Japanese Confucian Philosophy

First published Tue May 20, 2008; substantive revision Mon Oct 3, 2022

In Japan, Confucianism stands, along with Buddhism, as a major religio-philosophical teaching introduced from the larger Asian cultural arena at the dawn of civilization in Japanese history, roughly the mid-sixth century. Unlike Buddhism which ultimately hailed from India, Confucianism was first and foremost a distinctly Chinese teaching. It spread, however, from Han dynasty China, into Korea, and then later entered Japan via, for the most part, the Korean peninsula. In significant respects, then, Confucianism defines much of the East Asian identity of Japan, especially in relation to philosophical thought and practice.

While there is a religious dimension to Confucianism, its teachings – ethical, epistemological, metaphysical, political, and aesthetic – are typically understood in relation to the socio-political world of humanity, beginning with the individual and his/her pursuit of moral and intellectual perfection, the family and its pursuit of harmony and order, and the polity and its pursuit of peace and prosperity throughout all below heaven, i.e., the world at large. In this respect, Confucianism was the secular philosophy operative in the ordinary world of everyday existence, at one level or another, throughout Japanese history, well into modern times. As often as not, however, its teachings have become so thoroughly integrated into Japanese culture without being explicitly identified as “Confucian” that many have naively assumed them simply generic to the Japanese mind and its myriad expressions in history and culture.

Viewed as a religio-philosophical teaching, Confucianism brims with high-minded ideals that have always challenged humanity to realize the highest state of ethical perfection and self-realization. However, as a political doctrine appropriated by the ruling elite to provide a modicum of legitimization for coercive rule, Confucianism was often voiced in cynical if not self-serving ways, belying the very ideals to which little more than lip-service was otherwise given. However, from the beginnings of political unity in Japan as provided by the nascent imperial system and then later by various shogunal regimes, Confucian thinking informed the ethics and socio-political ideals of the polity, and not infrequently imperial names and reign names, thus defining the parameters of real world discourse about the governed, those governing, and the nature and purpose of government. In modern times, ever resilient Confucian notions have provided conceptual foundations for integrating much of western thinking about self, society, the family, and the polity, thus helping to mediate Japan’s advance, philosophically, toward a more global understanding of civilization and modernity.

Here, rather than trace the historical vicissitudes of Confucianism in Japanese culture, or explore the thinking of individual scholars, Confucianism will be approached as a systematic conceptual discourse defining the contours, philosophically, of much that was said and thought about the everyday world of common sense reality. In particular, the focus is on Confucian thinking about language, metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, the mind, political theory, education, spirituality, and the environment. In this way, the foundations of Confucianism as intellectual discourse are hopefully laid bare.

1. Prolegomenon: Names and Realities

“Confucianism” is a term used by westerners to refer to a diverse set of philosophical movements that have been variously known in Japanese as Jugaku (the learning of the scholars), Jukyō (the teachings of the scholars), seigaku (the learning of the sages), seirigaku (the learning of human nature and principle), rigaku (the learning related to principle), and shingaku (the learning of the mind). There was no single word in the traditional East Asian lexicon that corresponded exactly and consistently to “Confucianism,” yet by late-medieval and early-modern times, there was a fairly distinct understanding among Japanese intellectuals of an essential unity to the diverse Confucian teachings otherwise variously referred to. This is clear in references to the “three teachings”, Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism (and/or Shintō). One of many examples is Matsunaga Sekigo’s (1592–1657) Irinshō (Selected Writings on Ethics, 1640), which opens by stating, “Between heaven and earth, there are three major ways: the Confucian, which is the way of Confucius; the Buddhist, which is the way of Shakyamuni; and the Daoist, which is the way of Laozi.”

The most commonly used references to Confucianism in Japanese history, traditional and modern, are the terms Jugaku and Jukyō. In these, Ju is the Japanese reading of the Chinese word Ru, literally referring to “weaklings.” The latter was a reference to scholars who tended to work with their minds rather than their bodies and were, as a result, perceived as being weaker. The term was used by later scholars in explaining the teachings of Confucius (551–479 B.C.E.). Acceptance of the term partly reflected Confucius’ distaste for coercive force as opposed to the softer power of ethical examples and the allegedly irresistible efficacy of moral suasion.

In the west, the term “Confucianism” first came into use following contacts between Jesuit missionaries and Chinese scholars. The Jesuit term “Confucianism” is a Latinized version of the honorific reference to the great sage of China, Kong Fuzi. Minus the honorific fuzi, Confucius’ name was Kong Qiu. The relatively recent origins of the western term should not obscure the fact that there had long before developed, among East Asian intellectuals, an understanding of Confucianism expressed not through a root reference to the founder Confucius, but instead to those who followed his teachings, the Ju, or scholars.

Viewing Confucianism as “philosophy” began, in western studies, with the Jesuit anthology, Confucius Sinarum Philosophus (Confucius, China’s Philosopher), published in Paris in 1687 and dedicated to King Louis XIV. This work introduced Confucius’ thought with high praise and selected translations from the Great Learning, the Analects, and the Doctrine of the Mean. Originally published in Latin, Confucius Sinarum Philosophus was soon translated into French, German, and English. It influenced early admirers of Confucianism and Chinese philosophy, as it quickly came to be known, including Gottfried Leibniz (1646–1716) and Voltaire (1694–1778). The anthology was also known to those who later disparaged Confucianism, including G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831) who remarked that Confucius’ reputation would have been enhanced had his works never been translated. Regardless, Hegel never flatly denied that Confucian thinking merited consideration as “philosophy,” even though he did not regard it highly.

In this article, the term “Confucian” is used in reference to things (people, practices, discussions, texts, etc.) that derive from or relate directly to the Analects, as well as other works of ancient literature associated with the Analects and Confucius. The five classics of ancient China – including the Book of History, the Book of Changes, the Book of Poetry, the Book of Rites, and the Spring and Autumn Annals – are here considered as Confucian classics because they were, for the most part, thought to have been edited by Confucius. While modern scholars might well doubt that claim, most scholars in Chinese and East Asian history accepted the traditional accounts crediting Confucius’ editorship. The term “Neo-Confucian” refers to thinkers, ideas, texts, practices, and institutions that developed out of Confucian traditions as they were reinterpreted in the wake of Chinese and East Asian encounters with Buddhism. The term “Confucian” could equally apply to Neo-Confucians for simplicity’s sake, though differences between Confucian and Neo-Confucian teachings are sufficiently substantial to merit the distinction between the two groups.

Understood most comprehensively, the importance of Confucianism in Japanese history is undeniable: as in China and Korea, Confucian philosophizing in Japan came to define one major if not dominant layer of the early-modern and modern worldviews. Its lexicographic legacy is omnipresent in modern Japanese discourse, with Confucian terms playing new roles in discourses ranging from modern philosophy to science, religion, the humanities and the social sciences. One indication of the importance of Confucianism to Japan today is that the modern word for “university” (J: daigaku; C: Daxue) is taken from the title of the first of the four books of Neo-Confucianism, the Daxue (The Great Learning; J: Daigaku), a text that was understood as the gateway to learning for adults. This legacy, incidentally, is one that originated in Japan, with the founding of Tokyo Imperial University and a number of other imperial universities including Kyoto Imperial University, but soon spread throughout East Asia. The acceptance of this designation signaled the consensus among East Asian statesmen and intellectuals regarding the significance of Confucianism for the advanced educational values of the region as well as the multifaceted lexicon of Confucianism as the most apt for conceptualizing and ultimately translating modernity.

Hegel’s view that the history of philosophy encompassed Asian philosophy including Chinese philosophy, with Confucius as the prime representative of the latter, influenced the first definition of “Japanese philosophy” and “Japanese Confucian philosophy.” Between 1884 and 1890, Inoue Tetsujirō (1855–1944), studied in Heidelberg and Leipzig, focusing on German Idealism and Hegel. A decade after his return to Japan and appointment as the first Japanese professor of philosophy at Tokyo Imperial University, Inoue began publishing his monumental three-volume account of Japanese Confucian philosophy, the Philosophy of the Japanese School of Wang Yangming (Nihon Yōmeigakuha no tetsugaku, 1900), the Philosophy of the Japanese School of Ancient Learning (Nihon kogakuha no tetsugaku, 1902), and the Philosophy of the Japanese School of Zhu Xi (Nihon Shushigakuha no tetsugaku, 1905). Standing as Hegel’s antithesis, Inoue presented a detailed and fairly positive account of Japanese Confucian philosophy. In doing so, Inoue suggested that well before the introduction of western philosophy, Japan had developed a substantial philosophical tradition of its own, one that in terms of volume and diversity compared impressively with any national tradition of philosophy in the west.

Although overtly nationalistic and so not always cited in contemporary scholarship on the history of philosophy in Japan, Inoue’s trilogy remains the first extended statement of what Japanese philosophical thought consisted of. Its descriptions of Confucian thinking as philosophical in nature decisively impacted later East Asian estimations of Confucianism. Even as Inoue elevated Japanese Confucian thinking as philosophical, late-Qing China abandoned its civil service examination system which for over five centuries had tested one’s mastery of Confucian texts. That Chinese thinkers did later recognize value in Confucianism as the most compelling statement of traditional Chinese philosophy owed much, ironically enough, to Inoue’s earlier vision of the role of Japanese Confucianism in the philosophical development, prior to western contact, of Japan. It is no exaggeration to say that the study of Japanese Confucianism as philosophy began with Inoue’s trilogy.

Many western scholars distinguish Confucianism from Neo-Confucianism. As an interpretive category, Neo-Confucianism has a variety of nuances but most scholars who use the term do so in reference to forms of Confucian philosophizing that emerged in the wake of Buddhism. Many philosophical positions that Buddhism endorsed had not been well addressed by earlier Confucian philosophers. For example, Buddhists often affirmed that metaphysically all things are empty of self-substantial being. Along similar lines, Buddhists offered a psychology of introspection claiming that the reality constructed by ordinary experience is permeated with delusions arising from egocentrism and ignorance. As such, the reality of common sense is the realm of suffering. Early Confucians had not typically discussed metaphysics, apparently thinking that common sense assumptions about the reality of this world were not in question. As Buddhist estimations of reality gained a greater hearing, Confucians formulated a metaphysics affirming the reality of the world of ordinary experience, explaining the substantial nature of the world by way of the notion of ki, a term indicating the generative force that is the transformative stuff of all that exists in an unending process of becoming. In positing this metaphysics of ki along with various other ideas related to ethics, politics, spirituality, and humanity, Confucian scholars expanded upon the basics of early Confucian thinking so much so that many modern interpreters have referred to them as “Neo-Confucians.”

2. Origins and Varieties of Confucian Philosophy

Confucianism began with the teachings of Confucius, despite the fact that Confucius in no way saw himself as founding a school of philosophy. Arguably his foremost concern was to effect a restoration of the kind of socio-political order that had prevailed, at least in his mind, at the beginning of the Zhou dynasty (1027–256 B.C.E.). In search of a position of influence that would enable him to contribute to a return to such order, Confucius traveled from realm to realm within the Zhou kingdom, hoping that his ideas about how government and society ought to be aligned would find an enthusiastic patron. Although Confucius never succeeded in this, along the way a group of interested students came to associate themselves with him. For his followers Confucius appears to have emerged as much as a teacher as a political figure. While Confucius never wrote any independent treatises or dialogues that were meant to serve as systematic expressions of his personal ideas, over time reports about his discussions with his disciples came to be recorded and edited into a work most commonly translated as the Analects. Some scholars have long questioned the extent to which the Analects actually represents a true and consistent expression of Confucius’ thought. Nevertheless, the text has been accepted (perhaps naively) by sufficient numbers of followers over the centuries to make it, whether authentic or not, a work that must be read and understood by anyone hoping to develop more than a superficial appreciation of what have been received as Confucius’ teachings.

Confucius set in motion the project of philosophy as a search for and love of wisdom in ancient China. Shortly after his passing, around 500 B.C.E., a variety of philosophical teachings emerged, including those associated with Daoism, Mohism, and Legalism. So many were the philosophical positions that commentators of the time noted, with hyperbole, that a “hundred schools of thought” had appeared. Each of these new developments in classical philosophy, which interestingly enough appeared at about the same time as did the ideas of the ancient Greek philosophers, emerged at least in part as a pointed critique of the ideas associated with Confucius.

The most original philosophical notion attributed to Confucius was, first and foremost, that of humaneness (C: ren; J: jin). Though never so much clearly and concisely explained as it was discussed and explored, the Analects suggests that the practice of humaneness consists in not treating others in a way that one would not want to be treated. Not surprisingly, this notion has been characterized as the Confucian “golden rule,” and likened as well to Kant’s categorical imperative calling on people to act according to rules that they would be willing to deem universal laws. The Analects situates humaneness at the center of its moral philosophy, emphasizing it as the most universal ethical notion. Indicative of that quintessential nature, almost all thinkers in East Asian history who could in any way be considered “Confucian” had to address it in their own writings.

Equally significant in the Analects is the notion of the junzi (Japanese: kunshi), or the “prince.” The term literally refers to the “son of a ruler,” but the Analects emphasizes that anyone who cultivates himself to the extent that his virtue is worthy of a prince is indeed a “prince.” Conversely, it makes clear that those born to high standing who do not cultivate their virtue are not worthy of being deemed a prince. In effect, by developing this notion, the Analects was outlining an ethical perspective whereby even the highest levels of the socio-political hierarchy could be critically assessed.

Politically, the Analects suggests that rule by moral example is far more effective than rule by law and the threat of punishment. The latter might elicit compliance, but not a sense of moral conscience. Rule by virtue, on the other hand, not only brings forth compliance when the coercive power of the ruler is manifest, but also when it is not. Confucius also emphasized the primary importance of language and its correct use for rightly governing the realm. In one passage, Confucius suggests that making sure language and words are used correctly is the first step to good government (13/3). Without denying the importance of rule by law, Confucius rejected narrow-minded legalism. At one point, the Analects (13/18) even portrays Confucius as affirming that it would be right for a father to conceal the crimes of a son rather than turn him over to the authorities. The Analects hardly meant to endorse evasion so much as the responsibility of family members to take care of their kin.

The Analects is also well known for what it does not discuss: metaphysics and spiritual matters. In particular, Confucius is known for asking students who wanted to hear about spiritual matters why they were interested in such topics when they had yet to master the moral way of humanity. In another context, the Analects suggests that Confucius revered spirits, even while keeping his distance from them. These passages imply that Confucius was not so much uninterested in metaphysical issues as he was in what he considered to be more fundamental and practical moral teachings.

Confucius’ teachings were advanced by various disciples in the late-Zhou period, the most systematic being Mengzi (371–289 B.C.E.), known most commonly in the west by his Latinized name, Mencius. A text by the same name conveys Mencius’ most important elaborations of Confucian philosophy. Undoubtedly the most significant contribution Mencius made to Confucian thought was his unequivocal affirmation that human nature is, at birth, good. Confucius had observed that people are alike by birth, but differ in practice. However, it was not entirely clear how or in what sense people were actually alike. Mencius argued for the inborn goodness of humanity, noting how that goodness issued naturally from a mind endowed with the beginnings of humaneness, righteousness, propriety, and wisdom. Yet, Mencius also acknowledged that evil, all too evident in the world, resulted when people abandoned the beginnings of goodness they were born with. The project of Confucian learning as Mencius described it was to maintain this mind of goodness and recover it if lost. This Mencian view of the inherent goodness of human nature won out over the opposing view of his influential Confucian contemporary Xunzi. (See entry on “Xunzi,” Sect 2).

Politically, Mencius defined a more aggressive and confrontational approach than evident in the Analects. In one passage, Mencius suggests that when a ruler forsakes ethical behavior and engages in extreme misrule, he can and should be removed, even executed, without such amounting to regicide. According to Mencius, one who claims to be a ruler but in fact engages in extreme misrule forfeits any claims to being a true, legitimate ruler, and is nothing more than a common criminal who may rightly be executed for his crimes. In another instance, Mencius defines a more people-centered understanding of legitimacy, suggesting that crucial to acquiring legitimate rule is the ability to win the hearts-and-minds of the people. Without that, a ruler might never hope for success. Equally important was Mencius’ affirmation that legitimate government consists of ethical, humane government, or renzheng (J: jinsei).

Confucius was credited, according to traditional accounts, with editing the various classics of ancient Chinese writing that supposedly existed prior to his day. While there might be some truth to this attribution, the classics that were known to Chinese history have been shown to derive, as a matter of textual fact, from the early-Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.-220 C.E.). These classics, often referred to as six in number, only consisted of some five books by Han times: the Book of Changes (Yijing); the Book of History (Shujing); the Book of Poetry (Shijing); the Book of Rites (Liji); the Spring and Autumn Annals (Chunqiu). Whatever the truth of the matter, it was widely believed among later Confucians that the classics they studied had been in part edited by Confucius and so, in subtle ways, conveyed his understandings of history, literature, etiquette, and even change itself. In the Han dynasty, these texts came to be studied widely as part of the expanding “Confucian” curriculum. After a brief but brutal persecution of Confucian scholars and Confucian literature during the Qin dynasty (221–206 B.C.E.), Confucius began to emerge, during the Han dynasty, as the much exalted and revered sage-philosopher of China, and Confucians as a more distinctly identifiable group of scholars.

It was also in the Han that another philosophical system, that of Buddhism, entered China. Following the fall of the Han, Buddhism gradually expanded, often in association with the ruling power of non-Chinese elites. While a conspicuous presence during the Sui and most of the Tang dynasties, Buddhism eventually fell victim to imperial persecution at the highest level and widespread ethnocentric reactions issuing from an increasing consciousness of the foreign nature of the teachings. In tandem with the reaction against Buddhism and all of its philosophical claims, Confucian teachings were variously reasserted. In many cases, these reassertions of Confucianism were made along such distinctively novel lines that western scholars have referred to them as expressions of Neo-Confucian philosophy. The term does have its counterparts in East Asian discourse in the form of designations such as Songxue, “the learning of the Song dynasty,” xinglixue, “the learning of human nature and principle,” xinxue, “the learning of the mind,” and lixue, “the learning of principle.”

Undoubtedly the newest thing about Neo-Confucianism was its metaphysics: while Confucius and Mencius had apparently assumed the reality of the world, they had not felt obliged to explain that assumption theoretically, even in passing. In the wake of Buddhism’s sway during much of the Tang dynasty, Neo-Confucians of the Song and later dynasties explicitly accounted for the reality of the world by positing a generative substantial force, qi (: ki), capable of assuming a variety of forms: liquid, solid, and ethereal. This generative force was the Neo-Confucian response to Buddhist claims regarding the essential insubstantiality of the world. Providing a sort of intelligible order to the world of generative force was the Neo-Confucian conception of an essential rational principle (C: li; J: ri) inhering in all things. Together, rational principle and generative force constituted the basic ingredients of a variety of expressions of the Neo-Confucian affirmation of the reality of the world. Theorists often differed regarding the priority of one notion in relation to the other, or whether there was in fact any priority between them at all, but rarely was it the case that later Confucian forays into metaphysical speculation abandoned either of the two metaphysical ingredients entirely.

Another novel area of philosophical speculation was that related to spiritual forces. Confucius said little about them, other than that people’s proper concern should be how to live in the world of humanity. Yet following the Buddhist discourses on the afterlife, rebirth, and various heavens and hells, Neo-Confucians were compelled to articulate various understandings of the spirit world. One of the more commonly accepted positions defined ghosts and spirits (C: guishen; J: kishin) in terms of the spontaneous activities of yin and yang in the world. Without denying that there were spiritual forces, this account provided for a kind of naturalistic understanding of spiritual phenomena.

Neo-Confucians were not always so innovative. Virtually all affirmed the Mencian line that human nature was at birth good. Furthermore, most acknowledged that the mind is endowed with the four beginnings of this goodness as expressed in humaneness, righteousness, propriety, and wisdom. Supplementing Mencius’ claims, however, many Neo-Confucians added that human nature was rational principle, giving all of humanity a common bond with the rational structure of the world, and conversely giving the rational structure of reality common ground with the essential goodness that otherwise characterized humanity through human nature.

The interpenetration of the cosmos and the individual was pursued along several other lines as well, perhaps most notably in the new explanations of the ancient Confucian notion of humaneness in terms of forming one body with everything in the universe. This sort of mysticism, more characteristic of Daoism than classical Confucianism, was one of the more distinctive features of many expressions of Neo-Confucianism. Clearly the theoretical insights of the later Confucian scholars were not formulated simply to oppose Buddhism: not a few instances of Neo-Confucian philosophizing emerged as reformulations of appealing aspects of either Buddhism or Daoism. Such reformulations prompted many later critics of these innovative ideas to see in them offensive amounts of heterodox thinking that should have been given no harbor in Confucian thought.

One example of Neo-Confucians reformulating ideas and/or introspective practices from Buddhism took the form of the often practiced, albeit somewhat controversial, method of meditation known as jingzuo (Japanese: seiza), or “quiet-sitting.” With this practice, Neo-Confucians developed an alternative to the popular Chan (Zen) form of meditation known as zuochan (Japanese: zazen). The latter was meant to help the practitioner intuit the essential emptiness of the ego, also understood as intuiting their Buddha nature, as well as the emptiness or insubstantiality of all things. Neo-Confucians, however, emphasized that the introspective moments achieved during quiet-sitting would lead to a comprehensive enlightenment wherein the person realized clearly the essential goodness of their original nature as moral principle and its simultaneous identity with the principle informing all things in the universe. This understanding of the ethical unity of the self and world was the ground, as Neo-Confucians understood quiet-sitting, not for withdrawal or inactivity but instead for a dynamic engagement with the world.

3. Introduction of Confucianism into Japan: Early Developments

With the territorial and cultural expansion of the Han dynasty into what is today known as the Korean peninsula, the stage was set for the introduction of Confucian texts and teachings into Japan by way of the Korean kingdom of Paekche in the mid-6th century, along with Buddhism and the essentials of Chinese civilization. It must be noted that an ancient Japanese text, Records of Ancient Matters (Kojiki, 712), relates that earlier, Keun Ch’ogo, the ruler of the kingdom of Paekche, had sent an instructor named Wani, along with a copy of the Analects and another Chinese text, the Thousand Character Classic (Qianziwen; Japanese: Senjimon), to the ruler of Yamato around 400 C.E. Presumably the intent was that of educating the Yamato prince in Confucianism and the Chinese language. Controversy surrounds this account, however, making acceptance of it problematic. Still, if nothing more, Wani was a figure of considerable legendary and cultural significance who, according to traditional accounts, was the first scholar-teacher of the Analects to enter the Japanese islands.

By all accounts, Paekche served as an effective transmitter of Confucian texts and scholars in the mid-6th century. The most conspicuous new philosophical force conveyed by this transmission was that of Buddhism, especially as represented in art and architecture. Yet, alongside Buddhism came Confucianism, especially evident as a conceptually-defined philosophical system informing social, political, and economic relations and institutions.

An enduring early Confucian contribution to Japanese culture related to conceptions of historical time. In particular, it was in the wake of the introduction of Buddhism that the Japanese imperial court came to use nengō (C: nianhao), or “year-names,” as a means of counting the years within the reign of an emperor. This system had originated in China, during the Han dynasty, as emperors named the span of their rule to reflect the agenda and values they sought to embody. In 1912, with the founding of the Chinese republic, the practice ended in China, but it is followed even today as the standard means of counting years in Japan. Insofar as virtually every one of the nengō used in Japanese history as names for annual time has derived from Confucian texts, there can be little question that Japanese understandings of calendric time have been nuanced in accordance with Confucian philosophy.

Much the same can be said about the names associated with emperors. Though supposedly descended from an unbroken succession of Shintō deities tracing back to Izanagi and Izanami, progenitors of Amaterasu and Susanoo, Japanese emperors, mythic as well as historical, have taken names that were distinctly Confucian in character. This connection has remained throughout Japanese imperial history. In this respect, the Confucian nuances of imperial names in Japan reveal significant limits of Shintō as the sole foundation for all things imperial.

To an extent, ancient Japanese conceptions of space also reflected distinctly Confucian nuances. Yamato and Nippon were terms used to refer to the imperial realm that came to be known, in the West, as Japan, but when ancient Japanese spoke in the most universal terms, referring not just to their own socio-political realm but to the larger world, they often did so by use of the expression tenka (C: tianxia), or “all-below-heaven.” This term first appears in the ancient Confucian classical literature including in particular the Book of History and Book of Changes (Yijing).

Cosmologically, the ancient Japanese explained their origins, in part, in terms that were noticeably Confucian. Both the Records of Ancient Matters (Kojiki) and the Chronicles of Japan (Nihon shoki) open with cosmological narratives accounting for the origins of the world, Japan, and the Japanese people. One noteworthy ingredient in the narratives was that of the “five processes” (C: wuxing; J: gogyō): wood, fire, earth, metal, and water. These processes were in effect ontological forces that unfolded in progressive incremental combinations, giving in turn a particular metaphysical character to a time, place, or thing, as well as a discernible dynamic rhythm to change. Not surprisingly, the cosmology of the Kojiki and Nihon shoki reflects the eclectic outlook of Han Confucianism.

Textually, perhaps the most conspicuously Confucian-influenced writing of ancient Japan is the so-called “Seventeen-Article Constitution” (Jūshichijō kenpō) attributed to Prince Shōtoku (573–621). Although this document was not so much a constitution in the sense of a blueprint for government and political organization as a set of maxims meant to serve as standards for political society, it is clearly influenced by Confucianism throughout. The opening article states, “Harmony is to be valued,” alluding to the Analects (1/12). In most of the remaining articles, the Constitution advances a secular advocacy of Confucian social principles such as the importance of the natural hierarchy informing the political realm, as well as political virtues such as loyalty, obedience, ritual decorum, impartiality, diligence, trustworthiness, moderation, and public-mindedness. Though these could be easily dismissed as mere platitudes, their affirmation reflected the extent to which even at an early stage of political development Confucian notions were privileged at the very core of official discourse.

The political nomenclature that came to be used in ancient Japan, including the term, tennō, meaning “emperor,” also derived, at least in part, from a host of Confucian texts. To a large degree, Confucius and later Confucians were teachers who emphasized the importance of learning as both a source of pleasure and as a means for self-cultivation and even perfection in the form of sagehood. Given the political orientation of Confucianism, it should come as no surprise that study and learning came to be considered the prerequisites for properly governing the realm and bringing peace to the world.

Important political policies of ancient Japan also derived from Confucian philosophical teachings. The handen system of equal land distribution in Japan was an outgrowth of the Mencius’ account (3 A/3) of “humane government.” Mencius explained that people cannot be expected to be good law-abiding members of society if they do not have the basic material needs of life including food, clothing, and shelter. To ensure that people have these, Mencius advocated the “well-field” (C: jingtian) system of land distribution, allotting an equal share for all families. According to Mencius, humane government begins with this system of land distribution. Although promulgated in the wake of the Taika reforms of the seventh century, this idealistic approach to land distribution was incrementally compromised by special allowances of semi-permanent land holdings for Buddhist temples, Shintō shrines, aristocrats, and samurai rulers. Still, the very attempt at its implementation reflected the extent to which the ancient Japanese initially sought to realize egalitarian Confucian thinking about landholding as a means of establishing the ethical foundations of political society.

Another noteworthy institution was the daigakuryō, or the imperial academy, established for the education of imperial princes and aristocrats who were likely to be involved in government service. Ancient Japan never followed the Chinese practice of selecting bureaucrats by way of civil service exams based on Confucian learning and its practical applications. Yet, in sponsoring the daigakuryō and a variety of provincial schools modeled on the blueprint articulated in the Confucian Book of Rites, ancient Japan established an elite educational system centered largely around the study of Confucian texts and the socio-political values advanced in them.

Following the Genpei War (1180–1185), a samurai regime was established in Kamakura. Religiously and philosophically, the Kamakura regime was far more eager to advance the development of Rinzai Zen Buddhism, for example, rather than the teachings of Confucius. While the latter had spread significantly during the peaceful years of aristocratic imperial rule, they suffered for centuries during the medieval period when warrior regimes preferred the arts of war as a means to power over the Confucian foundations of moral virtue and ritual refinement. The upheaval of the medieval period thus witnessed a relative eclipse of Confucianism as it came to be enveloped, at best, in a new syncretic cultural order, typically dominated by either one form of Buddhism or another as they responded to the social and personal suffering of the times.

Confucianism and Buddhism were, however, always closely interrelated throughout Japanese history. The introduction of Confucianism, for example, came alongside of the introduction of Buddhism. Later the Neo-Confucian teachings of various Song philosophers including the Cheng brothers, Zhu Xi, and Lu Xiangshan, were introduced to Japan beginning in the thirteenth century, by Zen monks who had traveled to China for advanced study of Chan teachings there. For centuries, the teachings of the Song philosophers remained subjects of study largely within the confines of Zen monasteries, attaining no independent existence or philosophical integrity apart from Zen. This should hardly be surprising, given that Neo-Confucian philosophers such as Zhu Xi had themselves come to develop their Confucian thinking after earlier study and practice of Chan Buddhism. While Zhu Xi came to criticize Buddhism, other Neo-Confucians did not see Buddhism as necessarily antithetical to Confucianism or Neo-Confucianism. Ultimately, however, many Neo-Confucians did come to be more distinctive and unrelenting critics of Buddhism than tolerant competitors.

Some of the first indications of an effort to establish Neo-Confucian learning as an independent branch of study and practice can be seen in the reigns of Emperor Hanazono (r. 1308–1318) and Godaigo (r. 1318–1339). Godaigo’s ill-fated Kenmu Restoration, an attempt at restoring full political power to the imperial line, was grounded in part in his understanding of imperial authority as defined by Neo-Confucian texts. This complemented efforts by Watarai Shintō theorists like Kitabatake Chikafusa who, at about the same time, were trying to shore up Shintō arguments for imperial authority. Also, during the Ashikaga period, some Rinzai Zen monks returned from study in China advocating forms of Neo-Confucian learning for their shoguns. And in the early 15th century, the Ashikaga shogunate established the Ashikaga Academy where supposedly several thousand students of Neo-Confucian teachings studied. Yet still, the students were Zen monks.

If the inclusion of Confucian icons within samurai architecture can be construed as evidence of the philosophical comeback of Confucianism, Oda Nobunaga’s (1534–1582) Azuchi Castle, featuring paintings of Confucius and a host of Confucian sage figures, is surely worthy of mention. The ultimate standing accorded Confucianism in Azuchi Castle suggests that Nobunaga’s thinking was moving away from battlefield strategies and toward the task of governing the realm and providing for peace and order throughout, especially as he understood Buddhist institutions to be a threat rather than aid to his plans for political control.

4. Early-Modern Confucianism: Major Philosophical Themes

Japanese developments of Confucian philosophy are often discussed in relation to the Tokugawa period (1600–1868), with scant mention of what came before, other than to say that Confucian thought had been submerged earlier in an eclecticism dominated by Zen monks. Tokugawa Confucianism is typically described by recitation of a succession of names and schools. Much of this approach to the philosophical history of Japanese Confucianism derives from interpretations advanced by Inoue Tetsujirō (1855–1944), professor at Tōkyō Imperial University, in his monumental trilogy dating from the late 19th and early 20th centuries. Inoue is noteworthy for having viewed Japanese Confucianism as “philosophy” (tetsugaku), and for affirming that Confucian scholars had set forth substantial and diverse philosophical perspectives in Japan well in advance of the introduction of Western philosophy.

Vaguely following Hegelian notions of thesis, antithesis, and synthesis, Inoue described the unfolding of Japanese philosophy by explaining the dialectical relationships of three major philosophical schools: the Zhu Xi School, the Wang Yangming School, and the School of Ancient Learning. Ever since Inoue, Japanese Confucianism has been most typically explained in terms of these three schools, as represented by a succession of philosophers associated with each, including Zhu Xi philosophers such as Fujiwara Seika (1561–1617), Hayashi Razan (1583–1657), Yamazaki Ansai (1619–1682); Wang Yangming philosophers such as Nakae Tōju (1608–1648) and Kumazawa Banzan (1619–1691); and so–called Ancient Learning philosophers such as Yamaga Sokō (1622–1685), Itō Jinsai (1627–1705), and Ogyū Sorai (1666–1728).

Rather than recite this interpretive schema, which in many respects, despite its trilogistic appeal, simply does not accurately represent developments of Japanese Confucianism, this essay will offer an alternative approach. Here, Confucian philosophy is explained as a discourse comprised of major concepts addressed by virtually all who would be called Confucian philosophers. Quite typically, Japanese Confucians articulated their philosophical visions by defining terms that were at the core of their systems. While accounts of the meanings of words varied widely, an easily discernible discourse developed.

Overall, Japanese Confucianism from the seventeenth through the early-nineteenth centuries reasserts the integrity of language, meaning, and discursive truth. This reassertion was made in opposition to the Buddhist view of language which was, despite myriad sutras in the Tripitaka, or the Buddhist canon, rather negative. Or at least this was how many early-modern Japanese Confucians understood it. According to these Confucian critics, the Buddhists held that ordinary language lacked ultimate meaning and the ability to convey absolute truth. Rather than packed with significant meaning, Buddhists insisted that words were to be viewed as inherently empty. If wrongly understood as conveyors of substantial meaning, they became the source of profound error. Perhaps the unifying feature of Confucian philosophizing in the early modern period was the view that words were crucially important as vehicles for substantial meaning. Moreover, words and their correct usage were deemed by Confucians as absolutely essential to self-understanding, self-cultivation, and at the grandest level, to governing the realm and bringing peace and prosperity to the world. In this regard, Japanese Confucian philosophy can be viewed as an East Asian philosophy of language engaged in a search for right meaning. This “right meaning” was considered fundamental to any attempt to resolve philosophical problems.

Insofar as the ultimate achievement of Japanese Confucian philosophizing amounted to a relative turn away from nominalist Buddhist claims about the semantic emptiness of words and the merely conventional nature of meaning and truth, it set the philosophical stage in profound ways for the conceptual assimilation of Western philosophical learning during the Meiji period (1868–1912). Because it was, when viewed comprehensively, a conceptual movement of enormous consequence relative the development of modern philosophy in Japan, the period from the seventeenth through the early-nineteenth centuries is referred to here as “early modern,” emphasizing its role in establishing the foundations of modernity, rather than in terms of the more traditional terminology of historical periodization where the “Tokugawa” or “Edo” period is often associated with either “late medieval” or “feudalistic” developments. Apart from the contributions of Confucian philosophy to early-modern understandings of language, meaning, and discursive truth, Confucian philosophizing in Japan during this period was simply not always related to or an expression of the interests of the Tokugawa shoguns, nor did it always issue from the shogun’s capital, Edo. Thus, the terms “Tokugawa” and “Edo” as historical categories do not satisfactorily convey the generally progressive proto-modern thrust of Confucian philosophizing as a whole during this period.

Additionally, Japanese Confucian philosophy emerged in no small part in opposition to the western religion of Christianity and all that was associated with it, including the threat of possible domination. While this was true throughout the Tokugawa period and in the Meiji as well, it is nowhere more conspicuous than in an early Tokugawa work, Ethics (Irinshō) by Matsunaga Sekigo. Writing shortly after the brutal defeat of the Christian-nuanced Shimabara Rebellion of 1637–38, Sekigo used words rather than swords to combat what he viewed as the dangerous foreign heterodoxy might mean ruin to the Japanese polity. Unlike the earlier debates against the Christians carried out by the Buddhists on strictly metaphysical grounds Seikigo aimed to demonstrate the superiority of Confucianism as a philosophy that was universal, in his view, and yet distinctively East Asian and Japanese in its cultural roots. Arguably, later affirmations of Confucianism were meant to do much the same, even long after the effective threat of the spread of Christianity had been stopped by government policies such as Buddhist temple registration. Somewhat similarly, in the late Meiji, Inoue Tetsujirō defined Japanese Confucianism as Japan’s first philosophy, yet he also stood as one of the most outspoken and vehement critics of Christianity as a system of thought that was inherently mistaken and completely inappropriate for Japanese. Throughout much of its history, Japanese Confucianism has therefore implicitly if not explicitly opposed Christianity on philosophical grounds.

4.1 Language

As various forms of Buddhism dominated the medieval period of Japanese philosophical history, so did Buddhist estimations of words and meaning come to inform the minds of many of the philosophically inclined. While some aspects of Rinzai Zen esteemed components of traditional Chinese arts and letters, the more central spiritual praxis was more renowned for its their anti-intellectualism. This latter stance was well expressed in the use of kōan, or paradoxical exchanges meant to facilitate realization of Buddha-nature. The gist of the Zen teachings was that words, at best, are mere conventions useful for everyday communication. The transitory, insubstantial way of things (suchness or emptiness) cannot be adequately captured by the fixed meanings of conventional language. When transmitted from teacher to disciple, the highest level of truth could only be conveyed in a mind-to-mind transmission, one that typically eluded simple discursive language.

Generally speaking, the Neo-Confucian position of early-modern Japan was defined in opposition to assertions of the semantic emptiness or radical nominalism so often advanced by Buddhists. While the Neo-Confucian affirmation that words convey significant meaning might seem commonplace, it was hardly so at the juncture of Japan’s medieval and early modern history. Indeed, the rise of Neo-Confucian discourse in the Tokugawa should be understood as a reassertion of the meaningfulness of language and its ultimate value in relation to any understandings of truth.

An early expression of the Neo-Confucian belief in the ultimate value of language and meaning was made by Hayashi Razan in the preface to his colloquial rendition of Chen Beixi’s (1159–1223) The Meanings of Neo-Confucian Terms (Xingli ziyi). Incidentally, the latter text can easily be interpreted as a sustained reaffirmation of the correct meanings of terms in the wake of an age of semantic skepticism, and as a defense of Confucian realism over rampant Buddhist nominalism. That Razan devoted much of his final years to authoring a lengthy colloquial explication of Beixi’s Ziyi speaks volumes about his view of the importance of language. In his preface, Razan explained the crucial nature of language by reasoning that “the minds of the sages and worthies are manifest in their words, and their words are found in their writings. Unless we understand the meanings of their words, how can we comprehend the minds of the sages and worthies?” Elsewhere Razan emphasized that people could never realize the minds of the sages and worthies in themselves unless they first understood the remarks of the sages and worthies as recorded in the words of texts communicating them.

Razan even suggested that thorough immersion in the words of the sages was the best way to achieve a kind of comprehensive, mystic enlightenment experience. Thus when asked about the methods involved in the study of words, Razan explained,

Read them horizontally! Read them vertically! Read them from the left and from the right! Comprehend their source! Analyze them and synthesize them until you thoroughly penetrate them from beginning to end. Ultimately you will understand that everything in the sages’ writings culminates in a unified grasp of principle. When you realize a mystical unity with the sages’ writings, one in which the self and those texts are non-dual, you will have read them well! How could that be true only of the Six Classics? The same method holds for reading other classics!

Razan was hardly alone in emphasizing the semantic integrity of words. Itō Jinsai’s most comprehensive philosophical text, the Gomō jigi (The Meaning of Words in the Analects and Mencius), articulates both a defense of the meaningfulness of words, and in-depth, systematic analyses of the meanings of some two dozen high-level philosophical terms. In his preface to the Gomō jigi, Jinsai explained his pedagogical approach in terms of the study of language and meaning. There he stated,

I teach students to scrutinize the Analects and Mencius thoroughly so that they will discern the lineage and semantic importance of the sagely Confucian concepts. When so trained, students recognize the true lineage of [philosophical] notions and fathom their meanings without error. Too few scholars study such philological matters as they relate to the study of meaning, despite the fact that a single misinterpretation can lead to errors that are hardly trivial. Detailed philological studies of the Analects and Mencius facilitate understanding of those sagely texts and keep students from erratically manipulating them by imposing their subjective thoughts on them.

Jinsai’s emphasis on semantic etymology and philological instruction was meant to offset Buddhist training and presuppositions: he wanted his students to recognize the difference between Buddhist terms with their various nuances and those of Confucianism. In particular Jinsai was offended to see so many seemingly Buddhist terms in Neo-Confucian discourse. In an attempt to rid such terms from Neo-Confucianism, Jinsai took great pains to document the heterodox lineages of words so that they could be eliminated from Neo-Confucian writings.

Brief introductory essays defending the ability of language to refer to reality are relatively common in early-modern Neo-Confucianism. Ogyū Sorai’s (1666–1728) Benmei (Distinguishing Names), presents an even more in-depth analysis of philosophical terminology than Jinsai’s Gomō jigi. In the preface to his Benmei, Sorai highlighted the political edge intrinsic to language and meaning, at least as understood by many Confucians and Neo-Confucians alike. After allowing that some words are coined by commoners, Sorai emphasized that the more abstract and philosophical terms are the very ones articulated by sages for the sake of instructing people in the foundations of civilized life. Sorai then added that because these terms convey such powerful teachings, princes are cautious in using them.

Sorai next alludes to a passage from the Analects (13/3) which relates that Confucius had said that if given charge of the government of a state, his first priority would be correcting the meanings and usages of words. When asked the reason for this, Confucius replied in effect that socially and politically, all else depends upon correct usage of language. Without that, there would be no limits to which people might go. Sorai proceeds to sketch his understanding of the problems related to philosophical meaning in his day, adding that his intent in authoring the Benmei was to understand the right relationships between words and things so that the minds of the sages could be fathomed.

In essence, Sorai believed that by rightly defining words he was providing the foundations for the integrity of a rightly governed social and political order. Ultimately, then, Confucians and Neo-Confucians in their repeated reaffirmations of the importance of language and meaning were not simply indulging in philological exercises or arcane semantic research. Instead, they were engaged in an effort to recover the way (C: dao/J: michi) for the sake of establishing a means to sagely truth, and a ground for a righteous political order.

Many other examples of the Confucian reassertion of meaning in the early-modern period could be given. Suffice it to say that the concern for language so evident in Confucian writings reflected both a profound turn away from what they considered to be the empty talk of Buddhists, especially Zen Buddhists, and toward a concern for defining the conceptual bases for a well-ordered society. The need to defend the integrity of language gradually subsided as Japanese thinkers increasingly recognized the importance of words and meaning for philosophical analysis. This reinforced an emphasis on linguistic truth and meaning as a means for providing political order, an emphasis that continued well into the modern period.

4.2 Metaphysics

An important Neo-Confucian contribution to the philosophical consciousness of early-modern Japan was its metaphysical account of the world of ordinary experience as fully real. Early in the Tokugawa period, Hayashi Razan was among the leaders of those Japanese theorists who reiterated, with some distinctive variations, the metaphysical accounts synthesized by Zhu Xi during late-Song China. Essentially, this metaphysics explained reality in terms of two components, ri (“principle” or “pattern”) and ki (“generative force”). Ri referred to the rational and moral order of things generally, as well as that of each and every thing in terms of their particulars. In Razan’s view, there is a ri for each aspect of existence, making all particulars what they are in actuality. At the same time, there is an essential universal element in ri that defined a larger realm of commonality in terms of what things can potentially be. Thus, for example, the human nature that defines all people as people is referred to as ri, indicating that the rational order integral to humanity is shared in common. But more importantly, there is a normative, moral side of ri which makes it as much an ethical aspect of existence as it is a rational one. In the case of humanity, as well as virtually all of the ten-thousand things of the cosmos, ri is defined as morally good. This affirmation means, in the case of humanity, that human nature is good. Viewed in the perspective of all things existing between heaven and earth, the goodness of ri means that the world as such is also ethically good by nature and in terms of what it is to become as well. No doubt evil enters in, but that is not the original state, nor should it be the ultimate fate of things.

The other component of reality, that of ki, accounts for the substantial, creative reality of all that exists in the world. Ki is the vital, transformative stuff of all that exists, including things that are solid, liquid, and gaseous. This ki is described variously in terms of its clarity or turbidity, but invariably things that exist have it as their substantial being. Simply put, nothing exists without ki. In certain respects, Neo-Confucian philosophers such as Zhu Xi and Razan affirmed that ki was the stuff of reality in order to counter the Buddhist claim that all things are insubstantial or empty. While admitting that things are not always as they might seem, Neo-Confucians typically affirmed that there was a substantial basis even behind the illusory and ephemeral.

Generally speaking, Razan and other Neo-Confucian philosophers who affirmed the duality of ri and ki added that it was impossible for there to be ri without ki, or ki without ri. In reality, the two were absolutely inseparable. Yet there were moments of equivocation, especially while analyzing the two notions, when Razan, following a long line of Neo-Confucian philosophers including Zhu Xi himself, emphasized the priority of ri over ki. No sooner was this broached, however, than it was also denied, with the appended insistence that one could not exist without the other. Nevertheless, later critics of the more standard Neo-Confucian line rarely bypassed the opportunity to criticize at length those who privileged ri over ki.

Itō Jinsai was one such critic. It would be easy to conclude that since Jinsai differed with orthodox Neo-Confucians such as Zhu Xi and their Japanese exponents, including Razan and others, that he was not a Neo-Confucian himself. There can be no doubt that Jinsai was not an orthodox, Zhu-Xi style Neo-Confucian. But then being a Neo-Confucian did not necessarily mean that one had to agree with Zhu Xi on all counts. Indeed Neo-Confucians often criticized one another to no end, but nonetheless remained Neo-Confucians. Doubt, questioning, and rigorous critique were at the heart of Neo-Confucianism as a philosophical movement. Jinsai’s inclusion of a metaphysics of ki and ri, along with his critical disagreement with Zhu Xi over their relative priority, arguably made him an exemplary Neo-Confucian. Certainly, there was scant ground for such a systematic metaphysics as Jinsai affirmed in any of the ancient texts, especially the Analects and Mencius, that he otherwise identified with. In this respect, the common characterization of Jinsai as an “ancient learning” (kogaku) philosopher who simply rejected Neo-Confucianism is misleading.

Rather than a dualism of generative force and principle, Jinsai affirmed an ostensible monism of ki, one which held that nothing existed other than ki. Yet Jinsai did not deny that there is ri in the world: rather, he simply subordinated it to ki, suggesting that while only ki exists, ri dwells within ki. Apart from its embedded nature within ki, ri has neither priority nor independent ontological status of any sort. It is wholly enveloped within ki. In making these claims, Jinsai was in effect rebalancing the more orthodox but often ambiguous Neo-Confucian metaphysics, away from its more standard equivocation hesitantly favoring some sort of prior status for ri by insisting in a more thoroughgoing manner a monism of generative force.

A corollary of Jinsai’s outspoken subordination of principle within generative force was his denial of the relatively orthodox Neo-Confucian claim that human nature is united in morally good ri. Rather than a universalistic affirmation of the goodness of human nature, Jinsai emphasizes the diversity of human nature as a person’s inborn disposition, ranging from good to bad. Needless to say, Jinsai saw the Cheng-Zhu claim that human nature is principle, or ri, as profoundly mistaken. After all, in Jinsai’s view, ri, which as a written word depicts the veins in a piece of jade, was a “dead word,” i.e., one that refers to an inanimate order not typically associated with the vitality of the human world. In contrast to ri, Jinsai extolled michi, or the way, as a “living word,” i.e., one which symbolized the dynamism of human activity.

Jinsai and Sorai both criticized the Neo-Confucian metaphysical notion of principle, stating that rather than a word with ancient, and therefore legitimate, Confucian origins, ri was a term that had derived in part from Daoist and Buddhist discourse and so was often wrongly construed in Neo-Confucian discussions out of ignorance of, or disregard for, the sanctity of the original teachings of Confucianism. Jinsai’s standard on this count was supposedly the lexicon of the Analects and Mencius, while Sorai’s was the more ancient Six Classics. Despite their disagreements on the level of antiquity that should be considered as the source of legitimate philosophical discourse, both agreed that principle was a problematic part of it and so should not be naively highlighted in metaphysical discussions.

Jinsai and Sorai’s critiques notwithstanding, the metaphysics of ri and ki came to enjoy a degree of philosophical domination in the remainder of the early modern period, especially among orthodox Neo-Confucians. Although often modified in one respect or another, the dualism of substantial, energetic generative force and rational, ethical order seemed like a compelling and sufficient account for the diversity of experience. Not surprisingly, both ri and ki were appropriated in any number of neologisms of the Meiji period to refer to terms from western philosophy and the sciences as they were translated into Japanese. One example is the word “logic,” or ronri in Japanese. The word ronri, when considered not as a unified word but as two words that can be read apart, indicates “discussions (ron) of principle (ri),” a typically Neo-Confucian activity. Although there were Huayan Buddhist usages of these terms, when the modern lexicon of theoretical discourse crystalized in the Meiji period, it was the Neo-Confucian usages that were then most relevant to the new terms coined such as ronri.

4.3 Doubt and the Critical Spirit

One of the more distinctive features of the various expressions of Neo-Confucian philosophy in early-modern Japan was their shared emphasis on the importance of doubt in learning. Chinese philosophers from the Song dynasty, from Zhang Zai (1020–1077) through Zhu Xi, emphasized the need for doubt and skepticism in relation to achieving any real progress in philosophical learning. In Japan, doubt came to have notable advocates, first with Hayashi Razan, one of the earliest and most consistent advocates of Neo-Confucianism, and later with Kaibara Ekken (1630–1714), to the end a professed Neo-Confucian, but one who advanced one of the most systematic expressions of philosophical doubt in the early-modern period. With Razan and Ekken, skepticism was never an end in itself, but rather a significant waypoint on the way toward coming to more solid conclusions regarding philosophical questions, and indeed, all matters related to informed engagement in this world.

One of Ekken’s most famous texts, the Taigiroku, is an account of his professed doubts about the validity of the teachings of Zhu Xi. Ekken opens his work by quoting Lu Xiangshan (1139–1192), Zhu Xi’s contemporary, who observed, “In learning, a person should be worried when he has no doubts. If he has doubts, then progress follows. As a result, he will learn something.” Zhu Xi made the case for doubting along similar lines, noting, “Those with major doubts make much progress. Those with minor doubts make little progress. Those without doubts make no progress.” Such remarks relating to the need for doubt and its resolution were quoted and paraphrased repeatedly by Razan, Ekken, and a number of others, as they sought to realize higher levels of philosophical confidence or even certitude regarding their positions.

One reason for the invitation to doubt extended by Neo-Confucians seems to have been their realization that many Neo-Confucian tenets, especially metaphysical ones, were profoundly novel. Upon first hearing these new ideas, students might have many questions before they could accept them. So, the Neo-Confucians typically encouraged students to ask questions and reflect critically on the matters prompting their doubts. By doing so, the critical spirit so often associated with philosophy as a discipline in the West was clearly instilled in the early-modern students of Neo-Confucian thought. There can be little question that the number of extended critiques of Neo-Confucian thinking in the early-modern period were in part an outgrowth of the invitation to doubt advocated by proponents of Neo-Confucianism. Far from a rigid and unchanging orthodoxy that allowed for little if any questioning and doubt, Neo-Confucianism actively engaged doubt as a prerequisite to progress in learning.

4.4 Ethics

Confucian philosophy in Japan, ancient, medieval, and early-modern, is often caricatured as a teaching of loyalty and trustworthiness, that is, one suited to authoritarian rulers and obedient subjects, as well as warrior-lords and their samurai followers. No doubt loyalty and trustworthiness were integral to the Confucian ethic, but equally important were more universal ethical prescriptions such as humaneness (jin). Humaneness was described variously, but most often associated with the injunction not to do to others what one would not want done to oneself. Humaneness might well be deemed the most quintessential of all Confucian and Neo-Confucian virtues. While Neo-Confucians affirmed the ancient and fundamental meaning of humaneness as the “golden rule,” they added substantially to the meaning of humaneness by suggesting that being truly humane led one to become mystically one body with everything in existence. While such a unity was grounded substantially in the single generative force constituting all reality (ichigenki), it was equally a function of recognizing other selves as oneself, and other entities, sentient or not, as part of a cosmic, familial continuum of essential oneness and wholeness. Moreover, the unity reflected one’s immersive participation in the generative activities of heaven and earth, and ultimate identification with the all-inclusive unity of the limitless creative potential of the cosmos. At a more rationalistic level, this unity was equally grounded in a cognitive grasp of the rational principles defining human nature’s goodness and the core ethical goodness of all things and their limitless becoming.

Another ethical notion crucial to Confucian and Neo-Confucian ethics was that of gi, or justice. Often translated as “righteousness” and “rightness,” gi also conveys a sense, in some contexts, of duty, responsibility, and obligation. To affirm that something or someone is gi amounted to ethical praise of the highest order, while denying the same meant virtual condemnation. Gi was often combined with humaneness to form the compound, jingi, indicating humaneness and justice, inherently political virtues that established the clear legitimacy of a regime embodying them.

From Mencius forward, fidelity to gi was often defined in terms of one’s willingness to sacrifice one’s life if realization of gi and one’s continued existence could not be realized in tandem. One of the most famous debates of the Tokugawa period centered around an incident occurring in 1703 concerning a group of forty-seven samurai who had been left masterless (rōnin) due to the shogun’s forcing the suicide of their lord. The question was whether the rōnin were acting according to gi in taking revenge upon the man who had, in the first place, prompted their deceased lord to commit the offense that led to his being condemned to self-destruction. Clearly, the issue was not the legal one of whether the rōnin obeyed or disobeyed the law, but instead the moral one of whether they acted on the basis of a sense of rightness and justice. Opinions varied, of course, but that the debate was widespread and meaningful reveals the extent to which Neo-Confucian ethical notions such as gi had become integral, substantive factors in public discourse in early-modern Japan.

4.5 Mind

The early-modern Neo-Confucians commonly described mind as the master of the body. All of the body’s activities are under the control of the mind. As a combination of ri (principle) and ki (generative force), the mind can serve as the master of the body because of its capacity for clear and unclouded intelligence. Due to the ri within it, the mind is originally good. Though evil might intrude into its workings, the mind’s original state is one of ethical goodness.

The Neo-Confucian position may not seem particularly profound unless we consider a Buddhist position it opposes. Namely, some Buddhists held that the mind is essentially empty delusion and ignorance. Rather than dismissing the everyday mind as the source of error, or advocating the realization of a mind that is “no-mind,” Neo-Confucians sought to describe the mind as a real, substantial entity in which intelligible ethical and rational principles indwelled, enabling humanity to know both what is, and what is right. The knowledge provided by the mind was not considered delusional or unreal, but rather as real as any could possibly be. Insofar as the principles that dwell within the mind are identical with those pervading the external world, the mind became the foundation for a mystic union with all existent things.

Often the mind was discussed in relation to the feelings issuing from it. Most Neo-Confucians considered human feelings – pleasure, anger, sorrow, fear, love, hate, and desire – to issue from the mind when it encounters things. As long as these feelings are expressed in accord with principle, they are considered natural outgrowths of the mind. If manifested insufficiently or to excess, the feelings are judged to be negative and in need of control. So as to enable the mind to master itself appropriately, Neo-Confucians sometimes advocated a Zen-like practice called “quiet-sitting.” Essentially a meditation upon one’s original, moral nature, quiet-sitting perceives the calmness and stillness of the mind before its engagement with the world of activity. The latter was typically seen as a source of overstimulation, one which could easily distract or distort the mind. If properly practiced, quiet-sitting could enable one to engage in any activity without overstepping or falling short in terms of emotive reactions. Such a mind was viewed as one well-regulated in accordance with the mean.

Neo-Confucian critics such as Itō Jinsai and Ogyū Sorai objected to characterizations of the mind in terms of “stillness” and “calmness,” asserting that those attributes harked back to Buddhism or Daoism, not Confucianism. Whereas their criticisms had some merit, previous orthodox Neo-Confucians such as Hayashi Razan had insisted that the Confucian usage of terms such as “stillness” and “calmness” meant something profoundly different from what was meant by Buddhists and Daoists. Ultimately, Razan insisted, the mind is an active thing, meant to be engaged in ongoing relations with the world at large and so, “stillness” is being poised for engagement, rather than an end in itself.

4.6 Human Nature

One of the many terms used in East Asian philosophical discussions to refer generally to the ideas of the Song philosophers of the Cheng-Zhu tradition and their exponents in later dynastic periods, was seirigaku (C: xinglixue), or “the school of human nature and principle.” The two words “human nature” (C: xing; J: sei) and “principle” (C: li; J: ri) were joined in part as a reflection of the Neo-Confucian identification of human nature with principle. In Japan, this position, equating human nature and principle, was affirmed by orthodox proponents of the Cheng-Zhu teachings such as Hayashi Razan and later, Yamazaki Ansai and their followers. In many respects, their accounts of human nature can be construed as an egalitarian affirmation of the commonly shared nature of all people. The grammar of most statements asserting the identity of human nature and principle support this understanding: they leave little room for doubt that orthodox Cheng-Zhu thinkers were saying that all people have the same human nature, and that that human nature is principle. To the extent that they explained the myriad differences in humanity, they did so by reference to variations in the clarity or turbidity of the generative force (ki) of particular individuals.

The ethical nuance assigned to human nature was a function of the Cheng-Zhu understanding of principle in both positive and normative terms. Not only did principle indicate what “is,” it also referred to what “ought to be” in a particular entity. In all matters, including human nature, principle was considered to be morally good. Thus at the macrocosmic level, the world of ordinary life was viewed not as the Buddhists saw it in terms of delusion, error, and anguish, but rather as the bountiful and morally good creation of heaven and earth, leading to the on-going production and reproduction of the ten-thousand things of the world in which we live. At the microcosmic level, rather than stressing human thoughts and feelings as given to attachments leading to one painful rebirth after another, the orthodox early-modern Neo-Confucians viewed the person as ethically good by virtue of their human nature. Those with clear generative force perhaps better understood and manifested the goodness of their human nature, while those with more turbid generative force did so less aptly. Nevertheless, with education and effort all could perfect themselves so as to realize fully the original goodness of their human nature. The human ideal of sagehood, more sought after than perhaps ever actually realized, was recognized as one that all could, with sufficient effort, achieve.

The orthodox Neo-Confucian explanation of human nature was frequently affirmed in early-modern Japan, especially in philosophically informed circles. However, those circles tended to be populated by individuals representing hereditary, status-bound social estates. At the top of the social system were the aristocrats of the ancient imperial capital, Kyōto, including the imperial family. Yet, during the Tokugawa period, the aristocracy was both respected and controlled by the samurai leadership exercising coercive governing power. Apart from the aristocracy, which was by and large restricted to the ancient imperial capital, the samurai were at the top of the secular social system. Below them were peasant farmers, then artisans, and finally merchants. Shintō and Buddhist clergy, often defined by hereditary lines as well, were esteemed as outside the secular social system. Thus, in practice, there was precious little egalitarianism in the early-modern social system.

Reflecting the inequalities of the day, Itō Jinsai challenged the orthodox Neo-Confucian view by asserting that human nature is simply the physical disposition (kishitsu) that each person is born with. In formulating this view, Jinsai was essentially agreeing with Dong Zhongshu (ca. 179–104 B.C.E.), who defined human nature as “the inborn disposition” of each person. But Jinsai also sympathized with the thinking of Zhou Dunyi (1017–1073), a Song philosopher who is often considered an early exponent of the Neo-Confucian philosophy that found its most complete form in the thought of Zhu Xi. Zhou Dunyi differentiated five natures including the morally strong, the immorally strong, the morally weak, the immorally weak, and the mean which relies on neither strength or weakness.

Jinsai did not seek to advance Zhou’s position as much as to expand it into a recognition of the manifold diversity of human natures. A scholar by profession, Jinsai’s own social standing was that of a townsperson, presumably of merchant background. The orthodox Neo-Confucian egalitarian position was at odds with the official hierarchy, but so was Jinsai’s view insofar as it affirmed a far more individualized diversity than the established hierarchy allowed. Though Jinsai’s theory of human nature as innate, individual physical disposition was reformulated by Ogyū Sorai, it did not achieve wide acceptance in early-modern Japan. Despite the extent to which it was at odds with reality, Confucian pronouncements on human nature in the early-modern period tended to repeat the Neo-Confucian line that human nature, as principle (ri), is morally good.

4.7 Political Thought

There is always a political nuance to Confucian philosophizing. Confucius himself first sought to offer his teachings to a ruler, thinking that they would provide an effective solution to the political crises of his times. The human ideal extolled by Confucius was that of the junzi (J: kunshi), or the “son of a ruler” that is, a “prince.” (Some translators have rendered this term as “gentleman,” “noble person,” or “exemplary person.”) But for Confucius, the true prince was not one born to the position. Rather, Confucius most admired the person who cultivated himself to such a point that he embodied a host of virtues associated with royal birth. Confucius had little use for the person who was born to that station but neglected the task of self-cultivation. Such a person, in Confucius’ view, hardly merited the standing accorded by birth. This understanding of the true prince implied that those born to high rank must strive to earn, through self-cultivation, the kind of respect and right to exercise power otherwise associated with their standing.

Mencian political thought was grounded in the view that government ought to be humane, and provide for the best interests of humanity. In this context, the ruler was characterized as the parent of the people, and his subjects as his own children, emphasizing the importance that he should attach to their welfare. Mencius at points explained success in governing as a matter of gaining the hearts-and-minds of the people at large, suggesting that without popular support rule would not be effective. In addressing questions related to instances in the past where tyrants had been executed, Mencius argued that there had been no instances of regicide. Instead, those put to death had been common criminals, having forfeited their legitimacy by their very mistreatment of people. Implied, of course, was that rulers who did the same might be legitimately dealt with in a similar manner.

Given the conditional perspective that Confucianism affirmed in relation to governing, it is not surprising that Confucian teachings tended to circulate first and foremost among the ruling elite throughout most of Japanese history. After all, had they had a wider circulation, the political implications might have resulted in even more challenges to those in power than actually occurred. Even more problematic than the views of Confucius and Mencius were those in the Book of Historical Documents related to the notion of tianming (J: tenmei), or “the mandate of heaven.” According to numerous passages in the History, if a ruler repeatedly abandoned his concern for the people, heaven would eventually give the mandate to rule to a new line, one that distinguished itself on the basis of concern for the people. In this process, the role of the people was instrumental. One passage in the History even states that heaven and the people are nearly the same: “heaven sees with the eyes of the people, and hears with the ears of the people.”

There can be no question that this notion entered Japan, as surely as the classical literature of China did. That the tianming notion attained no wide circulation reflects the extent to which Confucian political teachings in particular were restricted to the ruling elite rather than taught to the population at large. It must be added, however, that as Confucian learning became more widespread, even the peasantry began to understand the basics of Confucian political thought and developed clear expectations regarding humane government. Early-modern peasant protest movements and uprisings were often grounded in the notion that righteous and humane rulers ought to provide for the just interests of society as a whole. When such expectations were not fulfilled, it was not uncommon for peasants to make their dissatisfaction evident through remonstration and rebellion.

By comparison with the ancient, foundational writings, Neo-Confucian political philosophy was far more concerned with the project of ensuring that the ruler understood the benefits of self-cultivation. One of the most pertinent texts, the Great Learning (C: Daxue; J: Daigaku), outlines how a ruler should proceed if he wishes to manifest luminous virtue, noting that the project most fundamentally involves self-cultivation. For the latter to be realized, the ruler must first make his mind correct and his thoughts sincere. To realize this project, he must extend his understanding of things by studying and investigating them. If those ruling could cultivate themselves in this way, then they would find their families well ordered, their states well governed, and all below heaven enjoying great peace. Effective rule was thus cast as a matter of self-cultivation on the part of those ruling. This was the central political philosophy taught by orthodox Neo-Confucians such as Hayashi Razan, Yamazaki Ansai and their followers in Tokugawa Japan.

One major challenge to this approach came from Ogyū Sorai. According to Sorai, the orthodox Neo-Confucian position was impractical because it was based on the assumption that the human mind can control itself. In Sorai’s view, this was simply impossible because it would entail dividing the mind into two entities: the controlling mind and the controlled mind. Rather than expect the mind to control the mind, Sorai appealed to the Book of History and its teaching that the rites of “the early kings” be used to control not only the mind, but the socio-political realm at large. Sorai claimed that his philosophy was based on a correct reading of the ancient classics, especially the Book of History, but it is clear that he leaves a great deal out. Most particularly, he passes over the tianming notion completely, even though it is at the very core of the Book of History. Sorai also extolled the rites and music and their effectiveness for ruling, but never provided great clarity regarding what these included. Moreover, he repeatedly praised “the early kings” as the only sages who had and would ever exist in human history. The sagehood of the early kings was a function of their having established the way of social and political organization, a way that could never be surpassed, only followed. Sorai identified that way, “the way of the sages,” as consisting in the rites and music, as well as the laws and bureaucratic forms necessary for good government.

Ultimately, it seems that Sorai’s political philosophy meant to extol in later history those who stood as the representatives of the early kings. For him, these were the samurai ruling elite of his day, and their imposition of rites, laws, and administrative government as a means of implementing the greatest peace and prosperity for the greatest number. Sorai surely had little faith in the efficacy of internal means of self control; instead, he consistently advocated external strategies such as rites and music, penal laws, and administrative government as the means for providing, along utilitarian lines, for the welfare of all.

Sorai’s political philosophy, though one of the most systematic statements offered during the early-modern period, was never fully accepted as the philosophy of the ruling elite, despite the fact that that seems to have been Sorai’s explicit intent. Rather, his political philosophy ended up being viewed as a heterodox alternative, one much akin to that of Xunzi in ancient China.

4.8 Education

A most important contribution of Neo-Confucianism to early-modern Japanese culture was its emphasis on education at virtually all levels. Orthodox Neo-Confucianism viewed learning as one of the most basic methods of self-cultivation, one that contributed positively to the full realization of a person’s morally good human nature. At the highest level, education and learning were considered integral components in the realization of a well-governed state and peace throughout the world.

According to Zhu Xi, learning involved most basically the process of emulation. This account of learning came to be widely endorsed in early-modern Japan, even by heterodox thinkers such as Itō Jinsai and Ogyū Sorai. The model that Jinsai used in explaining learning as emulation was that of calligraphy. In learning to write, a student is presented with the example of his teacher, and then is expected to emulate it. Sustained efforts at emulation lead eventually to comprehension and the ability of the student to perform thoughtfully the task that has been learned.

While the practice of learning as emulation was widely endorsed, early-modern philosophers disagreed over the subject matter of education. Orthodox Neo-Confucians typically emphasized broad learning in the ancient classics and historical literature, but most importantly they extolled the value of studying the Four Books and Zhu Xi’s commentaries on them. Reflecting the orthodox Neo-Confucian value placed on education is the first of the Four Books, the Great Learning. Described as the “gateway” to all subsequent learning, the Great Learning outlines the series of methods to be mastered in order for a person to manifest luminous virtue. In this process, the investigation of things is preliminary. With such investigation, our understanding of things becomes complete and our thoughts sincere. Then, our minds are rectified. With this comes the realization of a cultivated self, one capable of regulating families, governing states, and bringing peace to the world.

Orthodox Neo-Confucians viewed the Great Learning as a work for mature students. To provide for the most widely educated society possible, other texts, such as the Elementary Learning, addressed topics for younger minds. In early-modern Japan, the Neo-Confucian emphasis on education also led to the formulation of a curriculum for women, as is evident in the Great Learning for Women (Onna daigaku), attributed to Kaibara Ekken, the Elementary Learning on Samurai Teachings (Bukyō shōgaku) by Yamaga Sokō, and other educational works for townspeople and farmers.

Heterodox thinkers such as Jinsai and Sorai often challenged orthodox Neo-Confucians on matters related to the texts elevated for study. Jinsai in particular affirmed that the most important works for students were the Analects of Confucius and the Mencius. Distancing himself considerably from the orthodox position, Jinsai offered a series of arguments seeking to prove, on textual and philosophical grounds, that the Great Learning was not a Confucian text. While he admitted that there was value in the study of the ancient classics, Jinsai believed that the Analects and Mencius were by and large sufficient for meaningful education.

By contrast, Ogyū Sorai emphasized the efficacy of studying the Six Classics. In Sorai’s view, the Six Classics conveyed the words of the sages predating Confucius. He considered their words unique insofar as they enabled humanity to fathom the minds of the sages themselves. Sorai did value texts such as the Analects, but decidedly less so. After all, Sorai reasoned, Confucius had not been fully a sage, at least not in his strictest sense of the term. For him, the sages were those ancient figures who had established the basic way of socio-political civilized life, the way that Confucius later championed as a transmitter. Yet, far more than learning through books, Sorai valued learning gained through practice in following the way. With this kind of performative learning, students were expected to come gradually to realize a full level of practical knowledge: knowing how to do something rather than knowing that something is the case.

The proliferation of education in early-modern Japan, producing mid-nineteenth-century literacy rates comparable to those of the most advanced Western nations, resulted from a complex set of factors, including the development of mass printing, the creation of schools in the various samurai domains, and the rise of educational movements related to Japanese literature and culture that were highly critical of Chinese-style philosophy of any sort. Yet, at the base of much of this was the Neo-Confucian view, shared generally by orthodox and heterodox thinkers, that education, whether practical or discursive or both, was a necessary ingredient in the life of all persons who might hope to realize their full potential.

4.9 Critiques of Buddhism

The liberation of Neo-Confucianism from the domination of Zen learning only became possible in the late-sixteenth and early-seventeenth centuries, following Toyotomi Hideyoshi’s (1537–1598) invasions of the Korean peninsula. As a result, a number of Neo-Confucian texts that included pointed critiques of Buddhism came into Japan. As the anti-Buddhist perspectives of these texts came to be ever more influential throughout the seventeenth century, an increasingly common theme in Japanese Neo-Confucian discourse was its relationship, positive or negative, to Buddhism.

One of the more interesting Confucian critiques of Buddhism was articulated by Itō Jinsai (1627–1705), a Kyōto-based scholar who, significantly enough, had neither been brought up nor educated by Buddhists. In his discussion of “the way,” Jinsai suggested that the Buddha believed emptiness was the way, and that mountains, rivers, and land masses were all unreal. In opposition, Jinsai argued along distinctly commonsensical lines: that for myriad ages heaven and earth have sustained life; the sun and moon have illuminated the world; mountains have stood and rivers flowed; birds, beasts, fish, insects, trees, and grasses have lived as they do now. Given this evidence from the phenomenal world, Jinsai asked how the Buddhists could claim that all is emptiness or nothingness. Answering his own question, Jinsai said that their emphasis on emptiness derived from their tending to retire to mountains and to sit silently while emptying their minds. Thus, Jinsai argued, the theoretical principles affirmed by the Buddhists – emptiness and nothingness – exist neither within this world nor outside it.

Instead of Buddhist emptiness which he claimed to be groundless, Jinsai affirmed that the principles of love and social relations are found in every aspect of life from humanity down to bamboo plants, trees, grasses, insects, fish, and even grains of sand. Jinsai denied that Buddhist principles received any corroboration in any level of existence whatsoever, dismissing them as heterodoxies utterly lacking any basis in reality.

Jinsai maintained that the Confucian way is how people should conduct themselves ethically in their daily lives. In doing so, he asserted that the Confucian way is both natural and universal insofar as it is understood by everyone in every part of the universe as the inescapable path of all. Because this has been and will be true for all time, it is simply called “the way.” Amplifying his point, Jinsai added that the Confucian way does not exist simply because it is taught. Rather, its vitality is naturally and universally so. By contrast, the teachings of Buddhism exist only because certain people revere them. If those people vanished, Jinsai maintained, so would Buddhism. Emphasizing their lack of practicality, Jinsai observed that even when Buddhist teachings are accepted, they bring no benefits. If they are rejected, people lose nothing. Worst of all, Jinsai said, when the world followed the teachings of the ancient Confucian sages, it was at peace, but since Buddhism had become dominant, great chaos and disturbances have ensued. Thus, Jinsai’s rejection of Buddhism follows, at least in part, pragmatic lines, emphasizing that at best there is no gain from it, and at worst that it brings chaos and disorder to the world.

Jinsai also criticized Buddhists for abandoning ethics, in particular righteousness and justice (gi). While he allowed that Buddhists taught the virtue of compassion, Jinsai added that they ultimately extolled nirvana as the way. This led them to downplay righteousness rather than recognize it as “the great path of all below heaven.”

Jinsai emphasized the mind as the seat of the moral sentiments giving rise in action to the virtues of humaneness and righteousness. In making this point and at the same time emphasizing the vital activity of the mind, Jinsai enthusiastically endorsed the views of Mencius. Jinsai pointedly criticized Buddhists and others who followed them for claiming that the mind is empty. He also argued against the Buddhist belief that the mind ought to be made pure, utterly rid of human desires, and empty like a bright mirror or calm like still water. Jinsai rejected such images for being at odds with the energetic approach to moral action that Confucianism endorses. For Jinsai, moral action emerges from moral sentiments and can never be divorced from the passions. Because the Buddhists sought, according to Jinsai, to eliminate passions in their pursuit of nirvana, their view of the mind was fundamentally mistaken.

Yet for all of his criticisms of Buddhism, Jinsai explained, in one of the appendices to his Gomō jigi, that the best way to refute Buddhism and heterodoxies generally was not by means of debate, but instead by manifesting the Confucian way of ethical engagement with the world in daily practical activities. Debate, argument, and rhetoric were, in Jinsai’s view, little more than empty formulations reflecting descent into the same kind of emptiness that so characterized the Buddhist teachings one sought to oppose.

It might be added in this connection that Tokugawa Confucians often sought to outdo one another in their opposition to Buddhism. In one of his more tolerant moments, Jinsai wrote a farewell letter to a Buddhist monk, Dōkō (b: 1675?), who was about to depart Kyōto after a period of study there. In the letter, which Jinsai surely never meant to be construed as a definitive statement of his views on Buddhism, he praised Dōkō’s study of Confucianism. At one point, Jinsai graciously added, “From the perspective of scholars, both Confucianism (Ju) and Buddhism (Butsu) definitely exist. However from the vantage point of heaven and earth, there is most fundamentally neither Confucianism nor Buddhism. Rather, there is only one way and that is all.” Jinsai’s letter, which was subsequently published, shocked many Confucians who were far more doctrinaire in their opposition to Buddhism. One scholar, Satō Naokata (1650–1719), went so far as to republish Jinsai’s letter with a running commentary, sharply critical of both Buddhism and Jinsai. The latter was the subject of Naokata’s wrath because Jinsai, in Naokata’s intolerant view, had been insufficiently hostile to the “evil thing,” namely, Buddhism.

Confucian discourse on Buddhism, then, was much more complex than Jinsai’s critiques alone might suggest. But what is clear is that during the early-modern period of Japanese intellectual history, Confucianism and Buddhism came to be fairly distinct philosophical forces, with much critical antipathy issuing from the Confucian camp. As Confucian learning became increasingly secure and respected in its own right, these critiques tended to diminish. Ogyū Sorai, for example, rarely discussed Buddhism, though when he did his remarks were critical. Still one senses that for Sorai and his audience, Buddhism did not need to be subjected yet again to a Confucian critique. Buddhism had its own relevance for some people at certain times, and Confucianism had its own. Confucianism had arrived, apparently, as a largely secular ethic with clear and distinct socio-political relevance that to many suggested not just independence, but even philosophical dominance.

4.10 Ghosts and Spirits

Neo-Confucian philosophical discussions, often featuring lengthy explanations of “ghosts and spirits” (C: guishen; J: kishin), differed markedly from ancient Confucianism. Confucius declined to discuss spiritual matters at length, even when asked about them specifically. Why address the world after, Confucius asked, when one has yet to master the way of humanity within this world? Confucius was not disrespectful of ceremonies for the spirits, but he did emphasize that he maintained a respectful distance from them. Still, if he found himself in attendance at such a ceremony, he behaved as if the spirits were actually there. Confucius’ reluctance to discuss the spiritual dimension in any real detail has led many to speculate that he was an atheist, or perhaps a polite agnostic.

In the wake of Buddhism, however, it was impossible for Confucians to ignore the topic of ghosts and spirits. Buddhist literature went into great detail about the Western Paradise, or the Buddhist Pure Land, and the many layers of hell where sinners would be punished by wardens of hell. Graphic depictions of the spirit world, heaven, hell, demons, hungry ghosts, and angelic bodhisattvas made the accounts seem all the more credible. In Japan, Shinto as well had its own traditions of ghosts, spirits, goblins, and changelings. To counter such discourse, Neo-Confucians formulated their own explanations of spiritual phenomena, ones offering a more naturalistic account of the apparent activities of ghosts and spirits. These accounts can be interpreted as bordering on atheism or agnosticism and so are in keeping with Confucius’ position, at least as some have interpreted it. Yet, they were far more lengthy overall than anything that Confucius or most prior Confucians had offered.

A key feature of Neo-Confucian philosophical discussions of ghosts and spirits is their naturalistic metaphysical character. Rather than purporting to describe particular spirits, many Neo-Confucians, following Cheng Yi, explained ghosts and spirits as “traces of the creative transformations of the world.” More specifically, Neo-Confucians often interpreted what appeared to be ghosts and spirits as “the spontaneous activities of the two generative forces,” yin and yang. As yin and yang expanded and contracted, spiritual forces purportedly emerged with yang, and ghostly forces with yin.

While casting ghosts and spirits in metaphysical terms that in certain respects seemed intent on explaining away ghosts and spirits, Neo-Confucians also affirmed that just as yin and yang pervade reality, so do ghosts and spirits. The spirits are simply the expansive and ghosts, the contractive forces of the world. Recognizing the interrelatedness of ghosts and spirits with the world at large, many Neo-Confucians associated spirits with heaven, spring and summer, morning, the sun, light, music, and so on, while ghosts were linked to the earth, fall and winter, evening, the moon, darkness, rituals, and so forth. With this analysis, Neo-Confucians did not deny spirits, but instead asserted that they infuse every aspect of reality just as surely as do yin and yang.

Providing a basis for ancestor worship, Neo-Confucians typically claimed that within a family line, there is a shared generative force, which entails a shared spirituality. This common spirituality is communicated through the male line in ancestral rites performed by sons to their fathers, grandfathers, and so on. Because the shared family line was considered essential to the shared spiritual basis, Neo-Confucians emphasized that if a family had to adopt a child, then it should take care to adopt a son from a male relative of the father so that the sacrifices offered by the adopted son might be happily accepted by the spirits. If adoption was outside the male line of the family, then offerings to the family ancestors would actually be communicated to the family line of the adopted son, leaving the family that had adopted the son unhappily neglected. In an effort to curb popular involvement in spiritualistic movements and practices, Neo-Confucians generally described as wanton and improper any participation in a religious ritual or ceremony that had no relationship with the larger family involved with them.

One of the more heterodox Neo-Confucian accounts of ghosts and spirits came from Ogyū Sorai. Unlike the naturalistic explanations provided by most Neo-Confucians, Sorai emphasized the integrity of the accounts of ghosts and spirits set forth by the ancient sage kings. Sorai asserted that since the ancient kings had said that there were spirits, then there must indeed be spirits. Likewise with ghosts, as well as a host of other spiritual beings. To question the existence of ghosts and spirits was, in Sorai’s view, to disrespect the ancient sage kings. Sorai’s insistence upon an unquestioning belief in ghosts and spirits, however, was more the exception than the mainstream view among early-modern Japanese Confucians.

4.11 Environment: Mountains, Rivers, and Forests

One of the great texts of Song dynasty Confucianism is Zhang Zai’s (1020–1070) “Western Inscription” (Ximing). In its opening lines, Zhang states that he views heaven as his father, earth as his mother, and the ten thousand things of the world as his brothers and sisters. All that fills the space between heaven and earth he considers as his body. Elsewhere Zhang spoke more metaphysically, describing that which fills all between heaven and earth as qi, or the generative force (J: ki) that is the creative substantial being and energy of becoming in all things. Zhang also explained qi in terms of the great vacuity, a notion that sounds Buddhistic but was meant to capture the openness of all becoming to change and transformation. Yet in the end, qi was the rock bottom of Confucian realism, metaphysically speaking, and was in large part the ontological dimension of things that prompted Confucians throughout East Asia to take the world seriously not as a site of delusion and ignorance, but instead as a both the crucible of their being and an extension of themselves in becoming. Reportedly, Zhang’s sense of oneness and kinship with everything between heaven and earth left him unable to cut the grass and bushes outside his window. Other Song Confucians offered their own vision of oneness with reality by declaring that the humane person forms one body with the ten thousand things of existence. These visions of oneness and kinship prompted Confucians to paint landscape (shanshui) paintings, literally paintings of mountains (shan) and water (shui), compose poetry alluding to the interrelatedness of things, and to direct public works projects meant to maintain the harmony and balance of heaven, earth, and humanity.

Zhang’s “Western Inscription” inspired Confucians throughout East Asia to develop philosophical thinking about their oneness with the natural world and its generative being, and to advance practical thinking about how to respectfully engage with the realm of heaven and earth. In Tokugawa Japan, this environmental concern took many forms. Kaibara Ekken’s Plants of Japan (Yamato honzō), a kind of botanical study of Japanese medicinal plants and herbs, is one example. In his Instructions of Cultivating Life (Yōjōkun), Ekken emphasized the importance of nourishing one’s ki, or generative force, in harmony with that of all between heaven and earth. Equally important, especially as an indicator of the perennial significance of Zhang Zai’s “Western Inscription” is Kumazawa Banzan’s (1619–1691) “Western Inscription for Japanese” (Yamato nishi no mei), an expansive, vernacular commentary on Zhang Zai’s brief text. In his Questions and Answers on the Great Learning (Daigaku wakumon), Banzan outlined various policy proposals, including limits on the construction of Buddhist temples and samurai castles, as a means of preventing deforestation. He also declared mountains, forests, and rivers – metaphors for the natural world – to be the foundations of the state, and essential components in the longevity of political lines. If a ruler forfeited these components of nature and his realm’s balance with the natural world, then his line would pay the price. Banzan’s writings reveal that even Confucians in the private sector were thinking proactively about achieving a sustainable equilibrium with the forces of nature, one that provided for both the best interests of human society and the integrity of natural growth and development.

5. Confucianism in Modern Japan

An important legacy of Confucian philosophy in modern Japanese history derives from Confucian understandings of the philosophy of history. This is evident in the transition from the Tokugawa period, dominated politically by a samurai regime led by a shogun, to the Meiji period, at least billed as a restoration of imperial rule. Rather than assuming that history was progressing ever forward to incrementally better levels, Confucians tended to see ideals in the past. Therefore, they often advocated a return to a supposed golden age as a means to improve conditions in the present. Confucius himself had denied that he was an innovator, insisting that he only sought to transmit the ideals of the past. Although Confucius might have cast his work as mere transmission, he was clearly innovating in revolutionary philosophical ways. The political transformation giving rise to the Meiji imperial regime, at least in terms of its philosophical presentation as a return to an ancient, supposedly more ideal model, was characteristically Confucian. So was the fact that this purported return to the past ushered in a profoundly new historical period, one that revolutionized most aspects of life.

One of the philosophical minds behind the Meiji restoration, at least insofar as several of the anti-Tokugawa, pro-Meiji samurai leaders were concerned, was the Confucian scholar, Yoshida Shōin (1830–1859). He was a hereditary master, in the Chōshū domain, of the Confucian teachings of Yamaga Sokō. Philosophically, Sokō is best known for his Essential Records of the Sagely Teachings (Seikyō yōroku), a brief but pointed critique of orthodox Neo-Confucian thinking. It advocated instead Sokō’s own understanding of the Analects. As transmitted to Shōin through the Yamaga line of scholarship, and then embodied by Shōin’s students such as Itō Hirobumi (1841–1909), a Chōshū revolutionary turned Meiji statesman, the restorationism that was at the core of both Confucianism and Neo-Confucianism was clearly echoed in the spirit of the Meiji restoration.

The Meiji period, however, soon involved a profound turn away from traditional patterns and toward more distinctively Western ones. This was true in philosophy as well, resulting in the relative atrophy of Confucian studies. However, it is significant that most of the Meiji leaders who promoted Western philosophical ideas had backgrounds in Confucian studies. Nishi Amane (1829–1897), often referred to as the father of western philosophy in Japan, read Ogyū Sorai’s philosophical works before turning to the study of the ideas of Auguste Comte and John Stuart Mill. During the people’s rights movement of the 1870s and early 1880s, advocates such as Nakae Chōmin (1847–1901) often cast their understandings of liberty, equality, and natural rights in terms of notions drawn from Confucian discourse.

With the swing toward conservatism and nationalism in the late-Meiji period, philosophical voices such as that of Inoue Tetsujirō advocated not so much a faithful return to Confucianism per se but to what Inoue called kokumin dōtoku, or “national ethics.” This set of teachings was based largely on selective Confucian virtues such as loyalty and filial piety. Inoue is also noteworthy for having led the way, albeit along highly nationalistic lines, in interpreting Confucian developments of the early-modern period as movements in “philosophy,” using the newly coined Japanese word, tetsugaku. This Japanese word chosen as the gloss for “philosophy” alluded back to, in Chinese literature, the Book of History, a Confucian classic, where tetsu (C: zhi) refers to the “wisdom” manifested by the ancient sages of China. In that respect, the “study of wisdom,” the literal meaning of tetsugaku, was as much an apt characterization of the Confucian project as it was one of the western field of philosophy.

Unfortunately, Inoue’s claim that there had been traditional forms of philosophy, specifically the Neo-Confucian schools of the early-modern period, well prior to the introduction of western philosophy had one disturbing side effect. He increasingly elevated the status of Confucian notions not necessarily as Confucian notions in themselves, but as integral parts of a nationalistic, imperialistic, and militaristic blend serving the interests of Japanese militarists of the 1930s and 1940s. In particular, Inoue’s later years were devoted to expounding bushidō, the so-called “way of the warrior,” as a core ingredient in kokumin dōtoku. Inoue produced such a large corpus of bushidō-related literature that one might claim that the way of the warrior was far more his invention than something grounded in tradition.

With the defeat of Japan in 1945, Confucian notions came to be regarded negatively because of their unfortunate appropriation by Inoue and other philosopher-ideologues. They had manipulated the core ethics of Confucian philosophy into a teaching of loyalty to the imperial state and self-sacrifice for the sake of its glory. Those Confucian philosophers whose writings had been most enthusiastic about Japan, and so easily appropriated – as was the case with Yamaga Sokō who had argued at one point in his multifaceted philosophical corpus, that Japan, not China, was the true Central Kingdom – have consequently suffered from significant neglect in the postwar period. By contrast, those earlier Confucians whose writings had disparaged Japan and celebrated China, such as those of Ogyū Sorai, rebounded from their former pariah status in jingoistic Japan to becoming the focus of repeated postwar studies. Usually, however, because of the overall feeling that Confucianism of any sort was more ideology than philosophy (and this was surely the most egregious legacy of its prewar appropriation) Confucianism has most frequently been interpreted simply as “thought” (shisō) or “ideology” (ideorogii), typically of a “feudalistic” sort. In other countries, including contemporary China, interpreters are reexamining Confucianism as a living philosophy of ongoing significance, but Japanese scholars have more viewed it as a historical artifact, not a vital philosophy. Instead, philosophy departments in most major Japanese universities today continue to define “philosophy” as western philosophy, finding relatively little place for the study of Confucianism under its rubric.

Exaggerating the extent to which the fortunes of Japanese Confucianism declined in the postwar period, one scholar, Kiri Paramore, in his Japanese Confucianism: A Cultural Study, has suggested that in Japan, Confucianism ended up becoming taboo, a topic shunned by scholars and public intellectuals who would not so much utter the word, “Confucianism,” in their writings. As evidence, Paramore cites the oeuvre of Maruyama Masao, one of the greatest political thinkers of the mid-twentieth century. One of Maruyama’s most widely read works, Studies in the Intellectual History of Tokugawa Japan (Nihon shisōshi kenkyū), had discussed Neo-Confucianism in some detail, albeit in the flawed interpretive framework that Hegel had provided. Thus, Maruyama saw Neo-Confucianism as antithetical to change, and its continuative metaphysics linking the natural and ethical spheres, in need of dissolution.

Written during Japan’s war years, Maruyama identified a succession of Japanese Confucian scholars, including Ogyū Sorai, as vanquishers of the Zhu Xi mode of thought. The latter was, in Japan, little more – according to Maruyama – than an expression of spiritual slavery to the ossified philosophy of Song dynasty China, that of Zhu Xi. The dissolution of the Zhu Xi mode of thought credited to Japanese thinkers such as Sorai seemingly echoed the battlefield advances of the imperial Japanese forces in their conquest of large swathes of China and East Asia. Even though Maruyama was ideologically opposed to the war, his narrative hardly transcended the war rhetoric of Japanese nationalism in its ascent over China. Despite the fact that Maruyama later acknowledged errors and misjudgments in his presentation of Japanese Confucianism, his thinking came to be widely deemed as “a starting point” for future studies of the subject. There can be little doubt that as translated by Mikiso Hane and published by Princeton University Press, Maruyama’s Studies in the Intellectual History of Tokugawa Japan prompted many students of Japanese thought to renewed thinking about Confucianism and its importance in Japanese history.

Paramore claims that in the postwar period, Maruyama soon turned away from Confucian studies and only rarely used the term, “Confucianism” (Jukyō). This shunning of the notion supposedly announced a new era in which, according to Paramore, Confucianism was “taboo.” Put differently, Maruyama’s avoidance of the term, “Confucianism,” established the so-called “Maruyama rule” that “Confucianism” was not to be broached. However, familiarity with Maruyama’s oeuvre proves this analysis mistaken. After all, well after Studies, Maruyama authored a lengthy essay on the Yamazaki Ansai school, “Yamazaki Ansai’s Learning and the School of Yamazaki Ansai” (Ansai gaku to Ansai gakuha). Maruyama’s essay was published in a substantial volume on Ansai’s school, The School of Yamazaki Ansai (Yamazaki Ansai gakuha) in 1980. This volume was co-edited by Maruyama himself, and published by Iwanami shoten as part of its Nihon shisō taikei series. In the essay, Maruyama discusses Confucianism repeatedly, and admittedly, critically. Nevertheless, in discussing Confucianism, Maruyama violated the so-called “Maruyama rule” that had supposedly rendered Confucianism taboo. Clearly, Maruyama’s continued engagement with Confucianism proves that that was hardly the case.

Evidence of the continued vitality of Confucianism within Japanese philosophical discourse is also at the University of Tokyo Center for Philosophy. Since its founding in 2002, UTCP has sought to establish itself as an international base for the discussion of philosophical problems. UTCP has also sponsored discussions addressing dimensions of Confucianism within Japanese philosophy. In doing so, UTCP has emerged as a leader in affirming the notion of “Japanese philosophy” and that of “Japanese Confucian philosophy.” Much the same is true with the recently established journal, the Journal of Japanese Philosophy published by the State University of New York Press. Along with the longstanding efforts of the East-West Center and the University of Hawai‘i’s Department of Philosophy, the UTCP and JJP promise to significantly contribute to the revival of interest in Japanese Confucianism and its contributions to Japanese philosophical discourse.

Along similar lines, the International Association for Japanese Philosophy (IAJP), founded in 2014 by the editors of the Journal of Japanese Philosophy, provides opportunities, through regular conferences and panels, for discussion of a range of topics and themes in Japanese philosophy, including Japanese Confucianism, keeping the latter very much in the mainstream, rather than taboo, going forward. Recent calls for “Green Confucianism,” or an emphasis on environmentally-oriented dimensions of Confucian tradition that might serve as the foundations for an expansion of environmental philosophy within Japanese philosophical thinking, have also contributed to the ongoing relevance of the tradition in ways that go well beyond the confines of family morality, ancestor worship, and the basics of everyday morality in society and the political sphere. “Green Confucianism” is just one of many possible re-expressions of Confucian thinking vis-a-vis the evolving contexts of Japanese modernity that establish the perennial significance of Confucian cosmological thinking, alongside its ethical and sociopolitical and spiritual teachings.


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