Isaac Israeli

First published Mon Sep 10, 2007; substantive revision Wed May 9, 2018

Isaac ben Solomon Israeli (ca. 855–955 CE), not to be confused with Isaac Israeli the Younger (an astronomer of Spain, d. 1322 CE), served as physician to the founder of the Fatimid Dynasty in North Africa and wrote several philosophical and medical treatises in Arabic which were subsequently translated and widely read in Latin and Hebrew. Israeli was one of the earliest medieval Jewish Neoplatonist writers, though not as original in his thinking as later Jewish philosophers such as Solomon Ibn Gabirol (Avicebron), Moses Maimonides and Gersonides. His work reflected and encapsulated the prevailing philosophical paradigm, namely, Aristotelian thought read through a Neoplatonist lens. Israeli’s thought was largely influenced by the Arab philosopher al-Kindi (d. ca. 870 CE) and by available Neoplatonist sources, either The Theology of Aristotle or (by S. M. Stern’s hypothesis) a pseudepigraphic Neoplatonist treatise (no longer extant in the Arabic original) which was later translated into Hebrew by Abraham Ibn Hasday (d. 1240) and appended to the belles-lettrist work The Prince and the Ascetic. Although much of his work is paraphrase and commentary on these two sources, Israeli’s thought did include a few divergences from al-Kindi, such as the idea of the emanation of shadow, and a reversal of the process of intellection described in al-Kindi’s model. Israeli’s philosophical works were read by several later Jewish and Christian authors who occasionally quoted him, sometimes without attribution. His medical treatises were widely read and respected by physicians for centuries in Muslim and Christian domains.

1. Biography

We have only a few scant clues of his biography, and we cannot be sure of their veracity, especially in the issue of the date of his death. We know that he lived the first half of his life in Egypt, before moving to Karouan, Tunisia between the years of 905–907. Most biographers agree that he lived to the age of 100, though they disagree on the years of birth and death. Sacid al-Andalusi (mid-11th century), in his work Kitab Tabakat al-Umam, indicates that he died in 932 (R. Blachere 1935, p. 157). However, one of Israeli’s pupils, Ibn al-Jazzar died in 1009 at an approximate age of 80. If Israeli had died in 932, Ibn al-Jazzar would have been only five years old at his death, thus this date is unlikely. Abraham Ibn Hasday, a translator of Israeli’s works from Arabic into Hebrew, provides the date of his passing as 942. But Altmann and Stern (Isaac Israeli, p. xx) have pointed out that Ibn Hasday likely made a transcription error in his quotation of Sacid al-Andalusi. Another student of Israeli, Dunash Ibn Tamim, wrote a commentary on the Jewish mystical work Sefer Yetzirah in 956, and indicated therein that Israeli was no longer alive, though not mentioning the year of his death.

The Arab chroniclers of physicians indicate that Isaac Israeli served as a doctor to Ubayd Allah al-Mahdi, the founder of the Fatimid Dynasty of North Africa, who reigned from 910–934. In his capacity as physician, Israeli wrote several medical treatises which were widely regarded in the Islamic world, and highly valued in Christian scholastic circles as well. These works include the Book of Fevers, the Book of Foodstuffs and Drugs, and the Book of Urine. Later Islamic historians relate accounts that the first and third Fatimid rulers died from not following the sound advice of Isaac Israeli, though the absence of these anecdotes in the earlier chronicles, combined with their literary trope-like character, render the tales suspect. Nonetheless, these narratives do indicate the great respect accorded to Isaac Israeli.

Although the chronicler Ibn Abi Usaybi’a, as well as titles of some of Israeli’s work in manuscripts, assign Israeli the patronymic term Abu Yacqub (“father of Jacob”), the biographers state that he never married or fathered children, and attribute to him the statement that his books will cause his name to be remembered far better than children would. The assignment of patronymics to persons who did not marry and beget offspring is not altogether rare—thus we also see the patronymic “Abu Ayub” applied to the childless poet and philosopher Solomon Ibn Gabirol. As some of Israeli’s treatises have survived over a millennium and remain the occasional subject of scholarly research, his prediction is correct.

2. Isaac Israeli’s Philosophical Sources

Regrettably, in his surviving treatises, Israeli does not discuss his philosophical studies. We do know that by Isaac Israeli’s lifetime, several Greek books of philosophy translated into Arabic as well as original Arabic philosophical works were available, though perhaps some of these treatises, mostly produced in Baghdad and its environs, had not yet journeyed westward to North Africa. Much of Aristotle’s corpus had been translated in the previous century, as had Porphyry’s Isagoge, often studied as an introduction to Aristotle’s works. Further, an Arabic partial paraphrase of Plotinus’ Enneads circulated under the pseudepigraphic title The Theology of Aristotle in two recensions, the shorter of which is called the Vulgate Theology of Aristotle (due to its larger number of manuscripts) while the other recension is called the Longer Theology of Aristotle. There are both significant parallels and significant variances between Israeli’s writings and the Longer Theology of Aristotle. Thus, the influences of Aristotle and Plotinus on Israeli’s philosophy are strong, and he likely read translations of their works as well as commentaries on them.

S.M. Stern argues for the existence of a lost pseudepigraphic Arabic treatise which influenced the longer recension of The Theology of Aristotle and Isaac Israeli, and was quoted without proper attribution by both. Further, he argues that this same treatise is identical to a philosophical excursus which was appended to the literary tale The Tale of the Prince and the Ascetic (Hebrew: Sefer ben ha-melech veha-nazir) when Abraham Ibn Hasday translated the text from Arabic (Bilawhar wa-Yudasaf) into Hebrew in the thirteenth century. Although one may be tempted to conjecture that the Neoplatonist appendix is an original work by Ibn Hasday which largely paraphrases Israeli—a hypothesis strengthened by the fact that Ibn Hasday had translated Israeli’s Book of the Elements—Stern disproves this possibility by demonstrating that Israeli’s Book of Substances is largely a commentary on the metaphysics of Ibn Hasday’s treatise, and Israeli’s Book on Spirit and the Soul is an attempt to reconcile Ibn Hasday’s treatise with scriptural proof texts. Hence, according to Altmann and Stern, Israeli was strongly influenced by this treatise they call “Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist.” Further, we know that Israeli did not author this treatise, for when he quoted it, he cited “the philosopher,” thereby indicating that he thought he was quoting Aristotle.

More recently, Fritz Zimmerman has argued that Stern’s hypothesis of an otherwise unattested “Neoplatonist” as source for Israeli is superfluous. Israeli’s source may have been the Longer Theology of Aristotle, while Ibn Hasday’s source may simply have been Israeli, either synthesizing the view’s in Israeli’s extant treatises, or paraphrasing a lost treatise of Israeli’s. In the absence of further documentary evidence, neither Stern’s nor Zimmerman’s theory can be definitively ruled out.

Isaac Israeli’s passages on intellection, interpreted by Stern as a misreading of al-Kindi, actually mirrors a passage in John of Damascus’ (c. 676–c. 749) De Fide Orthodoxa, which was translated into Arabic in the tenth century (Wolfson, 1961: 279–280). While it is within the realm of possibility that Israeli read this translation, it is also possible that both authors are citing a previous source which is no longer extant.

A clear and strong influence of the Arab philosopher al-Kindi (d. 873) is evident in the work of Isaac Israeli. Like the former, he wrote a book of definitions, many of which are strongly similar to definitions in al-Kindi’s Fi Hudud al-ashya’ wa-rusumiha. Scholars Altmann and Stern illustrate the extensive similarities between the two books in their commentary on Israeli’s Book of Definitions in their study Isaac Israeli: A Neoplatonic Philosopher of the Early Tenth Century. Further, Israeli uses much of al-Kindi’s terminology for both astronomical and terrestrial objects. Nonetheless, it would be wrong to call the book a paraphrase of al-Kindi, as there are numerous divergences as well.

Though we see overlap with The Theology of Aristotle and al-Kindi, we do not have any evidence that Israeli read the works of his younger contemporary al-Farabi (ca. 870–ca. 950), nor do we see the influence of his younger coreligionist philosopher Saadya Gaon (882–942 C.E.).

3. Metaphysics

3.1 The Four Kinds of Inquiry

The four kinds of inquiry, introduced by Aristotle in his Posterior Analytics, and subsequently modified by Neoplatonist commentators, were such a universal and fundamental component of the cultural episteme, that elaboration of the four inquiries often formed part of the introduction to philosophical and medical treatises. Aristotle lists the four questions thusly:

“(1) whether the connexion of an attribute with a thing is a fact, (2) what is the reason of the connexion, (3) whether a thing exists, (4) what is the nature of the thing.” (Posterior Analytics ii.1, G.R.G. Mure translation)

Following the practice of thinkers of his age, at the very beginning of his Book of Definitions and also at the beginning of his Book on Fevers, Isaac Israeli introduces the Aristotelian distinction of the four kinds of inquiry, in a slightly modified form:

“(1) The first is existence: when one inquires whether so-and-so exists; (2) the second is quiddity: when one inquires what so-and-so is; (3) the third is quality: when one inquires how so-and-so is; (4) the fourth is ‘quarity’: when one inquires why so-and-so is.” (Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli, pp. 10–11)

Israeli’s description mirrors the list of al-Jahiz (d. ca. 869) in the Book of Indications and Considerations (Arabic: Kitab al-Dala’il wa’l-cItibar) as well as cAli ibn Sahl Rabban al-Tabari (fl. 9th century), in his medical text Firdaws al-Hikmah fi al-Tibb. His list varies slightly from that of al-Kindi, who in his treatise on metaphysics Al-Falsafah al-cula defines the third inquiry as which, rather than how.

3.2 The Four Causes

Just as medieval thinkers adopted Aristotle’s four inquiries, so too did they adopt his distinction of four types of causes (material, formal, efficient, and final) elaborated in Aristotle’s Metaphysics v.2 and other places. Although Israeli adopts the schema, he notes that within each of the four categories a cause can be either spiritual or corporeal. While a “spiritual material cause” might sound oxymoronic to our ears, in his Book of Definitions Israeli provides an example:

A case of a spiritual material cause is that of the genera which are divided into their species and are the substratum for their forms which complete their speciality, as for instance ‘living being’, which is the genus of man and horse and other species, and is the substratum for their forms which constitute their essence. (Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli, p. 24)

Just as spiritual material causes are the material substratum for genera, spiritual formal causes are substantial forms of genera. These genera “cause” those objects which partake of them to be as they are. Israeli’s example of a spiritual efficient cause is paradoxical:

A case of the spiritual efficient cause is the power of the sphere which was appointed by the Creator, may He be exalted, in nature, and ordained in it over the effects which take place in the corporeal microcosm… (Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli, p. 25)

The prevalent medieval conception of the sphere of the cosmos is that it is not a vacuum, but rather, crystalline and composed of a fifth element superior to the four elements of our terrestrial world. Hence, it would appear that the efficient spiritual cause could also be an efficient material cause. However, this difficulty is resolved if what Israeli meant here was an intelligence or soul governing the sphere. Although Israeli does not in any of his surviving writings and fragments mention a soul of the spheres, his pupil Dunash Ibn Tamim affirms it in his commentary on Sefer Yetzirah.

3.3 The Four Elements

Israeli adopts the Aristotelian doctrine of the four elements which compose all material objects: earth, air, fire and water. These elements are generated by the motion of the heavenly sphere, and they inhere in a material substratum—though Israeli does not elucidate its nature. Although Israeli does not explicitly state that the elements are made up of form and matter, Altmann and Stern (Isaac Israeli, p. 183) present a strong case for his acceptance of this idea. In his Mantua Text, also known as the Chapter on the Elements, he describes the generative order of the elements. The motion of the sphere of the world generated heat, and thus is fire brought into existence. As fire cooled, it became air, which, moving away from fire, cooled and moistened into water, and as water moved from air it cooled and dried and generated earth (Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli, pp. 120–121).

3.4 Substance, Form and Matter

Similar to most other Neoplatonists, Israeli accepted the Aristotelian definition of a substance as a something of which something is said or predicated—and not something which is said of something else. Within a substance, matter is the substratum for the form which determines its being as substance. Further matter can be either particular or general and universal, and if particular “it is the substratum for a special form which constitutes the essence of a particular species…” (Isaac Israeli, p. 86)

3.5 Theology

Although explication of the nature of God is absent in the surviving fragments of Israeli’s philosophical corpus, it is apparent that Israeli, like the Muslim philosopher al-Kindi before him, combined the Neoplatonist notion of God as the source of emanation of all things, with the idea common to the monotheistic religions, of a willful Creator who created the world in time. In blending these two conceptions, these philosophers rejected the Aristotelian conception of the eternity of the world, as well as the idea of eternal emanation of some of the Greek Neoplatonists. Israeli’s use of the Arabic term, al-Bari, “the Creator” reflects the religious sensitivities of his age—and is not simply a translation of Plotinus’ “The One”.

In Plotinus’ Enneads, the founding text of Neoplatonist philosophy, The One contains a will which is not separate from itself (Enneads, vi 8.21), and precedes the emanation of Nous (The Intellect/Intelligence) a secondary entity from which all lower beings emanate. In Arabic paraphrases of Plotinus, the Will or Word of God is a secondary hypostasis which creates Intellect (cAql). This model is also seen in later Jewish Neoplatonist philosophers Solomon Ibn Gabirol and Judah Halevi. However, Isaac Israeli, like Plotinus, does not treat the will of God as a separate hypostasis or secondary being.

One prominent feature in most variants of Neoplatonist thought is Negative Theology, the idea that one cannot predicate anything of God. The problems which this approach intended to avoid were two undesired implications arising from predication of a quality of God—namely, that if we attribute a particular quality to God, this quality exists co-extensively with God, and must hence be co-eternal; secondly, it introduces multiplicity to God. The Neoplatonists, in the main, wished to conceive of God as a simple and radical unity, preceding all multiplicity in the world, and as such, must precede the existence of qualities. Hence the only two allowable predications of God are God’s Unity and God’s Existence. In none of the surviving materials do we find Israeli expressing Negative Theology explicitly. Israeli’s pupil Dunash Ibn Tamim promotes negative theology in his commentary on the mystical work Sefer Yetzirah, which lead scholars Altmann and Stern (Isaac Israeli, pp. 157–8) to conclude that we can safely assume that Israeli held this opinion as well.

3.6 The Sequence of Emanation

Whereas for Plotinus, the second being in the emanative chain is Nous (Intellect), Israeli concurs with the model in “Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist”, that First Matter and First Form are the first and only “creations” of the Creator—that is, produced by an act of Will—and precede the Intellect. First Matter and First Form conjoin to form the First Intellect. After God creates First Matter and First Form, God’s active role in creation ceases and all subsequent beings emanate in a chain of hypostases from Intellect, downward to the three kinds of soul, and culminating in the material and corporeal Sphere/Nature. Further, Israeli adds a second Intellect which is a distinct hypostasis from First Intellect. First Intellect contains the totality of forms and knows itself intuitively with perfect unchanging knowledge. Second Intellect exists within the domain of Soul, and knows the actualization of particular things via temporal knowledge.

Soul is the next realm in the emanative sequence, and Israeli here replicates Aristotle’s threefold division. This universal soul is made up of the higher Rational Soul, the Animal Soul and the Vegetative/Nutritive Soul and from these emanates the superlunary sphere of heaven—the point where the material world emerges from Soul. Whereas most other Neoplatonists use the term “Nature” for the corporeal world, Israeli uses the term “the sphere.” The motions of the superlunary sphere of heaven, made up of a fifth unchanging element, govern the combinations and recombinations of the four elements in the material world below the moon—hence they govern the processes of generation and corruption. Israeli’s student Dunash Ibn Tamim calls this fourth soul the soul of the sphere.

3.7 Metaphors of Light and Shadow

In Neoplatonist philosophy the metaphor of light emitted from its source illustrates the process of emanation. The light spreads out from its source, but does not diminish its source. Similarly, the generation of emanated entities and hypostases in no way diminishes the source of each emanation. Israeli accounts for the increasing corporeality and particularity and imperfection of each emanated hypostasis by adding the idea of shadow or shade to emanation. Each emanated hypostasis has a lighter region closer to the source of its emanation, but it also contains regions of shade or shadow in areas further from their source. It is in these shaded regions that the emanation of the next sequential entity begins. Further, each emanated hypostasis receives light from its source but also shadow, which grows denser as the ontological distance from the source of emanation increases.

3.8 On Generation and Passing Away

As is standard within the intellectual milieu dominated by Aristotelian physics, Israeli opined that the generation and passing away of terrestrial objects was the result of recombination of elements and their attendant properties (heat, coldness, wetness and dryness), a process which is governed by the movement of the cosmic sphere. Later thinkers would, via astrology, attribute certain roles in this process to the “intelligences” governing individual celestial objects and their relative positions. The heavens, which are not composed of the four elements and hence not affected by their contrary qualities, are not subject to generation and degeneration. (Isaac Israeli [Book of Definitions], p. 48)

4. Psychology

4.1 Intellect and Intellection

In a few instances in his Book of Definitions, Israeli diverges from models given by his forerunner al-Kindi. Although Israeli posits a first intellect and a second intellect, Israeli describes three hypostases of intellect. First intellect, the entity which emerges from the conjunction of first matter and first form, contains all subsequent forms, which emanate from the first intellect and determine the specificality of all substances and knows all things eternally. The secondary hypostasis of intellect is actually in the rational soul, and is potential intellect before it passes into the actual intellect of the first intellect. The “second intellect” (actually the third hypostasis of intellect) is a faculty of the rational soul, which via sense perception and imagination (the “internal senses”) conveys information to the higher hypostasis in the rational soul. The second intellect of the rational soul unites with the objects of its intellection in a spiritual, non-corporeal sense and similarly, upon conveyance of the intellection to the higher intellect of the rational soul, the higher hypostasis of intellect within the rational soul also spiritually unites with the objects of its intellection. (Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli, pp. 36–7) Since Israeli here diverges from al-Kindi, Stern accuses Israeli of a clumsy misreading of the latter. (Isaac Israeli, p. 39) However, since Israeli’s description of internal senses largely mirrors the description in John of Damascus’ De Fide Orthodoxa, (Book II, Chapter 20) it is likely that Israeli derived his overall schema of intellection from another source. While Stern rejected the connection between the text of John of Damascus and Israeli (Isaac Israeli, p. 59), Harry Wolfson rejoined that De Fida Orthodoxa was available in Arabic translation in the tenth century (Wolfson, 1961, p. 279). Further, it is possible that Israeli was drew his conception from another lost source common to himself and John of Damascus, or from a lost Arabic commentator on the latter.

4.2 Soul, Spirit and Body

Isaac Israeli did not believe in the ensoulment of souls in bodies. The three souls, despite their role in the governance of the body, and the role of bodily sense perception in conveying information to the rational soul, remained outside the body. In his Book on Spirit and Soul, Israeli utilizes scriptural proof texts to argue that the rational soul is what entitles mankind to reward or punishment after death. But he writes tersely and vaguely on the subject of reward and punishment and does not explicitly clarify the relationship between the generic rational soul and rational souls of individuals. Presumably, we all have separate rational souls, otherwise the idea of reward and punishment of rational souls makes no sense. He notes that the perfect actions of man pass beyond the corporeal sphere while those actions to satisfy bodily appetites do not. Further, he affirms that the soul of the righteous will endure in the upper realm with the intellect. Although he has sidestepped the traditional Rabbinic Jewish conception of bodily resurrection of the righteous by stating that the world to come is the upper non-physical world, he does not spell out whether this dwelling entails reintegration of one’s rational soul with the intellect, or a separate yet proximate existence.

Israeli, like the physician Qusta Ibn Luqa (ca. 835–912), argued that in addition to its connection with souls, a living being has a vital spirit, which unlike souls, is contained within the body and dies with the body, and he employs scripture (Psalms 78: 39) to argue this point. Altmann and Stern show that Israeli’s text very closely parallels Ibn Luqa’s, hence either derived it directly from the former, or they both are quoting the same prior source. (Isaac Israeli, p. 50)

4.3 The Perfection of the Rational Soul

In addition to an emanative/generative order, a prominent feature of Neoplatonist philosophy is the idea that through withdrawal from bodily desires, and perfection of the intellect, one’s rational soul can attain unity with the higher world. The early Neoplatonists—those outside of the “revealed” monotheistic traditions of Islam, Judaism and Christianity—suggest that it is possible for the rational soul to achieve unity with The One/God. However, the Neoplatonists who were members of established monotheist religions do not think that one’s rational soul is capable of so high an ascent up the emanative chain, and advocation of such belief might have lead to prosecution for blasphemy or heresy. Nonetheless, Neoplatonists of religious traditions did think that the rational soul’s union with the realm of intellect was possible. Neoplatonists from Proclus onwards describe unification as a three-part process, which Altmann and Stern characterize as Purification—Illumination—Union. For Israeli, the Purification stage involves three activities: an ascetic rejection of bodily desires and pleasures, and the dominance of the two lower souls; a worship of God combined with ethical behavior towards one’s fellow men; and the study of philosophy to develop one’s rational soul. In the second stage, the soul is illuminated by truth. In the third stage, one’s rational soul becomes spiritual and divine, though not achieving full unity with the Creator.

4.4 Free Will and Negation of Akrasia

According to Israeli, a human being can act in a number of ways when faced with a specific situation. The reason for this ability is the capacity of discernment, and more specifically of cogitation and consideration. Due to these capacities people are able to acquire theoretical and practical knowledge and to differentiate between good and evil. Because animals do not possess intellectual capacities, they are limited to acting in a definite way in particular situations. However, the ability of humans to act in different ways is a consequence of humans’ position between pure intellect and beast. People use their cogitation and consideration to attain a higher level of knowledge. However, as long as humans use those capacities their knowledge will remain imperfect and they will continue to hesitate and be uncertain. When they are united with intellect they no longer are uncertain and act in the best possible way in all situations without any tension in their soul. According to Israeli, the certainty of truth cancels all kinds of bad temptations.

One may interpret Israeli here as saying that if a man has an imperfect knowledge that it is bad to eat unhealthy candies, his knowledge and his temptation for these candies are in struggle in his soul. His capacities of consideration and cogitation (אלפכר) have to decide between this imperfect knowledge and the temptation. Once this person attains perfect knowledge, he or she no longer wishes to eat the candies. S. Sadik argues that Israeli’s remarks constitute a Socratic negation of akrasia (Sadik 2013).

5. Philosophical Works, Manuscripts and Translations

All of the following works, except the Book on the Elements, have been translated by Alexander Altmann and S. M. Stern in their monograph Isaac Israeli: A Neoplatonic Philosopher of the Early Tenth Century. In the 1950s and 1960s these two scholars have also published transcriptions of the fragments and manuscripts of these works in a number of journals. In addition to publishing and translating known works of Isaac Israeli, Altmann and Stern firmly established the hypothesis suggested by Gershom Scholem that Isaac Israeli authored a work previously erroneously attributed to Aristotle: The Chapter on the Elements (Mantua Text). Further, in their extensive analyses of Israeli’s texts (in which they often compare Israeli’s text to parallel passages in al-Kindi and other authors), they established the surprising antiquity of the Neoplatonic treatise which Abraham Ibn Hasday (d. 1240) appended to his Hebrew translation of The Prince and the Ascetic. This work, which they dubbed “Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist” actually predated and influenced both Isaac Israeli and the Longer Recension of the Theology of Aristotle, and Stern’s article on “Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist” is an important component of any thorough study of the philosophy of Isaac Israeli.

5.1 The Book of Definitions

Originally written in Arabic, this work is extant in two Latin (Liber de Definicionibus/Definitionibus) and two Hebrew translations (Sefer ha-Gvulim), but only a fragment of the original Arabic (Kitab al-Hudud) survived. That this book was widely read by Christian scholastics is evidenced by Thomas Aquinas’ and Albertus Magnus’ misattribution of Avicenna’s definition of truth to Isaac’s Book of Definitions (see Altmann & Stern, Isaac Israeli, p. 59). This book is a collection of 57 definitions, the bulk of which are paraphrases and quotes (often without attribution) of various passages of al-Kindi. In some instances, he cites “the philosopher” who would be understood to mean Aristotle, but he is actually paraphrasing al-Kindi, who oftentimes purports to elucidate what Aristotle had written on a particular subject. Occasionally, his definitions derive from other possible sources such as Qusta ibn Luqa (a physician, mathematician, scientist and translator, lived 835–912 C.E.), Ammonius Hermiae of Alexandria (Fifth Century C.E.) and John Philoponus (490–ca. 570 C.E.). A few ideas expressed in this work are not attested in any other known sources. Yet, because of the book’s close adherence to al-Kindi, Stern hypothesizes that these deviations are often either quotation of definitions of al-Kindi which have been lost, or are misreadings of al-Kindi. One of the colophons at the end noted that the work is a “collection,” perhaps indicating that the material was not original, nor intended to be read as such. In another manuscript the colophon asserts that Isaac Israeli had written it, yet this same colophon contains spurious information—that Israeli was from Spain and that he had fathered children whom he hoped would study it (Altmann & Stern, Isaac Israeli, p. 78), hence its claim that the treatise is an entirely original work of Israeli’s must not be regarded as authoritative.

Both Latin versions were published by J.T. Muckle, “Issac Israeli, Liber de Definicionibus” in Archives d’histoire doctrinale et litteraire du moyen age, 1937–8. The longer version was translated by Gerard of Cremona (1114–1187), and appears in manuscripts (Paris B.N. 14,700; Paris B.N. 6443; Vatican Lat. 2186) as well as a printed edition Omnia opera Ysaac, from Lyons in 1515. M. Alonso speculated that the shorter version (MS Munich Lat. 8001) is a translation by Domingo Gundissalinus and predated the longer version (Alonso, 1947, pp. 295, 325) (See “Traducciones del arcediano Domingo Gundisalvo” in Al-Andalus, 1947, pp. 295, 325). Altmann and Stern challenge this hypothesis, arguing that the shorter version is an epitome of the longer version, improving the translation at points (Isaac Israeli, p. 5).

Nissim ben Solomon translated one of the Hebrew versions, and it can be found in its entirety in H. Hirschfeld, Festschrift zum 80. Geburtstag M. Steinschneiders, pp. 131–42. J.L. Teicher was of the opinion that the Hebrew version was translated from the Latin version (See “The Latin-Hebrew school of translators in Spain in the twelfth century,” in Homanaje a Millas-Vallicrosa, v.ii, pp. 416–22). Julius Guttman and Stern think that his primary source was the Arabic version (Stern and Altmann, Isaac Israeli, p. 6). The second Hebrew translation, whose translator is unknown, was published by Altmann in Journal of Semitic Studies, 1957, pp. 232–42.

The surviving Arabic fragment is written in Hebrew characters, but there are indications that the original text was written in Arabic script. The Arabic fragment can be found in the Cambridge Taylor-Schechter collection, document TS. 8 Ka.62 and has been published twice—by H. Hirschfeld in “The Arabic portion of the Cairo Genizah at Cambridge,” Jewish Quarterly Review xv (1902), pp. 689–93 and by Altmann in Journal of Semitic Studies, 1957, pp. 232–42. This work is accessible in English translation with commentary in Altmann and Stern’s Isaac Israeli, 9–78.

5.2 The Book of Substances

The Book of Substances (Arabic: Kitab al-Jawahir) is extant only in fragments of Judeo-Arabic (that is, Arabic written in Hebrew letters) in the Firkovitch Collection in St. Petersburg and in the British Museum. Stern established that both manuscripts were separately transliterated from an original text in Arabic characters—which is deducible from transcription errors arising from Arabic rather than Hebrew orthographic similarities, and that the transcription and transliteration errors in the two manuscripts do not match (Stern, “The Fragments of ‘The Book of Substances’”, pp.16–17). Stern pieced together the fragments, adding some missing materials from a passage in “Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist” and published them in the Journal of Jewish Studies, vii (1956), 13–29. The extant fragments largely paraphrase and add commentary to passages from the pseudo-Aristotelian “Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist.” Due to the close textual proximities between the two texts, Stern conjectured that in places where Israeli is quoting “the philosopher” he is likely quoting a lost passage of the Neoplatonist. These parallels allowed Stern to arrange the discontinuous fragments into an order mirroring its source treatise. Altmann and Stern subsequently published a translation of the fragments in Isaac Israeli, pp. 81–105.

5.3 The Book on Spirit and Soul

J.L. Teicher argues that Isaac Israeli is not the author of this work (Teicher, 1956 p. 424). However, since Israeli’s pupil Dunash Ibn Tamim quotes passages of it in his commentary on the mystical work Sefer Yetzirah, Teicher’s view is likely erroneous.

Two Hebrew translations (Sefer ha-Ruah v’ha-Nefesh) and a fragment of the Arabic original remain of this work. Altmann and Stern provide a critical English translation based on the Hebrew manuscripts (Munich Steinschneider’s Cat. no. 307, fols. 47ff; Cambridge Addler 1858 fols. 113v ff.) and A. Borisov’s publication of the Arabic fragment in Isaac Israeli, pp. 108–117.

This treatise, unlike the Book of Definitions and Book of Substances is a distinctly Jewish work of philosophy, as it combines doctrines of soul drawn from Ibn Hasday’s Neoplatonist with Jewish scriptural proof texts, supporting a Neoplatonist conception of soul as distinct from mortal spirit, combined with the Rabbinic Jewish belief in reward and punishment of souls.

5.4 The Chapter on the Elements

A single Hebrew translation (Shacar ha-Yesodot le-Aristo) is extant in manuscript Mantua 28c, folios 16r–18r. This unsigned work was initially regarded as an anonymous commentary on Aristotle. Altmann, developing a hypothesis first proposed by Gershom Scholem, argues that this text is the work of Isaac Israeli. Also called the Mantua Text, it is available in English translation by Altmann in two publications—Journal of Jewish Studies, vii (1956) pp. 31–57 and in Altmann and Stern’s Isaac Israeli, pp. 119–32.

5.5 Book of the Elements

Like most of his other philosophical works, Israeli’s Arabic original (Kitab al-Ustuqussat) is lost, and we are left with a Latin translation and two Hebrew versions. Gerard of Cremona’s Latin translation of this book was published in the work Omnia opera Ysaac, Lyons: 1515. One Hebrew version (Leiden, Warner MS No. 13) was rendered by Abraham ibn Hasday for David Qimhi. The other translation (Munich MS No. 43) is more eloquent, and likely an improvement on the earlier translation, leading Salomon Fried to conjecture that the famous Medieval translator Moses ibn Tibbon (flourished mid-13th century, Provence) prepared it (Fried, 1884, pp. 75–83).

6. Israeli’s Influence on Later Thinkers

In 956, Dunash Ibn Tamim, a pupil of Isaac Israeli, wrote an extensive commentary on the short recension of Sefer Yetzirah, a mystical work of cosmogony which attributes great importance to the letters of the Hebrew alphabet and their combinations in determining the structure of the universe. In this work he cites Israeli so extensively that in the nineteenth century, a few scholars misidentified the commentary as Israeli’s.

Isaac Israeli’s medical treatises were studied for several centuries both in the original Arabic and in Latin translation. In the eleventh century, Constantine Africanus, a professor at the prestigious Salerno school of medicine, translated some of Israeli’s works into Latin. Many medieval Arabic biographical chronicles of physicians list him and his works.

Israeli’s philosophical works exercised a considerable influence on Christian and Jewish thinkers, and a lesser degree of influence among Muslim intellectuals. In the twelfth century, following a major phase of the Christian reconquest of Spain, a group of scholars in Toledo transmitted many Arabic works of science and philosophy into Latin. One of the translators who migrated to this cultural center, Gerard of Cremona, rendered Israeli’s Book of Definitions and Book on the Elements into Latin. Israeli’s work was quoted and paraphrased by a number of Christian thinkers including Gundissalinus, Albertus Magnus, Thomas Aquinas, Vincent de Beauvais, Bonaventura, Roger Bacon and Nicholas of Cusa (See Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli, pp. xiii–xiv; Julius Guttmann, Die Scholastik des 13. Jahrhunderts in irhen Beziehungen zum Judentum und zur judische Literatur, pp. 55–60, 129–30,150 and 172; as well as Guttmann, Das Verhaltniss des Thomas von Aquino zum Judentum und zur judischen Literatur, pp. 55–60).

Isaac Israeli corresponded with Saadya ben Joseph al-Fayyumi (882–942) prior to the latter’s departure from Egypt. Saadya later became the head (Gaon) of the Talmudic Academy of Sura and one of the most influential figures in the medieval Judaism. Saadya Gaon was known for his Jewish legal rulings, his arrangement of the Jewish prayer book (Siddur), his translation of the Hebrew Bible into Arabic, his liturgical poetry and his philosophical work The Book of Beliefs and Opinions (Arabic: Kitab al-‘Amanat wal-‘Itikadat, Hebrew: Sefer emunot ve-decot). Altmann and Stern suggest that it is possible that Saadya Gaon’s concept of rational commandments was influenced by Israeli’s concept of “intellectual precepts” from his Book of Definitions. (Isaac Israeli, p. 217) However, it is also possible that Saadya Gaon’s conception may have been a product of the vibrant and somewhat ecumenical intellectual culture of Baghdad, in which a group of theologians known as the Muta‘zilites reconciled logic and science with Islamic theology, arguing for the rationality of God and His actions.

The great Jewish poet and Neoplatonist Solomon Ibn Gabirol (known in Latin as Avicebron and Avicebrol) likely read Isaac Israeli’s works as well as the widely-circulated encyclopedic Epistles of the Brethren of Purity (Arabic: Rasa’il Ikhwan as-Safa’). Solomon Ibn Gabirol was at times close to the latter in his models of emanation. He was also highly innovative—hence the influence of Isaac Israeli is difficult to gauge. Nonetheless, Israeli’s Book on Spirit and Soul was likely the only philosophical text which combined Neoplatonist cosmology and psychology with Biblical proof texts—a task which Ibn Gabirol accomplished so masterfully in his liturgical poem Keter Malkhut. It is probable that Ibn Gabirol’s idea of spiritual matter was influenced by Israeli.

Another of the Golden Age Hebrew poets of Spain, Moses Ibn Ezra (c. 1060–1139) quotes Isaac Israeli without attribution in his treatise The Book of the Garden, explaining the meaning of Metaphor and Literal Expression (Originally in Judeo-Arabic: Kitab al-Hadiqa fi Macna ‘l-Majaz wa’l-Haqiqa). Stern explores this matter in his article “Isaac Israeli and Moses ibn Ezra.” The poet and philosopher Joseph Ibn Tzaddiq of Cordoba (d. 1149) authored a work The Microcosm (the Judeo-Arabic original is lost, but the work survived in Hebrew translation as Ha-colam ha-Qatan) containing many ideas indebted to Israeli. Parallels between the two thinkers are illuminated in Altmann and Stern’s Isaac Israeli (pp. 30, 44, 73–74, 117).

Isaac Israeli’s philosophical influence on Muslim authors is slight at best. The only known quotation of Israeli’s philosophy in a Muslim work occurs in Ghayat al-Hakim, a book on magic, produced in eleventh-century Spain, translated into Latin and widely circulated in the West under the title Picatrix. Although there are passages which correspond directly to Israeli’s writings, the author does not cite him by name.

As Neoplatonist philosophy waned, in addition to the Galenic medical tradition of which Israeli was a part, the appreciable influence of Isaac Israeli diminished as well.


Primary Sources

  • Altmann, Alexander, 1957. “Isaac Israeli’s Book of Definitions: Some Fragments of a Second Hebrew Translation,” Journal of Semitic Studies, 2(3): 232–242.
  • Altmann, Alexander, 1956. “Isaac Israeli’s ‘Chapter on the Elements’ (MS Mantua),” Journal of Jewish Studies, 7 (1–2): 31–57.
  • Altmann, Alexander and S.M. Stern, 1958. Isaac Israeli: A Neoplatonic Philosopher of the Early Tenth Century, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fried, Salomon, 1884. Das Buch uber die Elemente, Leipzig: W. Drugulin.
  • Hirschfield, Hartwig, 1896. Festschrift zum 80. Geburtstag Moritz Steinschneiders., Leipzig: O. Harrassowitz, pp. 131–42.
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  • Altmann, Alexander, 1979. “Creation and Emanation in Isaac Israeli: A Reappraisal,” in Isadore Twersky (ed.), Studies in Medieval Jewish History and Literature, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, Vol. 1, pp. 1–15.
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  • Pessin, Sarah, 2003. “Jewish Neoplatonism: Being above Being and Divine Emanation in Solomon Ibn Gabirol and Isaac Israeli,” in Daniel Frank (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 91–110.
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  • –––, 1957. “Isaac Israeli and Moses Ibn Ezra,” Journal of Jewish Studies, 8 (1–2): 83–89.
  • Stitskin, Leon, 1965–66. “Isaac ben Solomon Israeli: Philosophy as Self-Knowledge,” Tradition, 7–8: 89–94.
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  • Zimmerman, Fritz, 1986. “The Origins of the So Called Theology of Aristotle,” in J. Kraye, C.B. Schmitt, and W. F. Ryan, Pseudo-Aristotle in the Middle Ages, London: Warburg Institute, pp. 110–240.

Other Internet Resources

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