest 1997a). A world complying with intuitionistic logic, and where instances of the Law of Excluded Middle fail, will be impossible in the third sense.

Contradiction-Realizers: a still more specific definition has it that an impossible world is a world where sentences of the form \(A\) and \(\neg A\) hold, against the Law of Non-Contradiction (see e.g. Lycan 1994). Impossible worlds of the fourth kind will be impossible in the third sense, but not vice versa. Our intuitionistic world above will have the Law of Non-Contradiction hold unrestrictedly: it will be impossible in the third, but not in the fourth sense.

These are all absolute notions of impossibility: in any of these senses, a world is either possible or impossible. One may relativise the notion, e.g. by allowing what counts as a law of logic to differ between worlds. Then (as Sandgren and Tanaka 2020 point out), one world’s laws may be a proper subset of the laws of a second world. In this scenario, each world would be impossible relative to the other (since they differ in what they take the laws to be), even though the former does not violate any of the laws of the latter. (See also Tanaka 2018, 2022.) This relativised notion of logical impossibly is relatively new and under-explored.

1. Reasons for Introducing Impossible Worlds

Why might one believe in impossible worlds? One argument is the so-called “argument from ways” (Vander Laan 1997), which is related to the first definition of impossible world given above. This draws on the analogy with David Lewis’s notorious argument concerning our quantifying over ways things could have been (see Lewis 1973: 84). The world could have been different in so many ways: Hilary Clinton could have won the 2016 US election, I could be dancing on the ceiling, and Fermat’s Last Theorem could have remained without proof. Our belief in possible worlds is just a paraphrase of our belief that there are many ways the world could have been.

Aren’t there also ways the world could not have been? Some authors endorse the claim that anything is possible (e.g. Mortensen 1989). However, the majority of philosophers believe that not everything is possible, in the sense that some things just can’t happen. If I tell you that my college has a cupola which is both fully round and fully square, you are likely to reply, “it can’t be that way!”. So it seems that “‘ways’ talk goes both ways” (Beall and van Fraassen 2003: 86). If quantification on ways the world could have been should be taken at face value as providing evidence for possible worlds, then quantification on ways the world could not have been should be taken at face value as providing evidence for impossible worlds.

The argument as such is hardly convincing. Firstly, one author’s modus ponens is another’s modus tollens. Some have used similar considerations to argue against Lewis’s modal realism (see Skyrms 1976; Naylor 1986): if one believes in possible worlds (of the Lewisian kind) as ways things could have been, then by parity of reasoning one should believe in impossible worlds (ditto) as ways things could not have been. But impossible worlds are too much to swallow, so (by modus tollens) one should not believe in Lewis’s modal realism.

Secondly, taking quantification over any kind of entity whatsoever at face value, just because it is embedded in ordinary language, doesn’t look like a promising general strategy. Lewis’s case for accepting commitment to possible worlds did not consist just in an argument from ways. He also provided independent motivation for taking quantification over possible worlds at face value. A non-reductive account of possible worlds, according to Lewis, brings net theoretical utility. The ontological cost is compensated by a theoretical gain, given the variety of ontological, semantic, and conceptual explanations allowed by our taking the notion of possible world seriously. This is likely to be the main motivation for believing in impossible worlds. As we will see below, defenders of impossible worlds claim that they are are theoretically useful.

Another argument on behalf of impossible worlds, quite pervasive in the literature, comes from counterpossible reasoning (e.g. Beall and van Fraassen 2003, Chapter 4; Nolan 1997; Restall 1997; Brogaard and Salerno 2013). This is reasoning from suppositions, assumptions, or conditional antecedents which are not only false, but impossible. We can reason non-trivially from impossible suppositions, by asking what would be the case, were (say) the Law of Excluded Middle false. To say that we reason non-trivially from an assumption means just that we accept some conclusions but reject others on the basis of that assumption. If we hypothetically suppose the Law of Excluded Middle to be false, for example, then we would likely conclude that intuitionistic logic would be preferable to classical logic, given that supposition. We are unlikely to conclude that classical logic would be a satisfactory logic, or that scarlet would be a shade of green, given that supposition. The point readily generalizes to reasoning about entire theories and to serious philosophical and logical debates. We often reason from suppositions about the truth of certain logical, mathematical, or metaphysical theories which, if in fact false, are necessarily false, because of the very nature of their subject matter.

This kind of reasoning is related to our assessment of certain conditional statements with impossible antecedents, often called counterpossible conditionals or, more simply, counterpossibles. These include:

(1.1) If Hobbes had squared the circle, then mathematicians would have been amazed.

Let’s call a conditional like this trivially true when it is true and the conditional with the same antecedent and opposite (negated) consequent is also true. (1.1)​​ is intuitively true, and yet

(1.2) If Hobbes had squared the circle, then mathematicians would not have been amazed.

is intuitively false. If that’s correct, then there are non-trivially true counterpossibles. These considerations impact on our preferred semantics for such conditionals, for the possible worlds semantics for conditionals has trouble accommodating this position. Yet the analysis in terms of worlds does a good job for conditionals with possible antecedents. This motivates a semantics for counterpossibles in terms of impossible (as well as possible) worlds. We will get into more detail in section 2.5.

These kinds of argument highlight the usefulness of impossible worlds as devices for analyzing particular linguistic, logical, and philosophical issues. The point can be expanded into the general “argument from utility” mentioned above: we should believe in impossible worlds because they are useful tools for logicians and philosophers. Whether that general argument is acceptable depends on how persuasive the specific impossible worlds analyses are. Let’s look at some.

2. Applications of Impossible Worlds

This section briefly describes various applications of impossible worlds, which collectively provide the main motivation for introducing them.

2.1 Intentional States

Modelling intentional states, such as knowledge and belief, is a prominent motivation for introducing impossible worlds. The intuitive idea is that one gains knowledge or belief by ruling out would-be possibilities (the epistemic/doxastic possibilities for that agent). An agent’s knowledge is whatever is true according to all epistemically possible worlds accessible to that agent, i.e., the worlds which represent ways things could be, for all the agent knows (and similarly for belief).

Impossible worlds are useful within this approach because these would-be possibilities often turn out to be impossible. Our beliefs are often (covertly) inconsistent with one another. Moreover, our knowledge and belief is not closed under (classical) logical consequence: we do not know or believe all consequences of what we know or believe. It is hard to accommodate these features using only possible worlds. Possible worlds models usually generate the problem of logical omniscience (see epistemic logic), which we will discuss in section 5.3.

One feature of rational agents’ intentional states is that they typically reject obvious impossibility or absurdity whilst being subject to subtle inconsistency (Lewis 2004). One attempt to capture this feature is developed in Jago 2006, 2007, 2009, 2014a. The idea is that only genuine possibilities and non-obvious impossibilities should be epistemically accessible to rational (but imperfect) agents such as us. For some agents, it may be epistemically possible that Fermat’s Last Theorem’s is false, but 0 being 1 shouldn’t be epistemically possible for anyone. That’s why we know the latter but may fail to know the former, says Jago. One worry with this approach is that it is partly proof-theoretic (invoking proof rules as relations between worlds), whereas it isn’t clear that proof length correlates well with obviousness. Bjerring (2013) presents other objections to the view. A strategy similar to Jago’s is adopted in Berto 2014, 2017.

A quite different application of impossible worlds to epistemic states has been proposed by JC Beall 2009, in relation to the Church-Fitch knowability paradox. The Church-Fitch reasoning is supposed to show that is contradictory to suppose that any truth can be known (as some anti-realists claim). The reasoning is this. Suppose all truths are knowable but some are not in fact known. Then some truth \(A\), is not known: \(A \wedge \neg KA\). By assumption, it’s possible to know this: \(\Diamond K(A \wedge \neg KA)\). Seemingly good reasoning (in classical epistemic logic) implies that it’s possible both to know and not know that \(A\): \(\Diamond(KA \wedge \neg KA)\), which of course isn’t possible at all. The usual moral to draw is that not all truths are knowable. Beall’s idea, by contrast, is that the knowability principle can be maintained (and the corresponding kind of anti-realism along with it). His suggestion is to deny distribution of knowledge over conjunction: the principle that knowing that \(A \wedge B\) implies knowing that \(A\) and knowing that \(B\). He achieves this using impossible worlds in which conjunctions may be true even if their conjuncts are not.

2.2 Inconsistent Information

Closely connected with inconsistent information (e.g., information including or entailing contradictions) is the issue of modelling inconsistent databases (see Belnap 1977a,b, Barwise 1997). These may consist, for instance, in sets of data supplied by different sources which are inconsistent with each other, such as incompatible evidence presented by different witnesses in a trial. Intuitively, we are allowed to draw the logical consequences of data fed in by a single source, but should not conjoin data from distinct sources which may be inconsistent with each other. The database is “compartmentalized”: occasional inconsistencies are placed in separate sectors and should not be asserted conjunctively (see e.g., Belnap 1977a,b, Hyde 1997, Brown and Priest 2004). Impossible worlds are useful in such models—particularly non-adjunctive worlds, where a conjunction may be false even if both conjuncts are true. (We discuss such worlds further in section 5.2.)

2.3 Fiction

Inconsistent information is at issue also in certain works of fiction. Lewis’s classic 1978 paper proposed an analysis of the expression “true in such-and-such fiction” in terms of possible worlds. What holds in a certain fictional work is what holds at a set of possible worlds, properly selected via a series of (quite subtle and complex) clauses. But fiction can be occasionally inconsistent. Sometimes, this happens unintentionally: Conan Doyle’s The Sign of the Four describes Watson as limping because of a war wound at his leg. In A Study in Scarlet, however, Watson has no wound at his leg (for his wound is in his shoulder and he doesn’t limp). One may claim that the set of worlds that make such stories true has to be split into disjoint subsets, making true consistent fragments of the fiction. This strategy won’t always work, however, for inconsistencies in fiction may be intentional (as stressed in Proudfoot 2006). Suppose we write a novel, and in its first chapter we have the Mad Mathematician produce a round square. If the intentional inconsistency is excised, the fact that mathematicians all over the world are amazed by this result in the second chapter becomes unexplainable. A natural treatment of these cases, then, is obtained by admitting (appropriately selected) impossible worlds in the set of situations that realize what is told in the story (see e.g. Priest 1997b; Woods 2003, Chapter 6; Berto 2012, Chapters 7 and 8; Badura and Berto 2019).

2.4 Propositional Content

Closely connected to belief is the notion of propositional content. Within possible worlds semantics, propositions can be defined as functions from worlds to truth values, or as sets of worlds: a proposition is the set of worlds at which it is true. The account is notoriously too coarse-grained (Barwise 1997). Intuitively distinct impossible propositions (that swans are blue and not blue; that Fermat’s Last Theorem is false; that Charles is a married bachelor) all hold at precisely no possible worlds. And we have a dual problem with (unrestrictedly) necessary propositions, which are all identified with the set of all possible worlds. Treating propositions as set-theoretic constructions out of possible worlds leads to a very coarse individuation of propositions, and because of this it has been subject to seemingly devastating attacks, for instance, by Scott Soames 1987. However, impossible worlds allow for fine-grained distinctions unavailable in standard possible worlds semantics. An impossible proposition need not be equated with the empty set of worlds, for it may be a set which includes (only) impossible worlds. We can have an impossible world \(w_1\) with impossibly coloured swans, a distinct impossible world \(w_2\) at which Fermat’s Last Theorem is false, and a further impossible world \(w_3\) at which bachelors are married (but at which swans and Diophantine equations behave correctly). Ripley (2012) argues that an account along these lines is a better strategy for addressing the coarse-grainedness problem than resorting to structured propositions.

One other application of impossible worlds concerns perceptual impossibilities. When we see an Escher drawing or a Penrose triangle, our experience has content. But that content is impossible: such structures cannot be realised. The content of our experience in such cases is naturally captured using impossible worlds. Splitting that content into smaller internally consistent parts would lose the essential feature of the whole. This issue is explored in Mortensen 1997.

2.5 Counterpossible Reasoning

Perhaps the most important application of impossible worlds has to do with counterpossible reasoning, understood as counterfactual reasoning from impossible antecedents. As we saw in section 1, this kind of reasoning is often taken to provide independent motivation for believing in impossible worlds. (For a recent overview of the literature on counterpossibles, see Kocurek 2021.) In Lewis-Stalnaker theories of counterfactuals, a conditional of the form, “if it were the case that \(A\), then it would be the case that \(B\)” is true if and only if, at the closest world (or closest worlds) at which \(A\) is true, \(B\) is also true. (This is a simplification of the truth conditions provided in the full-fledged semantics of Lewis 1973.)

While the standard conditional logics based on this idea have been quite successful in the treatment of counterfactuals, the approach entails that any counterfactual whose antecedent is impossible is vacuously true. For if there are no possible worlds at which \(A\) is true, then trivially, all closest \(A\)-worlds (worlds where \(A\) is true) are \(B\)-worlds. This is unsatisfying in many respects, for we often need to reason nontrivially about theories that (perhaps unbeknownst to us) cannot possibly be correct; and we often need to reason from antecedents that may turn out to be not only false, but necessarily so. (Compare the conditionals (1.1) and (1.2) in section 1 for an example.) Recent defences of the view that counterpossibles are not all vacuously true include Sendłak 2021 and McLoone 2021.

Three contexts in which theories of this kind show up are discourses on (1) alternative logics, (2) mathematical conjectures, and (3) metaphysical views. We will now say a few words on each of them.

(1) A famous Quinean motto has it that “to change the logic is to change the subject”: apparently disagreeing logical parties are actually speaking of different things. So when intuitionists deny that the Law of Excluded Middle holds in non-finitary contexts, they are actually changing the meaning of logical operators; when paraconsistentists claim that some formula can be true (in some weird circumstances) together with its negation, they are not talking of negation anymore (see e.g., Berto 2008).

But this does not make good sense of many disputes between intuitionists, classical logicians, paraconsistentists, quantum logicians, etc. It is more fruitful to assume that each party generally understands the rival logics as intelligible, albeit necessarily false, theories. Even if classical logic actually is the one true logic, one can reason counterpossibly about what would be the case if a certain non-classical logic were the correct one (e.g., “if intuitionistic logic were correct, then the Law of Excluded Middle would fail” is true and “if intuitionistic logic were correct, then the Law of Explosion would fail” is false). One can take into account situations in which the Law of Excluded Middle fails and argue about what would and would not be the case in them. These situations are, by classical standards, just impossible worlds (of the third kind: Classical Logic Violators).

(2) Similar claims can be made for mathematical conjectures. Different set theorists have different views on controversial subjects such as non-well-founded sets, the Continuum Hypothesis, the Axiom of Choice, the set/(proper-)class distinction, etc. If one embraces the Platonic view (subscribed to, at least implicitly, by many set theorists) that there is One True Universe of sets, then at most one of the alternative set theories can be correct: the others are wrong, and necessarily so. But people can work under the hypothesis that a necessarily false basic mathematical principle holds, and reason coherently from this:

It is doubtless true that nothing sensible can be said about how things would be different if there were no number 17; that is largely because the antecedent of this counterfactual gives us no hints as to what alternative mathematics is to be regarded as true in the counterfactual situation in question. If one changes the example to “Nothing sensible can be said about how things would be different if the axiom of choice were false”, it seems wrong … : if the axiom of choice were false, the cardinals wouldn’t be linearly ordered, the Banach-Tarski theorem would fail and so forth. (Field 1989: 237–8)

Field takes this as an argument to the effect that mathematical necessity is not coextensive with logical necessity. But we can turn the tables around: mathematical necessity is unrestricted and false mathematical theories are just impossible theories.

(3) The third area in which counterpossible reasoning comes into play are metaphysical disputes (and more broadly, any philosophical dispute whose subject matter is necessarily true or necessarily false). Much metaphysical talk is made with our quantifiers “wide open”, that is, aiming at stating truths about all that there was, is, or could possibly be. This is evident in modal ontology, when people advance a theory on the totality of worlds and on their nature. But other metaphysical debates easily come to mind. Suppose a philosopher wants to evaluate metaphysical theories which she considers wrong (say, in order to draw unpalatable consequences by way of criticism), such as Spinoza’s monism or Hegel’s metaphysics of the Absolute. She must envisage situations where such metaphysics are correct and wonder what would be the case according to them: situations at which there is only one substance, or at which the Absolute Geist necessarily shapes the teleological development of history. These situations will be, under the hypotheses we have made, impossible worlds.

Counterpossible reasoning may also show up in philosophical analyses of various kinds. For example, Boris Kment (2014) has proposed an account of modal notions which grounds them in explanatory reasoning, in particular of the counterfactual kind. To account for non-trivial counterpossibles, Kment uses impossible worlds taken as as collections of structured Russellian propositions.

Semantic structures for counterfactual conditionals involving impossible worlds were first introduced by Routley 1989, and have been proposed e.g. by Read 1995, Mares and Fuhrmann 1995, Mares 1997, Nolan 1997, Brogaard and Salerno 2013, Bjerring 2014, Berto et al. 2018. Most of these are natural extensions of Lewis’s 1973 semantics for counterfactuals and capture several intuitions about counterpossible reasoning. The main task for such theories consists in accounting for the concepts of closeness and qualitative similarity between worlds once impossible worlds enter the stage. How to fine-tune these notions is not a trivial matter (for an extensive discussion, see Vander Laan 2004; we will say more in section 4.2).

Non-trivial treatments of counterpossibles require the failure of several logical principles which hold in the standard Lewis-Stalnaker approach to counterfactuals (Williamson 2007 chapter 5, Brogaard and Salerno 2013). (Williamson uses these failures to argue that counterpossibles are always trivially true.) One important principle that fails is the entailment from a strict conditional, “if \(A\) then-strictly \(B\)”, to the corresponding counterfactual, “if it were the case that \(A\) then it would be the case that \(B\)”. Normally, the former entails the latter. A strict conditional is true when all the (accessible) possible worlds where the antecedent is true also make the consequent true. If all the possible \(A\)-worlds are \(B\)-worlds, then in particular all the closest possible \(A\)-worlds are \(B\)-worlds. In an account which admits impossible worlds, however, we can have closest impossible worlds where \(A\) obtains and \(B\) fails, making the counterpossible false even though the corresponding strict conditional is true.

The ensuing anarchy can be mitigated to some extent, e.g., by assuming what Nolan 1997 calls the Strangeness of Impossibility Condition (SIC): any possible world, however weird, should be closer to any possible world \(w\) than any impossible world is to \(w\). Reality will be turned upside down before logical laws or mathematical truths abandon us. Then it is plausible that the Lewis-Stalnaker principles will still hold whenever the relevant antecedent is possible. For then we will consider only the closest antecedent-worlds when we evaluate the conditional, all of which will be possible worlds: the impossible ones will be too far away (Berto et al. 2018).

3. The Metaphysics of Impossible Worlds

Supporters of impossible worlds disagree over their metaphysical nature, just as supporters of possible worlds do. If one accepts ontological commitment to worlds of any kind, then one faces the follow-up question: just what are they, metaphysically speaking?

The two main options among modal realists (philosophers who accept possible worlds in their ontology) are David Lewis’s extreme or genuine modal realism and ersatzism (or actualism or abstractionism: these terms all have slightly different connotations, which we’ll ignore here). It is a common thought among impossible worlds theorists that impossible worlds should just inherit the ontological status of their possible mates: whatever your favorite metaphysics of possible worlds is, impossible worlds are of the same kind. This has been called the Parity Thesis (see Rescher and Brandom 1980). As Graham Priest puts it:

As far as I can see, any of the main theories concerning the nature of possible worlds can be applied equally to impossible worlds: they are existent nonactual entities; they are nonexistent objects; they are constructions out of properties and other universals; they are just certain sets of sentences. … There is, as far as I can see, absolutely no cogent (in particular, non-question-begging) reason to suppose that there is an ontological difference between merely possible and impossible worlds. (Priest 1997b: 580–1)

Yagisawa’s extended modal realism proposes a Lewis-inspired realist account of impossible worlds and impossibilia (the objects exemplifying absolute impossibilities which inhabit impossible worlds). On this view, impossible worlds are concrete mereological sums of real individuals, which are causally and spatiotemporally interrelated within each world but never across worlds (see Yagisawa 1988). Yagisawa exploits the “argument from ways” we met above: if quantification on ways the world might be or have been commits us to possible worlds, then, by parity of reasoning, quantification on ways the world might not be commits us to impossible worlds. The argument is backed by Yagisawa’s considerations on the additional logical and philosophical applications allowed by impossible worlds, which are not available, in his view, to traditional Lewisian modal realism. Extended modal realism is a strong position: concrete impossible worlds represent absolute and logical impossibilities directly, by instantiating them. So impossibilities and, in particular, logical inconsistencies, are “out there” in reality.

In his 2010 book, Yagisawa is more distant from Lewisian modal realism. He still admits impossible worlds and impossibilia, and he rejects ersatz accounts of them. However, he now takes worlds to be points in modal space. Worlds are modal indices for truth, just like times are temporal indices for it; and modal matters are treated in a way similar to how four-dimensionalist philosophers, who believe in temporal parts, treat temporal matters. According to four-dimensionalists, material objects are like temporal worms extended across time: an object has a property at time \(t\) by having a temporal stage at time \(t\) which has that property. Analogously, for Yagisawa an object has a modal property, a property at world \(w\), by having a modal stage at world \(w\) which has that property.

More moderate (Yagisawa would say: too moderate) realists treat impossible worlds as ersatz constructions: abstract entities on a par with ersatz possible worlds (see e.g. Mares 1997, Vander Laan 1997). Modal ersatzism comes in various shapes (Divers 2002, Part III, is by far the best critical evaluation in the literature). If one takes possible worlds as maximally consistent sets of propositions (as per Adams 1974), impossible worlds could be sets of propositions that are inconsistent and/or incomplete. Similarly, Plantingan ersatzism (possible worlds are particular states of affairs) or Stalnakerian ersatzism (possible worlds are world-natures or maximal properties) could be easily extended to accommodate impossible worlds. All hands agree that such worlds come at no great ontological or theoretical cost, once one has accepted ersatz possible worlds. After all, ersatz worlds are abstract: they account for impossibilities, not by instantiating them as Lewisian worlds do, but by representing them in some way or other. Jago (2012) takes both possible and impossible worlds to be constructions out of positive and negative facts, such as Barack Obama’s not being French (see the entry on facts).

The extension of ersatzism from possible to impossible worlds appears to be particularly straightforward for linguistic ersatzism. On this approach, possible worlds are world-books: sets of sentences of a special “worldmaking” language. (Carnap’s (1947) state-descriptions and Jeffrey’s (1983) complete consistent novels are examples of this strategy.) It is easy to admit impossible worlds of the same kind, that is, world-books which are locally inconsistent or incomplete, which fail to comply with some logical law or to be closed under some notion or other of logical consequence.

However, there may be reasons to reject the Parity Thesis. If Lewis’s criticisms of ersatzism in On the Plurality of Worlds are right, then each ersatz account of impossible worlds inherits the limits of ersatz theories of possible worlds: each of these theories has to resort to intensional entities taken as primitive (such as propositions or states of affairs) in its explanation of what ersatz worlds are, or to primitive modal notions (most often, to both). Suppose that, instead, one wants to retain the advantages of both worlds (no pun intended), ersatz and genuine, when it comes to impossibilities. Suppose, that is, that (a) one wants to employ a modal framework including both possible and impossible worlds to retain the theoretical benefits provided by the latter; and (b) one wants to stick to Lewis’s project of a reductive account of intensional and modal notions to fully extensional ones (contra ersatzism); but also (c) one wants to avoid the unwelcome consequences of concrete impossible worlds instantiating impossibilities, such as having true contradictions “out there” in reality (contra Yagisawa’s extended modal realism). One could then try the following hybrid solution: (1) go realist about possible worlds, and (2) exploit the set-theoretic machinery of modal realism to represent different impossible worlds as distinct ersatz, abstract constructions.

To fulfil these desiderata, Berto 2010 sketches an intermediate account, labeled as Hybrid Modal Realism (HMR), which dispenses with the Parity Thesis. The account follows suggestions from Divers 2002, Chapter 5, and is similar to a strategy pursued in Kiourti 2010, Chapter 3. On this view, genuine, concrete possible worlds are the basic stuff. Atomic propositions are taken as sets of possible worlds. Distinct impossible situations can then be represented by distinct world-books, taken as set-theoretic constructions from atomic propositions. Krakauer 2013 gives a similar account in terms of structured propositions built out of ordinary possible worlds. Jago 2012 and Sendłak 2015 criticise Berto’s approach on the basis that it cannot distinguish the proposition that Hesperus is the second planet from the sun from the proposition that Phosphorus is the second planet from the sun. Reinert 2018 attempts to do better by combining Lewisian possible worlds with an ersatz situation-based account of impossible worlds. Fouché 2022 develops Berto’s hybrid account into a full-fledged hyperintensional theory of content.

A metaphysical account of impossible worlds, alternative both to ersatzism and to Lewisian realism, has been proposed in Zalta 1997. Zalta’s powerful theory of abstract objects is based upon his logic of encoding, whose core idea consists in postulating an ambiguity in the copula of predication: “\(x\) is \(P\)” can mean that object \(x\) exemplifies property \(P\), as per ordinary predication; but it may also mean that \(x\) encodes \(P\), encoding being a special mode of predication. Abstract objects encode properties, besides exemplifying them; in particular, they can encode properties they do not exemplify (see Zalta 1983). Within this theory, situations are defined as abstract objects that encode states of affairs (taken as 0-ary properties); and impossible worlds are taken as maximal situations that are not possible, that is, such that it is not possible that all the states of affairs encoded by them simultaneously obtain.

Zalta claims that, despite treating worlds as abstract objects, this is not an ersatz conception of worlds. A given state of affairs \(p\)’s obtaining at world \(w\) (no matter whether \(w\) is possible or impossible) is analyzed as:

  • (Z) \(w\) encodes the property being-such-that-p,

and so being-such-that-p is ascribed, in the encoding sense, to \(w\). As such, \(w\) is (in the encoding sense of the copula, at least) such that \(p\). Thus, according to Zalta’s theory of encoding, worlds are in some sense metaphysically characterized or determined by such states of affairs. And according to Zalta nothing of the sort can be claimed of ersatz conceptions of worlds.

All the ontological accounts of impossible worlds presented so far are in a broad sense realist. They all accept that sentences referring to or quantifying over impossible worlds can be literally true, and take the entailed ontological commitment at face value, although they disagree with each other about the metaphysical status of worlds. A deeply anti-realist alternative to modal metaphysics has also been developed: modal fictionalism. The view is fictionalist (or anti-realist) about worlds. Its key claim is that talk of and quantification over worlds ought to be understood as literally false: it is only true within a “worlds fiction”. We make-believe in the fiction because it delivers useful results in the explanation of modal notions. Modal fictionalism promises the theoretical benefits of modal realism without the ontological costs. We should not include worlds (other than the actual world) in our ontological catalogue. But talking as if there were worlds is useful. Gideon Rosen (1990), a major proponent of the view, takes Lewisian modal realism to be the relevant fiction. But it is relatively easy to extend such modal fictionalist accounts into fictional treatments of possible and impossible worlds, taking e.g. Yagisawa’s extended modal realism as the fiction which we make-believe. JC Beall (2008) proposes an approach to impossible worlds (see section 5.1), which can be motivated by the idea that these are worlds where “logical fictions” take place.

4. The Structure of Impossible Worlds

Another issue which theories of impossible worlds disagree on concerns the amount of logical structure such worlds have. This issue affects impossible worlds specifically: there is no correlative issue concerning possible worlds (beyond our choice of logic). Various classes of impossible worlds display different degrees of anarchic logical behavior: as we shall see, non-normal worlds for non-normal modal logics (section 5.1), for instance, are such that only modal sentences behave in a non-standard fashion at them, whereas sentences that include just the Boolean operators of classical logic get the standard treatment. Such worlds appear to be logically more structured than fully anarchic “open” worlds (section 5.3). For, we shall see, even principles of classical logic involving only the extensional, truth-functional connectives can fail at open worlds: their openness consists in their not being closed under any non-trivial logical consequence principle.

Should we require impossible worlds to comply with any logical rules? And if we allow different classes of impossible worlds, each exhibiting different degrees of logical structure, can these classes be ordered in a meaningful way? This section focuses on these two issues.

4.1 The Granularity Issue

Are there any logical principles which impossible worlds must obey? More precisely, is there any logical inference such that, for any (impossible) world \(w\), if the premises are all true according to \(w\), then so is the conclusion? There is at least one such inference: the trivial inference from \(A\) to \(A\). (For if \(A\) is true at world \(w\), then \(A\) is true at world \(w\)! An impossible world may represent that it is not the case that A entails A; but unless there are true contradictions, it cannot both represent and not represent that A.) Are there any others? This is the granularity issue.

In addressing the issue, a good starting place is the Nolan-Zalta Principle (Nolan 1997: 542; Zalta 1997: 647):

  • (NZ) If it is impossible that \(A\), then there’s an impossible world which represents that \(A\).

(This is not an ‘if and only if’, since the converse is clearly false: some impossible world represents your reading this article, yet that’s not at all impossible. Impossible worlds represent possible and impossible situations. The things they represent make for an impossible bunch, but might each be possible when taken individually.)

The principle has some intuitive force. Nolan thinks of it as a kind of unrestricted ‘comprehension principle’ for impossibilities. It tells something about which impossible worlds there are. There will be worlds which represent that water is not H\(_2\)O, that \(2+2=5\), and that snow both is and is not white. One might think that (NZ) entails that ‘anything goes’ with regard to impossible worlds: that any logical principle (except \(A \vDash A)\) will be broken by some impossible world. If so, then (NZ) delivers the open worlds mentioned above. However, to apply (NZ), we need a single object-language sentence \(A\) which describes an impossibility. Logical laws, by contrast, are stated as relationships between multiple object-language sentences. So it is not clear that (NZ) does its intended work.

Priest (2016) adopts two principles that are similar to, but stronger than, (NZ): ‘everything holds at some worlds, and everything fails at some worlds’ (Priest 2016, 5) and, for any distinct \(A\), \(B\), ‘there are worlds where \(A\) holds and \(B\) fails’ (Priest 2016, 7). More specifically, in our terminology:

  • (4.1) For any \(A\), there is a world which represents that \(A\) and a world which does not represent that \(A\).
  • (4.2) For any distinct \(A\) and \(B\), there is a world which represents that \(A\) but does not represent that \(B\).

Priest calls these the ‘primary directive’ and ‘secondary directive’ on impossible worlds, respectively. The latter implies the former, which in turn implies (NZ), but neither converse holds.

To illustrate the extra power (4.2) gives us (over (4.1) and (NZ)), consider Simplification, the inference from \(A \wedge B\) to \(A\), or Disjunction Introduction, from \(A\) to \(A \vee B\). (4.2) directly entails that there are worlds where these rules fail. So, if we find (4.2) plausible, we can infer that impossible worlds are not, in general, governed by standard paraconsistent logics. A paraconsistent logic is any one in which cont radictory premises \(A\), \(\neg A\) do not entail arbitrary conclusions. But standardly, paraconsistent logics maintain the principle that conjunctions are true just in case both conjuncts are; disjunctions are true just in case at least one disjunct is; and double negations \(\neg \neg A\) are true just in case \(A\) is. If we accept (4.2), then these relationships will break down in some impossible worlds.

Yet even with (4.2) in play, it doesn’t follow that ‘anything goes’ with impossible worlds. No principle so far entails that some impossible world breaks the Adjunction rule, from \(A\) and \(B\) to \(A \wedge B\), simply because 4.2 doesn’t apply to inferences with multiple premises. (We discuss Adjunction-violating worlds further in section 5.2 below.) To infer the ‘anything goes’ conclusion, that for any logically valid inference there is some impossible world that breaks it, we’ll need this principle:

  • (NZ\(^+\)) If it is impossible that \(A_1, A_2,\ldots\) but not \(B\), then there’s an impossible world which represents that \(A_1, A_2,\ldots\) but not \(B\).

However, we can hardly claim that we’ve derived the ‘anything goes’ picture of impossible worlds from this principle, for it is, in effect, an explicit statement of that very view. Whilst the original (NZ) has a good deal of intuitive force, it’s much harder to feel that way about (NZ\(^+)\).

There may be no completely general, intuitively motivated principle (along the lines of (NZ)) from which we can ascertain just how fine-grained impossible worlds should be. Nevertheless, there are arguments which support the ‘anything goes’ picture, on which there exist open worlds (those closed under no valid inferences except \(A \vDash A)\). We’ll briefly consider three such arguments.

The first is simple. If impossible worlds can break some logical rule, then why can’t they break all of them? Suppose we fix on standard proof rules for the connectives. Each such rule is as closely tied to the meaning of the associated connective as the others are (to their associated connectives). Yet, as each logically impossible world breaks at least one of those rules, what’s to stop some other impossible world from breaking any of the other rules? This argument has some intuitive force, but is clearly far from conclusive.

The second argument is from epistemic states. When we consider real-world finite and fallible epistemic agents, there seem to be no rules of the form: if someone believes \(A_1, A_2,\ldots\), then they must believe (distinct) \(B\) (that’s why the logical omniscience problem discussed in 2.3 is hard!). If we model their epistemic states in terms of worlds, then at least one of the worlds must break the inference from \(A_1, A_2,\ldots\) to \(B.\) So each logical inference (except \(A \vDash A)\) is broken by some world (Jago 2014a; Priest 2016).

The third argument is from counterpossible reasoning. Suppose, in a class on alternative logics, we consider what would happen if Excluded Middle \((\vDash A \vee \neg A)\), Double-Negation Elimination \((\neg \neg A \vDash A)\), or the Law of Explosion \((A, \neg A \vDash B)\) were to fail. If classical logic is the one true logic, and logical necessity is absolute, we’re then reasoning counterpossibly. If we want to analyse counterpossibles in general using impossible worlds, then we’ll need worlds where these principles fail. But we seem to be able to reason this way, non-trivially, for any kind of logical principle, and so our analysis will require open worlds (Priest 2016).

Why have we spared \(A \vDash A\) so far? Well, it seems that in order to break this, an impossible world would simultaneously have to represent that \(A\) and not represent that \(A\). Such a world would itself be an impossible object, one with inconsistent features. Since most impossible worlds theorists maintain that impossible worlds (actually) exist and that actuality is not inconsistent, this position is ruled out. It is available to dialetheists and others who allow reality to have inconsistent features. There seems to be no theoretical cost in requiring \(A \vDash A\) to hold at all worlds (impossible or otherwise). Going back to epistemic states, for example, we want to represent inconsistent beliefs, such as someone’s believing both that \(A\) and that \(\neg A\) at the same time; but it would be a mistake to infer that she both believes and does not believe that \(A\).

4.2 The Closeness of Impossible Worlds

If impossible worlds display different degrees of logical structure (or lack thereof), it may make sense to order them. A natural way to do this is via an extension of the traditional “closeness” relations between possible worlds. How to spell out the ordering in detail, though, is far from straightforward. Within standard conditional logics, and in the treatment of counterfactual conditionals in terms of possible worlds due to Robert Stalnaker (1968) and David Lewis (1973), worlds stand in similarity relations; and similarity comes in degrees. This is usually represented by having each possible world, \(w\), come with a system of “spheres”. If \(W\) is the set of all worlds, let \(\$\) be a function from worlds to sets of subsets of \(W\), so that \(\$w = \{S_1, S_2 , \ldots \}\), with \(w \in S_1 \subseteq S_2 \subseteq \ldots = W\). Worlds within a given sphere \(S_i\) are more similar to \(w\) than worlds outside it.

If we take the special case in which \(w =\) the actual world (call it “@”), we get a natural arrangement of possible worlds in a system of spheres that mirrors their degree of (dis)similarity with respect to @, according to the different kinds of possibilities and (relative) impossibilities they represent. For instance, a world which is exactly like @, except that Franz wears a white t-shirt instead of the black one he’s actually wearing while writing these lines, is, intuitively, closer to @ than a world at which the laws of physics are turned upside down. Some people have a general, intuitive depiction of such closeness relations, and set out a hierarchy of modalities accordingly: possible worlds where the laws of physics are different from ours are naturally seen as more eccentric than worlds where only biological, but not physical, laws are different; and these are more eccentric than possible worlds with minimal factual changes with respect to @, such as the white t-shirt world.

Can such a natural view be extended to impossible worlds? First, it is intuitive to claim that some impossible worlds are more similar to the actual world @ than others. For instance, the “explosion” world (call it \(e)\) at which everything is the case (every sentence is true) seems to be as far from @ as one can imagine, if one can actually imagine or conceive such an extremely absurd situation. Now, pick the impossible world, \(t\), at which everything is as in @, except that Franz wears an impossible t-shirt which is white all over and black all over. Intuitively, \(t\) is closer to @ than \(e\).

Next, some authors (e.g. Mares 1997) favor Nolan’s SIC principle (introduced in section 2.5). This implies that any possible world is closer to @ than any impossible world is to @. A system of spheres for impossible worlds centered on @ will just extend the intuitive possible worlds spheres described above, by adding further, larger spheres where worlds outside (logical, or more generally unrestricted) possibility stand. But how are these latter to be internally ordered?

One very general option is the following. Even though we subscribe to some unrestricted comprehension principle for impossible worlds, we may admit that worlds where only the intensional operators, e.g., the box and diamond of necessity and possibility, behave in a non-standard fashion are less deviant than worlds where also the extensional operators, like classical conjunction and disjunction, do. Let us call worlds of the former kind intensionally impossible and worlds of the latter kind extensionally impossible. This picture (inspired by Priest 2005, Chapter 1) has some intuitive force to recommend it. Kripkean non-normal worlds, where only the behaviour of the modal operators is non-standard (see section 5.1), are intuitively less deviant than open worlds, where all formulas may behave arbitrarily. Generalizing, the view would entail arranging the respective spheres in such a way that any intensionally impossible world is closer to @ than any extensionally impossible one.

This very general ordering of impossibilities, albeit intuitive, may not be fully satisfying. A general qualm concerns the SIC principle itself. For one may claim that, intuitively, some slightly deviant impossible worlds may be more similar to the actual world @ than some possible but very weird worlds. For instance, the impossible world \(t\) above, which is like @ except for Franz’s wearing an inconsistent T-shirt, may look more familiar than a world which is logically possible, but where the laws of physics are turned upside down. Several authors (Nolan 1997, Vander Laan 2004, Bernstein 2016) have proposed putative counterexamples to SIC along these lines.

Although we cannot pursue this topic further within the limits of this entry, the discussion developed so far should show that the issue of the structure, closeness, and ordering of impossible worlds is quite open.

5. The Logic(s) of Impossible Worlds

This section is a bit more technical than the others. None of the other sections presuppose this material.

5.1 Impossible Worlds in Non-Normal Modal Logics

Possible worlds semantics is celebrated for providing suitable interpretations for different axiomatic systems of modal logic, such as C.I. Lewis’s systems \(\mathbf{S4}\) and \(\mathbf{S5}\) (Lewis and Langford 1931). In each model, sentences are evaluated as true or false relative to a possible world. Modal sentences \(\Box A\) and \(\Diamond A\) (usually read as ‘it is necessary that \(A\)’ and ‘it is possible that \(A\)’, respectively) are evaluated in terms of \(A\)’s truth at all or some of the accessible worlds. By placing various conditions on the accessibility relation between worlds, different modal logics can be accommodated. (Readers unfamiliar with modal logic are advised again to read the entities on possible worlds and modal logic before going further in this section.)

This approach validates the Necessitation inference rule:

If \(A\) is valid, then so is \(\Box A\). (In symbols: if \(\vDash A\) then \(\vDash \Box A\).)

To see why, suppose \(A\) is a logical truth. Then in any model, it is true at all possible worlds. So given any world \(w\) in an arbitrary model, \(A\) is true at all worlds accessible from \(w\), hence \(\Box A\) is true at \(w\), and so \(\Box A\) too is valid.

Logics in which the Necessitation rule is valid are called normal modal logics. But historically, not all of the modal logics of interest are normal logics. C.I. Lewis’s systems \(\mathbf{S2}\) and \(\mathbf{S3}\) (Lewis and Langford 1931) are non-normal logics, for example. These logics are weaker than normal modal logics, in the sense that they support fewer valid inferences. To give a worlds-based semantics for such logics, we need to look beyond possible worlds.

In 1965, Saul Kripke introduced a special kind of world, the non-normal worlds, in order to provide semantics for non-normal modal logics. Let us introduce some simple semantic machinery for propositional modal logic. Take a non-normal interpretation of a propositional modal language, \(\langle W, N, R, v\rangle\), where \(W\) is a set of worlds; \(N\) is a proper subset of \(W\), the set of normal worlds; \(R\) is a binary accessibility relation between worlds; and \(v\) is a valuation function assigning truth values to formulas at worlds: “\(v_w(A)\)” denotes the truth value of \(A\) at world \(w\). Worlds in \(W - N\) are the non-normal worlds. The truth conditions for the extensional logical vocabulary (negation, conjunction, disjunction, the material conditional) are given the usual way. The same holds for the modal operators of necessity \(\Box\) and possibility \(\Diamond\), but only at normal worlds. If \(w\) is non-normal, the truth conditions for the modalizers go as follows:

\[\begin{align} v_w (\Box A) &= 0 \\ v_w (\Diamond A) &= 1 \end{align}\]

where 1 stands for true, 0 for false. At non-normal worlds, formulas of the form £\(A\), with £ a modal, are not evaluated depending on the truth value of \(A\) at other (accessible) worlds, but get assigned their truth value directly: all box-formulas are false and all diamond-formulas are true. In a sense, at non-normal worlds nothing is necessary, and anything is possible. These worlds, however, are deviant only in this respect: their behavior, as far as the extensional connectives are concerned, is quite regular.

In some (though not all) worlds semantics, logical validity and consequence are defined relative to just the normal worlds. The idea is that the normal worlds behave ‘appropriately’ with respect to the logic in question, whereas the non-normal worlds do not. For example, \(\Box(A \vee \neg A)\) is valid in \(\mathbf{S2}\) and \(\mathbf{S3}\), but (by definition) it is false at the non-normal worlds. So we need to ignore the non-normal worlds when defining validity and consequence, which we do as follows:

\(A\) is valid \((\vDash A)\) if and only if, for all normal worlds \(w\) in all models, \(v_w (A) = 1\).

Premises \(S\) entail \(A (S \vDash A)\) if and only if, for all normal worlds \(w\) in all models: if \(v_w (B) = 1\) for all premises \(B \in\) S, then \(v_w (A) = 1\).

Even though we have ignored the non-normal worlds in this definition, they still play a role in invalidating Necessitation. For take any classical propositional tautology, say \(A \vee \neg A\). This holds at all worlds of all models, so \(\Box(A \vee \neg A)\) holds at all normal worlds and hence is valid. But \(\Box(A \vee \neg A)\) holds at no non-normal world. Now suppose \(w\) is a normal world that has access to any non-normal world. Then \(\Box \Box(A \vee \neg A)\) is false at \(w\) and so (since \(w\) is normal) \(\Box \Box(A \vee \neg A)\) is not valid. That’s a counterexample to Necessitation.

In these semantics for non-normal modal logics such as \(\mathbf{S2}\) and \(\mathbf{S3}\), the valuation function assigns the same truth value to all box formulas (false) and all diamond formulas (true) at non-normal worlds. But we can do things differently. In Cresswell’s (1966) semantics for the modal system S0.5 (due to E.J. Lemmon 1957), sentences beginning with a modality are assigned arbitrary truth values. The valuation function \(v\) treats modal sentences as if they were atomic sentences. (Interpretations for \(\mathbf{S2}\) or \(\mathbf{S3}\) are thus special cases of the interpretations for S0.5.) The idea of considering impossible (non-normal) worlds as worlds at which complex formulas are treated as atomic one is a popular one, as we will see below.

Kripke introduced non-normal worlds as a technical device in order to treat C.I. Lewis’ non-normal modal logics; the question of the interpretation of such structures (particularly, of the ontological status of impossible worlds), then, makes perfect sense — and the answer is not straightforward, as have seen in section 3.

5.2 Nonadjunctive and Nonprime Impossible Worlds

In 1980, Nicholas Rescher and Robert Brandom published The Logic of Inconsistency. A Study in Non-Standard Possible-Worlds Semantics and Ontology. They introduced a modal semantics including, besides ordinary possible worlds (taken as maximally consistent collections of states of affairs), also non-standard worlds that are locally inconsistent (such that, for some \(A\), both \(A\) and \(\neg A\) hold at them), and incomplete (such that for some \(A\), neither \(A\) nor \(\neg A\) hold at them). These are obtained combinatorially, via two recursive operations having standard worlds as their base, and called schematization \((\cap)\) and superposition \((\cup)\). Given two worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\), a schematic world \(w_1 \cap w_2\) is one at which all and only the states of affairs obtain, which obtain both at \(w_1\) and at \(w_2\). Dually, a “superposed” or inconsistent world \(w_1 \cup w_2\) is one at which all and only the states of affairs obtain, which obtain at \(w_1\) or at \(w_2\). Rescher and Brandom’s inconsistent-superposed worlds are, therefore, impossible worlds of the fourth kind: Contradiction Realizers making both \(A\) and its negation true, for some \(A\) (just superpose, for instance, a possible world, \(w_1\), at which I am 1.70m tall, and another possible world, \(w_2\), at which I am 1.90m tall).

The assignment of truth values at such worlds is not (obviously) compositional with respect to conjunction. The standard semantic clause interprets the ‘\(\wedge\)’ symbol using our world ‘and’:

  • (S\(\wedge\)) \(v_w (A \wedge B) = 1\) if and only if \(v_w (A) = 1\) and \(v_w (B) = 1\)

But the right-to-left direction will have to go, if \(w\) is one of Rescher and Brandom’s impossible worlds. These worlds are nonadjunctive: they allow two sentences to be true even though their conjunction is not true. (Adjunction is the principle that the truth of a conjunction follows from the truth of its conjuncts.) Rescher and Brandom’s worlds can also be nonprime: a disjunction may hold at them even though neither disjunct does. They may also make some \(A\) and its negation \(\neg A\) both true. But the corresponding conjunction, \(A \wedge \neg A\), doesn’t follow. These impossible worlds retain a certain amount of logical structure. They are closed under any classically valid, essentially single-premised inference (such as Disjunction Introduction); but they are not closed under essentially multiple-premised inferences (such as Adjunction).

Rescher and Brandom’s approach falls in the nonadjunctive tradition (see Berto 2007, Chapter 6) of paraconsistent logics: a tradition started by Jaskowksi’s discussive logic \(\mathbf{D}_2\) (also labeled as \(\mathbf{J}\) in the literature, Jaśkowski 1948), and based on the idea of rejecting or limiting the Adjunction principle. Such an approach has been revived in works by Hyde (1997), and Varzi (1997 and 2004).

5.3 Impossible Worlds in Epistemic Logic

To model a concept such as knowledge, we can use a modality ‘\(K\)’ for ‘knows that’, with semantics along the lines of ‘\(\Box\)’, quantifying over all epistemically possible worlds: worlds which are ways things could be, for all one knows, or given the information or evidence one has available. This is epistemic modal logic. (See the entry on epistemic logic for background material.)

This approach has proved to be very useful. However, when epistemically possible worlds confirm to the rules of logically possible worlds, the following principle is valid:

(Closure) If \(KA\) and \(A\) entails \(B\), then \(KB\)

This principle says that one knows all the logical consequences of the things one knows. A special case of this principle says that all valid formulas are known:

(Validity) If \(A\) is valid, then so is \(KA\)

But these principles seem false. You don’t know all the logical and mathematical truths, and there are truths which follow from what you know which you don’t know. (You might be indifferent to those truths; you might even disbelieve them.) This is the problem of logical omniscience (see epistemic logic again). There is a rich literature on the problem (Alechina et al. 2004, Duc 1997, Hintikka 1975, Jago 2014a,b, Rantala 1982a), including some who defend these seemingly false principles (Stalnaker 1991, 1999).

Exactly the same holds for belief (treated with a modality ‘\(B\)’ along the lines of ‘\(K\)’). The modal epistemic approach tells us that, as well as believing all consequences of what we believe, we must hold a perfectly consistent set of beliefs:

(Consistency) \(\vDash \neg(BA \wedge B\neg A)\).

This is a hard principle to defend, as anyone who has reflected on their own beliefs will appreciate.

A popular method of avoiding these principles (beginning with Cresswell 1973 and Hintikka 1975) is to allow impossible worlds into the account. Consider again Rescher and Brandom’s nonadjunctive and nonprime worlds, at which conjunction and disjunction behave anarchically. Rantala (1982a) takes the idea further, introducing worlds at which any connective may behave anarchically.

Rantala’s approach divides the worlds into normal and non-normal ones. Normal worlds behave like possible worlds whereas at non-normal worlds, every sentence is assigned an arbitrary truth value. In effect, complex sentences \(\neg A, A \vee B\), and so on, are treated as if they were atomic sentences. The truth value of \(\neg A\) is independent of \(A\); the value of \(A \vee B\) is independent of the values of \(A\) and \(B\) at a non-normal world; and so on for the other complex sentences. These non-normal worlds are thus a very anarchic form of impossible world. Priest (2005, 2016) calls them open worlds, since they are not closed under any rule of inference (other than the trivial rule allowing one to infer \(A\) from \(A\); see also Jago 2014a).

Logical consequence and validity are defined with respect to possible (normal) worlds only. Impossible worlds come into play only when evaluating knowledge claims, \(KA\). So, ignoring \(K\)-sentences, the logic is classical. But the logic of \(K\)-sentences is not closed under any non-trivial rule of inference, thereby dispensing with Closure, Validity, and (in the case of belief) Consistency. An agent is modelled as having inconsistent beliefs, for example, simply by treating an impossible world where both \(A\) and \(\neg A\) are true as being epistemically accessible (from the actual world) for that agent.

The approach has been generalized to quantified modal logics (Rantala 1982b) and developed into a unified framework for epistemic logics (Wansing 1989, 1990). Wansing has shown that various logics for knowledge and belief developed in Artificial Intelligence can find equivalent models in structures including impossible worlds. Further equivalence results in this area have been obtained in Sillari 2008, where it is shown that impossible worlds structures using binary epistemic accessibility relations are equivalent to structures using Montague-Scott neighborhood semantics.

This kind of approach faces problems, however. If there’s no logical structure to impossible worlds, then we might do as well to model an agent’s knowledge using an arbitrary set of sentences, as in Konolige 1986. The worry is that unconstrained impossible worlds semantics makes no real progress over this purely syntactic approach (Jago 2007, 2009).

One may instead adopt impossible worlds that retain some logical structure, e.g., worlds closed under some weaker-than-classical logical consequence. One approach of this kind is found in Levesque 1984 (see also Cresswell 1973). This employs impossible worlds of the kind used in paraconsistent relevant logics, which can be locally inconsistent and incomplete but are well-behaved with respect to conjunction and disjunction, that is, they are adjunctive and prime. Laws of classical logic fail at them, and by accessing them a cognitive agent can have inconsistent beliefs. However, we still have a weakened form of logical omniscience: the beliefs of an agent are closed under the weaker paraconsistent-relevant logic at issue. This seems incorrect as an attempt to model finite agents.

Rasmussen (2015) and Bjerring and Skipper (2019) present a dynamic impossible worlds solution to the logical omniscience problem. Agents’ beliefs evolve over time due to epistemic actions, on this approach (see the entry on dynamic epistemic logic for background). Bjerring and Skipper focus on deductive actions. Agents count as competent insofar as they unfold the consequences of their beliefs, up to a certain depth of reasoning. Their operator “\(\langle n\rangle KA\)”, says: “After some \(n\)-step chain of logical reasoning, the agent comes to know that \(A\)”. The agent can update its epistemic state by kicking out choices of impossible worlds which were epistemic possibilities before the deduction took place. One can show that if a formula \(A\) follows from formulas \(A_1, \ldots, A_n\) in \(n\) steps of reasoning, then \(KA_1, \ldots, KA_n\) together entail \(\langle n\rangle KA\).

Impossible worlds are starting to be used not only in formal, but also in mainstream and Bayesian epistemology. Modal accounts of knowledge invoking possible worlds, whether based on the notion of safety or on that of sensitivity, make all necessary or logical truths trivially sensitive and safe. Melchior 2021 proposes to address the issue by using impossible worlds. Probabilistic-Bayesian accounts of credences or degrees of belief can be formulated using logically possible worlds and sets thereof, to which probabilities are assigned by credence functions obeying the Kolmogorov axioms of probability. As noted by Pettigrew 2021, this models logically omniscient, idealised agents who assign probability 1 to all logical truths and never have higher credences in any given premises than in their logical consequences. To model rational but more realistic agents, Pettigrew introduces a setting similar to that Berto and Jago 2019 had for all-or-nothing beliefs. He resorts to “personally possible worlds” which make true what a rational but cognitively limited agent believes and has not (yet) ruled out using its bounded cognitive resources. Such worlds are in fact impossible worlds of the open kind.

5.4 Impossible Worlds in Relevance Logic

Relevance logic (or relevant logic) is an attempt to capture the idea that good reasoning requires a genuine condition between premises and conclusions. This should go beyond a mere guarantee of truth preservation. For when a conclusion \(A\) is guaranteed to be true (for example, when it is a logical truth), any argument concluding in \(A\) will preserve truth from premises to conclusions. But those premises may have no genuine connection whatsoever to what \(A\) is about. The same consideration applies when taking a conditional \(A \rightarrow B\) to be valid: there should be a genuine connection between \(A\) and \(B\).

With this in mind, relevance logic attempts to avoid the ‘fallacies of relevance’ (also called ‘paradoxes of the material conditional’). These are conditionals that are valid in classical and modal logic, simply because the antecedent is a necessary falsehood or the consequent is a necessary truth, but without a guarantee of any real connection between them. Examples include \(A \wedge \neg A \rightarrow B\) (ex contradictione quodlibet, or the Law of Explosion), \(A \rightarrow B \vee \neg B\), and \(A \rightarrow (B \rightarrow B)\) (verum ex quolibet).

Contradiction-realizing impossible worlds can help us avoid ex contradictione quodlibet, if they are worlds where some contradiction \(A \wedge \neg A\) is true but some other \(B\) is not true. For that reason, various systems of relevant logic have been given semantics which include (things naturally thought of as) impossible worlds.

A Routley-Meyer interpretation (see Routley and Routley 1972; Routley and Meyer 1973, 1976; Routley 1979) for relevant (propositional) logics is a structure \(\langle W, N, R, {}^*, v\rangle\), where \(W\) is a set of worlds; \(N\) is a proper subset of \(W\) including the normal or possible worlds (the remaining worlds are the non-normal or impossible worlds); \(R\) is a ternary accessibility relation between worlds, and \({}^*\) (the Routley star) is a function from worlds to worlds. \({}^*\) and \(R\) figure prominently in the truth conditions for negation and the (relevant) conditional. Their task is precisely to provide a semantics for negation that allows for the truth of \(A\) and \(\neg A\) at some worlds, and a semantics for the conditional that frees it from the fallacies of relevance.

5.4.1 The Relevant Conditional

In order to get rid of such entailments as \(A \rightarrow (B \rightarrow B)\), we need some world at which \(A\) holds but \(B \rightarrow B\) fails. One way to achieve this may be to admit “partial” or incomplete situations of the kind studied in situation semantics, at which \(A\) holds but \(B \rightarrow B\) fails to hold, just because they carry no information about \(B\). Another way is via impossible worlds: an understanding of such worlds, as we have seen, is as scenarios where logical laws may fail, and the Law of (propositional) Identity, stating that any formula entails itself, is one of them. At possible worlds, we still require for the truth of conditionals \(A \rightarrow B\) that at every accessible world where \(A\) holds, \(B\) holds, too. Consequently, \(A \rightarrow(B \rightarrow B)\) is not logically valid. Technically, when \(w\) is an impossible world, we state the truth conditions for the conditional, by means of the ternary \(R\), as follows:

  • (\(\rightarrow\)) \(v_w (A \rightarrow B) =\) true if and only if, for all worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\) such that \(Rww_1 w_2\), if \(v_{w1}(A) =\) true, then \(v_{w2}(B) =\) true.

The key difference between \((\rightarrow)\) and the standard modal clause for the strict conditional (which is true at a world if and only if, at all accessible worlds where the antecedent is true, the consequent is true), is that the worlds of the antecedent and the consequent have been “split”. Specifically, \(B \rightarrow B\) fails at impossible worlds \(w\) when there are worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\) such that R\(ww_1 w_2, B\) holds at the former, but fails at the latter. Since we do not want \(B \rightarrow B\) to fail at normal/possible worlds, we can add a Normality Condition, saying that the accessible worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\) are one and the same:

  • (NC) For normal worlds \(w, Rww_1 w_2\) only if \(w_1 = w_2\).

Using the ternary relation \(R\), one can build models for different relevant logics. Starting with the basic relevant system \(\mathbf{B}\), one obtains models for stronger logics such as \(\mathbf{R}\), the system of relevant implication, by adding additional conditions on \(R\). (This is similar to the way we may move on from basic modal logic \(\mathbf{K}\) to the systems \(\mathbf{T}, \mathbf{S4}\), and \(\mathbf{S5}\), by adding extra conditions on the accessibility relation.) The constraints to be added to the ternary \(R\) are more complex than those of standard modal logic and some involve the star operator \({}^*\) (which we’ll address shortly).

It isn’t easy to provide an intuitive reading for the ternary relation \(R\). The basic idea is that the truth of an entailment \(A \rightarrow B\) at a world \(w\) depends on \(w\)’s “seeing an accessibility” (Bremer 2005: 67) between two other worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\), such that if \(A\) is true at the former, \(B\) is true at the latter. But what does this mean? This is perhaps the most important philosophical issue facing semantics for relevant logics. One approach is the information-based account of Mares (2004, 2009, 2010) and Restall (1995), based on situation semantics. Another approach draws on various interpretations of conditionality, such as those found in the literature on conditional logics (Beall et al. 2012). (See the entry on relevance logic or Jago 2013c for further discussion.)

5.4.2 The Routley Star

Given a world \(w\), the Routley star function outputs a world \(w^*\) which is, in a sense, its “reverse twin”. The truth conditions for negation within the Routley-Meyer semantics are:

  • (\(\neg\)) \(v_w (\neg A) =\) true if and only if \(v_{w^*}(A) =\) false.

So \(\neg A\) is true at a world \(w\) if and only if \(A\) is false, not at \(w\) itself (as it happens with standard negation), but at its twin \(w^*\). Relevant negation is therefore an intensional operator: in order to evaluate negated sentences at \(w\), we may need to check the goings on at some other world.

Adding appropriate constraints provides this negation with many intuitive inferential features. If \(w^{**} = w\) for all worlds \(w\), for example, Double Negation introduction and elimination is valid. This is often called De Morgan negation, for De Morgan’s Laws hold of it. But it does not validate the Law of Explosion (that a contradiction entails any sentence). For a counterexample, take a model where \(A\) holds at \(w, B\) doesn’t hold at \(w\), and \(A\) doesn’t hold at \(w^*\). Then, both \(A\) and \(\neg A\) hold at \(w\), whereas \(B\) doesn’t: \(w\) is an inconsistent but non-trivial world.

What is the intuitive connection between \(w\) and \(w^*\)? The idea is that the twins are “mirror images one of the other reversing ‘in’ and ‘out’” (Dunn 1986: 191). If \(w\) is \(A\)-inconsistent (both \(A\) and \(\neg A\) hold), then \(w^*\) is \(A\)-incomplete (neither \(A\) nor \(\neg A\) hold), and vice versa. The \({}^*\) takes local inconsistency into local incompleteness and vice versa. It may also be the case that \(w = w^*\): the twins are in fact one. In that case, \(w\) must be a maximal and consistent world, where negation behaves classically: \(\neg A\) is true if and only if \(A\) is false there.

6. Objections to Impossible Worlds

This last section discusses some difficulties for impossible worlds theories.

6.1 The Exportation Principle

Suppose that the expression ‘at world \(w\)’ works as a restricting modifier: its main task consists in restricting the quantifiers within its scope to parts of \(w\) (Lewis 1986). If so, then it should distribute through the truth-functional connectives. This means in particular that

\[ \text{At } w: (A \wedge \neg A) \]

will entail the contradiction

\[ (\text{At } w: A) \wedge \neg (\text{at } w: A). \]

This is the exportation principle. It is disastrous for any theory of impossible worlds. It implies that an inconsistency at some impossible world will spill over into an overt inconsistency. A true contradiction at some \(w\) implies that there are true contradictions, full stop. This is hard to swallow, unless one is a dialetheist. (And even dialethists may want to reject the exportation principle for impossible worlds: see Jago 2013b.)

Avoiding the exportation principle is not difficult, however (Kiourti 2010, Chapter 4; Jago 2013b). For it to be valid, it seems to require genuine worlds, as in Lewis’s (1986) genuine modal realism or Yagisawa’s (1988, 2010) extended modal realism. Adopting an ersatz conception of worlds blocks the principle. If a world represents that \(A\) (say, by containing a sentence or proposition expressing that A), but is not in itself such that \(A\), then the principle is blocked. ‘At \(w: (A \wedge \neg A)\)’ will be interpreted as: \(w\) contains the sentence (or proposition) that A \(\wedge \neg A\), whereas ‘at \(w: A\)’ will mean that \(w\) contains the sentence (or proposition) that A, and ‘not at \(w: A\)’ will mean that \(w\) does not contain the sentence (or proposition) that A. But an impossible world may contain both, or neither, of \(A\) and \(\neg A\), so that containing one implies nothing about containing the other. An impossible world may (depending on how fine-grained we take them to be) also contain the conjunction \(A \wedge \neg A\) independently of whether it contains both \(A\) and \(\neg A.\) So the inference from ‘at \(w: (A \wedge \neg A)\)’ to ‘(at \(w: A) \wedge \neg\)(at \(w: A)\)’ is blocked (possibly twice over).

It is controversial whether any genuine account of worlds can block the exportation principle. Jago 2013a,b argues not; Yagisawa 2015 responds in defence of genuine impossible worlds.

6.2 Defining Possibility

If there are impossible worlds, then we cannot accept the simple clause for possibility:

  • (P) It is possible that \(A\) if and only if there’s a world \(w\) such that, at \(w\), \(A\).

Once impossible worlds enter the stage, (P) becomes false from right to left. We therefore need a principle that restricts the quantification in the right half of the biconditional to possible worlds. How to do that, without appealing to modal notions, is not straightforward. A hybrid account (Berto 2010) can answer the objection, by taking possible worlds to be all and only the genuine ones, with impossible worlds as ersatz constructions of some kind. We can then capture the intent of (P) as:

  • (P\({}^*\)) It is possible that \(A\) if and only if there’s a genuine world \(w\) such that, at \(w\), \(A\).

Note that it doesn’t matter if the hybrid account accepts the existence of ersatz possible worlds in addition to her genuine possible worlds: (P\({}^*\)) will still give the right result.

The ersatzist may respond by biting the bullet. Even without admitting impossible worlds, most possible worlds accounts do not aim at providing a reductive and complete analysis of modality. (Lewis’s modal realism does. But it may not succeed, when so-called ‘alien’ properties, not instantiated by anything at the actual world nor obtainable as constructions out of actually instantiated properties, enter the stage. See Divers 2002, Chapter 7; Divers and Melia 2002.)

6.3 The Usefulness of Impossible Worlds

Stalnaker (1996) argues that, whilst there is nothing wrong in admitting impossible worlds, not much explanatory work can be expected from them. For instance, if one takes worlds as sets of propositions, one cannot then analyze propositions as sets of worlds. But an advocate of impossible worlds may respond that the same point can be made against any account of possible worlds (such as Adams’s) that takes them to be maximally consistent sets of propositions. And, just as ersatz possible worlds needn’t be constructed in this way, nor need ersatz impossible worlds. Impossible worlds have found many uses in the recent literature, as we have abundantly seen. So we don’t find Stalnaker’s worry convincing.

6.4 The Semantics of Negation

The standard semantic clause for negation has it that \(\neg A\) is true if and only if \(A\) is not true. So there could not be worlds at which both or neither of \(A\) and \(\neg A\) are true, unless we revise the semantics of negation. Stalnaker (1996) argues that negation is such a basic operator, whose semantics is ‘learned in a first logic class’ that it had better be left alone.

To this, the impossible world theorist can reply that it is in fact the case that \(\neg A\) is true if and only if \(A\) is not true; for this concerns truth simpliciter, that is, truth at the actual world. She may also agree that the same holds for any possible world. But it is precisely impossible worlds that we are talking about here; how negation works at any possible world need not be affected by the fact that, at some impossible world or other, some sentence can hold together with its negation: this is one of the things that makes them impossible, after all.

6.5 Counterpossible Reasoning

Timothy Williamson (2007, Chapter 5) has objected to non-trivial treatments of counterpossibles, in particular (though not perforce) when they resort to impossible worlds. Consider the claim:

  1. If \(5 + 7\) were 13, then \(5 + 6\) would be 12.

Prima facie, this is a non-trivially true counterpossible. However, Williamson argues, other non-trivial consequences of the supposition would then be that \(5 + 5 = 11\), and \(5 + 4 = 10\), and … , and \(0 = 1\). Therefore,

  1. If the number of answers I gave to a given question were 0, then the number of answers I gave would be 1.

But (2) is clearly false.

Brogaard and Salerno (2007) pose a dilemma for Williamson: either we hold the context fixed in this kind of counterpossible reasoning, or we don’t. If we don’t, then (2) does not follow from (1). In particular, the context at which (2) comes out false is one at which the closest antecedent worlds are possible and, to be sure, at those worlds, 0 is not 1. But if we hold the context fixed, then what does follow is just the following counterpossible:

  1. If 0 were 1 and the number of right answers I gave were 0, then the number of right answers I gave would be 1.

Now this is intuitively true, and non-trivially so.

Williamson (2007) also argues that non-trivial treatments of counterpossibles create opaque contexts, in which the substitutivity of co-referential terms fails. Supporters of non-trivial counterpossibles will take the following conditional as false:

  1. If Hesperus had not been Phosphorus, then Phosphorus would not have been Phosphorus.

Given the necessity of identity, (4) is a counterpossible: as Hesperus is Phosphorus, its antecedent can only be true at impossible worlds. That’s false, supposedly, because even if Hesperus and Phosphorus had been distinct, Phosphorus would have remained self-identical. However, all accept that

  1. If Hesperus had not been Phosphorus, then Hesperus would not have been Phosphorus

since it is an instance of ‘if it had been that \(A\), then it would have been that \(A\)’. Yet substituting ‘Phosphorus’ for the first occurrence of ‘Hesperus’ in the consequent of (5) gives (4). Since (5) is true and (4) is (supposedly) false, substitution of identicals has failed. This failure of substitutivity, Williamson claims, is a bad result, for counterfactuals should not create opaque contexts.

Brogaard and Salerno (2013) accept that counterpossibles do create opaque contexts. They argue that the impossible worlds similarity semantics for counterpossibles should be “partially epistemic” (Brogaard and Salerno 2013: 654), and this epistemic component explains the failure of substitution.

An alternative reply to Williamson is that the objection is question-begging. It is clearly false that counterfactuals allow substitution of identical terms (of arbitrary type). ‘Had Aristotle never taught, Aristotle would still have been Aristotle’ is true, and Aristotle is the teacher of Alexander, yet ‘had Aristotle never taught, Aristotle would still have been the teacher of Alexander’ is clearly false. The substitution principle must (at the least) be restricted to rigid designators: terms that denote the same entity in all metaphysically possible worlds. But if the definition of ‘rigid designator’ is to be restricted to possible worlds, then the application of the corresponding substitution principle should likewise be restricted to contexts which do not invoke impossible worlds. Viewed from this perspective, it is question-begging to insist at the outset that the substitution principle (for rigid designators) is valid for all counterfactuals (including counterpossibles).

Berto et al. 2018 is an extensive discussion of a number of Williamsonian objections to non-trivial treatments of counterpossibles.

6.6 Compositionality

Compositionality is the principle that the meaning or content of a complex expression is a function of the meanings of its constituent expressions. It’s commonly taken to be a mandatory feature of any adequate theory of meaning and content. The argument is that, as competent speakers of a language, we are in principle capable of grasping the meanings of a potentially infinite number of sentences. And since we’ve learnt the meanings of a limited number of words, this is possible only if the meanings of complex sentences are obtainable recursively from the meanings of their constituent parts (Davidson 1965).

The worry is that a theory of meaning or content which includes impossible worlds will not be compositional. Consider what we said above about the exportation principle (Section 6.1) and the semantics of negation (Section 6.4). An impossible world may represent that \(\neg A\) independently of whether it represents that \(A\). But then, for such worlds, the truth-value of \(\neg A\) is not a function of the truth-value of \(A\). So, the worry goes, the content or proposition that \(\neg A\), understood as a set of possible and impossible worlds, will not be a function of the proposition that \(A\). Certainly, the latter is not the set-theoretic complement of the former, as it is on the possible worlds account. The same goes for all the other logically complex sentences. This is perhaps the most serious objection to the impossible worlds approach. If it can’t be met, it may well be fatal.

To address the worry, defenders of impossible worlds must show that their notion of content is compositional, even if it does not provide uniform truth-conditions across all worlds. In other words, they must specify a way to calculate complex contents from constituent contents, but which does not go via the usual truth-at-a-world clauses for connectives. As far as we know, the only attempt to achieve this is in Berto and Jago 2019, Chapter 8. They view contents as sets of (possible and impossible) worlds, which are themselves sets of sentences of some ‘worldmaking’ language. They argue that grammatical structures can thus be recovered from semantic contents, via the syntactic structure of the worldmaking sentences involved. This provides a functional map between grammatical structure and semantic content which in turn, they argue, provides a means for calculating complex contents from their constituents. Whether this provides an acceptable notion of compositionality (as they claim) remains to be seen.

The compositionally objection also appears in Williamson 2020, a book mostly devoted to a defense of the extensional material conditional as giving the meaning of the indicative “if”, but also dealing with counterfactuals. Williamson accuses hyperintensional approaches to conditionals and to content in general — whether based on impossible worlds, or of other kinds, e.g., based on truthmakers — of “overfitting”: complicating the semantics in order to account for the variability and systematic inconsistencies of speakers’ judgments, with the result of incorporating “noise” in their models. At the extreme of fine-graining, open impossible worlds approaches “must individuate meanings so finely as to restrict synonymy to self-synonymy, and thereby render the conception of meaning theoretically useless, because it filters nothing out” (249).

Of course, hyperintensionalists (with impossible worlds sympathies, or of other kind) may equally accuse extensional or merely intensional semantics of “underfitting”: conflating contents we may have good reasons to keep distinct. We seem to need some principled way to mark the proper boundaries of semantics. Williamson proposes one: we should pay more attention to a cognitive or epistemic level, intermediate between semantics and pragmatics. Many intuitive distinctions hyperintensionalists try to force into the semantics are better explained as belonging to competent speakers’ cognitive-epistemic heuristics. He grants, for instance, that the view that counterpossibles are not all trivially true speaks to our intuitions; but objects that “sometimes, the robustly shared verdicts of native speakers on a sample sentence will simply be false, the predictable output of a fallible human heuristic.” (265).

Some authors, e.g. Rothschild (2021), argue that the Williamsonian stance is at odds with standard practice in semantics. The early chapters of any textbook introduction to semantics (e.g., Chierchia and McConnell-Ginet 1990; Heim and Kratzer 1997) tell us that one key task of semantics is to account for (rather than explain away) competent speakers’ intuitions and judgments of synonymy, antonymy, entailment, etc. Williamson’s endorsement of the extensional material conditional gives, of course, a very simple semantics for the indicative “if”; but, says Rothschild, “the simplicity comes at the cost of failing to integrate conditionals with the compositional semantics of natural language” (22). And once the heuristic procedures are developed in order to carry out the aforementioned key task, “it is not clear that Williamson’s overall system will still look simple”. (Ibid.)

The compositionally objection is also raised by Fine 2021, who proposes his truthmaker semantics as a hyperintensional account of content in place of possible and impossible worlds-based accounts. Fine’s semantics (2017a,b) uses states in place of worlds, where states are things that may fail to be maximal (making some sentences neither true nor false), and they may be inconsistent. Inconsistent states may be formed as mereological sums of consistent states, e.g., summing the state in which the table is round with one in which it is square gives an impossible situation in which there is a round square table. (To handle conjunction, Fine requires each set of states to have a mereological sum, so he is committed to inconsistent states like this.) Impossible worlds, too, may be inconsistent and incomplete. One live issue is thus whether truthmaker semantics is a notational variant of a kind of impossible worlds semantics, rather than an alternative to it. Ontologically, they seem on a par and, in this sense, truthmaker semantics can be seen as a form of impossible worlds semantics. However, it is probably more appropriate to view truthmaker semantics as a rival to standard impossible worlds accounts. Central to truthmaker semantics is the notion of exact truthmaking, whereby the state in question is wholly relevant to the sentence’s truth. Truthmaker semantics stakes its reputation on the utility of this notion, whereas standard impossible worlds semantics does not.

Fine’s approach is appealing with respect to the compositionally worry: it provides uniform clauses for the Boolean connectives at a state, irrespective of whether the state is consistent. But the same can be said of some impossible worlds semantics, e.g. the worlds semantics for First Degree Entailment (FDE), a simple four-valued, paraconsistent logic (Dunn 1976, Belnap 1977a-b) which has been provided with a worlds semantics including worlds where formulas can be both true and false, or neither true nor false. But whether uniform clauses can be given for all operators is unclear. In Fine’s 2012 semantics for counterfactuals, for instance, counterfactuals may be evaluated only with respect to possible worlds (which are, in effect, maximal possible states), with the consequence that embedded counterfactuals are not permitted. It is currently unclear whether evaluation of counterfactuals at impossible states would require non-uniform clauses.

Another compositionally-based worry concerns negation: are the negations of equivalent sentences themselves equivalent? This will not be the case in general within impossible worlds semantics. The situation with truthmaker semantics is not straightforward: it holds in some but not all systems (e.g. not in Fine and Jago 2019). Fine’s response is not to banish those weaker systems, but to prefer certain systems for certain purposes. That response is also open to friends of impossible worlds.

Undoubtedly, other objections to impossible worlds can and are likely to be raised. The current debate on impossible worlds appears to be at the same stage as the one on possible worlds was, some forty years ago. At that time, people struggled to make sense of the concept of a possible world. Many declared it meaningless. Nowadays, the variety of its applications has placed the notion firmly at the core of much philosophical and logical practice (see e.g., Divers 2002, Chapter 4). Impossible worlds may undergo the same fate, should they prove as useful as they appear to be in the treatment of impossibilities of various kinds.


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The authors would like to thank JC Beall, JC Bjerring, Berit Brogaard, Nicola Ciprotti, Ira Kiourti, Daniel Nolan, Graham Priest, Greg Restall, Achille Varzi, Heinrich Wansing, and three anonymous referees, for helpful comments, suggestions, and references.

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