John Italos

First published Mon May 13, 2024

John Italos (fl. 1070s) was a prominent and controversial intellectual figure in eleventh-century Byzantium. An immigrant from Byzantine Italy, he made a stellar career in Constantinople succeeding Michael Psellos as head of the imperially sponsored school of philosophy. His dialectical method and combative temper made him a renowned figure in the Eastern Mediterranean. Among his students counted the future Constantinopolitan elite as well as foreigners from the Latin West, the Near East, and the Caucasus. His meteoric rise and Platonic teachings gained him not only admiration but also fierce opposition, which led to his repeated investigation in 1076/77 and 1082. Ultimately, an ecclesiastical synod condemned him for heterodoxy in 1082 and forced him to retire from public life. Italos’ legacy is a contested one. He has been seen as a staunch heretic by those who accept the condemnation at face value and as a Socratic free-thinker by those who see him as a victim of political intrigue. The debate over the significance of his condemnation has dominated the study of Italos and has decisively shaped the reconstruction of his teachings.

1. Life and Work

Our knowledge of Italos’ life rests largely on the account of Anna Komnēnē, who describes his origin and character in her Alexiad (V.8–9), which was written in hindsight in the 1140s. She gives an overtly hostile account of the philosopher and presents him as the exact opposite of what an acculturated Byzantine was supposed to be (Arabatzis 2002). Notwithstanding her bias, Komnēnē’s account relates the key milestones of Italos’ life, with the exception of his dates of birth and death, which are unknown. Italos was probably born in southern Italy in c. 1030, at a time when the region was still under Byzantine control. He spent his formative years in the company of his father, who was a soldier. As a battle-hardened youth, who had undergone some kind of elementary education, Italos moved to Constantinople around 1050, possibly as a refugee. In the capital he received a literary education and joined the circle of the polymath Michael Psellos. Psellos praised Italos’ forceful use of argumentation, which compensated for his lack of linguistic elegance (Or. min. 19). Elsewhere (Or. min. 18), he reprimanded his student’s utilitarian approach, which aided his dialectical exploration and profitable advancement but precluded him from properly examining and teaching certain disciplines, such as geometry.

Italos’ argumentative fervor earned him both praise and criticism. His alleged temperament (cf. Hunger 1987, 38) and strict argumentativeness endeared him to his students, who included members of the ecclesiastical hierarchy and the imperial court. Due to his political network and Italian provenance, he was sent on a diplomatic mission to the Normans in the mid-1070s. During his mission, he was accused of treason, whereupon he fled to Rome. He was pardoned shortly thereafter by Emperor Michael VII and returned to Constantinople. Around the year 1076, he succeeded Psellos as Consul of the philosophers (hypatos tōn philosophōn), i.e., as the head of the school of philosophy. About this time, he was accused of heterodoxy, but the emperor, whose patronage he enjoyed, intervened on his behalf and ensured that he was acquitted. Yet the bad repute stayed with Italos. Following the usurpation of Emperor Alexios I in 1081, Italos was put on trial again and was found guilty of heterodoxy in March 1082. Most significantly, his dialectical method and his Platonic teachings were judged objectionable. Thereafter, Italos disappeared from the public sphere. Although there is some evidence that suggests he may have been partially rehabilitated (Magdalino 1996, 23, cf. Alexiad V.9.7), he was never reinstated in his teaching position.

It stands to reason to assume that many of Italos’ writings were destroyed following his condemnation. The practice of destroying the works of the anathematized is documented in the case of Italos’ student Eustratios of Nicaea (Joannou 1954, 378); however, we lack such explicit information in Italos’ case. Be that as it may, what has come down to us are his Quaestiones quodlibetales, a variety of logical treatises (De dialectica, De syllogismis, In Aristotelis Topicorum commentaria, Synopsis minor in Porphyrii Isagogem), a manual on rhetorics (De rhetorica), a few scholia on Pseudo-Dionsyius, and – possibly – an apologetic letter addressed to the Patriarch (Epistula apologetica ad patriarcham). The epistle describes a situation that resembles Italos’ condemnation: the author complains that he was convicted in an unfair trial, in which his statements were deliberately distorted. Yet there are some incongruities with what we know of Italos’ two trials, which call into question its authenticity (Gouillard 1985a). Likewise, the authenticity of the summary on Porphyry’s Isagoge (Synopsis minor in Porphyrii Isagogem) has been impugned (Rigo 2001, 65). But its succinct style, the explicit attribution to Italos in the manuscript tradition, and the preference for the Aristotelian example of “goat-stag” (traghelaphos; a fictional animal), which Italos employs also in Qu 3 and Qu 28 (cf. Romano 1994), speak in favor of its authenticity. The text briefly defines the five voices (genus, species, difference, property, and accident – the universals distinguished by Porphyry) and discusses their interrelationship (Romano 1992). Probably also by Italos are the three scholia on the first chapter of Ps-Dionysios’ De Coelesti Hierarchia that are contained in a single Florentine manuscript (Laur. plut. V.13) (Rigo 2006). The scholia point out – among other issues – that the celestial hierarchy is an intelligible realm that is completely devoid of matter and thus does not undergo generation and corruption.

Italos’ undisputed writings include De rhetorica. It has been shown that this work is not an actual summary of Aristotle’s Rhetoric but rather a compilation from commentaries and prolegomena that were available to Italos (Conley 1998; 2004). In particular, it is remarkable that Italos does not mention enthymēmata (rhetorical demonstrations), which indicates that he did not have first-hand knowledge of the Rhetoric. Similarly, Italos’ commentary on books II-IV of Aristotle’s Topics (In Aristotelis Topicorum commentaria) does not offer an independent exposition of the Aristotelian work but draws heavily on Alexander of Aphrodisias’ commentary (Wallies 1891; Kotzabassi 1999). Italos’ interest in the Topics is evident also in his De dialectica and De syllogismis. In the former work he defines dialectics as the intermediary between the demonstrative and sophistic arts. Its purpose is to train the mind and to reason well – relying on common beliefs (endoxa) – whenever demonstrative proof cannot be given (§6). By drawing consistently on Aristotle’s Topics and Prior Analytics, he offers an introduction to Aristotelian dialectics and syllogistic, which he dedicated to the co-emperor Andronikos Doukas. He continued his introduction in De syllogismis, which starts by distinguishing the matter (premises) from the form (figures) of syllogisms. He goes on to differentiate ten kinds (topoi) to construct syllogisms (§7), which he discusses in detail (§§8–32) before providing a synopsis of Aristotle’s Topics II-VI (§§33-89). The logical treatises show Italos as an author who – much like Aristotle – shunned redundancy, expressing himself succinctly to the point of occasional obscurity. They also show him as a teacher who composed epitomes for the courtly intelligentsia.

Italos’ most important work is his Quaestiones quodlibetales (Questions and Answers or Ἀπορίαι καὶ λύσεις). It comprises a collection of 93 aporetic chapters, in which Italos discusses various issues related to logic, epistemology, ethics, physics, and theology. The collection stands in the tradition of eleventh-/twelfth-century erōtapokriseis (e.g., Michael Psellos’ De omnifaria doctrina, Symeōn Sēth’s Conspectus rerum naturalium). Ιt was not compiled by Italos himself, given that it contains spurious works (Qu 59) and lecture notes by his students (Qu 44). Yet the bulk of the miscellany is authentic. It contains references to Italos’ oral teachings (e.g., Qu 63, 68) and a number of works dedicated to members of the imperial court. Qu 43 was written in response to an inquiry by co-emperor Andronikos Doukas regarding a Homeric passage (Trizio 2013), Qu 50 instructs Emperor Michael VII on the post-mortem fate of the soul, and Qu 71 proves to an unspecified emperor (possibly Alexios I) that the world is not everlasting. The work also contains a letter to an unspecified Abkhazian grammarian (Qu 64), who may be identified with the Georgian philosopher Ioane Petritsi (Kechagmadze 1967). The Quaestiones comprise a miscellany whose compositional technique and variegated contents remain to be studied.

2. Teachings

Italos’ extant writings are mostly didactic treatises written for his students. The esoteric nature of these writings explains in part their succinct and unadorned style. Moreover, the treatises presume the reader’s familiarity not only with the school curriculum but also with Italos’ own views. As has been noted, it is difficult to reconstruct a philosophical system on the basis of didactic epitomes and commentaries alone (Stéphanou 1957, 433). Notwithstanding this limitation, the Quaestiones are our best source for piecing together Italos’ teachings. Supplementary sources are the trial records, the Synodikon anathemas, the Alexiad, and the Timarion. These sources provide crucial testimonies, but they are hostile towards the philosopher and must be taken cum grano salis. The reconstruction of Italos’ teachings largely rests on one’s decision about 1) the reliability of those hostile accounts and 2) the trustworthiness of Italos’ own statements. For instance, the Alexiad and the Synodikon anathemas both claim that Italos taught the transmigration of souls and the eternity of Platonic ideas, while holding a blasphemous attitude towards the saints. However, these views cannot be corroborated with Italos’ own statements, unless one allows for some degree of distortion and/or dissimulation. One way of making sense of the discrepancies between Italos’ writings and later testimonies is to assume that Italos took part in an intellectual struggle between two factions: on the one end stood radical Hellenizers and, on the other, orthodox fundamentalists (e.g., the authors of the Synodikon anathemas). Italos represented a middle position, which sought to harmonize Hellenic learning with the Christian faith (Masai 1956, 292). Owing to his tightrope position, he was vilified by extremists on both sides. The following exposition of Italos’ teachings on logic, the cosmos, ethics, the soul, and God reflects his coherent and eclectic Christian Platonism.

2.1 Logic

The greater part of the Quaestiones discusses logic. In Qu 7, Italos explains that substances (ousiai) are authyparkta, that is, they are entities that exist on their own, independently from accidents. He follows Michael Psellos in holding that, on the one hand, substances are created beings and thus dependent on divine causality, yet on the other hand, they are autonomous entities with regard to accidents (Walter 2021). A recurrent issue is the nature of universals. Italos follows the Alexandrian tradition in assuming three modes of existence for universals: they exist as separate entities prior to the particulars (ante res, pro tōn pollōn), they exist together with the particulars (in rebus, en tois pollois), and they exist after the particulars as abstractions of the mind (post res, epi tois pollois). The latter derive from the apprehension of common characteristics in the particulars. Given that all universals exist in the mind of God (ante res), their absence from particulars (in rebus) precludes only their existence in our mind (post res) and not their absolute non-existence. This tripartite mode of being, which was championed by Ammonius Hermiae (d. c. 526), was adopted by John Italos. In Qu 5, Italos discusses the differences between those three kinds, noting that universals (ante res) exist in God’s mind and that they are the paradigms of perceptible individuals. He remarks that universals in the particulars (in rebus) are themselves particulars. In Qu 58, he argues that universals are neither corporeal nor incorporeal and, thus, are not beings (but mere concepts). Elsewhere (Qu 3 & 4), however, he demonstrates that universals are incorporeal in nature and do belong among beings. Universals are beings that subsist in something else (enhypostata, Qu 19) – i.e., either in the particular and/or in the mind. Italos’ repeated discussion of universals testifies to the importance of the topic in the school curriculum and to his adherence to the moderate (or conceptual) realism of the Alexandrian tradition (Benakis 1982, 85; Ierodiakonou 2007; pace Joannou 1956b, 140–146).

2.2 Cosmology

Italos’ indebtedness to the Alexandrian tradition is also apparent in his cosmology. In Qu 71, he sets out to demonstrate the non-eternity of the world, drawing extensively on John Philoponus. The issue whether the world is everlasting or created in the beginning of time was hotly debated among pagan and Christian philosophers of Late Antiquity. John Philoponus (d. c. 570) devoted a number of works to the dispute, refuting the arguments by Aristotle, Porphyry, and Proclus, who all had argued in favor of an everlasting world. Following the sixth century, discussions over the world’s eternity became rare. The debate was revived in the eleventh century in the Constantinopolitan school of philosophy. Italos contributed to the revival with a treatise (Qu 71) that argues that the current world will come to an end and be reconstituted at the resurrection, whereby the world’s form will guarantee its identity (Kraft/Perczel 2018). Italos advances a two-fold argumentation. His first approach is to refute Aristotelian and Proclean arguments and to show that the cosmos must have been created by God’s arbitrary will rather than by divine nature. His refutations manifestly draw on Philoponus (Bydén 2013, 168). One key argument holds that all matter is corruptible and that the notion of an incorruptible matter (i.e., aether) entails a logical contradiction, as two different kinds of matter (corruptible and incorruptible) would require a formal distinction that cannot be attributed to formless matter. In Qu 42, he examines what Plato and Aristotle had to say about the heavens and, in particular, about the fifth element (quintessence, aether). Italos takes a classical reconciliatory approach, arguing that both philosophers were in agreement regarding the body of the heavens: while Plato associated the heavens with a fifth mathematical figure (dodecahedron), Aristotle focused on the physical qualities of the heavens, from which he inferred a fifth element (aether). Italos concludes that it makes no difference whether one talks about a fifth figure (schēma) or a fifth element (stoixeion) (Mariev/Marchetto 2017, 57–62). Qu 42 is a hermeneutical exercise and may not fully reflect Italos’ personal view because, for him, all matter is equally indefinite and inherently non-existent; it is privation, non-being, and the cause of the decay in (and of) the world. Elsewhere (Qu 92), Italos examined in detail the Plotinian and Proclean views of matter. It has been argued that this discussion presents another scholastic exercise, in which Italos opposes two prominent Neoplatonic theories of matter and shows their inconsistency (Stéphanou 1949, 92; Trizio 2014). Thus, it is important to keep in mind the argumentative strategy of a given treatise when interpreting and decoding Italos’ contentions. In regard to Qu 71, Italos’ strategy was to refute eternalist arguments in order to uphold Christian morals. This is made explicit in his second approach, which asserts that Christian piety necessitates the belief in the end of the world. An everlasting world would preclude the last judgment, which is foundational for Christian piety and ethics.

2.3 Ethics

Italos taught a coherent theory on ethics. In Qu 63, he differentiates between different types of virtues: natural virtues, which animals possess and, thus, do not really count as virtues; ethical virtues, which are the first human ones, as they require reason; and higher forms of virtues, which are essential for the union with the One. Italos draws on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (Book II) and establishes that ethical virtues constitute a mean between two extremes. Ethical virtues include the four cardinal virtues: prudence, justice, fortitude, and temperance. These virtues do not constitute a capacity or passion but a habitual state (hexis), which is attained through the use of the rational part of the soul. Italos uses Plato’s tripartite division of the soul into reason (logismos), passion (thymos), and desire (epithymia) (Republic 435c–441c) and the chariot allegory (Phaedrus 246a–254e) to describe the leading role that reason holds in acquiring virtues. In Qu 81, he integrates his views on ethical virtues into the larger framework of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of virtues. Accordingly, Italos identifies Aristotle’s ethical virtues with Plotinus’ political virtues. The political (or civic) virtues are the lowest kinds of (human) virtues and are superseded by the purgative, contemplative, and paradigmatic virtues (cf. Stéphanou 1949, 104–107). Italos closely follows here Plotinus (Enn. I.2) and Porphyry (Sentences, chap. 32) and notes that the notion that political virtue is a mean between extremes does not apply to the higher forms of virtue. By subsuming Aristotelian ethics into the Neoplatonic hierarchy of virtues, Italos promotes a Neoplatonic anthropology: humans are rational souls that seek to return to the intelligible and incorporeal God. Ethical (or political) virtues apply to mankind’s current embodied existence, which forms a mere transitory stage in the preparation of the soul’s return (O’Meara 2021, 145). Thus, when expounding Christ’s injunction to turn the other cheek (Matt. 5:39) in Qu 77, he argues that what Christ meant was to renounce the worldly duality (hylikē dyada) of opinion and reason, matter and form. Overcoming the dualistic (or binary) condition of embodied souls – a result of the Fall – is the ultimate goal of ethical training.

2.4 Psychology

The nature of the soul constitutes a key issue for Italos; he examined it repeatedly (Stéphanou 1933). As a Christian, he believed in the immortality of the soul, but as a Platonist he had to qualify that belief. In Qu 36, Italos contests Plato’s arguments that the soul is immortal because it is a self-moving (Phaedrus 245c–246a) and life-giving (Phaedo 105c–e) principle. The soul’s dependence on the body necessitates its corruptibility. If anything in the soul is immortal then it must be something that operates independently from the body. The only such thing is the intellect. Italos endorses Aristotle’s argument that only the intellect is unaffected by the body and thus incorruptible (De Anima III.5). Accordingly, Italos holds that the intellect survives the body’s death while the other parts of the soul perish. Man is essentially intellect (nous) – a conviction that he reiterates throughout his writings. For instance, in Qu 50 he reaffirms that only the intellectual part of the soul is immortal. When the rational part of the soul detaches itself from the body at the moment of death it loses its ability to undergo motion and change. Italos follows Proclus (Institutio theologica §191) in asserting that the post-mortem soul becomes inactive. Thus, the dead cannot experience any further progress (epidosis, anabasis), and even the deceased saints cannot perform miracles. That is why, his opponents counted Italos among the so-called “deadsoulers” (thnētopsychitai) (Gouillard 1976, 311–312; Krausmüller 2015, 11–15). But Italos concedes that divine grace could, in theory, overcome this incapacity and assist the deceased in their quest for the remission of sin. Qu 86 explores further the perennial issue of the fate of the soul by questioning the identity of our post-resurrection selves with our current selves. Italos argues that identity is a formal principle; corporeality and matter do not play any part in it. After all, our bodies are in constant change and thus cannot safeguard our identity. Italos was well aware of the food-chain argument (Qu 71) and thus rejected the assumption that the resurrection occurs in the very bodies that we currently live in. He held that form (eidos) is the only principle of identity (Stéphanou 1949, 93; Shchukin 2010, 120). At the resurrection this form will be clothed anew in matter, taking on better, less corruptible properties that render the resurrected body a spiritual entity. Italos is consistent in asserting that man’s embodied nature is due to the Fall and that the rational soul strives to return to its original, prelapsarian state as intellect. Put differently, Italos promoted a Christian Platonist (dubbed “Origenist”) psychology and eschatology that postulated a spiritual resurrection and the soul’s gradual return to its intelligible, divine origin (Kraft 2021).

2.5 Theology

Italos’ (Neo-)Platonism is apparent also in his theology. The notions of the hierarchy of causes and of the great chain of being permeate his writings. In Qu 51, when explaining solar eclipses, he asserts that the primary cause of the natural phenomenon is God the Creator, while the secondary cause is the moon that covers the sun (Pontikos 1992, 91). In Qu 68, he gives an account of the three divine hypostases (of the great chain of being) and their triple movement of rest, procession, return (monē, proodos, epistrophē). He identifies the three hypostases with the Trinity, which he makes clear by describing the second hypostasis (nous) in Christological terms. He alludes to John 8:42, thereby equating the second hypostasis with Christ. It is true that the treatise starts by claiming that he merely expounds the teachings of “the best theologians among the pagans”. Yet the scriptural reference and the fact that he used the same terminology in his confession of faith, as recorded in the trial records (Gouillard 1985b, 145.164–168), prove that Italos gives an overview of his own theology in Qu 68 (cf. Shchukin 2008, 250; pace Stéphanou 1949, 91).

Another section of his confession of faith (Gouillard 1985b, 147.218–149.223) has been shown to be an adaptation of the Ps-Athanasian (Quicumque) creed, which was commonly used among the Latins (Grumel 1938). It contains subtle modifications that were understood at the time as indicative of a heretical Trinitology. According to one modern interpretation, Italos followed Philoponus in holding that God’s unity cannot lie on the level of secondary substance (natures or universals) but only on the level of primary substance (hypostases or concrete beings). Accordingly, God’s unity is a hypostatic function, which could be viewed as Tritheism, i.e., the view that three separate divine hypostases exist. This contradicts the standard Cappadocian formula, according to which God’s oneness is due the common divine substance (or nature) of the three hypostases. Thus, Italos sought to counterbalance his Tritheism with a Sabellian solution, merging the three hypostases into one and emphasizing their hypostatic union (Krausmüller 2016). Conversely, it has also been argued that Italos’ application of philosophical terms was in complete harmony with Christian Trinitology (Joannou 1956b; Clucas 1981; Niarchos 1996, 250–258). Such an apologetic reading, however, brushes aside many of Italos’ more subtle remarks.

Yet another passage of his credo (Gouillard 1985b, 153.315–316) stipulates to “worship” (latreuein) the icon of Christ. The unexpected choice of the word “worship” (latreia) should not be seen as a slip of tongue. Italos probably had Heb. 8:5 in mind and held that icons are mere sensible shadows of the intelligible archetype (Christ), which need to be transcended by worshipping the archetype (Shchukin 2008). Elsewhere (Qu 87), Italos chose to quote virtually verbatim from John of Damascus’ first speech of his Orationes de imaginibus tres, which explores the different meanings of images (Nikolaou 2012). That paraphrase shows no indication that he deviated from orthodox icon theology and may have served an apologetic purpose.

Many such ambiguities emerge from Italos’ writings. His stringent and succinct arguments, the dialectical style, and the fragmentary and esoteric nature of his extant writings pose a challenge to the modern reader. The difficulty to reconstruct Italos’ thought is further compounded by the hostile testimonies and by the reasonable assumption that he used at least some degree of dissimulation (Siniossoglou 2011, 82–85; Kaldellis 2012, 141–142). In view of these difficulties, it is not surprising that we still lack a reliable critical edition of the Quaestiones, which distinguishes Italos’ genuine writings from his students’ lecture notes, on the one hand, and from spurious works, on the other. A comprehensive study of Italos’ thought, which remains a desideratum, will also have to examine his philosophical progeny, Eustratios of Nicaea and Ioane Petritsi, who are important witnesses to the thought of Italos’ school.

3. Condemnation and afterlife

Italos’ teachings aroused considerable attention among his contemporaries and were subject of repeated debates. His views were investigated twice by ecclesiastical synods; first in 1076/77, when he was acquitted, and again in 1082, when he was anathematized. The latter trial was a major event at the time. We know about it not only from narrative sources, i.e., Anna Komnēnē (Reinsch/Kambylis 2001, 165–167) and Nikētas Chōniatēs (Tafel 1832, 2–3), but also from legal and liturgical documents, i.e., the trial records (Gouillard 1985b) and the Synodikon of Orthodoxy (Gouillard 1967, 57–61). The Synodikon is a liturgical text that was originally composed in the ninth century to commemorate the restoration of icon veneration at the end of the iconoclast controversy. It was repeatedly updated starting from the second half of the eleventh century, with the condemnations against Italos marking the first major addition. The condemnations consist of ten articles (an eleventh, personal condemnation is contained in some manuscripts), which claim that Italos held divergent views on cosmology, theology, and eschatology. It is unlikely that all the accusations were baseless, although we have to assume that they contain simplifications and distortions of Italos’ actual views.

A key approach to Italos’ philosophy is to compare the condemnations with his extant writings (Stéphanou 1933; Gouillard 1967, 194–200; Clucas 1981; Shchukin 2010). Scholars are in disagreement as to whether Italos did, in fact, deviate from the orthodox norms of his day. It matters little in this respect that Michael Psellos vouched for Italos’ orthodoxy (Or. min. 19). Those who accept the veracity of the ecclesiastical verdict see Italos as a subversive philosopher, whose teachings and methods challenged the orthodox establishment with crypto-pagan wisdom (Nicolaidis 2011, 64–67; Siniossoglou 2011, 82–85). But those who disagree with the verdict see him as a dialectician who explored theological issues with philosophical methods without, however, endorsing any heretical view (Joannou 1956b; Clucas 1981). Accordingly, it was Italos’ philosophical methodology – and not any particular doctrine – that motivated his condemnation (Stéphanou 1949, 117; Ierodiakonou 2007, 24–28; Gutas/Siniossoglou 2017, 290–291). Italos’ legacy ranges from a subversive heretic to a Socratic free-thinker. The large discrepancy in interpretation is in part due to the nature of the sources (didactic treatises and hostile testimonies). In part, it is due to the assumption that Italos’ command of the Greek language was deficient and that he cannot be held fully accountable for his statements (Gouillard 1976, 309; Clucas 1981, 40). It is true that Anna Komnēnē, Michael Psellos, and the Timarion all criticize Italos’ lack of rhetorical eloquence, but this can hardly be taken as a justification of the claim that Italos could not have fully understood the meaning of his own propositions. In fact, the extant writings do not substantiate the view that he did not know Greek proficiently. To be sure, there are occasional textual difficulties, but these are probably due to scribal errors rather than to any linguistic shortcomings of the author.

While views depart on whether Italos actually held heterodox views, there is virtual unanimity in scholarship that he was condemned, at least in part, for political reasons. As head of the school of philosophy, Italos enjoyed the direct patronage of the imperial court under the Doukas dynasty (1059–1081). When Emperor Alexios I usurped the throne in 1081, those connections became disadvantageous. Italos was seen as a threat to the early rule of Alexios I. His daughter, Anna Komnēnē, later recalled that Italos – allegedly – incited his students to insurrection (Alexiad V.9.4; Buckley 2014, 125–129). Other political considerations, such as Italos’ Latin origin and the emperor’s intention to distract public attention from military setbacks, certainly disfavored the philosopher’s position. Moreover, factional rivalry within the school of philosophy (Anastasi 1975, 531) and the tacit socio-economic implications of his Christian Platonism (Kraft 2021) further contributed to his downfall, which should be seen as the outcome of a confluence of several factors.

Italos’ trial in 1082 has been presented as a watershed event not only in Italos’ career but also in the history of science. Accordingly, the condemnation is thought to have inhibited further philosophical exploration of theology and cosmology and contributed to the scientific decline in the Eastern Roman Empire (Stéphanou 1949, 119–121; Browning 1975, 15; Clucas 1981, 172–177). This view can be seen as an inverted mirror image of the ‘Pierre Duhem thesis’, which argued that the Condemnation of 1277 in the Latin West led to the development of modern science. But while the ‘Duhem thesis’ has been met with substantial criticism, the thesis that Italos’ condemnation foreclosed scientific development in Byzantium still awaits refutation.

After the condemnation, Italos disappeared from the public sphere. Yet his legacy was not immediately forgotten. The Timarion, a Lucianic satire of the twelfth century, presents a fictitious narrative in which Italos is rejected by ancient Greek philosophers in Hades for his incorrigible “Galilean” (Christian) mindset. He is also said to be hated by the Christians. Thus, the Timarion depicts Italos as a heretic, who is repelled by both ancient philosophers and contemporary Christians. With regard to the transmission history of his works, we have about two dozen manuscripts that transmit his writings. Two of the earliest manuscript copies date to the thirteenth century and are of southern Italian provenance (Vat. gr. 316 and Marc. gr. Z.265). It has been suggested that Nicholas of Otranto (d. 1235) may have brought Italos’ works from Byzantium to Italy (Romano 1988). No work has yet been done on the reception history of Italos in late Byzantium and beyond, although heuristic comparisons with the late Byzantine philosophers Barlaam the Calabrian (Magdalino 2017) and Gemistos Plēthōn (Siniossoglou 2011), as well as with Ibn Rushd (Lauritzen 2007, 82) and the Renaissance (Dujčev 1939) have been made. The impact Italos had on medieval intellectual history, if any, still remains to be established. In modern times, Italos does not seem to have been read until his rediscovery by nineteenth-century Russian and Georgian scholars (Uspenskiy 1893, 14–18, 46–67; Bezobrazov 1896; Cereteli 1924 & 1926). Thereupon, Hussey (1937, 89–94), Stéphanou (1949), Tatakis (1949, 210–215, 226–227), and Joannou (1956b) introduced him to Western scholarship. In recent decades, Italos has gained prominence among historians of the Byzantine world, first and foremost because of his trial and its assumed significance for the relationship between faith and reason in the Greek Middle Ages. The examination of his philosophical views has received less attention and is still in its infancy.


Primary sources

  • Cereteli, G., 1924 & 1926, Ioannis Itali opuscula selecta, 2 vols., Tbilisi: Typis et impensis Universitatis Tphilisiensis.
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  • Reinsch, D. R., and A. Kambylis, 2001, Annae Comnenae Alexias, Vol. 1 (CFHB, 40/1), Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Rigo, A., 2006, “Giovanni Italos commentatore della Gerarchia celeste dello Pseudo-Dionigi l’Areopagita”, Νέα Ῥώμη, 3: 223–232.
  • Romano, R., 1992, “Un opuscolo inedito di Giovanni Italo”, Bollettino dei classici, ser., III, 13: 1424.
  • Tafel, G. L. F., 1832, Annae Comnenae supplementa, historiam ecclesiasticam Graecorum seculi XI et XII spectantia, Tübingen: Hopfer de l’Orme.
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Secondary literature

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Other Internet Resources


The entry was produced within the framework of the European Union’s Horizon 2020 research and innovation programme under the Marie Skłodowska-Curie grant agreement № 101019501. I thank Michele Trizio and Jonathan Greig for their perceptive feedback on a draft version of the entry.

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