First published Fri Jul 6, 2018

Xunzi 荀子 (third century BCE) was a Confucian philosopher, sometimes reckoned as the third of the three great classical Confucians (after Confucius and Mencius). For most of imperial Chinese history, however, Xunzi was a bête noire who was typically cited as an example of a Confucian who went astray by rejecting Mencian convictions. Only in the last few decades has Xunzi been widely recognized as one of China’s greatest thinkers.

1. Xunzi and Xunzi

The name Xunzi means Master Xun and refers to Xun Kuang 荀況, who was renowned in his day as “the most revered of teachers” (zui wei laoshi 最爲老師). His precise dates are unknown, and extant sources contradict one another: in particular, there is disagreement as to whether he journeyed to the philosophical center of Qi 齊 at the age of fifteen sui 歲 (i.e. thirteen or fourteen years of age) or fifty sui (forty-eight or forty-nine). The former figure is more plausible (Goldin 1999: 110n.13; Knoblock 1982–83: 33–34), and would indicate a year of birth sometime around 310 BCE All we can surmise of his death is that it must have been after 238 BCE, because he was alive when his patron, Lord Chunshen 春申君, was assassinated in that year. Virtually all available information about his life comes either from internal references in Xunzi, the posthumously edited collection of his works, or from his biography in Records of the Historian 史記, by Sima Qian 司馬遷 (145?–86? BCE), which is known to contain serious distortions, especially in its treatment of famous philosophers (Kern 2015). Hence modern attempts to piece together Xun Kuang’s life (such as Knoblock 1988–94: I, 3–35; and Liao Mingchun 2005: 535–46) are necessarily tentative.

Sima Qian relates that Xunzi polished his voluminous writings in his old age, but they do not survive in his own recension. All extant editions of Xunzi derive from a compilation by Liu Xiang 劉向 (79–8 BCE), a palace librarian who located 322 bamboo bundles of text (pian 篇) that he confidently attributed to Xunzi, of which he eliminated 290 as duplicates. These high numbers suggest that Xunzi’s essays had been circulating independently for about two centuries (Sato 2003: 27–36). The general consensus today is that Xunzi is a collection of predominantly authentic essays, but certainly not organized in a manner that Xun Kuang himself had authorized (e.g., Knoblock 1988–94: I, 105–28). One indication of the diversity of Liu Xiang’s sources is that a few chapters (notably “A Debate about Warfare” [“Yibing” 議兵]) refer to Xunzi as Sun Qingzi 孫卿子, “Master Chamberlain Sun”, a title that he himself would not have used.[1] The chapter divisions, in particular, seem unreliable: whereas some chapters read like self-standing essays, others do not. In “Refutation of Physiognomy” (“Feixiang” 非相), for example, only the opening lines deal with physiognomy; the rest of the chapter seems to consist of stray passages that Liu Xiang did not quite know where to insert. There are also some chapters with generic instructional material, as well as poems and rhymed riddles that are rarely studied (Knechtges 1989). One of the consequences of this arrangement is that reconstructing Xunzi’s arguments requires reading across chapter boundaries: taken as a whole, the book conveys a distinctive philosophical position, but individual chapters are inadequate, indeed sometimes incoherent, on their own (Kern 2016; Hutton 2014: xviii–xxiii).

2. Human Nature (xing 性)

Chapter 23,[2] “Human Nature is Evil” (Xing’e 性惡), is a reasonable point of entry into Xunzi’s philosophy for multiple reasons: it exemplifies some of the textual problems mentioned above; it addresses one of the core themes of the collection; and it was, for centuries, the most frequently cited section of Xunzi.

First, the two keywords need to be unpacked. Xing, commonly translated as “human nature”, is a term of uncertain etymology that earlier philosophers had used in subtly dissimilar ways. Mencius (372–289 BCE?), for example, used it to refer to the ideal state than an organism is expected to attain under the right conditions, or perhaps an innate tendency toward that state (Graham 1989: 117–32; Graham 1990: 7–66). Famously, Mencius argued that the xing of human beings is good (shan 善), by which he meant that all human beings have the capacity to become good, even though, in reality, not all people are good, because they fail to exert themselves sufficiently—or even take the obligation seriously.

In Xunzi, “Human Nature is Evil” is framed as an argument with Mencius (who was probably long dead), and takes the view that the xing of human beings is the very opposite of shan, namely e. The basic meaning of e is close to “detestable” (as a transitive verb, wu 惡 means “to hate”); the translation “evil” is acceptable only with the understanding that something like an Augustinian conception of evil is not intended. (Some scholars opt for “bad”, another standard antonym of “good” in English.) But in prosecuting this position, Xunzi uses xing in a fundamentally different sense: “What is so by birth is called xing” (Xunzi 22.1b).[3] Thus xing refers to the basic faculties, capacities, and desires that we have from birth, which cannot be called “good” because following the impulses of our xing, without reflecting on them and moderating them, will lead us to act harmfully (Hutton 2000; Tang 2016: 51).

In effect, both Xunzi and Mencius argued that human beings all have the capacity to become good, even though some people develop this capacity and others do not (Graham 1989: 250; Shun 1997: 222–31). The main differences, only recently appreciated, are that they were not operating with the same implicit definitions of xing, and Xunzi’s recommendations for moral self-cultivation—that is, how to overcome one’s inherently detestable nature—were more complex than Mencius’s, as we shall see. Because of Mencius’s subsequent prestige, it was commonly supposed that Xunzi’s definition of xing was heterodox, if not deliberately subversive. But a collection of Confucian manuscripts recently excavated from a tomb near the modern town of Guodian 郭店 and dated to ca. 300 BCE suggests that it may have been Mencius’s usage of xing, not Xunzi’s, which was considered eccentric in ancient times.[4] The Guodian text called The Xing Emerges from the Endowment (Xing zi ming chu 性自命出) defines xing in a manner very similar to Xunzi: the set of inborn characteristics shared by all members of a species (Goldin 2005: 38).

Fixating on the title “Human Nature Is Evil” (which may or may not derive from Xunzi himself) can lead to an elision of the second half of the chapter’s credo: “what is good [in people] is their artifice” (qi shan zhe wei ye 其善者偽也). “Artifice” (wei)[5] refers to all the traits and habits that we acquire through our own conscious actions. And if we achieve any goodness, it must be because of our artifice: whereas

obeying one’s xing and following one’s emotions must result in contention and robbery … the transformation [brought about by] the methods of a teacher and the Way of ritual and morality will result in deference and courtesy, in accordance with refinement and principles, and return to order. (Xunzi 23.1a)

Thus the phrase that is used to denote moral self-cultivation is not to overcome or abandon the xing, but to transform it (huaxing 化性). For this reason, in addition to stylistic features that trouble some readers, the chapter is occasionally impugned as corrupt or inauthentic (Robins 2001–02; Zhou Chicheng 2014).

3. Modes of Moral Self-Cultivation: Ritual (li 禮) and Music (yue 樂)

What prompted Xunzi to dissent from Mencius’s characterization of xing as good if he ultimately agreed with Mencius’s larger view: that people can perfect themselves and that such an achievement requires great exertion and self-motivation? Perhaps Xunzi wished to highlight his conviction that the proper models for moral behavior lie outside the self, which is fundamentally opposed to a Mencian notion of Four Beginnings (siduan 四端) lodged within the human heart (e.g., Mencius 2A.6). Whereas Mencians have always emphasized looking inwards for moral direction—sometimes complicated by the acknowledgment that the heart can be corrupted—self-cultivation in the Xunzian style is inconceivable without looking outwards.

Xunzi held that for most ordinary people, the best guide is the set of rituals (li) handed down by sages of yore (sheng 聖 or shengren 聖人). What are rituals and why did the sages institute them? In some passages, Xunzi attributes, in a manner superficially reminiscent of Hobbes or Rousseau, the genesis of the rituals to the sages’ recognition that unbridled competition produces a globally unsustainable situation:

If people follow their desires, then boundaries cannot contain them and objects cannot satisfy them. Thus the Former Kings restrained them and established for them ritual and morality in order to divide them [into classes]. (Xunzi 4.12; cf. 19.1a)

Sometimes these rituals are described as efficient social conventions (e.g., Perkins 2014: 189–97), but this is inadequate for two reasons.

First, Xunzi elsewhere explicitly denies that an arbitrarily chosen set of rituals would be effective. Rather, the rituals of the sage kings are legitimate because they accord with “that which makes humans human” (ren zhi suoyi wei ren zhe 人之所以為人者); by implication, any competing ritual code would necessarily fail. Specifically, human beings, unlike any other species of animal, abide by certain distinctions (bian 辨)—male is distinguished from female, old from young, and so on—and it is altogether natural that we do so. The rituals of the sage kings confirm the distinctions that we are bound to make by nature (the core text is Xunzi 5.4; see also 10.3a and 19.1c).

Second, rituals, in Xunzi’s conception, not only facilitate social cohesion, but also foster moral and psychological development (Ivanhoe 2014; Yearley 2014: 92–101). Indeed, if they did not, they would be mere instruments of expedience, not rituals. These dimensions become clear when Xunzi begins to discuss specific rituals and their purposes. We observe regulations concerning funerary ceremonies and grave goods, for example, in order to learn how to avoid incivility and miserliness (19.4a-b). Similarly, the mandatory three-year mourning period for deceased rulers and parents helps us conduct ourselves properly by providing suitable forms for us to express emotions that are so deep as to be potentially debilitating:

When a wound is colossal, its duration is long; when pain is profound, the recovery is slow. The three-year mourning period is a form established with reference to emotions; it is the means by which one conveys the acme of one’s pain. (Xunzi 19.9a)

One ritual discussed in extenso is the village wine-drinking ceremony (xiang 鄉). The fact that the host fetches the guest of honor himself, but expects the other guests to arrive on their own, underscores the distinctions that need to be drawn between noble and base. And the detail that each participant toasts the next, serially and according to their ages, demonstrates that one can align society according to seniority without excluding anyone. When the guest of honor retires, the host bows and escorts him out, and the formal occasion comes to an end: this is to make it known that one can feast at leisure without becoming disorderly. The clear implication is that by taking part in the rite, we can gradually comprehend the moral principles that the sages wished us to embody (Xunzi 20.5).

Xunzi’s rituals have such an important role to play in our emotional and moral development that he spends an entire chapter limning what are essentially rituals of artistic expression. The term he uses is “music” (yue), which is distinct from ritual, but Xunzi’s conception of their origin and purpose is so similar that we can scarcely speak of one without the other. Thus “ritual and music” (liyue) can only be understood as two aspects of human artifice (wei): “ritual” refers to cultural forms that affect social cohesion, “music” to those involving the orderly expression of human emotions. The crucial point is that the sages created both.

Like all Confucians, Xunzi accepts that human beings have certain irrepressible impulses (Xunzi 20.1), which are not objectionable in themselves. The problem is that unreflective outbursts driven solely by emotional responses may cause harm, and thus we are enjoined to be mindful of our impulses, rather than to extinguish them (compare Xunzi 22.5a). To aid us in this process, the Sages left behind appropriate musical compositions that we can use to channel our need to express ourselves. What Xunzi meant by this is the canonical collection of Odes (Shi 詩), which all Confucians seem to have regarded as a nonpareil repository of edifying literature (Goldin 2005: 35).

Xunzi’s immediate purpose in this section was to counter the Mohist view that music is wasteful. Xunzi counters that by focusing exclusively on the material costs, Mo Di 墨翟 (d. ca. 390 BCE) and his followers failed to recognize the psychological utility of music as an instrument of moral suasion (Cook 1997: 21–24; Graham 1989: 259–61).

When music is centered and balanced, the people are harmonious and not dissipated. When music is stern and grave, the people are uniform and not disorderly. When the people are harmonious and uniform, the army is firm and the citadels secure; enemy states dare not invade. (Xunzi 20.2)

As the last quote intimates, the proper implementation of ritual is also decisive in politics and international relations.[6] In the “Debate about Warfare”, for example, Xunzi offers a distinctive variant of the old Confucian idea that a true king (wang 王—always a moral term in Confucian discourse) will succeed on the battlefield without even having to fight, because the populace will not support a tyrant or hegemon (ba 霸, a lord who rules by brute force). What is unique is Xunzi’s emphasis on ritual as the key to a well-ordered state. To be sure, earlier writings had also discussed the idea of ritual as the foundation of statecraft, and the Zuo Commentary to the Springs and Autumns (Zuozhuan 左傳), in particular, is famous for its scenes in which a ruler who is about to attack his neighbor publicly justifies his aggression on the grounds that he is merely “punishing” his enemy’s intolerable violations of ritual. But Xunzi raises the significance of ritual to a new level: in his view, the ruler’s ability to govern his state in accordance with ritual is the sole criterion that will determine success or failure on the battlefield (Xunzi 15.1c; see also Xunzi 16.1).

Having established that “exalting ritual” (longli 隆禮) is the true path to order and strength, Xunzi expatiates in characteristic language:

When kings and dukes follow [the rituals], that is how they obtain the world; when they do not follow them, that is how they bring about the perdition of their altars of soil and grain. (Xunzi 15.4)

Even advanced military technology is no match for a king who “exalts ritual and esteems morality”.

Accordingly, in two passages assessing the mighty state of Qin 秦—which would go on to unify the Chinese world under the infamous First Emperor (r. 221–210 BCE)—Xunzi acknowledged its power but diagnosed a correctible weakness: it lacked schooled moral advisors (like himself) to guide the ruler and save him from self-defeating avarice and aggression. Such counselors, moreover, should have a Confucian orientation (Xunzi 8.2–10 and 16.4–6). The judgment of most ancient writers is that Qin never corrected this weakness.

4. The Source of the Rituals: Heaven (tian 天) and the Way (dao 道)

Xunzi places so much emphasis on the role of the rituals in moral self-cultivation that one might ask how the sages managed to perfect themselves when they did not have such a model themselves. A glimpse of the answer was already afforded by Xunzi’s insistence that the rituals surpass any arbitrary code of conduct because they accord with fundamental human tendencies. But elsewhere the question is addressed more fully. The rituals, it turns out, are the equivalent of helpful signposts. Just as those who ford rivers “mark” (biao 表) treacherous spots, the sages “marked the Way” (biao dao 表道) by means of rituals, so that people would no longer stumble (Xunzi 17.11).

The Way that Xunzi invokes in this simile is sometimes called “constancy” (chang 常). Heaven’s processes (tianxing 天行) do not change from one epoch to the next;[7] thus one must learn how to respond to them with “the right order” (zhi 治), whereafter it would be either ignorant or hypocritical to blame Heaven for one’s misfortune. When a ruler governs a state well, there are bound to be good results; when a ruler governs a state badly, there are bound to be bad results. Disasters can have no long-term consequences because a well governed state will prosper even in the face of disasters, and a poorly governed state will be vanquished even if it avoids disasters altogether. (Xunzi’s opinion of foreseeable natural disasters such as hurricanes would undoubtedly have been that they strike all states, but a well governed state will be prepared for such an event, whereas a poorly governed state will be in no position to respond to the crisis.) Consequently, Heaven plays a sure but indirect role in determining our fortune or misfortune. Heaven never intercedes directly in human affairs, but human affairs are certain to succeed or fail according to a timeless pattern that Heaven determined before human beings existed. “The revolutions of the sun, moon, and stars, and the cyclical calendar—these were the same under Yu 禹 and Jie 桀” (Xunzi 17.4), he notes, referring to a paradigmatic sage king and tyrant, respectively. The same is true of the regular and predictable sequence of the seasons—a particularly significant example, as we shall see.

Next, Xunzi makes a crucial distinction between knowing Heaven (zhi tian 知天) and knowing the Way (zhi dao 知道). The former is impossible, and therefore a waste of time to attempt, but the latter is open to all who try. To cite a modern parallel, it is not difficult to understand how the force of gravity works by carefully observing its effects in the phenomenal world, but to understand why gravity works is a different matter altogether. Xunzi would say that one should constrain one’s inquiries to learning how gravity works, and then think about how to apply this irresistible force of nature to improve the lives of humankind (Fraser 2016: 297–300). His attitude was not scientific in our sense. Speaking of “those who are enlightened about the distinction between Heaven and human beings”, he says:

Their aspiration with respect to Heaven is no more than to observe the phenomena that can be taken as regular periods (e.g., the progression of the seasons or stars). Their aspiration with respect to Earth is no more than to observe the matters that yield (sc. crops). Their aspiration with respect to the four seasons is no more than to observe the data that can be made to serve [humanity]. Their aspiration with respect to yin 陰 and yang 陽 is no more than to observe their harmonious [interactions] that can bring about order. (Xunzi 17.3b)

Thus rituals are not merely received practices or convenient social institutions; they are practicable forms in which the sages aimed to encapsulate the fundamental patterns of the universe. No human being, not even a sage, can know Heaven, but we can know Heaven’s Way, which is the surest path to a flourishing and blessed life. Because human beings have limited knowledge and abilities, it is difficult for us to attain this deep understanding, and therefore the sages handed down the rituals to help us follow in their footsteps.

5. Is the Way Discovered or Constructed?

Although this discussion has presented the Way as an unchanging cosmological reality to which we must conform (or suffer the consequences), it is sometimes understood, rather, as having been constructed by human beings. A.C. Graham first raised this issue by asking, “Is Xunzi saying that man imposes his own meaning on an otherwise meaningless universe?” (Graham 1989: 243). Although Graham himself answered his question in the negative, others have since pressed the point further. This is probably the greatest controversy in Xunzi studies today.

One passage, in particular, is frequently cited as support for a constructivist position (Hagen 2007: 11.n31; Tang 2016: 59, 75, 118): “The Way is not the Way of Heaven, nor the Way of Earth; it is what people regard as the Way, what the noble man is guided by” (Xunzi 8.3). This seems to say, despite what we have seen about apprehending the constancy of Heaven and then applying it profitably to daily life, that we are supposed to disregard the Way of Heaven, and create our own Way instead. The basic problem is that the surviving text of Xunzi is vague enough to permit various interpretations, but the repeated references to the importance of observing and appropriately “responding” (ying 應) to the seasons would seem to rule out the interpretation that natural patterns are not to be taken as normative.

Yang Liang 楊倞 (fl. 818 CE), the author of the oldest extant commentary on Xunzi, evidently recognized this problem, and tried to soften the impact of Xunzi 8.3 by making it fit with the rest of the text:

This emphasizes that the Way of the Former Kings was not a matter of yin and yang, or mountains and rivers, or omens and prodigies, but the Way that people practice.

Yang Liang’s opinion is surely not decisive: he was but an interpreter, not the master himself, and his glosses are not always regarded as the most compelling today. But in this case he may have been right that Xunzi meant to say no more than that the Way is to be found not in prodigies and other freakish occurrences, but in the “constancies” that people can put into practice. Indeed, the very notion that the Way of Heaven, the Way of Earth, and the Way of human beings are distinct entities would contradict the frequently reiterated point that there is only one Way, e.g., “There are no two Ways in the world, and the Sage is never of two minds” (Xunzi 21.1). This single and holistic Way, moreover, serves as the enduring standard for all times because all ramified truths of the universe are unified within it (Xunzi 5.5, 21.6b, and 22.6b).

What we need to understand, then, is the Way as it pertains to human beings. Unusual celestial phenomena such as shooting stars must, theoretically, be explainable by a comprehensive formulation of the Way—there can be no violations of the Way in the natural world—but this is exactly why we do not aim for a comprehensive formulation of the Way (cf. Hutton 2016a: 81–83). We can safely ignore shooting stars as irrelevant to human beings because they do not provide replicable patterns for use in moral and social development. Responding to the seasons with timely planting and harvesting is, once again, a more productive model.

6. Portents (yao 祅)

In accordance with his notion of the Way as the observable “constancies” that can be profitably applied to human conduct, Xunzi argued strongly against the notion that weird occurrences on earth can be rationalized as monitory signs from Heaven. Superficially terrifying occurrences such as shooting stars or squalling trees are merely “shifts in Heaven and Earth, transformations of yin and yang, material anomalies” (Xunzi 17.7). We should be concerned instead with “human portents” (renyao 人祅), a term that would have seemed as counterintuitive in Xunzi’s language as it does in ours. “Human portents” are the many shortsighted and immoral acts through which human beings bring on their own destruction: “poor plowing that harms the harvest, hoeing and weeding out of season, governmental malice that causes the loss of the people” (Xunzi 17.7). Heaven has no part in such wrongdoing. Now and then strange things may happen in the skies, but they have happened at all moments in history, and they have never been sufficient to destroy a prudent and moral society—whereas an imprudent and immoral society will fail even if it is spared an eclipse.

Xunzi even extends this theory of “human portents” to contend that religious ceremonies have no numinous effect; we carry them out merely for their inherent beauty and the social cohesion that they promote.[8]

If the sacrifice for rain [is performed], and it rains, what of it? I say: It is nothing. Even if there had been no sacrifice, it would have rained. … Thus the noble man takes [these ceremonies] to be embellishment, but the populace takes them to be spiritual. To take them as embellishment is auspicious; to take them as spiritual is inauspicious. (Xunzi 17.8)

7. Rectifying Names (zhengming 正名)

Xunzi’s famous essay on language, “Rectifying Names” (“Zhengming” 正名) includes some impressive insights into the nature of verbal communication (William S-Y. Wang 1989: 186–89), but the primary concern of the chapter is morality, not linguistics (Fraser 2016: 293–96). The thrust of the essay is easily missed because a few of Xunzi’s comments sound as though they came out of a modern pragmatics textbook, e.g., “Names have no inherent appropriateness. We designate them [by some word] in order to name them” (Xunzi 22.2g). Although this may sound like something that Ferdinand de Saussure (1857–1913) could have written, Xunzi was not interested in the same questions as modern linguists. In “Rectifying Names”, Xunzi also discusses sophistic paradoxes that were rampant in his day (the most famous being “A white horse is not a horse”),[9] dividing them into three typological categories. His conclusion discloses that his main purpose is not a proper taxonomy of falsidical paradoxes (for this term, see Quine 1976: 3), but an assertion of the moral purpose of language:

All heretical theories and aberrant sayings depart from the correct Way and are presumptuously crafted according to these three categories of delusion. (Xunzi 22.3d)

The paradoxes of the sophists cannot be used as a basis for moral governance, and thus would be objectionable even if they were not in fact false; they are “disputes with no use” (Xunzi 6.6).

The only legitimate purpose of language, like that of government itself, is to serve as the king’s tool in propagating moral excellence:

When one who is a king determines names, if names are fixed and realities distinguished, if the Way is practiced and his intentions communicated, then he may cautiously lead the people and unify them by this means. (Xunzi 22.1c)

The task of determining names and then enforcing their use belongs to the king alone, not to any lord and certainly not to the people. “One who is a king” (wangzhe 王者) refers not to the person who happens to be sitting on the throne, but someone who has lived up to the moral requirements of that office and duly rules the world by his charismatic example. Accordingly, a phrase like “leading and unifying the people” refers not to expedient rulership, but to implementing the Confucian project of morally transforming the world. Language is useful in that enterprise because, without it, the people could not even understand the ruler’s wishes, let alone carry them out.

Just as the rituals need to be based on the foundation of the Way, the ruler’s names, though they can be arbitrary as designations, must correspond to reality. You can make up the word for “reality”, but you cannot make up reality. “Same and different” (tongyi 同異) are distinguished by the so-called “Heaven-endowed bureaux” (tianguan 天官), i.e. the eyes, ears, mouth, nose, body, and heart-mind. For most of these, we might say “senses” or “sense organs” in English, but the heart-mind (xin 心) is an exceptional case, for it is said to be able to distinguish “statements, reasons, happiness, resentment, grief, joy, love, hate, and desire” (Xunzi 22.d), which are not simply sense data. The heart-mind will be treated more fully in the next section.

The suggestion that we rely upon our senses to perceive the world around us represents a substantial claim on Xunzi’s part, because other philosophers had already suggested that reality is not straightforwardly discerned; on the contrary, one’s partial perspective on reality necessarily informs one’s perception of it. This was, essentially, the argument in “Discourse on the Equality of Things” (“Qiwu lun” 齊物論), an important chapter in Zhuangzi 莊子 (e.g., Graham 1989: 176–83). For Xunzi, however, reality is reality, regardless of how we perceive it. Once again, some scholars (e.g., Hagen 2007: 59–84) question whether Xunzi is such a strong realist, but a constructivist interpretation is difficult to reconcile with Xunzi’s repeated assertions that language must conform to reality and the Way, e.g., “Names are that by which one defines different real objects” (Xunzi 22.3f).

8. The Heart-Mind (xin)

In many respects, the heart-mind is the keystone of Xunzi’s philosophy, the one piece that links together all the others. The Chinese word xin means “heart”, but Xunzi attributes such strong and varied mental processes to this organ that one has to construe it as not only the heart but also the mind. (The mind was not located in the brain in premodern Chinese philosophy.)

First, the heart-mind is the organ that we use to discover the Way. Xunzi’s discussion of Heaven presents his argument that moral self-cultivation is a matter of correctly perceiving and then applying the Way, but does not explain how we perceive the Way in the first place. Elsewhere, he states explicitly that we come “to know the Way” by means of our heart-mind (Xunzi 21.5d), which has three cardinal attributes: “emptiness” (xu 虛) “unity” (yi 壹), and “tranquility” (jing 靜). Xunzi patently borrowed these three terms from earlier discourse, particularly Zhuangzi (e.g., Yearley 1980; Goldin 1999: 22–31; Stalnaker 2003), and uses them to denote three nurturable faculties that we all possess from birth, but do not employ to the same degree. (The title of the relevant chapter, “Resolving Blindness”, refers to the self-destructive acts that people undertake because they fail to employ their heart-minds correctly.) “Emptiness” refers to the heart-mind’s ability to store a seemingly unlimited amount of information: we do not have to erase one datum in order to make room for another. “Unity” refers to the heart-mind’s ability to synthesize diverse data into meaningful paradigms. And “tranquility” refers to the heart-mind’s ability to distinguish fantasy from rational thinking. Armed with these powers, we can infer the patterns of the Way by taking in, and then pondering, the data transmitted to the heart-mind by the senses.

In addition, the heart-mind is the chief among the organs. It is the only organ that can command the others; indeed, it is the only organ with any self-consciousness. “The mind is the lord of the body … It issues commands but does not receive commands” (Xunzi 21.6a). Because the heart-mind can control both itself and all other organs of the body, it is the font of “artifice”, or the deliberate actions that begin to transform the morally deficient xing: “When the heart-mind reasons and the other faculties put it into action—this is called ‘artifice’” (Xunzi 22.1b). The heart-mind is capable of overriding every human impulse, even the instinct of self-preservation, if it conflicts with the correct “patterns” (li 理).[10] We have the necessary faculties to recognize immorality when we see it, and if we permit ourselves to tread an immoral path, we cannot blame our emotions or desires, but must accept that our heart-mind has failed to exert the requisite discipline. We know that we could have done better. Indeed, when we speak of “we”, we are speaking of our heart-mind. For the heart-mind is the crucible where these teeming moral deliberations take place.

Thus Xunzi ends, like all Confucians, with individual responsibility: in his case, the heart-mind’s obligation to process the principles of the Way and then command the rest of the body to conform. Because we are not sages, we are advised to follow the rituals in order to attain this degree of understanding, but, fundamentally, the path to morality is open to anyone who sees and thinks (Xunzi 8.11 and 23.5b).

Xunzi’s conception of the heart-mind also figures in a distinctive congruence that he postulates between a kingdom and a human being. A kingdom possesses an initial set of features—it may be large or small, rich or poor, hilly or flat—but these are immaterial to its ultimate success or failure, for any territory, however small, provides enough of a base for a sage to conquer the world. Thus it is the management of the state, and not its natural resources, that determine whether it will become the demesne of a king or be conquered by its neighbors. This management, furthermore, comprises two elements: a proper method, namely the rituals of the sage kings; and a decisive agent, namely the lord, who chooses either to adopt the rituals or unwisely discard them.

In much the same way, human beings are made up of two parts: their xing, or detestable initial condition, and wei, their conscious conduct. They may reform themselves or they may remain detestable: this depends entirely on their conduct. The management of the self, just like the management of the state, comprises two elements: a proper method, which is, once again, the rituals of the sage kings; and a decisive agent, which chooses either to adopt the rituals or unwisely discard them. This agent, the analogue of the lord of a state, is the heart-mind (Goldin 1999: 16–17).[11] As in the Broadway song, “It’s not where you start; it’s where you finish” (Fields et al. 1973 [1975: 54]).

9. Xunzi’s Reception after His Death

At[12] the end of his life, Xunzi was the leading teacher and philosopher in the Chinese world. Among his former students were some of the most influential men in politics, including Han Fei 韓非 (d. 233 BCE), Li Si 李斯 (d. 208 BCE), and Zhang Cang 張蒼 (ca. 250–151 BCE), as well as transmitters of several leading redactions of canonical texts, including Fuqiu Bo 浮丘伯 and perhaps Mao Heng 毛亨 (Goldin 1999: xii).

The early Han 漢 dynasty statesman Lu Jia 陸賈 (ca. 228–ca. 140 BCE) is sometimes said to have been Xunzi’s student as well (e.g., by Tang Yan 唐晏 [1857–1920] in Wang Liqi 1986: 222–23), but the two men’s dates make this relationship unlikely. Perhaps Lu Jia was a disciple of Fuqiu Bo, and thus an intellectual grandson of Xunzi. Regardless, the strongest evidence of Lu Jia’s indebtedness to Xunzi lies on the level of ideas (Li Dingfang 1980). Like Xunzi, Lu Jia appealed to the classics, the sages’ textual legacy, as the best practical guide to government and moral self-cultivation (Puett 2002: 253–54; Jin Chunfeng 2006: 73–74). But Lu’s most important philosophical thesis is that human beings bring about auspicious and inauspicious omens through their own actions.

Xunzi, we recall, argued strongly against the belief in Heavenly portents. Lu Jia accepted Xunzi’s framework, but with a single, consequential innovation: people bring about their own fortune or misfortune by emitting qi 氣:

Thus when societies fail and the Way is lost, it is not the work of Heaven. The lord of the state has done something to cause it. Bad government breeds bad qi; bad qi breeds disasters and abnormalities. (Wang Liqi 1986: 155)

By adding the element of qi—a term that Xunzi rarely used, and certainly did not build into his metaphysics—Lu Jia retains Xunzi’s volitionless and mechanistic Heaven but forges a novel philosophical justification for the arcane science of omenology, which Xunzi mercilessly deprecated. Where Xunzi counseled us to ignore abnormalities, Lu Jia accepts their validity as “admonitions” (jie 誡). But, once again, Heaven itself has no effect on our success or failure. If we are faced with a host of wood-boring caterpillars, to use Lu’s vivid example, the only way to account for them is to acknowledge that our government is responsible for their generation through its maleficent conduct (Zhou Guidian 1999: 51–53; Puett 2002: 249–52). Two coeval philosophers, Jia Yi 賈誼 (201–169 BCE) and Dong Zhongshu 董仲舒 (ca. 198–ca. 107 BCE), agreed that human beings are responsible for their own fortune or misfortune, and thus have no cause to blame Heaven, although Jia Yi did not refer to qi in prosecuting his theory, whereas Dong Zhongshu did (Goldin 2007).

Dong Zhongshu is reported to have written a paean to Xunzi (now lost), and writers of late antiquity, such as Wang Chong 王充 (27–ca. 100 CE) and Ban Gu 班固 (32–92 CE), still took him seriously as a philosopher. But thereafter, Xunzi’s star began to set. In later centuries, the two tirelessly repeated clichés about Xunzi were that he propagated the anti-Mencian doctrine that human nature is evil, and that, by serving as Li Si’s and Han Fei’s teacher, he furthered the cause of Legalism (fajia 法家) and thus subverted high-minded principles. Ji Kang 嵇康 (223–262), for example, obliquely identified Xunzi as the chief architect of everything that Ji and his group disdained: artificial ritualism, counterfeit erudition, and an oppressive network of laws that serve only to interfere with the innocuous enjoyment of life (Goldin 2007: 140–42).

By the Tang 唐 dynasty, even literati who admired Xunzi—such as Han Yu 韓愈 (768–824)—were careful to add that his works contain grave mistakes (Kong Fan 1997: 281; Liu Youming 2006: 48–50). In the Song 宋, there were still some voices that praised him, but the opinion with the greatest long-term consequences was that of Zhu Xi 朱熹 (1130–1200), who declared that Xunzi’s philosophy resembled those of non-Confucians such as Shen Buhai 申不害 (fl. 354–340 BCE) and Shang Yang 商鞅 (d. 338 BCE), and that he was indirectly responsible for the notorious disasters of the Qin dynasty (Kong Fan 1997: 291–95). For the rest of imperial history, Xunzi was rejected by the cultural mainstream;[13] into the twentieth century, he was criticized by intellectuals such as Kang Youwei 康有爲 (1858–1927), Tan Sitong 譚嗣同 (1865–1898), and Liang Qichao 梁啟超 (1873–1929) as the progenitor of the Confucian scriptural legacy, which, in their view, had derailed the original Confucian mission and plunged China into a cycle of authoritarianism and corruption that lasted more than two thousand years.

Today the tide has reversed almost completely. Xunzi is one of the most popular philosophers throughout East Asia, and has been the subject of a large number of books published over the past two decades. From a twenty-first-century perspective, this revival of interest in Xunzi is not hard to explain: his body of work has always been one of the best preserved, and with the commonplace scholastic objections to his philosophy having lost most of their cogency, it is only to be expected that philosophical readers should be attracted to his creative but rigorous arguments. In this sense one could say that Xunzi has finally been restored, more than two millennia after his death, to his erstwhile position as zui wei lao shi.


Chinese Editions of Xunzi

  • Wang Tianhai 王天海, 2005, Xunzi jiaoshi 荀子校釋, 2 vols, Shanghai: Guji.
  • Wang Xianqian 王先謙 (1842–1918), 1988, Xunzi jijie 荀子集解, edited by Shen Xiaohuan 沈嘯寰 and Wang Xingxian 王星賢, 2 vols, Beijing: Zhonghua.

English Translations

  • Dubs, Homer H. (1892–1969) (tr.), 1927, The Works of Hsüntze. London: Probsthain.
  • Hutton, Eric L. (tr.), 2014, Xunzi: The Complete Text, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Knoblock, John (tr.), 1988–94, Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works, 3 volumes, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Watson, Burton (tr.), 2003, Xunzi: Basic Writings, New York: Columbia University Press. [Abridged.]

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  • Fields, Dorothy, William Gibson, Cy Coleman, and Michael Bennett, 1973 [1975], Seesaw: A Musical, New York: Samuel French.
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  • Tang, Siufu, 2016, Self-Realization through Confucian Learning: A Contemporary Reconstruction of Xunzi’s Ethics, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
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  • Wang, William S-Y., 1989, “Language in China: A Chapter in the History of Linguistics”, Journal of Chinese Linguistics, 17(2): 183–222.
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  • Yearley, Lee H., 1980, “Hsün Tzu on the Mind: His Attempted Synthesis of Confucianism and Taoism”, Journal of Asian Studies, 39(3): 465–480. doi:10.2307/2054674
  • –––, 2014, “Xunzi: Ritualization as Humanization”, in Kline and Tiwald 2014: 81–106.
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Other Internet Resources

  • Robins, Dan, “Xunzi,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2018/entries/xunzi/>. [This was the previous entry on Xunzi in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
  • Xunzi, entry by David Elstein (SUNY/New Paltz) in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Xunzi, entry by Ulrich Theobald (University of Tübingen) on chinaknowledge.de website.

Copyright © 2018 by
Paul R. Goldin <prg@sas.upenn.edu>

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