Kant and Hume on Morality
The relation between Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) and David Hume (1711–1776) is a source of widespread fascination. Kant famously credited Hume with waking him from his “dogmatic slumber,” and he describes the Critique of Pure Reason as the solution to the “Humean problem in its greatest possible amplification” (Prol 4:260–61). Much of the focus has been on their respective views in theoretical philosophy, particularly on the nature of causality. Yet many philosophers also find it useful to compare their respective approaches to moral philosophy. Such comparisons provide an opportunity to clarify and assess a number of opposed views in normative ethics, meta-ethics, and moral psychology. Hume’s method of moral philosophy is experimental and empirical; Kant emphasizes the necessity of grounding morality in a priori principles. Hume says that reason is properly a “slave to the passions,” while Kant bases morality in his conception of a reason that is practical in itself. Hume identifies such feelings as benevolence and generosity as proper moral motivations; Kant sees the motive of duty—a motive that Hume usually views as a second best or fall back motive—as uniquely expressing an agent’s commitment to morality and thus as conveying a special moral worth to actions. Comparing their views also illuminates the landscape of eighteenth-century moral philosophy. Although there are many points at which Kant’s and Hume’s ethics stand in opposition to each other, there are also important connections between the two. Kant shared some important assumptions about morality and motivation with Hume, and had, early in his career, been attracted to and influenced by the sentimentalism of Hume and other British moralists, especially Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746).
The aim of this essay is not to compare Hume and Kant on all matters ethical. Instead, we examine several key areas of ethics in which we can reasonably see Kant as responding to or influenced by Hume, or in which comparisons between their theories are particularly interesting. There is more here about Kant than Hume but we include exposition of many of each philosopher’s important arguments so that the reader can make comparisons herself.
- 1. Brief overview of Kant’s ethics
- 2. Brief overview of Hume’s ethics
- 3. Hume’s influence
- 4. Sentimentalism’s influence and the problem of obligation
- 5. Freedom of the will
- 6. Reason and motivation
- 7. Virtues and vices
- 8. Religion and morality
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Although Kant’s ethics are discussed in relation to Hume’s ethics for much of this piece, we begin with five important features of Kant’s mature moral philosophy.
First, Kant places special importance on the a priori or “pure” part of moral philosophy. In Kant’s normative ethics in Metaphysics of Morals and lectures on ethics, Kant draws heavily on observations and ideas about human nature. But both in his normative works and in his foundational work, the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant makes explicit that the supreme moral principle itself must be discovered a priori, through a method of pure moral philosophy (G 4:387–92). By “pure” or “a priori” moral philosophy, Kant has in mind a philosophy grounded exclusively on principles that are inherent in and revealed through the operations of reason. This sort of moral philosophy contrasts with empirical moral philosophy, which is grounded in a posteriori principles, principles inferred through observation or experience. While empirical moral philosophy, which Kant calls moral anthropology, can tell us how people do act, it cannot, Kant claims, tell us how we ought to act. And what we want to find, when we are seeking the supreme moral principle, is not a descriptive principle, but the most fundamental, authoritative normative principle. According to Kant, morality’s commands are unconditional. We could never discover a principle that commands all rational beings with such absolute authority through a method of empirical moral philosophy; we must use the a priori method. Moreover, we must keep the pure and empirical parts of moral philosophy clearly distinguished, since if we do not we could find ourselves confusing conditional truths, such as what is prudentially good for certain individuals or species, with unconditional truths about fundamental moral requirements (G 4:389–90). Once one has in hand the supreme principle of morality, however, one requires an understanding of human beings in order to apply it to them (MM 6:217). One can say little about what the supreme moral principle requires as duties human agents have to themselves and to one another without knowing such things as the sorts of ends people may be inclined to adopt and the conditions under which human agency will characteristically thrive or wither.
Second, Kant’s notion of autonomy is one of the more central, distinctive, and influential aspects of his ethics. Kant defines autonomy principally as “the property of the will by which it is a law to itself (independently of any property of the objects of volition)” (G 4:440). According to Kant, the will of a moral agent is autonomous in that it both gives itself the moral law (it is self-legislating) and can constrain or motivate itself to follow the law (it is self-constraining or self-motivating). The source of the moral law is not in the agent’s feelings, natural impulses or inclinations, but in her pure, rational will or noumenal self, which Kant identifies as the “proper self” (G 4:461). Heteronomous wills, on the other hand, are governed by some external force or authority—that is, by something other than a self-given law of reason. Kant assumes that all nonhuman animals, for example, are heteronomous, their wills governed by nature through their instincts, impulses, and empirical desires (G 4:444; CPrR 5:61).
It will be important in appreciating Kant’s response to Hume to note that, at least in his mature philosophy, Kant regards all moral theories prior to his as failing to explain the categorical nature of moral obligation and to articulate a supreme moral principle that could capture the categorical nature of morality, because those previous moral theories had neither recognized moral agents as autonomous in Kant’s sense, nor recognized that the supreme moral principle must be self-legislated (see Korsgaard 1996b; Wood 2005b; Schneewind 2009). According to Kant, only autonomous legislation can yield a categorical imperative; whereas heteronomous legislation can yield only hypothetical imperatives. Kant criticized for their assumption of heteronomy all theories that located the ground of moral obligation or of proper moral motivation in such things as self-love, sympathy, and fear of divine punishment or hope for divine reward (G 4:441–44; CPrR 5:39–41). It is also worth noticing that in addition to Kant’s describing all moral agents as autonomous (in that they are self-legislating and have the capacity to act rightly through their own self-constraint), Kant sometimes describes as autonomous ways of acting that realize the latter capacity—and as heteronomous ways of acting that fail to do so (G 4:440–41, 444; CPrR 5:29, 43, 78). Agents who are autonomous in the sense of being self-legislating do not consistently act rightly due simply to their commitment to morality; it is that latter way of acting that we might think of as the fullest expression of autonomy in action (cf. Baxley 2010, 57–61).
Third, Kant conceives of the human agent as having both noumenal and phenomenal aspects—or, as Kant sometimes puts it, being members of both the intelligible world and the sensible world. This point relates to the centrality of autonomy in Kant’s ethics, for it is in our membership in the intelligible world that Kant locates our freedom (G 4:451–52, 454; CPrR 5:43). Kant takes us to be both free and determined: free insofar as we are members of the noumenal world, determined insofar as we are members of the world of sense. The sensible world is in time, governed by laws of nature and open to empirical investigation; we are capable of attaining cognition of objects in this world. The noumenal world is neither in time nor governed by the laws of nature, but rather (somehow) grounds the laws that govern the world of sense, and underlies the world of appearance in other ways as well; objects in the noumenal world are not available for our cognition, but may be postulated (A 532–67, 633–35/B 560–95, 661–63; CPrR 5:132–48).
Fourth, Kant believes that morality presents itself to human agents as a categorical imperative, and that it is from this imperative, together with various facts about the world and our embodied agency, that we derive all specific moral duties. Kant says that the supreme moral principle is, for rational beings who do not necessarily follow the moral law, a categorical imperative (CI). It is an imperative because it commands and constrains us; it is a categorical imperative because it commands and constrains us absolutely, with ultimate authority and without regard to our preferences or empirical features or circumstances. A hypothetical imperative, by contrast, expresses a command of reason, but only in relation to an end already set by the agent, e.g., based on her inclinations (G 4:413–20). Perhaps the two best known formulations of the CI are the formula of universal law (FUL), which commands, “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (G 4:421), and the formula of the end in itself (FEI), which commands, “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (G 4:429). These are the versions of the CI that Kant not only discusses, but also illustrates, in the second section of the Groundwork. Although he illustrates FUL and FEI in relation to maxims that he assumes to be obligatory or forbidden in the Groundwork, however, it is not until the Metaphysics of Morals that Kant argues systematically for duties by means of the CI and related principles, the universal principle of right (justice) and the supreme principle of virtue. The Metaphysics of Morals contains a “Doctrine of Right,” in which he explicates our innate right to freedom and discusses matters of private right (e.g., property and marriage) and public right (e.g., the right of the sovereign to punish subjects), and a “Doctrine of Virtue,” in which he explicates his notion of virtue, and argues for duties of virtue (such as the duties of avoiding servility and arrogance, and of promoting the ends of one’s own perfection and the happiness of others). Kant does not claim to derive these duties from the CI or the supreme principles of right or virtue alone. Rather, he draws on considerations regarding human nature and other aspects of the natural world in moving from general principles of morality to moral duties.
Fifth, Kant believes that morality gives rise to a notion of the highest good. Although the end that Kant’s ethics most closely concerns is rational nature (the “end in itself” which grounds moral duties), Kant’s ethics also contains a different sort of ultimate end: the complete object of practical reason, which we can think of all moral action as pointing toward. The highest good consists in a world of universal, maximal virtue, grounding universal, maximal happiness (CPrR 5:110–11). One reason that Kant’s account of the highest good is important is that it emphasizes that, for Kant, virtue is unconditionally good, whereas happiness is conditionally good; happiness is good when and only when it is pursued and enjoyed virtuously. These two components of the highest good are heterogeneous. No amount of happiness can make up for a deficit of virtue, and no amount of virtue—despite its unconditioned goodness—can make up for a deficit of happiness. The highest good requires both. Another reason that Kant’s account of the highest good is important is that Kant often portrays the highest good as a social good for us to strive for collectively, and which we may view history as leading toward; this shows Kant’s ethics to be less abstract and individualistic and more concerned with social and political progress than some of his more foundational writings suggest it is. A final reason that Kant’s account of the highest good is important is that it is through his account of the highest good that Kant argues for the rationality of belief in God and immortality. For example in the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant argues that because reason sets forth the idea of happiness conditioned by and proportionate to virtue as the ultimate culmination of our moral strivings, we must believe this end to be realizable; for if we do not believe it can be realized, we must admit that morality directs us to an empty ideal, and hence is itself fraudulent. But since this end does not seem attainable entirely through human agency in the natural world, we must, if we are to believe it is possible, postulate the existence of God, who mediates between the realms of nature and freedom, allowing morally good intentions to be expressed through actions in the natural world, and virtue to ground proportional happiness (CPrR 5:124–26). This argument does not give us knowledge of God’s existence, but rather practical warrant for belief in God. Moreover, it depends on the impossibility of proving that God does not exist; for this practical warrant would not hold in the face of theoretical proof of God’s nonexistence. But Kant believes that speculative arguments can prove neither God’s existence nor God’s nonexistence. Thus, Kant’s account of the highest good shows how, for Kant, moral commitment leads to religious belief. (Kant also argues that we must postulate the immortality of the soul, since otherwise it seems impossible for us to bring our dispositions into complete compliance with the moral law (CPrR 5:122–24).)
Five important aspects of Hume’s moral theory are the following.
First, Hume’s approach to ethics could be called naturalistic, empirical, or experimental. There are a variety of reasons for this. Hume’s ethics is part of his larger philosophical endeavor to explain naturalistically all aspects of human nature—not just what we can know of the world around us, but also how we make moral judgments and why we have religious beliefs. Hume’s ethics relies on and reflects his philosophy of mind, which is empirical in its approach. He intends to use the same experimental method in analyzing human morality that he uses in analyzing human understanding. Hume treats ethics, together with psychology, history, aesthetics, and politics, as the subject of his “moral science.” Hume often seems more interested in explaining morality as an existing natural phenomenon than in setting out a normative ethical theory. Hume seeks to displace a priori conceptions of human nature and morality with an approach according to which everything about us is open to empirical investigation and to explanation in naturalistic terms. Hume often compares humans with other animals, tracing the bases of human morality to features we share with them. Hume talks about morality and virtue as independent of religion and the supernatural, and about moral action as part of the same physical world in which we reasonably talk of in terms of cause and effect (EHU 8.1.20–22).
Second, according to Hume, moral judgments are essentially the deliverances of sentiment (EPM App.1.3). We recognize moral good and evil by means of certain feelings: the calm pleasure of moral approval or the discomfiting displeasure of moral disapproval, either of which may be felt in contemplating a character trait in oneself or another from an unbiased perspective (“the general point of view”). According to Hume, traits—be they feelings, motives, or abilities—that elicit our approval are those that are useful or agreeable to oneself or others; those that elicit our disapproval are those that are harmful or unpleasant for oneself or others. We call the traits that elicit our approval “virtues,” and those that elicit our disapproval “vices.” Hume assumes that we all have the same moral feelings, that is, that if we all take up the moral point of view, we will all agree in our approvals and disapprovals of various traits. The operation of our sentiments of moral approval and disapproval depend on sympathy, which allows the feelings of one person to be shared by others. Although Hume believes that only human beings experience moral sentiments, he believes that nonhuman animals also have sympathy, and thus share with us one of the essential foundations of morality.
Third, Hume’s ethics contains an extensive and diverse set of virtues. In Hume’s ethics, character traits are the primary object of moral assessment. Acts are judged derivatively, in relation to the traits assumed to cause them. In the Treatise, he divides virtues into the categories of natural virtues (e.g., beneficence and temperance) and artificial virtues (e.g., justice and fidelity to promises). Natural virtues are those traits that are useful or agreeable to people whether or not they are living in a large society, whereas artificial virtues are those traits that emerge as useful or agreeable in social groups that go beyond families or small communities, and in which social cooperation is needed among people with few or no personal ties. Natural virtues produce benefit or enjoyment with far greater reliability than artificial virtues do. Indeed, only natural virtues are characteristically pleasing on all occasions of their expression. Artificial virtues benefit people not consistently on each occasion, but rather through their wide-spread practice over time throughout a community (T 184.108.40.206).
Fourth, Hume provides only a limited (though not unimportant) role to reason in ethics. The principal role that Hume gives to reason in ethics is one of helping agents see which actions and qualities are genuinely beneficial or efficacious. Hume denies that reason itself sets the standard of morality, or sets forth certain ends as morally to be promoted. Reason, according to Hume, is a faculty concerned with truth or falsehood, both demonstrably in the realm of relations of ideas and empirically in the realm of matters of fact. Reason makes inferences, but neither sets ends, nor motivates action. Our ends depend on what we desire, which depends on what we feel (with respect to pleasure and pain). “Reason, being cool and disengaged, is no motive to action, and directs only the impulse received from appetite or inclination, by showing us the means of attaining happiness or avoiding misery: Taste, as it gives pleasure or pain, and thereby constitutes happiness or misery, becomes a motive to action, and is the first spring or impulse to the desire and volition” (EPM App.1.21). Once feeling has established utility as one of the primary objects of morality, reason is essential to determine which character traits or modes and conduct conduce to it. This task is especially difficult with regard to questions of artificial virtues, such as justice, since so many people are involved, and since the social benefits of these virtues can be expected only from (possibly tong-term) collective action (EPM App.1.2). Reason has other roles related to morality, too. For example, Hume notes that in order to make a moral judgment, one must have in mind all the relevant facts, and apprehend all the relevant relations of ideas. This takes reason. The moral judgment itself, however, is not possible without sentiment, which takes in all the deliverances of reason and emerges with something beyond them: the sentiment of approval or disapproval.
Fifth, Hume takes morality to be independent of religion. In his ethical works, he clearly tries to ground morality in human nature, and to make a case for morality that stands just as well without a theistic underpinning as with one. He argues not so much against belief in God as for the irrelevance of God to morality. Moreover, by basing morality in sentiment, he excludes God as a moral assessor. In Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion he considers and refutes the main speculative arguments for the existence of God. In his A Natural History of Religion, he provides an account of how religion emerged from human nature within the human predicament.
Before considering Kant’s response to Hume, we should note a few things about Hume’s influence on German philosophy, and Kant’s access to and direct impression of Hume’s work in ethics.
First, works by prominent British philosophers received much attention in Germany and Prussia in Kant’s day (Kuehn 2001, 107–108, 183). Hutcheson and Hume, for example, were much discussed in the philosophical communities not only in Berlin, but also in Königsberg, where Kant spent his life. The works of these philosophers were translated from English to German, and often reviewed in scholarly journals. Hume’s Enquiry concerning Human Understanding appeared in German in 1755.
Second, it is hard to know exactly which works of Hume and other British moral philosophers Kant read. Kant owned the 1762 German editions of Hutcheson’s An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725) and An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions, with Illustrations of the Moral Sense (1728) (Schneewind 1998, 501). He seems to have read Adam Smith’s Theory of Moral Sentiments in the 1770 German translation (Schneewind 1998, 378). Kant might have had access to a German edition of Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature, since his friend Hamann owned one (Kuehn 2001, 265, 482). Otherwise, we must suppose that his knowledge of it came second hand, from reviews, other writings, and discussion with people who had read such works.
Third, whether direct or indirect, the influence of Hume and other moral sense theorists on Kant was profound—according to Kant himself. In Kant’s lectures and elsewhere, he makes explicit his view that Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Hume were making significant contributions to ethics (Schneewind 1998, 378). It is worth noting, however, that Kant often indicated that he saw Hutcheson as more significant to ethics than Hume. Kant seems to have associated Hutcheson more with the positive insights about the role of sensibility in ethics, whereas he seems to have associated Hume more with skepticism about practical reason (Kuehn 2001, 182).
The influence of British sentimentalist ethics on Kant seems to have been strongest during the early to middle 1760s. Perhaps the piece of writing that most clearly exhibits both the influence of sentimentalism on Kant and his distinctive take on it is Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and the Sublime (1764). His project in this work involves noting and analyzing the various feelings of pleasure or displeasure, and attraction and aversion, people feel to different traits and temperaments in themselves and others (and to different types of literature, objects in nature, kinds of relationships, and other things). In addition to apparent similarities in endeavor and language (e.g., of “moral beauty”) between Kant’s project here and the work of sentimentalists, Kant makes some statements about the foundation of morality and its principles that are striking in their sentimentalist cast. For example, consider these two passages, which both reflect the influence of sentimentalism and foreshadow Kant’s later work in ethics:
[I]f, by contrast, general affection towards humankind has become your principle, to which you always subject your actions, then your love towards the one in need remains, but it is now, from a higher standpoint, placed in its proper relationship to your duty as a whole. The universal affection is a ground for participating in his ill-fortune, but at the same time it is also a ground of justice, in accordance with whose precept you must now forbear this action [of helping him with money you owe to another]. Now as soon as this feeling is raised to its proper universality, it is sublime, but also colder. (OFBS 2:216)
[T]rue virtue can only be grafted upon principles, and it will become the more sublime and noble the more general they are. These principles are not speculative rules, but the consciousness of a feeling that lives in every human breast and that extends much further than to the special grounds of sympathy and complaisance. I believe I can bring all this together if I say that it is the feeling of the beauty and the dignity of human nature. The first is a ground of universal affection, the second of universal respect, and if this feeling had the greatest perfection in any human heart then this human being would certainly love and value even himself, but only in so far as he is one among all to whom his widespread and noble feeling extends itself. Only when one subordinates one’s own particular inclination to such an enlarged one can our kindly drives be proportionately applied and bring about the noble attitude that is the beauty of virtue. (OFSB 2.217)
Other indications of the sentimentalist influence on Kant can be found in his notes and lectures from that period. For example, the announcement of his lectures for the winter semester of 1765–1766, in which Kant states his intention to develop and clarify “the attempts of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson and Hume, which, though imperfect and defective, have nevertheless come farthest in the discovery of the first principles of all morality” (Ak 2:311, translated by and quoted in Kuehn 2001, 176). Also, in notes that appear to come from between 1764 and 1768, Kant writes, “[t]he rules of morality proceed from a special, eponymous feeling, upon which the understanding is guided …” (NF 19:93 #6581).
If Kant was genuinely trying out a version of sentimentalism in the early 1760s, this phase did not last long, nor was it a simple adoption of the theories of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, or Hume. Kant’s description of the sentimentalist approach to ethics as “imperfect and defective” indicates a brief or incomplete acceptance of their approach to ethics. Moreover, in Observations, his account of true virtue and moral principles anticipates later discussions of these topics in which he will reject sentimentalism. For example, in Observations, Kant frequently and explicitly distinguishes between “true virtue” and all the “adoptive virtues” or “assisting drives,” locating sympathy and benevolence in the second group. In Kant’s more mature writing, he maintains the division between true virtue (which alone is sublime) and these same assisting drives (which can only be beautiful). But in his later works, Kant explicitly identifies true virtue with a rationally grounded commitment to morality, not with an initially pathological feeling of affection which has been universalized and cooled.
Interestingly, however, Kant makes comments about the importance of these assisting drives in his later works that echo those in Observations, even when they seem (at least on the surface) to sit ill with some of his other mature claims about the practicality of pure reason. Compare, for example, what Kant says in Observations with what he says in the Metaphysics of Morals (1797):
In recognition of the weakness of human nature and the little power that the universal moral feeling exercises over most hearts, providence has placed such helpful drives in us as supplements for virtue, which move some to beautiful actions even without principles while at the same time being able to give others, who are ruled by these principles, a greater impetus and a stronger impulse thereto. (OFBS 2:217).
But while it is not in itself a duty to share the sufferings (as well as the joys) of others, it is a duty to sympathize actively in their fate; and to this end it is therefore an indirect duty to cultivate the compassionate natural (aesthetic) feelings in us, and to make use of them as so many means to sympathy based on moral principles and the feeling appropriate to them… . For this [compassion] is still one of the impulses that nature has implanted in us to do what the representation of duty alone might not accomplish. (MM 6:457)
Kant also continues to believe some version of his claim at the beginning of Observations that some of our feelings indicate a “susceptibility of the soul which … makes it fit for virtuous impulses” (OFBS 2:208). We see this in the Metaphysics of Morals discussion of moral feeling, conscience, love of one’s neighbor, and self-respect, which he says “lie at the basis of morality, as subjective conditions of receptiveness to the concept of duty,” which every human being has, and by virtue of which everyone can be put under moral obligation (MM 6:399) (see Guyer 2010).
Despite the appeal that sentimentalism clearly held for Kant in the 1760s, by the late 1760s it was a theme of Kant’s notes and lectures that moral sense theories could not provide adequate accounts of moral obligation. Arguments for this conclusion appear in Kant’s later written works and lectures. In a number of works, Kant creates taxonomies of misguided, heteronomous ethical theories based on material determining grounds—in contrast to his theory of autonomy, in which the moral motive constitutes an objective, formal determining ground. (See Wood 2005b; Irwin 2009, chapters 68 and 71; and Schneewind 2009.) Kant distinguishes among these theories based on their accounts of the basis of moral obligation or the fundamental moral principle (G 4:441–44; CPrR 5:39–41; C 27: 252–54; M 29:621–25). Such theories may assume either subjective (empirical) or objective (rational) determining grounds for the moral principle; and within each of these categories, there are theories that assume these determining grounds are external, and others that assume they are internal. Objective, internal grounds include perfection (e.g., Wolff and the Stoics). Objective, external grounds include the will of God (e.g., Crusius). Subjective, external grounds include education (e.g., Montaigne) or civil constitution (e.g., Mandeville). Subjective, internal grounds can include physical feeling, such as self-love (e.g., Epicurus) or self-interest (e.g., Hobbes), or moral feeling (e.g., Hutcheson) (CPrR 5:40; C 27:253). Thus, Kant locates moral sense theories among those theories that assume a subjective, empirical, internal determining ground of moral feeling as the principle of morality:
What, then, is the basis of morality? … From what power does the principle come, and how does it run? … Those who assume a moral sense, whereby we are supposedly able, by feeling, to perceive the propriety or impropriety of our actions, have the principle of moral feeling. Shaftesbury introduced it, and had many Englishmen, including Hutcheson, among his followers. The moral and the empirical senses are both internal empirical grounds. (M 29:621)
Kant displays some level of relative approval for the moral sense theories. He compares them favorably with theories of self-interest, for example. Although he states that the principle of moral sense theories falls under the principle of happiness because all empirical interests promise to contribute to our happiness, moral feeling “nevertheless remains closer to morality and its dignity in as much as it shows true virtue the honor of ascribing to her immediately the delight and esteem we have for her and does not, as it were, tell her to her face that it is not her beauty but only our advantage that attaches us to her” (G 4:442–43).
Ultimately, of course, sentimentalism, along with all other attempts to ground morality in material determining grounds, fails in Kant’s view. Kant has a lengthy list of related reasons why moral sense theories are inadequate. No empirical principles can ground moral laws, because moral laws bind all rational beings universally, necessarily, and unconditionally; empirical principles are contingent in various ways, for example, on aspects of human nature (G 4:442–43). Variance in moral feelings makes them an inadequate standard of good and evil (G 4:442). Moral feelings cannot be the source of the supreme moral principle, because the supreme moral principle holds for all rational beings, whereas feelings differ from person to person (M 29:625). If duty were grounded in feeling, it would seem that morality would bind some people (e.g., the tender-hearted) more strongly than others, contrary to the universal, equal nature of moral obligation. Even if people were in complete agreement regarding their moral feelings, the universality of these feelings would be a contingent matter, and thus an inadequate ground for the unconditionally binding moral law. Indeed, if morality were grounded in feeling, it would be arbitrary: God could have constituted us so that we would get from vice the pleasurable, calm feelings of approval that we now (allegedly) get from virtue (M 29:625). So for Kant, the contingency of the ground of obligation offered by moral sense theories renders those theories inadequate; only a priori determining grounds will do.
Nevertheless, we can see the extent of the influence of moral sense theories on Kant’s ethics in the way that moral feeling continued to figure in Kant’s moral thought long after he rejected moral sense theories as heteronomous. Kant states in his notes that moral sense theories are better understood as providing a hypothesis explaining why we in fact feel approval and disapproval of various actions than as supplying a principle that justifies approval or disapproval or that guides actions (NF 19:117 # 6626). Kant suggests that even if one rejects moral sense “as a principle for the judgment of moral action” one might still accept it as a theory “of the mind’s incentives to morality” (M 29:625). Similarly, Kant declares, “Moral feeling does not pertain to the giving of laws, but is the basis of their execution” (M 29:626). As noted, Kant’s later works give an important role to certain moral feelings—moral feeling, conscience, self-respect, and love of one’s neighbor—as constituting subjective conditions for moral obligation. Although Kant takes many pathological feelings (such as sympathy and parental love) to be of vast moral usefulness, and worthy of cultivation for moral purposes, Kant puts conscience, moral feeling, self-respect, and love of one’s neighbor in a special category of feelings. He puts them in the category of “natural predispositions of the mind … for being affected by concepts of duty” and says that “[c]onsciousness of them is not of empirical origin; it can, instead, only follow from consciousness of a moral law, as the effect this has on the mind” (MM 6:399). As early perhaps as 1772, Kant can be seen to be giving moral feeling a special status in relation to reason. Kant writes that “[m]oral feeling succeeds the moral concept, but does not produce it; all the less can it replace it, rather it presupposes it” (NF 19:150 #6757). Perhaps even earlier, he writes that “[t]he moral feeling is not an original feeling. It rests on a necessary inner law …” (NF 19:103 #6598).
Kant develops his notion of moral feeling as a feeling that follows from rather than proceeds, or is independent of, consciousness of the moral law most fully in “On the Incentives of Pure Practical Reason” in the second Critique. Here Kant sets out an account of moral feeling as identical with the feeling of respect for the law, describing it as “a feeling that is produced by an intellectual ground, and … the only one that we can cognize completely a priori and the necessity of which we can have insight into” (CPrR 5:73). Kant explains, “there is no antecedent feeling the in subject that would be attuned to morality: that is impossible, since all feeling is sensible whereas the incentive of the moral disposition must be free from any sensible condition. Instead, sensible feeling … is indeed, the condition of that feeling we call respect, but the cause determining it lies in pure practical reason” (CPrR 5:75). “This feeling … is therefore produced solely by reason. It does not serve for appraising actions and certainly not for grounding the objective moral law itself, but only as an incentive to make this law its maxim” (CPrR 5:76). Kant’s treatment of moral feeling is surely one of the more significant ways in which he integrates what he sees as the valuable insights of moral sense theorists into his own theory.
Hume sets out his views concerning freedom of the will in Book II, Part 3, of A Treatise of Human Nature, and in section VIII of An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, “Of Liberty and Necessity.” The position that emerges from these works is compatibilist, in that Hume argues both that all human actions are caused (and caused with the same necessity as all other events) and that we have liberty of action. As attention to Hume’s arguments in the Enquiry will reveal, however, the kind of liberty that Hume ascribes to human beings is more superficial—more an account of freedom of action—than what is often desired by those arguing for freedom of the will. Indeed, for Hume, the very notion of will is problematic. In the Treatise, he calls it “impossible to define,” and provides the following deflationary account of it: “by the will, I mean nothing but the internal impression we feel and are conscious of, when we knowingly give rise to any new motion of our body, or a new perception of our mind” (T 220.127.116.11). Another point worth recognizing at the outset about Hume’s arguments in the Enquiry is that the kind of necessity he ascribes to human actions is the distinctively Humean one, according to which necessity “consists in the constant conjunction of like objects, or in the inference of the understanding from one object to another,” which he takes to be “at bottom, the same” (EHU 8.2.27).
Hume begins his discussion in the Enquiry by suggesting that ambiguities in language have kept interlocutors in the debate over freedom of the will talking past one another. Indeed, according to Hume, “all mankind, both learned and ignorant, have always been of the same opinion with regard to this subject, and … a few intelligible definitions would immediately have put an end to the whole controversy” (EHU 8.1.2). Hume sets out to clarify what we can best be understood to mean when we talk about liberty and necessity, and to show that so understood, there is no conflict between them.
He discusses necessity first. He argues thus: “It is universally allowed that matter, in all its operations, is actuated by a necessary force, and that every natural effect is so precisely determined by the energy of its cause, that no other effect, in such particular circumstances, could possibly have resulted from it” (EHU 8.1.4). “Our idea … of necessity and causation arises entirely from the uniformity, observable in the operations of nature; where similar objects are constantly conjoined together, and the mind is determined by custom to infer the one from the appearance of the other” (EHU 8.1.5). “It is universally acknowledged, that there is a great uniformity among the actions of men, in all nations and ages, and that human nature remains still the same, in its principles and operations” (EHU 8.1.7). It is on the basis of the observed uniformity among human actions that we draw inferences concerning them, just as it is on the basis of observed uniformity among events in the natural world that we draw inferences concerning them (EHU 8.1.16). When we think about how we interact with others and how we reflect on human actions through history and politics, it “seems almost impossible … to engage, either in science or in action of any kind, without acknowledging this doctrine of necessity, and this inference from motives to voluntary actions; from characters to conduct” (EHU 8.1.18). Finally, “when we consider how aptly natural and moral evidence link together, and form only one chain of argument, we shall make no scruple to allow, that they are of the same nature, and derived from the same principles” (EHU 8.1.19). Hume’s conclusion is that “the same necessity [is] common to all causes,” human and non-human (EHU 8.1.21).
Given his claim that if we reflect honestly and carefully, we can all recognize that we are committed to accepting this sort of necessity’s pertaining to human actions, Hume must explain why people have not generally believed that human actions are determined as natural events are. He locates the problem in part in a reluctance to accept his general account of necessity as a mere link the mind makes between one object or event and another based on experience of their correlation:
[M]en still entertain a strong propensity to believe, that they penetrate farther into the powers of nature, and perceive something like a necessary connection between the cause and the effect. When again they turn their reflections towards the operations of their own minds, and feel no such connexion of the motive and the action; they are thence apt to suppose, that there is a difference between the effects, which result from material force, and those which arise from thought and intelligence. (EHU 8.1.21)
When it comes to liberty of action in human beings, Hume declares, “We cannot surely mean, that actions have so little connexion with motives, inclinations, and circumstances, that one does not follow with a certain degree of uniformity from the other, and that one affords no inference by which we can conclude the existence of the other” (EHU 8.1.23). Any such view of liberty would fly in the face of both common and philosophical ways of thinking about human action. Instead, what we mean by liberty is simply, “a power of acting or not acting; according to the determinations of the will; that is, if we choose to remain at rest, we may; if we choose to move, we also may.” Every person “who is not a prisoner and in chains” has this liberty (EHU 8.1.23).
Hume argues that his notions of liberty and necessity are not only consistent with each other, but that both of them are consistent with, and even essential to, basic moral and legal practices (EHU 8.2.27–31). For example, we are far more condemnatory in blaming and punishing someone for an act we regard as caused by an enduring trait, motive, or inclination than one we regard as caused by a fleeting feeling, which is less deeply a part of that person. And it would make no sense at all to blame someone for an action the cause of which lay entirely outside her. Hume gives a mixed verdict to questions about whether his arguments about liberty and necessity pose problems for beliefs about God’s omnipotence and beneficence, arguing that while some standard arguments can handle one type of concern that might arise, not all such concerns can be dealt with so easily (EHU 8.2.32–36).
Kant shares Hume’s view that causal necessity governs human actions and other events, insofar as they are all considered part of the natural world, and that humans are nonetheless free. But Kant rejects Hume’s view that moral and natural actions must be viewed as part of a single chain of causes, effects, and explanations. Indeed, if they were, and if we accepted natural causal laws as universal and deterministic, there could be no freedom of the sort Kant is ultimately after for his moral philosophy (i.e., autonomy). Kant renders freedom and determinism consistent by distinguishing between two worlds of which we are members. As members of the phenomenal world, our actions can be understood in purely deterministic terms, according to natural causal laws; but as members of the noumenal world, we are free. (Lest the notion of “two worlds” seem spooky or wildly implausible, Kant states: “The concept of a world of understanding is … only a standpoint that reason sees itself constrained to take outside appearances in order to think of itself as practical” (G 4:458).) Thus, Kant endorses “not only the compatibility of freedom and determinism, but also the compatibility of compatibilism and incompatibilism” (Wood 1984, 74). Kant also rejects Hume’s account of necessity:
[T]he very concept of a cause so manifestly contains the concept of a necessary connection with an effect and of the strict universality of the rule, that the concept would be altogether lost if we attempted to derive it, as Hume has done, from a repeated association of that which happens with that which precedes, and from a custom of connecting representations, a custom originating in this repeated association, and constituting therefore a merely subjective necessity. (B 4–5)
For Kant, the judgment “every alteration must have a cause” is a pure, a priori judgment, and the concept of cause necessary for the very possibility of experience. (See also B 19–20, A 760–61/B788–89; Prol 4:260–61, 310–13.) (See Guyer 1987, esp. ch. 10.)
To provide a rough sense of Kant’s theory of freedom, we set out a few of Kant’s claims and arguments about freedom from the Critique of Pure Reason, the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, and the Critique of Practical Reason. But note that there are a couple of aspects of his view that are not discussed in those contexts. One is a distinction Kant makes (at least from the second Critique onward) between Wille and Willkür, two aspects or functions of the faculty of volition (MM 6:213–14, 226). Wille is the legislative aspect; it is through Wille that rational beings give our selves the law; and it is Wille that Kant identifies with pure practical reason. Wille is itself neither free nor unfree. Willkür is the executive aspect or function of the faculty of volition, and is the aspect of it that is properly regarded as free. An agent chooses morally when the subjective principles of her Willkür (i.e., her maxims) conform to the objective principles of her Wille. (In addition to Kant’s sometimes deviating from consistent use of these terms, matters are complicated by his using “Wille” as the general term for the faculty of volition.) A related aspect of Kant’s theory of freedom is what Henry Allison calls Kant’s “Incorporation Thesis,” according to which particular inclinations, impulses, and feelings do not constitute reasons for action unless an agent has a maxim of satisfying them (See Allison 1990, esp. 40–41, 189). Kant appears to state this view when he says, “freedom of the power of choice [i.e., Willkür] has a character entirely peculiar to it, that it cannot be determined to an action through any incentive except so far as the human being has incorporated it into his maxim (has made it into a universal rule for himself, according to which he wills to conduct himself)” (Rel 6:24). (For critical discussion of the Incorportation Thesis, see McCarty 2009, chapters 3 and 4.)
The most important arguments regarding freedom in Kant’s first Critique concern the Third Antinomy. In this work, Kant is primarily concerned with transcendental freedom, though also (to a lesser degree) with the practical freedom which depends on it. By transcendental freedom (which he identifies with absolute spontaneity of action), Kant has in mind, “a special kind of causality in accordance with which the occurrences of the world could follow, namely a faculty of absolutely beginning a state, and hence also a series of its consequences” (A 445/B 473). Practical freedom is “the will’s [as in Willkür] independence of coercion through sensuous impulses”; more positively, it is in reference to practical freedom that Kant says: “[i]n the human being there is a faculty of determining oneself from oneself, independently of necessitation by sensible impulses” (A 534/B 562). Kant’s antinomies present arguments for two contradictory positions, illustrating the contradictions into which reason falls when it fails to recognize its own bounds. The Third Antinomy concerns freedom and natural necessity. The thesis claims that the explanation of appearances (i.e., the world and its objects insofar as they are objects of possible experience for us) requires the assumption of a causality of freedom in addition to a causality in accordance with natural laws. The antithesis claims that there is no freedom, and that causation occurs only in accordance with laws of nature. There are equally compelling—but on the face of it, contradictory—arguments for both the thesis and the antithesis (A 444–51/B 472–79). Kant’s solution is to argue that freedom and determinism are not impossible to reconcile, if we posit two different points of view (standpoints): the standpoint he associates with the intelligible (or noumenal) world, according to which we are wholly independent of causal laws and instead subject to our own laws, and the standpoint he associates with the sensible (or phenomenal) world, according to which we are determined according to natural causal laws.
[I]f that which must be regarded as appearance in the world of sense has in itself a faculty which is not an object of intuition through which it can be the cause of appearances, then one can consider the causality of this being in two aspects, as intelligible in its action as a thing in itself, and as sensible in the effects of that action as an appearance in the world of sense. (A 538/B 566)
Kant even suggests that natural causal laws are themselves an effect of intelligible causation.
Kant maintains that the human will has an empirical character that can be studied, and is properly thought of as the empirical cause of our actions. But he thinks that the way we impute blame to others suggests that we think of rational beings as free to act rightly regardless of the natural causes that we can point to in order to explain their wrong actions, and thus are free (A 554–55/B 582–83). Moreover, our consciousness of moral imperatives leads us to recognize our freedom (rational causality), or at least to recognize our representation of ourselves as having rational causality (A 547/B 575). In sum, as long as one takes up both perspectives, “freedom and natural necessity can exist in one and the same action” (A 557/B 585). It is important to note, however, that Kant recognizes that it is impossible for us to say much of anything about the intelligible world itself, or how it underlies the sensible world. Moreover, Kant issues the explicit caveat that he has not been able to “establish the reality of freedom as a faculty that contains the causes of appearance in our world of sensible” or even “to prove the possibility of freedom.” He has been treating freedom “only as a transcendental idea” by which reason is led to think of its ability to begin a series of events in the sensible world. To show “that nature at least does not conflict with causality through freedom—that was the one single thing we could accomplish, and it alone was our sole concern” (A 557–58/B 585–86).
Kant’s main argument concerning freedom in the Groundwork takes place in section III, where he seeks to establish the supreme moral principle by showing that the categorical imperative is valid for rational agents. This argument has two main premises: that the moral law is the law of the free will, and that rational beings must regard themselves as free; the conclusion is that rational beings must regard themselves as subject to the moral law (G 4:446–48) (see Korsgaard 1996, ch. 6). Kant first defines the will “as a kind of causality of living beings insofar as they are rational” (G 4:446). After explaining the negative conception of freedom as a will’s ability to bring about effects in the world without itself being determined by “alien causes,” he argues that any negatively free will must also be free in the positive sense, i.e., autonomous. A will must have a law, since the very concept of cause implies a law-governed relation between cause and effect. A negatively free will cannot be heteronomous; so it must be autonomous. The discussion of autonomy in section two of the Groundwork already identifies autonomy with morality and the principle of autonomy with the moral law; so the moral law is the law of the free will. Next, Kant argues that all rational beings invariably and unavoidably act “under the idea of freedom” and so “in a practical respect are really free” (G 4:447–48). They must ascribe this freedom to all other rational beings as well as to themselves. So, since we inevitably ascribe freedom to ourselves, and since the moral law is the law of the free will, we must take ourselves to be bound by the moral law. Kant follows up this argument with one that concerns the interest we take in the moral law, and an apparent circle in Kant’s account of it. Here Kant argues that our membership in the intelligible world—revealed by reason’s spontaneity in its theoretical employment as well as its practical employment—shows us that we are autonomous, and that the moral law “interests [us] because it is valid for us as human beings, since it arose from our will as intelligence, and so from our proper self; but what belongs to mere appearance is necessarily subordinated by reason to the constitution of the thing in itself” (G 4:461).
In the second Critique, Kant contrasts the negative sense of freedom (independence of sensible determination) with the positive sense (self-legislation or autonomy); describes autonomy as “determination of choice through the mere form of giving universal law that a maxim must be capable of” and calls it “the sole principle of all moral laws and of duties in keeping with them”; and argues that only autonomy can establish moral obligations (CPrR 5:33). Kant describes transcendental freedom as “independence of the natural law of appearances in their relations to one another, namely the law of causality” and “independence from everything empirical and so from nature generally” (CPrR 5:29, 97). He describes practical freedom as “independence of the will from anything other than the moral law alone” (CPrR 5:94). In contrast to the Groundwork III argument from freedom to the validity of the moral law, the second Critique argues that our “direct consciousness” of the moral law grounds our conception of ourselves as free: Our consciousness of our ability to do what we judge that we ought to, in spite of temptations to act otherwise, makes us conscious of our freedom (CPrR 5:30). In the Dialectic, Kant argues that freedom “considered positively (as the causality of a being insofar as it belongs to the intelligible world),” along with the immortality of the soul and the existence of God, is a postulate of pure practical reason, belief in which is demanded (though not as a moral duty) in order to make sense of the moral law’s commands (CPrR 5:132). We cannot rationally regard the moral law as issuing duties to us unless we take ourselves to be free—in whatever way is necessary—for us to comply with those duties. Practical postulates do not expand the scope of speculative cognition, but rather “give objective reality to the ideas of speculative reason in general (by means of their reference to what is practical) and justify its holding concepts even the possibility of which it could not otherwise presume to affirm” (CPrR 5:132). (On freedom, especially in the second Critique, see Beck 1960, ch. 11.)
Many aspects of Kant’s arguments concerning freedom have raised questions. One objection is that (at least in the Groundwork and second Critique) Kant equivocates between two conceptions of freedom—one that is necessary for moral responsibility, and one that Kant identifies with moral goodness—and as a result, is left with the embarrassing position according to which only morally good wills are morally responsible (see Sidgwick 1888; cf. Wood 1984, 78–83; see also Guyer 2009). Another concern is that (at least in Groundwork section III) the kind of freedom that Kant argues we must ascribe to ourselves as rational beings is insufficient for moral freedom (autonomy), and that Kant does not recognize this (see Allison 1990, 227–29). There also questions about the development of Kant’s theory of freedom, and the consistency of his positions and arguments, and the shifting role of freedom in Kant’s philosophy (see Schneewind 1998, chs. 22–23; Guyer 2000, ch. 3). The distinction between noumena and phenomena is without a doubt one of the most controversial aspects of Kant’s ethics—and of his philosophy as a whole. Kantians have interpreted it differently. Some have understood Kant to be making a metaphysical (or ontological) claim when he distinguishes between noumenal and phenomenal worlds. (For a recent, book-length development and defense of the two-worlds interpretation, see McCarty 2009.) Others have understood Kant to be distinguishing between only different standpoints we take, identifying the noumenal world with the practical standpoint that we take when we think of ourselves as autonomous, responsible beings, and the phenomenal world with the theoretical standpoint we take when we think of ourselves as part of the natural, deterministic, empirical world (see Beck 1960, 191–94; Korsgaard 1996a, esp. chs. 6–7). There are concerns about both. Many find the notion of two worlds metaphysically cumbersome; but some raise doubts about whether the two standpoints approach is adequate for transcendental and practical freedom (see Irwin 1984, esp. 37–38; Allison 1990; Guyer 1992, 103–107; and Wood 2005a, 99–100).
Hume is a moral anti-rationalist famous for his claim, “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions, and can never pretend to any other office than to serve and obey them” (T 18.104.22.168). He is not claiming that reason has no role in human action, but rather that its role is an auxiliary one; the motivating force behind an action must come from passion. Hume’s main arguments for the limited role of reason are found in A Treatise of Human Nature. (There is debate among interpreters about whether Hume changed his position on reason and motivation between the Treatise and the second Enquiry, as well as precisely what Hume’s understanding of the nature, extent, and significance of reason’s contribution to action is (see, e.g., Milgram 1995; Radcliffe 1997; Cohon 2008 chapters 2 and 3; and Irwin 2008 chapter 26).)
The first argument reminds us of reason’s functions regarding to relations of ideas and matters of fact, and argues that “reason alone can never be a motive to any action of the will” (T 22.214.171.124). Abstract (or demonstrative) reasoning, which involves a priori inferences and judgments pertaining to relations of ideas, cannot influence the will, but only assist us in our pursuit of an end we already have (e.g., if mathematical calculations would facilitate our achievement of our end). Probable (or causal) reasoning helps us discover cause and effect relations among objects of experience conducive to the realization of pre-selected ends, but such information about cause and effect can never motivate action on its own: “It can never in the least concern us to know, that such objects are causes, and such others effects, if both causes and effects be indifferent to us” (T 126.96.36.199). In order to be motivated to act, we must first anticipate pleasure or pain from something. That anticipated pleasure or pain gives rise to feelings of desire or aversion for the object in question. Probable reasoning allows us to discern the causes of this object; our positive or negative feelings about the object then spread to the causes of it; and we are then motivated to pursue or to avoid them. Simply believing that one thing causes another will not motivate action; there must be a desire, fear, or other passion (T 188.8.131.52).
A second argument, which proceeds from the conclusion to the former argument, aims to show that reason “can never oppose passion in the direction of the will” (T 184.108.40.206). The only thing that can oppose an impulse to action generated by one passion is a contrary impulse. Reason, then, could counteract an impulse to action generated by a passion if and only if reason could itself generate a contrary impulse. But from the first argument, we know that that reason cannot generate such an impulse. “Thus it appears, that the principle, which opposes any passion, cannot be the same with reason, and is only called so in an improper sense” (T 220.127.116.11). Hume goes on to say that whatever we feel in us running contrary to an impulse to act that we mistake for reason must be something else, such as a calm passion (e.g., a general appetite for the good, benevolence, or aversion to evil) (T 18.104.22.168).
The third argument claims that a passion is an “original existence,” not an idea, or a mental copy of another object. Contradiction to truth and reason “consists in the disagreement of ideas, consider’d as copies, with those objects, which they represent” (T 22.214.171.124). So a passion cannot be contrary to truth and reason. Passions cannot, strictly speaking, be evaluated as reasonable or unreasonable, despite our practice of calling passions unreasonable or irrational when they depend in some way on poor reasoning or false beliefs. Later in the Treatise, Hume extends this argument to volitions and actions as well (T 126.96.36.199); we might view Kant’s conflict in conception and contradiction in will tests of the formula of universal law to constitute refutations of the latter argument (G 4:421–24) (see Guyer 2008, ch. 5).
These arguments convey Hume’s positions that passion plays the dominant role in motivating action, reason a merely subsidiary role; reason cannot control or resist passion’s motivational influence; and one cannot use the standards of reason to praise or criticize passions. Hume draws some further important, anti-rationalist moral conclusions, partly on the basis of these views and arguments on reason, passion, and motivation generally. One obvious implication is that reason cannot be the motive to moral action; if reason cannot motivate any sort of action, it cannot motivate moral action. A second further conclusion is that morality (fundamental moral principles) cannot be grounded in reason; this one follows both from his views about the “inertness” of reason generally, and from his assumption that morality is capable of motivating people: “Morals excite passions, and produce or prevent actions. Reason of itself is utterly impotent in this particular. The rules of morality, therefore, are not conclusions of reason” (T 188.8.131.52). Moreover, we can say, in keeping with the third argument, that an act’s rightness or wrongness cannot consist in its reasonableness or unreasonableness, because acts cannot, strictly speaking be reasonable or unreasonable (T 184.108.40.206). A third further conclusion is that reason cannot discover morality (or fundamental moral principles or distinctions). Virtue and vice, and other aspects of morality, are beyond the purview of demonstrative reasoning, which concerns the relations of resemblance, contrariety, degrees in quality, and proportions in quantity and number (T 220.127.116.11). And the moral goodness (for example) of an action cannot be reduced to its cause or effect, or to other matters of fact that probable (or causal) reasoning can supply (T 18.104.22.168). In sum, then, Hume argues that the source of morality, our means of discerning moral distinctions, and the spring of moral motivation, must be the passions.
For Kant, by contrast, reason not feeling is the source of morality, of moral motivation, and of our grasp of moral obligation. In Kant’s view, only if pure practical reason is the source of morality can morality categorically, necessarily, and universally, bind all rational beings:
Everyone must grant that a law, if it is to hold morally, that is, as a ground of an obligation, it must carry with it absolute necessity; that, for example, the command, “thou shalt not lie,” does not hold only for human beings, as if other rational beings did not have to heed it, and so with all the other moral laws properly so called; that, therefore, the ground of obligation here must not be sought in the nature of the human being or in the circumstances of the world in which he is placed, but a priori simply in concepts of pure reason. (G 4:389, see also 408, 411)
The example of not lying seems ill-chosen, because Kant’s own theory does not treat it as a fundamental moral requirement, but rather as a duty derived from a fundamental requirement (MM 6:429–31). Nevertheless, this passage shows how Kant’s conception of moral obligation implies that morality and its basic principles have a purely rational source.
When it comes to moral epistemology, feelings certainly have a role to play, but the role comes fairly late in the game. It is through reason that we discover basic moral principles; but judgment, experience, and cultivated feelings—all within the realm of what the average person can attain—can aid us in our use of these principles (G 4:389, 391, 403–404; MM 6:411, 456–58). For Kant, moral epistemology is not a matter of discovering an external, independently created set of moral rules, but rather recognizing a rationally self-legislated moral law. (Some commentators talk of reason’s “constructing” moral principles; see, e.g., Rawls 1980; O’Neill 1989, ch. 11; cf. Ameriks 2006, ch. 11). Kant talks of reason “commanding” what we should do, and emphasizes that we are co-legislators as well as subjects in the kingdom of ends (G 4:408, 431–45). Moreover, much of what we see Kant doing in the first two sections of the Groundwork is leading us from compelling assumptions about value and moral obligation, through arguments about the nature of rationality and the commitments inextricably linked to our rational nature, and to formulations of the categorical imperative.
Regarding moral motivation: It is a central feature of Kant’s ethics that pure reason can be practical—that reason can “of itself, independently of anything empirical, determine the will” (CPrR 5: 42). Kant says of right actions:
Such actions … need no recommendation from any subjective disposition or taste, so as to be looked upon with immediate favor and delight; nor do they need any immediate propensity or feeling for them; they present the will that practices them as the object of an immediate respect, and nothing but reason is required to impose them upon the will. (G 4:435)
Moreover, in the first section of the Groundwork, Kant repeatedly emphasizes the “moral worth” that attaches to right actions that are performed simply because they are right—i.e., actions motivated from “from duty” or “from respect for the law” (G 4:396–401) (see Timmermann, 2009).
Yet the way reason motivates finite rational beings (such as humans) to act rightly is by means of feelings. In the Groundwork, Kant focuses on respect for the law (mentioned above). Initially in the Groundwork, Kant describes respect in a manner that makes it sound like a felt aspect of the law itself: “an action from duty is to put aside entirely the influence of inclination, and with it every object of the will; hence there is left for the will nothing that could determine it the except objectively the law and subjectively pure respect for this practical law” (G 4:400). But Kant goes on to describe respect for the law in a way that makes it sound more like a separate feeling, though one arising from reason:
It could be objected that I only seek refuge behind the word respect in an obscure feeling, instead of distinctly resolving the question by a concept of reason. But although respect is a feeling, it is not one received by means of influence; it is, instead, a feeling self-wrought by a rational concept and therefore specifically different from all feelings of the first kind, which can be referred to inclination or fear. What I cognize immediately as a law for me, I cognize with respect, which signifies merely consciousness of the subordination of my will to a law without the mediation of other influences on any sense. Immediate determination of the will by means of the law and the consciousness of this is called respect, so that this is regarded as the effect of the law on the subject, and not as the cause of the law. (G 4:401 n; also see 460)
In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant describes the special moral feeling of respect for the law as having both a painful aspect, involving the humiliation the agent feels as the moral law strikes down her self-conceit, and a pleasurable, ennobling aspect, since the moral law comes from her own pure reason, and represents her own higher self and vocation (CPrR 5:73). In the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant lists moral feeling, conscience, love of human beings, and respect (for oneself) as special kinds of feelings of which we are made aware only though consciousness of the moral law (MM 6:399). He describes these feelings as “moral endowments” that “lie at the basis of morality” and as “subjective conditions of receptivity to the concept of duty” (MM 6:399). Since our compliance with duty presupposes our having these feelings, there is no duty for us to have them. There is a duty to cultivate them, however, because of their moral usefulness.
Kant is explicit that feelings—especially pleasure (or satisfaction) and pain (or displeasure), both actual and anticipated—are essential to human moral motivation (see Guyer 2008, ch. 5; and Guyer 2010). In the Groundwork, Kant states: “In order for a sensibly affected rational being to will that for which reason alone prescribes the ‘ought,’ it is admittedly required that his reason have the capacity to induce a feeling of pleasure or of delight in the fulfillment of duty, and thus there is required a causality of reason to determine sensibility in conformity with its principles” (G 4:460). Even though we cannot know (or “make intelligible a priori”) how a thought or judgment about the morality of an action “can itself produce a sensation of pleasure or pain,” Kant thinks that this somehow does happen; it must, if moral considerations are to be motivating in beings like us. In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant suggests that the painful feeling of having one’s self-conceit struck down is a necessary part, or perhaps condition, of moral motivation. The agent must see the moral law, not her own inclinations, as legislative for her in order to be morally motivated. By removing the “resistance,” “counterweight,” or “hindrance” to the moral law that self-conceit presents, the moral feeling of respect is, in the judgment of reason, “esteemed equivalent to a positive furthering of [the moral law’s] causality” (CPrR 5:75). And in the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant states that “Every determination of choice proceeds from the representation of a possible action to the deed through the feeling of pleasure or displeasure, taking an interest in the action or its effect” (MM 6:399; also see M 29:625–26). What is so important about respect for the law, moral feeling, and other rationally grounded feelings is that through them human beings are able to feel pleasure or displeasure solely by considering the morality of our actions.
In spite of the foregoing, Kant may nevertheless appear hostile to our natural, sensibly-grounded human emotions. In the Metaphysics of Morals “Doctrine of Virtue,” for example, he warns against the dangers of affects and passions, and urges apathy and self-mastery: “unless reason holds the reins of government in his own hands, a human being’s feelings and inclinations play the master over him” (MM 6:408). Apathy and self-mastery are essential for expressing and protecting inner freedom, which can be threatened by affects and passions. Affects [Affekte] are emotional agitations, sudden, fleeting emotions that temporarily interfere with rational reflection and self-control (Ant 7:253, 267; MM 6:407). Passions [Leidenschaften] are more persistent, stable inclinations that continually tempt us to satisfy them, even when we know that it is wrong to do so. Kant gives anger as an example of an affect, hatred as an example of a passion (MM 6:408). In praising moral apathy, Kant advocates not an insensibility but a resistance to affect, and in particular, a refusal to determine one’s will in accordance with whatever strong, fleeting feelings one happens to have. Self-mastery is more comprehensive than apathy, and includes resistance to passions. Self-mastery involves an agent’s “bring[ing] all his capacities and inclinations under his (reason’s) control and so to rule over himself” (MM 6:408). In urging self-mastery, Kant recommends not that one rid oneself of feelings and inclinations, but that one use them in ways that are compatible with—and perhaps even conducive to–morality. We are not completely passive with regard to our emotions; they respond to our cultivation, and so are in part products of our choices (Ant 7: 254; MM 6:402).
Indeed, Kant clearly sees moral value in some sensibly-grounded (“pathological”) feelings as well as special rationally grounded ones discussed above. Certain emotions are naturally-given feelings that we can use in the fulfillment of our duties, and which we therefore have a duty to cultivate (MM 6:456–57, 458; also M 29:626; NF 19:77 #6560). Speaking of sympathy, which is perhaps the best example of this sort of feeling, Kant says, “it is … an indirect duty to cultivate the natural … feelings in us, and to make use of them as so many means to sympathy based on moral principles and the feeling appropriate to them” (MM 6:457). According to Kant, sympathy allows us better to understand others’ needs, helps us to communicate our concern for them, and can act as an additional incentive to facilitate our promotion of our happiness helping others. Such sensibly-grounded feelings can work with rationally-grounded feelings in order to motivate us to act morally. We may cultivate sympathetic feelings from respect for the law, and then find these feelings prompting us to act in certain ways. Of course, however sympathetically motivated these actions are, their maxims must be morally permissible—something that cannot be guaranteed even when the sympathy that motivates has been cultivated out of respect for the law or the rationally-grounded feeling of love of one’s neighbor.
To conclude: Both Kant and Hume assume that moral considerations motivate action. Moreover, they appear to share a view of human action according to which feelings—especially feelings of pleasure and pain—are needed for motivating action. For Hume, of course, this view of human action is all that is needed or warranted; and in his version, passions take the leading role, reason the supporting one. For Kant, by contrast, the story of human action featuring feelings such as respect for the law, moral feeling, and sympathy, comes as an addition to his a priori story about the moral law’s being grounded in reason; and in Kant’s story, reason plays the dominant role in moral motivation and moral epistemology. The motivational roles Kant gives to feelings reflect his empirical moral psychology, not his metaphysics of freedom (Guyer 2008, ch. 5; and Guyer 2010). Moreover, the feelings that Kant sees as most crucial to moral motivation (respect for the moral law, respect for rational nature, moral feeling) are themselves rationally-grounded, reflecting the immediate effect of the moral law on our sensibility. The “pathological” feelings that we have indirect duties to cultivate are of genuine, but conditional, moral value.
A final contrast to note is that Hume would adamantly reject Kant’s attribution of a special moral value, “moral worth,” to actions done “from duty.” According to Hume, “no action can be virtuous, or morally good, unless there be in human nature some motive to produce it, distinct from a sense of its morality” (T 22.214.171.124). The motive of acting virtuously cannot be the standard or basic motive to virtuous action, since, according to Hume, what makes an act virtuous is its expression of a virtuous motive, which in turn reflects a virtuous quality of character (T 126.96.36.199). To avoid circularity, there must be a motive to virtuous action that does not itself refer to the moral goodness of the act (T 188.8.131.52). For Hume, the only time one would have to rely on one’s sense of the rightness or virtuousness of an act to motivate oneself to do it is when one finds oneself deficient in the natural feelings that ordinarily prompt people to act morally (e.g., natural affection, generosity, gratitude). In such a case, one may feel humility (or even self-hatred) due to one’s defect, and consequently form a desire to change one’s conduct (and perhaps even one’s character). As we have seen, however, on Kant’s scheme, the most pure or direct kind of moral motivation is motivation from duty or from respect for the law. Yet Kant often expresses doubt that there have ever been human actions motivated from duty alone (e.g., G 4:406–407). And, as discussed above, Kant’s more mature writings on normative ethics acknowledge that respect for the law works in conjunction with and even to some degree through other feelings. Although important, Kant’s notion of moral worth must be understood in the context of the Groundwork I argument from the idea of an unconditionally good will to the first, rough formulation of the categorical imperative. We should not confuse Kant’s concepts of the good will and moral worth in Groundwork I with his conceptions of virtue and the virtues that emerge in his more mature, normative works.
According to Hume, “morality is determined by sentiment” and virtue is “whatever mental action or quality gives to a spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation” (EPM App.1.10); “virtue … is a quality of the mind agreeable to or approved by everyone, who considers or contemplates it” (EPM 8n50). Our moral judgments, then, are best understood as deliverances of sentiment or feeling. The particular sentiments or feelings in question are those of approval or disapproval. They are usually (though not always) calm passions. The sentiment of approval is a kind of pleasure; of disapproval, a kind of pain. The characteristic object of our moral judgment, or what stimulates our sentiments, is a character trait of oneself or someone else. Character traits themselves are stable dispositions to feel—and thus to be moved to act—in certain ways. We usually judge acts as virtuous or vicious based on our assessment of the traits that we think motivate them. The basis for our approval or disapproval, Hume thinks, is the agreeableness or usefulness of the trait in question. Although each trait is assessed based on its usefulness or agreeableness both to the possessor and others, the standpoint from which one makes this assessment is a general one. Moral assessors take up a “common point of view” from which the assessor can appreciate how everyone who is affected by the object of evaluation (e.g., a character trait of a particular person) is affected by it. (See Cohon 2008, chapters 3, 4, and 8; Irwin 2008, chapter 58; and Korsgaard 2008, chapter 9.)
The process of moral assessment from this common point of view fundamentally involves sympathy, understood not as one among various sentiments such as pity or benevolence, but as a psychological mechanism through which one person can “enter into the same humor, and catch the sentiment” of another (EPM 7.2). Sympathy allows us “to receive by communication their inclinations and sentiments, however different from, or even contrary to our own” (T 184.108.40.206). Because human beings greatly resemble each other, we easily recognize others’ sentiments; this recognition leads us to “enter into” their sentiments. The greater the resemblance we recognize between ourselves and someone else, or the stronger the contiguity between us or our experiences to them or theirs, the easier it is for our imagination to convey their feelings to us, and the more vivid our sense of those feelings (T 220.127.116.11). One interesting thing about the operation of sympathy for Hume is that not only do we form an idea of the feeling of another, but this idea transforms into an impression:
[W]hen we sympathize with the passions and sentiments of others, these movements appear at first in our mind as mere ideas, and are conceiv’d to belong to another person, as we conceive any other matter of fact. ‘Tis also evident, that the ideas of the affections of others are converted into the very impressions they represent, and that the passions arise in conformity to the images we form of them. (T 18.104.22.168)
In most of Hume’s account of impressions and ideas, ideas are fainter copies of the impressions which precede them; yet here we have ideas giving rise to vivid impressions.
Now the fact that we have more resemblances to and relations with some people than others, and hence find it easier to sympathize with some than others, might suggest that moral judgment cannot rest on sympathy, since our moral approbation, unlike our personal preference, is not (or at least is not supposed to be) biased in favor of those to whom one is most similar or closest. Part of Hume’s response to this objection is to say that we can “correct our sentiments” (or at least our language) if “we fix on some steady and general points of view; and always, in our thoughts, place ourselves in them, whatever may be our present situation” (T 22.214.171.124). That is, if we take up an unbiased point of view, allowing ourselves to share the feelings of everyone affected by the person, trait, or action in question, our approval or disapproval of the object will be grounded in sympathy, but not be biased or fluctuating depending on our individual, changing relationships and circumstances.
In the Treatise, Hume divides virtues into natural and artificial ones. Artificial virtues depend on convention, contrivance, or rule-following (T 126.96.36.199–4). Their social utility may not be evident when a single act exhibiting an artificial virtue is committed in isolation. Rather, the beneficial nature of these virtues requires their being pervasively and consistently expressed throughout a society in accordance with a general rule (T 188.8.131.52). Artificial virtues are not arbitrary, however. They are necessary human inventions in response to the demands of broad social interaction (T 184.108.40.206). Natural virtues, on the other hand, have no need of rules or conventions for them to be useful or pleasing; additionally, they are useful or pleasing on each occasion (T 220.127.116.11). Among the artificial virtues, Hume includes justice, fidelity to promises, allegiance to government, obedience to laws of nations, chastity, and modesty. (See Cohon 2008, chapters 6 and 7; and Irwin 2008, chapter 59.)
In Book III, Part 3, Hume devotes much discussion to justice, which he seems to regard as a paramount and paradigmatic artificial virtue. Hume understands justice primarily as honesty with respect to property or conformity to conventions of property (T 18.104.22.168). Establishing a system of property allows us to avoid conflict and enjoy the possession and use of various goods, so the social value of conventions involving property seems obvious. Yet one reason that justice receives such attention from Hume is that it poses a problem about moral motivation and moral approval. Hume claims that there needs to be a natural (non-moral) motive for morally good actions, for otherwise they could only be done because they are morally good; and that would be circular, since our judgment of acts as morally good reflects our approval of the motives and traits that give rise to the acts in question (T 22.214.171.124, 126.96.36.199). But this position makes it hard to see how justice can be a virtue; for it is hard to find the requisite natural, nonmoral motive for it. Self-interest is the natural motive that justifies our establishing rules regarding property (T 188.8.131.52); but self-interest is neither always satisfied by just acts, nor approved in the way that traits we call virtues generally are (T 184.108.40.206–10). Neither public nor private benevolence would do, since neither could motivate all just actions (T 220.127.116.11). Hume himself says that “a sympathy with public interest is the source of the moral approbation, which attends that virtue” (T 18.104.22.168). But since sympathy with the public interest itself seems neither nonmoral nor inherent in human nature, this claim redescribes the problem rather than solves it. Hume must ground sympathy for the public interest in more obviously natural sentiments, and explain its development from them (e.g., as self-interest, corrected or redirected through education or the contrivances of politicians). Otherwise, Hume must abandon his claim that all morally good actions—even those associated with artificial virtues—have non-moral, natural motives. (See Gauthier 1979; Mackie 1980, ch. 5; and Darwall 1995, 302–316).
Among the natural virtues, Hume includes beneficence, prudence, temperance, frugality, industry, assiduity, enterprise, dexterity, generosity, and humanity (T 22.214.171.124). In An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, he distinguishes among virtues useful to others, virtues useful to oneself, virtues immediately agreeable to oneself, and virtues immediately agreeable to others. Among qualities useful to others are justice, fidelity, honor, allegiance, chastity, along with the other “social virtues” of humanity, generosity, charity, affability, lenity, mercy, and moderation (EPM 5.2.44). Among qualities useful to ourselves are discretion, caution, enterprise, industry, assiduity, frugality, economy, good sense, prudence, discernment (EMP 6.1.21). Among qualities contrary to our own well-being are indolence, negligence, “want of order and method,” obstinacy, fickleness, rashness, and credulity (EPM 6.1.1). Qualities immediately agreeable to oneself include cheerfulness, tranquility, benevolence, and delicacy of taste. Qualities immediately agreeable to others include good manners, politeness, wit, ingenuity, decency, cleanliness, and a graceful or genteel manner. What holds all these varied traits together as virtues is their evoking the sentiment of approval in spectators, itself grounded in sympathy.
A few more points about Hume’s account of the virtues are worth mentioning. Hume blames “superstition and false religion” for the misguided view some have that the “monkish virtues” of celibacy, fasting, penance, mortification, self-denial, humility, silence, and solitude are virtues; they are, instead, vices (EPM 9.1.3). When it comes to women, however, Hume does consider chastity, modesty, decency, and reserve essential virtues (EPM 6.1.14; T 3.2.12). Some of the traits that Hume considers virtues, such as cheerfulness, wit, or good memory, seem neither specifically moral, nor much within the agent’s control. They seem more to be a matter of non-moral talent or natural ability. In fact, Hume explicitly challenges the significance of the distinction between moral virtue and natural ability (T 3.3.4). For Hume, as long as a quality of a person is pleasing or useful, so as to give rise to the sentiment of moral approval in those considering it from the general point of view, it is a virtue. Moreover, Hume views all of our traits as effects of natural causation; and he takes virtues to be the sorts of traits that commonly and naturally arise among human beings—not as rare qualities that have to be arduously cultivated. Hume claims that it is extremely difficult for people to make any substantive change in their characters, though he thinks we may have some success in altering our conduct (e.g., by refraining from certain behaviors out of a desire to avoid moral disapproval from ourselves or others) (T 126.96.36.199, 188.8.131.52).
On Kant’s conception of virtue, virtue is the form in which a being with a non-holy will expresses her supreme commitment to morality. Virtue is such a being’s continually cultivated capacity to master her inclinations so as to fulfill her duties; a capacity whose cultivation and exercise is motivated by respect for the moral law. This account of Kant’s conception of virtue is grounded in six related theses about virtue that Kant advances. (The discussion below draws on Denis 2006; for a more recent, book-length account of Kant’s theory of virtue, see Baxley 2010.)
First, virtue is a disposition to comply with the moral law (i.e., to do one’s duty) do one’s duty out of respect for the moral law (CPrR 5:128, 160; C 27:300). Second, virtue is a kind of strength. Kant defines virtue as “the concept of strength” (MM 6:392, 390; Rel 6:57; V 27:429). Specifically, virtue is “a moral strength of the will” (MM 6:405), “moral strength in adherence to one’s duty” (Ant 7:147). Third, virtue presupposes opposition and entails struggle, and thus—fourth—is a feature of non-holy (e.g., human) wills (CPrR 5:84). Kant calls virtue “the capacity and considered resolve to withstand a strong but unjust opponent … with respect to what opposes the moral disposition within us” (MM 6:380). Human beings do not have holy wills, “whose maxims are necessarily in accord with laws of autonomy (the moral law)” (G 4:439); if we did, we would act rightly without moral obligation or struggle. Kant often seems to identify our inclinations as the primary opponents of morality (G: 4:405; V 27:450, 492; C 27:450). His considered view, however, is that inclinations are not the source of the problem. Virtue’s primary opponent is “radical evil in human nature”—a propensity to give self-love (and inclinations generally) priority over the moral law in our maxims (Rel 6:29, 35–37, 57 n., 58). It is because of radical evil that virtue implies struggle and demands strength. The fundamental task of the virtuous person is to achieve the proper ordering of her incentives, giving the moral law undisputed priority over self-love within her supreme maxim. Fifth, virtue is moral self-constraint “based on inner freedom” (MM 6:408), which is the capacity to act on the autonomously chosen principles of morality, even in the face of temptation (MM 6:394, 405). Virtue both expresses and promotes inner freedom. The greater one’s moral self-constraint (i.e., one’s virtue), the more one acts based on reason, and the less one acts based on inclination or impulse (MM 6:382 n). Finally, sixth, virtue can be understood either as “phenomenal virtue,” “a facility in actions conforming to duty (according to their legality),” or as “noumenal virtue,” “a constant disposition toward such actions from duty (because of their morality)” (Rel 6:14). Both noumenal and phenomenal virtue reflect the agent’s commitment to morality, but purity of motivation is an essential feature only of noumenal virtue (Rel 6:47). Phenomenal virtue is no mere pretender to virtue, however. Kant calls phenomenal virtue, virtue’s “empirical character,” the form in which true virtue appears to us (Rel 6:47–48).
Particular virtues and vices are grounded in Kant’s system of duties; these duties are grounded in the moral law, the supreme principle of morality. According to Kant, the moral law impresses itself on imperfect, finite rational beings like us as a categorical imperative (CI). Whatever duties we have must ultimately derive from this supreme moral principle. In the Groundwork, Kant articulates a number of formulations of his CI. The formula of universal law commands, “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (G 4:421). The formula of the universal law of nature commands, “act as if the maxim of your action were to become by your will a universal law of nature” (G 4:421). The formula of the end in itself commands, “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (G 4:429). The formula of autonomy commands, “act only so that the will could regard itself as at the same time giving universal law through its maxims” (G 4:434). And the formula of the kingdom of ends commands, “act in accordance with the maxims of a member giving universal laws for a merely possible kingdom of ends” (G 4:439). Kant claims that while all these formulations represent different aspects of the CI and can be used for different purposes, they are all expressions of a single law of pure practical reason (G 4:436–37). (See Guyer 2000; Paton 1947; Wood 1999; and Timmermann 2007).
In the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant introduces two additional principles, which he uses more directing in explicating and arguing for duties of right (or justice) and duties of virtue. The “universal principle of right,” which underlies Kant’s discussion of duties of right, states, “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if one its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law” (MM 6:230). Duties of right fundamentally concern external relations among people, aim to protect the lawful freedom of all, and can be externally compelled or enforced (e.g., by state coercion).
The “supreme principle of the doctrine of virtue” is, “act in accordance with a maxim of ends that it can be a universal law for everyone to have” (MM 6:395). Kant continues, “In accordance with this principle a human being is an end for himself as well as for others, and it is not enough that he is not authorized to use either himself or others merely as a means (since he could then still be indifferent to them); it is in itself his duty to make the human being as such his end” (MM 6:395). Duties of virtue have fundamentally to do with the ends, principles, and attitudes of agents; they aim to protect each agent’s inner freedom; they can be compelled only by the agent herself. It is because duties of virtue alone are subject only to internal compulsion that Kant calls them “directly ethical duties.” Among these duties are the perfect duties to oneself to avoid vices of suicide, self-mutilation, gluttony, drunkenness, sexual self-degradation (duties to oneself as an animal and moral being), lying, avarice, and servility (duties to oneself as a moral being only); the imperfect duties to oneself concerning the promotion of the obligatory end of one’s own natural and moral perfection, along with duties to foster self-knowledge, compassion for animals, and appreciation of the beautiful in nature; the perfect duties to others to avoid the vices of arrogance, defamation, and ridicule (duties of respect), and the imperfect duties to promote the end of others happiness by means of beneficence, sympathy, and gratitude, as well as by avoiding malice, envy, and ingratitude (duties of love and vices opposed to them). Kant does not claim to derive these duties from the CI or the supreme principles of right or virtue alone. Rather, he draws on considerations regarding human nature and other aspects of the natural world in moving from general principles of morality to moral duties.
More needs to be said about particular virtues and vices. Kant states, “in its Idea (objectively) there is only one virtue (as moral strength of one’s maxims); but in fact (subjectively) there is a multitude of virtues, made up of several different qualities” (MM 6:447; see also MM 6:395 and 406). These different qualities are required by, or facilitate fulfillment of, the agent’s moral duties. Vices, on the other hand, are “the brood of dispositions opposing the law … monsters [the agent] has to fight” (MM 6:405). Each virtue and each vice has its own maxim (MM 6:404). An agent can have some virtues but lack others. But if her virtues reflect a pure moral commitment, she will not have vices (MM 6:447; Rel 6:24–25). Vice, for Kant, is not mere lack of virtue (MM 6:384). Vice implies “contempt for moral laws,” not simply lack of resolve in fulfilling one’s duty, or meager advancement of obligatory ends (C 27:463). Vice is a propensity to act contrary to the moral law (Rel 6:37). Kant says, “it is when an intentional transgression has become a principle that it is properly called a vice” (MM 6:390, see also 408).
Rarely does Kant explain perfect duties to oneself in terms of virtues, such as humaneness, uprightness, or chastity, which one ought to cultivate (MM 6:443; C 27:459–60; V 27: 638, 699). Instead, he defines perfect duties to oneself in terms of vices contrary to them, delineating proper self-respect in opposition to the maxims and attitudes one ought to avoid out of respect for oneself. According to Kant, one manifests (or fails to manifest) self-respect in part through how one treats one’s body and its drives (MM 6:417–20). Kant classifies as vices contrary to perfect duties to oneself as an animal and moral being, suicide and self-mutilation, gluttony and drunkenness, and sexual self-degradation (MM 6:417–28). In the case of these vices, disrespect for one’s rational nature is shown by one’s willingness to treat one’s animal nature in a way destructive or disruptive to its reason-supporting role, directly or indirectly (e.g., through undermining our physical integrity or our organs’ abilities to function), for the sake of an inclination-based end. Kant classifies as vices contrary to duties to oneself as a moral being only, lying, avarice, and servility (MM 6:429–437). Kant’s calling servility, suicide, et al. “vices” may strike us as unusual, given that these vices are (on the face of it) not qualities or dispositions, but ways of acting. But calling them vices makes sense, given that they are ways of acting on maxims that are contrary to the ends and preconditions of virtue.
Kant has little to say about specific virtues to cultivate regarding the promotion of one’s natural and moral perfection, perhaps because there are so many possibilities, with different ones more appropriate to different agents at different times of their lives. Promoting one’s natural perfection requires developing whatever excellences pertain to the abilities of mind, body, and spirit which one thinks it makes most sense to develop, given one’s particular interests, desires, and talents. Promoting one’s moral perfection requires cultivating all the qualities one needs to purify one’s moral motivation and to fulfill all of one’s duties (MM 6:386–87, 392–93, 444–46).
Duties of respect require treating others in keeping with their dignity. Arrogance, defamation, and ridicule are vices are contrary to proper respect for others, for all deny their targets the respect they deserve as equal, rational beings with dignity (MM 6:462–68).
The qualities we must cultivate as part of our promotion of the happiness of others include beneficence, sympathy, and gratitude. Beneficence does this most directly, for it s maxim is one of promoting others’ morally permissible ends. Sympathy assists beneficence, as the maxim of sympathy is one both of sharing actively in others feelings and of cultivating one’s naturally sympathetic feelings to assist oneself in understanding their feelings and needs (MM 6:456–57; M 29:626). All three of these virtues require the cultivation of feelings. The vices opposed to duties of love are envy, ingratitude, and malice, which conflict with the happiness of others (MM 6:458–60; V 27:692–95).
There are other traits that Kant praises but stops short of calling virtues, or that he calls virtues only inconsistently. These qualities generally include dispositions that do not presuppose maxims grounded in respect for rational nature, but that often indirectly promote morality. The “virtues of social intercourse,” “affability, sociability, courtesy, hospitality, and gentleness (in disagreeing without quarreling),” are among this group (MM 6:473). Although these are not genuine virtues, we nevertheless have a duty of virtue to foster these traits “so to associate the graces with virtue” (MM 6:473; Ant 7:282). Kant excludes from the “Doctrine of Virtue” duties and virtues particular to those of various ages, social positions, or sexes (MM 6:468–69). When Kant ventures into practical anthropology, however, he discusses vices and virtues characteristic of men and women, as well as various races and nations (Ant 7:303–321).
Kant finds points in his sentimentalist predecessors’ work on virtue both to share and to criticize. One area in which Kant takes Hutcheson to task involves our moral relation to ourselves. Kant disparages Hutcheson’s focus on the happiness of others and his treatment of duties to oneself as derivative from (because instrumental to our fulfillment of) our duties to others (C 27:340; V 27:580). Kant identifies respect for rational nature in all persons, including oneself, as the fundamental moral attitude, and recognizes duties to oneself as necessary and independent of duties to others. Indeed, Kant sometimes suggests that duties to oneself are more fundamental to morality than duties to others (C 27:341; V 27:579–80; and see MM 6:417–18). One area in which Kant seems both to agree with much of what Hume says—and to have been influenced by him—regards what Kant calls the “fanatical and monkish virtues.” Kant follows Hume in rejecting fasting, self-flagellation, mortification of the flesh and other forms of physical self-chastisement and self-abasement as false virtues. Kant condemns such attempts at “weakening and removing all the body’s sensuality, to renounce everything that its sensuous enjoyment promotes, so that thereby the animal nature of the body would be suppressed” as contrary to proper care for the body; such care requires discipline, but also “involves trying to promote its vigor, activity, strength, and courage” (C 27:379–80). Kant denies, however, Hume’s contention that humility belongs among the list of monkish virtues. For according to Kant, “humility presupposes a correct estimation of self, and keeps it in bounds” (H 27:39).
There are a number of similarities between Kant and Hume on the virtues. Kant’s account of the virtues shares with Hume a rejection of both Hobbes’s psychological egoism and Hutcheson’s reduction of all virtues to the sentiment of benevolence. Both Hume’s and Kant’s accounts of the virtues reflect their acceptance of versions of Grotius’s distinction between perfect and imperfect duties, though they do not incorporate this distinction into their theories in the same way (see Schneewind 1990).
Among the differences between Kant and Hume on the virtues is the fact that justice is an immensely significant artificial virtue for Hume, but is not treated by Kant as a virtue at all. For Kant, justice has primarily to do with one’s external treatment of others. As long as one does not hinder their freedom in a way that violates universal law or legitimate positive law, one complies with the demands of justice. One’s motive or attitude is irrelevant from the standpoint of justice. It is a matter not of justice itself, but of ethics, if one respects the rights of others not from fear of punishment but from respect for persons or law. The moral worth adhering to acting rightly out of respect for right is not part of justice, but of ethics; it is a matter of self-constraint or virtue. Another difference between Kant and Hume is that the traits, dispositions, and attitudes that Kant regards as genuine moral virtues reflect agents’ maxims and moral commitment. Hume casts a much wider net with regard to the qualities that count as virtues. Notably, these traits can be things that seem to be a matter less of choice and moral commitment and more of temperament or nature—such as wit or good memory. Wit and good memory are certainly things that Kant would think that agent’s might well cultivate in the promotion of their natural perfection. But for these traits to be considered Kantian virtues would require at least an agent’s morally grounded interest in and cultivation of them. Finally, there is a significant difference in how Kant and Hume regard sympathy. As we have seen, for Hume, sympathy is not simply one among a number of morally useful traits; it is a fundamental piece in the mechanism of moral approval and disapproval. Kant shares Hume’s views that sympathy involves the transmission of feelings among people, and that sympathy or a related sort of fellow feeling is present in other animals. Indeed, Kant even acknowledges the epistemic, communicative, and subordinate motivational roles that sympathy can play, and that justify an indirect duty to cultivate it. But Kant nevertheless regards sympathy as being of only conditional moral goodness, with its status as a virtue depending on its place in the motivational-deliberative framework of the agent. If sympathy is cultivated by an agent out of an interest in becoming more sensitive to the morally important needs of others, and employed in ascertaining how best to fulfill one’s duties of beneficence, then it is a virtue. If it is simply a natural tendency to suffer when others suffer, or to feel happy when others are, or if an agent indulges these feelings by doing whatever is in her power to alleviate the suffering of others she feels, without taking other morally significant features of the situation into account, it is not a virtue.
Hume addresses religion, and the relation between religion and morality, in many works. A Treatise of Human Nature (1739–1740) sets out Hume’s naturalistic account of human actions, passions, and morals, as well as arguing against the immateriality and immorality of the soul (book 1, part 4, section 5). In An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748), Hume argues that there is no rational or empirical basis for belief in miracles (section 10) or divine providence (section 11). He also calls attention to the tension between belief in God’s omniscience and human moral responsibility (section 8, part 2), and criticizes the argument from design (section 11). An Enquiry Concerning Principles of Morals (1751) treats morality as independent of religion and criticizes many traditional Christian virtues (section 9, part 1, 73–74). Hume’s A History of England provides many examples of the pernicious effects that religion can have. The sections on miracles and providence proved to be highly controversial parts of the first Enquiry.
In The Natural History of Religion (1757) Hume sets out what he sees as the origin and natural development of religion. He traces the origin ultimately to human beings’ ignorance of the unseen powers that so greatly affect our lives, and the hopes, fears, and imaginings that emerge from that predicament. In his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1779), he analyzes and refutes all of the main arguments of the day for the existence of God. He focuses particular attention on the argument from design, arguing that we cannot use it to infer anything either about God’s existence or nature. “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm” (1741) details and contrasts what Hume sees as two primary and pernicious species of false religion. In it, he describes superstition as grounded in “weakness, fear, melancholy, together with ignorance” (EMPL 74) and portrays it as generally more hostile to civil liberties and friendly to priestly power than enthusiasm. Hume describes enthusiasm as grounded in “hope, pride, presumption, a warm imagination, together with ignorance” (EMPL 74), and (compared with superstition) as less hospitable to priestly power, more supportive of civil liberties, and more conducive to violence (at least in the early stages of an enthusiastic religious movement). “Of Suicide” (1777), which argues that each individual should be able to decide for herself whether to go on living, challenges not only common moral and religious views about suicide. It also argues that common views about the wrongness of suicide are grounded in superstition or false religion. In truth, according to Hume, suicide wrongs neither God, nor one’s neighbor, nor oneself. In “Of the Immortality of the Soul” (1777), Hume argues against the alleged metaphysical, moral, and physical grounds for the soul’s immortality. Yet, as he often does when it comes to religious arguments, he gives the argument an equivocal edge. Although he argues that our experience provides no basis for belief in immortality of the soul, he claims that “the gospels, and the gospels alone” do support this belief (EMPL 161). Both “Of Suicide” and “Of the Immortality of the Soul” were published after Hume’s death, as was Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. The essays were originally written at the same time as The Natural History of Religion (the 1750s) and destined for publication at the same time. But there was so much controversy surrounding pamphlet versions of “Of Suicide” and “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” that Hume decided against their publication during his lifetime.
For Hume, morality is independent of religion. He articulates a secular theory of virtue and moral sense, and an account of moral obligation as independent of divine commands. Hume’s interest in separating morality from religion may stem in part from his genuinely viewing then as conceptually distinct and independent at a fundamental level. But surely at least part of his motivation for doing this is Hume’s sense that religion can distort morality if they are not clearly separated. Although Hume is well aware of certain rational, intellectually estimable people, such as Bishop Joseph Butler and Sir Isaac Newton, who held some sort of religious belief, he sees religion as inviting superstition and enthusiasm, which can corrupt our estimation of what morality genuinely requires, and what moral merit genuinely consists in. Indeed, religious zealotry may mask or compete with moral obligation. (For a recent, book-length exploration of the significance for his moral philosophy of Hume’s views about God and religion, see Holden 2010.)
Just as Hume strives to provide a naturalistic account of morality, he attempts to provide a naturalistic account of religion. His fullest account of the origin of religion is The Natural History of Religion. Hume describes polytheism as the earliest form of religion. He describes it as emerging from the hopes and fears of early human beings concerning their own future well being—“the anxious concern for happiness, the dread of future misery, the terror of death, the thirst of revenge, the appetite for food and other necessities”—combined with ignorance of the future, “where the true springs and causes of every event are entirely concealed from us,” and where thus we recognize our own lack of power to effect desired outcomes. “[In] this disordered scene, with eyes still more disordered and astonished, they see the first obscure traces of divinity” (NHR 2.5). Early humans began to project their hopes and fears, desires and passions, out onto the world around them, imagining objects such as celestial lights, rivers, and fire to be or be controlled by beings who are like us but far more powerful. Imagining the world and its objects and forces to be beings of passion, belief, and self-interest gave us some comfort, by allowing us to think that these gods could be appeased or appealed to by means of our prayers, sacrifices, and supplications. Only much later did human beings lurch (sporadically, with much backsliding) toward monotheism, by imbuing some god who had special relevance to them with increasingly great powers.
In addition to examining how religious belief and practice came about, Hume explores the question of religion’s justification. He does this most extensively in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Though he discusses the cosmological argument (or “argument a priori”) in that work, his focus is on the argument from design (or “argument a posteriori”), which was the dominant argument among philosophers at the time, and with which Hume seems (at least comparatively) sympathetic. In part II, Cleanthes states that if you look at the world, you will see that it is “nothing but one great machine” with smaller and smaller machines as its parts. All its parts are astoundingly well adapted to one another and to their purposes, as though (but better than if) they and the whole had been created by a human designer. Given the similarity between the world’s organization and complexity, and the organization and complexity of human-made machines, “all the rules of analogy” lead us to conclude that the world is a work of design, that the designer is similar, but also far superior to, a human being in its relevant creative and intelligent faculties (DR 15).
Against this argument, Hume has Demea and Philo level many objections and counterarguments. Only some of them are provided here. First, through much of the Dialogues, Hume argues that the analogy between human-made objects and the world is too weak to imply that the world has a designer; the effects are not similar enough to imply similar causes. Second, the argument does not obviously end the train of explanation for the world, if such explanation is in fact needed. If the existence of the world (or of the world’s order) needs to be explained, and the existence of a designer explains it, we seem to need an explanation of the existence of the designer (or of the designer’s divine order) (DR IV). Third, if we grant from the order of the world that it is a product of design, we need not conclude that there is only one designer. The world could be the product of several designers working together. Or it might be the work of one god, but not the god that is the best designer. Or it might be the product of a single god, but a god who now lets it run on its own. In other words, the argument from design does not prove the existence of the kind of God that Cleanthes and his real-world counterparts want it to (DR V). Finally, and along the same lines the previous point, even if we grant that there is one (or more) divine designer, the argument from design does not show that the designer has the perfections Cleanthes and his fellow Christians attribute to God. In particular, if we base our inferences regarding God’s nature from God’s creation, God seems quite imperfect in his benevolence (DR X-XI).
Many of Kant’s works deal with religion in one way or another. We cover a bit about most but certainly not all of these works and their treatment of religion. The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763) contains analyses of some of the main arguments for the existence of God popular in philosophical circles at the time; Kant critiques them, favoring a modified version of the ontological argument, but ultimately asserting that “[i]t is absolutely necessary that one should convince oneself that God exists; that His existence should be demonstrated, however, is not so necessary” (OPA 2:163). Kant returns to his critique of philosophical theology many years later, in his Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion (1817, second edition 1830). Although not published until many years after his death, these lectures are most likely from a course during winter semester of 1783–1784 (Wood 1978, 14–15). In the negative, first half of this work, Kant argues against ontological, cosmological, and physiotheological arguments for God’s existence; in the positive, second half, he gives an early version of his moral argument for the existence of God. He sets out a practical faith, arguing in part ad absurdum practicum that anyone who denies God’s existence “would have to be a scoundrel” (LPDR 28:1083). He also here articulates his moral theology, stating that “the three articles of moral faith, God, freedom of the human will, and a moral world, are the only articles in which it is permissible for us to transport ourselves in thought beyond all possible experience and out of the sensible world” (LPDR 28:1091).
All three Critiques reflect Kant’s developing thought about the intersection between religion and morality. Kant begins the Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787) by explaining that the practically necessary assumptions of God, freedom, and immortality are “not possible unless at the same time speculative reason be deprived of its pretensions to transcendent insight” and stating that, in this work, he has “had to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith” (B xxx). Kant thinks that once we appreciate the limits of human reason, we will see that a metaphysical demonstration of God’s existence—and indeed, cognition of God—is impossible. Once we stop seeking such a demonstration, we stop playing with speculative arguments to substantiate claims to know that God does (or does not) exist, and turn instead to practical arguments to justify the belief in God’s existence. “The Ideal of Pure Reason,” in the “Transcendental Dialectic,” contains refutations of various speculative arguments for the existence of God, and goes on to discus God as a regulative ideal of reason (i.e., an idea that orients our thinking), but not as a concept of an object that can be known. “The Canon of Pure Reason” sets out the moral basis for belief in God, grounding it in our rationally necessary hope for the highest good (which Kant here suggests constitutes a necessary incentive to morality). The Critique of Practical Reason further develops Kant’s practical argument for belief in God, freedom, and immortality, arguing that these things are postulates of pure practical reason, belief in which is theoretically permissible and practically necessary. The role of God as a point of orientation in the moral life and as a need of reason is also articulated in the essay, “What is Orientation in Thinking” (1786). In the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant reiterates the practical argument for the existence of God, though in a way somewhat different than in the second Critique. His emphasis in this later work has more to do with teleology, and with how we can think of God as acting through nature and history. In this respect, the third Critique has themes in common with some of Kant’s essays on history and politics, such as “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose,” “Toward a Perpetual Peace,” and “On the Saying: This May be True in Theory, but it Does Not Apply in Practice.”
Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793) tackles fundamental issues related to morality and religion. Early parts of the book deal primarily with the relation between good and evil tendencies in human nature, the question of the nature of moral goodness and the possibility of grace, the relation between the noumenal and phenomenal aspects of the self, and the notion of the radical evil in human nature. Later chapters provide a critical examination of organized religion, argue for the superiority of Christianity over other ecclesiastical faiths, distinguish between true and counterfeit service of God, and emphasize the importance of ethical-religious communities as vehicles for individual and collective moral progress. Despite Kant’s favorable discussions of Christianity, his criticisms of certain common religious practices and tendencies within the Christianity of his day attracted serious political criticism. A 1794 cabinet order of Fredrick II forbade Kant from lecturing on or publishing his views on religion; Kant considered this prohibition ended upon the King’s death in 1797.
Discussion of God and religion emerges in both Kant’s Metaphysics of Morals and his lectures on ethics. In the Metaphysics of Morals, we see Kant stating that we can have no duties to God, but at most a duty of religion, which is a duty to oneself to recognize all one’s moral duties as divine commands (MM 6:443–44, 486–88). This work also contains an appendix on moral pedagogy, in which Kant both takes us again through the moral argument for the existence of God (here through a dialogue between teacher and student) and emphasizes the importance of keeping moral instruction prior to and distinct from religious instruction, so as to preserve the purity of the moral motive and the grasp of the true basis of moral obligation (MM 6: 477–84). Kant’s lectures on ethics address such wide-ranging issues of morality and religion as Kant’s moral criticisms of atheism, the independence of morality from religion, the corrupting influence of counterfeit religious service on morality, and the absence of special duties to God.
There are numerous other essays in which religion is a topic, such as “Dreams of a Spirit Seer” (1766), which criticizes religious mysticism of the Swinbergian ilk; “Miscarriage of All Trials in Philosophical Theology” (1791), which discusses the proper limits of reason regarding religion; and “Contest of the Faculties” (1798), which discusses differences between the philosophy faculty and those of law and medicine and theology, in addition to exploring questions of divine providence and human progress. Religion is also a topic in a collection of Kant’s notes, published long after his death as the Opus Postumum (1936, 1938); this work includes discussion of the nature of God, the highest good, and faith. (See Föster 2000.)
Some of the main themes and theses that emerge from Kant’s work on the relation between morality and religion are as follows. Kant argues against both those who claim to know of God’s existence based on metaphysical demonstration and those who claim to know of God’s existence based on direct mystical experience. He objects on both metaphysical and moral grounds to “dogmatic atheism,” which claims knowledge of God’s nonexistence. He is less critical of “skeptical atheism,” which withholds assent from the claim that God exists—perhaps based on the understandable, though according to Kant, false, assumption that belief in God’s existence can be warranted only by speculative proofs. Kant is highly critical of religion as commonly practiced. He is concerned about both the power of religious officials and the corrupting influence religious belief and practice can have on people who do not clearly separate morality and religion, recognizing morality as more fundamental. One way that Kant gives priority to morality over religion is by arguing that belief in God follows from a moral commitment, and denying that recognition of the moral law follows from or must be grounded in recognition of God’s authority. A second way in which Kant treats morality as fundamental is by denying that we have any duties to God. All that God commands us to do is what morality requires: our duties to ourselves and others. Yet a third way that Kant gives priority to morality is that Kant insists that children not be taught about religion until they are familiar with basic moral concepts and principles; otherwise, they may think, for example, that the reason one should act rightly is to hope for God’s favor and to avoid God’s punishment. Kant argues that Christianity is superior to other ecclesiastical faiths because of the centrality of ethics within it from its inception (Rel 6:167), but that all ecclesiastical faiths are liable to corruption; all require careful, morally informed interpretation of their revealed texts; and none is the ideal form for religion to take. Kant thinks that true religion is possible and highly desirable. Ideally, we will dispense with distinct ecclesiastical faiths, along with their revealed texts and doctrinal statutes and observances, in favor of a universal, pure religion of reason, dedicated to morality. Kant thinks that only through joining voluntary, ethical-religious communities can human beings make moral progress. Kant is a moral theist, arguing that the only argument for God’s existence is one that establishes belief in God, but not knowledge of God. This argument, a version of which we discuss below, establishes belief in God by appeal to moral considerations—specifically, by arguing that postulating God’s existence is necessary for thinking of the highest practical good as possible, and thus rendering morality credible. For Kant, God is a regulative ideal, which serves to orient us in our moral life. Kant uses a related argument to argue for the immortality of the soul as practical postulate.
Among the many significant aspects of Kant’s philosophy of religion, perhaps the most important is his moral theism, along with his main argument for it. Moral theism is belief in God founded on morality. By belief (or faith) [Glaube], Kant means something different from knowledge [Wissen] (A 822/B 850; WOT 8:140–41). Believing and knowing both involve holding something to be true. According to Kant, when one knows something, one holds it to be true on grounds that are “subjectively and objectively” sufficient, whereas when one believes something, one holds it to be true on grounds that are subjectively but not objectively sufficient (A 822/B 850). Here, Kant takes objective sufficiency to imply valid theoretical grounds, such as evidence or theoretical argument; he takes subjective sufficiency, by contrast, to imply valid practical grounds. So according to Kant, belief entails having valid practical reasons for holding something to be true, while lacking valid theoretical reasons for doing so. Indeed, when it comes to belief in God, Kant does not think that knowledge is possible (CPJ 5:471–72).
Kant’s moral theism contains a distinctly moral conception of God. In addition to the attributes of omniscience, omnipresence, and omnipotence, Kant ascribes to God the moral attributes of holiness, benevolence, and justice (LPDR 28:1073–74). God is not only author and executor of the moral law, but also as its “personification” (C 27:322; V 27:530, 723; LPDR 28:1076, 1091). Kant says that all moral requirements can be seen as divine commands (CPrR 5:129; Rel 6:153). God knows and cares about our virtue and well-being. In particular, he cares about the realization of the highest good, in which people attain maximal virtue and, consequently, maximal happiness. This is a God who has created the world, has incorporated morality into the world, and has a moral plan for the world (CPrR 5:125; CPJ 5:450). Belief in God allows us to retain our faith that some of our moral actions will produce the intended good consequences, and that if we strive our best to promote the highest good, God will complete the task (C 27:310, 321–22; CPJ 5:450–53; Rel 6:74–77, 192, 201–202).
The relation between God and the highest good is the basis of Kant’s main argument for belief in God. (See Wood 1970.) This argument is most clearly articulated in the Critique of Practical Reason, and goes like this (CPrR 5:110–14, 124–46). The moral law issues categorical demands through each agent’s own reason. If the moral law sets forth an end for us to promote, we must promote it. For our promotion of this end to be rational, the end must be one that we can rationally view as possible for us to promote through our own agency. The moral law gives rise to the highest good (i.e., virtue and conditioned, proportionate happiness), as practical reason’s ultimate end. Thus, we must promote it. Yet it is not clear that we are capable of effecting the highest good, given the limitations of our agency and the conditions and workings of the natural world. If the realization of the highest good is not possible, however, then we cannot rationally promote it as an end; indeed, we cannot even make sense of it as an end. But if we do not promote the highest good, we flout the moral law. Now, suppose that there were a supreme, eternal, all powerful, all knowing ruler of the universe (i.e., God); he could bring to completion our imperfect strivings for the highest good. Thus, if we postulate the existence of God, we can view the highest good as possible, and can rationally follow morality’s command to promote it. There is no reason not to postulate God’s existence, since his non-existence cannot be proven, and since belief in him does not conflict with any necessary beliefs (CPrR 5:135–43). In addition, since belief in God is necessary for seeing the highest good as possible, we must believe in God (CPrR 5:125–26, 142–46). Thus, belief in God is grounded in the necessity of seeing the highest good as possible, and so for the rational compliance with morality. Thus, Kant says that belief in God is morally necessary, and that morality leads ineluctably to religion (CPrR 5:125). We do not, however, have a duty to believe in God. Postulating God’s existence is a theoretical exercise of reason, which cannot be morally commanded (CPrR 5:125, 144). Rather, our duty to promote the highest good gives rise to “a need of reason” to assume the possibility of the highest good. From this need emerges the necessity of postulating God’s existence.
Kant’s practical argument differs profoundly from the speculative arguments for God’s existence popular in Kant’s day–i.e., ontological, cosmological, and physiotheological proofs. His moral argument grounds the necessity of believing in God in each person’s practical reason, required to “orient ourselves in thinking” (WOT 8:136–37). According to Kant, belief in God is “a postulate of pure practical reason”: “a theoretical proposition which is not as such demonstrable, but which is an inseparable corollary of an a priori unconditionally valid practical law” (CPrR 5:122). Although practical arguments cannot provide knowledge of God’s existence, they can provide “moral certainty” of God’s existence (A 828–30/B 856–58; CPrR 5:134, 143; LPDR 28:1011–12). Such moral certainty is stronger than the sort of confidence one could obtain from any theoretical argument.
Hume’s influence on Kant regarding the intersection of religion and morality is evident, though difficult to measure. It is also hard to tell how much of the influence came directly from Hume’s writings. Hume is not often cited regarding religion in Kant’s major works. Kant’s Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion, however, suggest familiarity with Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, a work which Kant could have read in its entirety in 1781 (Wood 1978, 14–15), and perhaps in part when it first came out, since Hamann translated the first and last parts of it for him (Kuehn 2001, 121). Kant explicitly discusses Hume’s Dialogues in the section on the physiotheological proof, which is what Kant calls the argument from design (see LPDR 28:1063–4). Furthremore, in the Danzig manuscript of these lectures, Kant cites Hume within his argument against the cosmotheological proof (Ak 28:1266) (Wood 1978, 83n31). Kant was clearly also familiar with Hume’s The Natural History of Religion. In “A History of Natural Theology, according to Meiners’ Historia doctrinae de uno vero Deo,” Kant refers briefly to Hume’s account of polytheists as tolerant in section 9 of The Natural History of Religion (LPDR 28:1125).
It is interesting to note that many philosophers and other intellectuals in Königsberg in the late 1750s and early 1760s seem to have attributed to Hume a view of religion that has something significant in common with Kant’s mature view. Hamann and others saw Hume’s skepticism as necessary for purging religion of its poor arguments and traditional associations, and clearing the way for true religion. One source for this view of Hume is the conclusion of book I of the Treatise, which Hamann translated into German (with some alterations and excisions to hide its origin) and published anonymously in 1771 under the title “Night Thoughts of a Sceptic” (Kuehn 2001, 198–201). Another source is the end of the dialogues, where Philo says, “To be a philosophical skeptic is, in a man of letters, the first and most essential step towards being a sound, believing Christian” (DR 89). This statement is out of line with Philo’s previous assertions and arguments, and comes as a surprise at this point in the Dialogues. Many take Hume to be arguing here that once a person has rid themselves of philosophically suspect rational justifications for belief in God, he is free to embrace religion based simply on faith. At least this seems to be how Hamann took Hume. Kant, of course is no fideist, for he does not take a leap of faith based on revealed religion to be the proper ground for belief in God. Still, Kant does endorse the notion that when one clears away the fallacious or at least inadequate metaphysical arguments for the existence of God found in philosophical theology, one is able to see that morality itself offers an argument for God’s existence which both allows for (moral) certainty and addresses people in a moving, concrete way.
Some of Kant’s views that seem to agree with, if not reflect, Hume’s include the following: the independence of morality from religion and the importance of keeping the two distinct; concern about the corrupting influence of false religion, including fanaticism and superstition; and an interest in undermining traditional arguments for the existence of God. Among the main differences are that Kant sees the primary importance of dismissing the speculative arguments for the existence of God to lie in its opening the way to his moral argument for the existence of God; Hume seems primarily interested in the negative arguments themselves, or perhaps in allowing for the sort of fideism that Philo presents in the Dialogues.
Hume’s main works of moral philosophy are the following.
|[EPM]||An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998. [Originally published in 1751.] (Cited as according to section, part [if any], and paragraph number.)|
|[T]||A Treatise of Human Nature: A Critical Edition, David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1739–1740.] (Cited according to book, part, section, and paragraph number.)|
Many of Hume’s other works are also relevant to his moral philosophy. We cite or discuss the following.
|[DR]||Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion in Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and the Posthumous Essays “Of the Immortality of the Soul” and “Of Suicide,” Richard H. Popkin (ed.), Indianapolis: The Hackett Publishing Company, 1980. [Originally published in 1779.] (Cited according to part [in Roman numerals] or page number [in Arabic numerals].)|
|[EHU]||An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. [Originally published in 1748.] (Cited according to section, part [if any], and paragraph number.)|
|[EMPL]||Essays Moral, Political, and Literary, Eugene Miller (ed.), Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1985. Two essays are cited according to page number: “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm,” pp. 73–79 [Originally published in 1741] and “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” pp. 590–98. [Originally published in 1777.]|
|[NHR]||The Natural History of Religion in David Hume: A Dissertation on the Passions; The Natural History of Religion, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1757.] (Cited according to page number.)|
Unless noted otherwise, we cite the pagination (beginning with volume number) of the Akademie Ausgabe edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1900–. This pagination can be found in the margins of most scholarly English translations, including The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992–.
Kant’s main works of moral philosophy are the following.
|[CPrR]||Critique of Practical Reason, in Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1788.]|
|[G]||Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, in Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1785.]|
|[MM]||The Metaphysics of Morals, in Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1797.]|
Many other works are also relevant to Kant’s moral philosophy. We cite or discuss the following.
|[Ant]||Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, Robert B. Louden (trans.), in Anthropology, History, and Education, Günter Zöller and Robert B. Louden (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1798.]|
|[CPJ]||Critique of the Power of Judgment, Paul Guyer (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000. [Originally published in 1790.]|
|[A], [B]||Critique of Pure Reason, Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (trans., eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988. ([A] citations refer to the pagination of the first edition of 1781 and [B] citations refer to the pagination of the second edition of 1787.)|
|[H], [C], [M], [V]||Lectures on Ethics, Peter Heath (trans., ed.) and J.B. Schneewind (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997. [Translation based on material published in the Akademie Ausgabe from 1974–1980.] ([H] citations refer to lecture transcriptions attributed to Herder, circa 1762–1764; [C] to Collins, circa 1774–1777; [M] to Mrongovius in 1784–1785; and [V] to Vigilantius, in 1793–1794.|
|[LPDR]||Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion, Allen W. Wood (trans.), in Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1817, second edition 1830, reflecting lectures most likely from 1783–1784.]|
|[NF]||Notes and Fragments, Curtis Brown (trans.), Frederick Rauscher (trans.), and Paul Guyer (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005. [Translation based primarily on Kant’s handwritten remains from the 1750s through the 1790s, contained in Akademie Ausgabe volumes published 1913-1934.] (Citations include reflection number in addition to volume and page number.)|
|[OFBS]||Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and the Sublime, Paul Guyer (trans.), in Anthropology, History, and Education, Günter Zöller and Robert B. Louden (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1764.]|
|[OPA]||The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God, David Walford (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy: 1755-1770, David Walford and Ralf Meerbote (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Originally published in 1763.]|
|[OP]||Opus Postumum, Ekart Förster (trans., ed.) and Michael Rosen (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993. [Translation based on material written primarily circa 1796–1801 and published in the Akademie Ausgabe in 1936 and 1938.]|
|[Prol]||Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics That Will Be Able to Come Forward as a Science, Gary Hatfield (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, Henry Allison and Peter Heath (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Originally published in 1783.]|
|[Rel]||Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, George di Giovani (trans.) in Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1793.]|
|[WOT]||“What does it mean to orient oneself in thinking?,” Allen W. Wood (trans.) in Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1786.]|
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