Notes to Locke On Freedom

1. Stuart (2013: 398) notes that in the 17th century, the word “prefer” had the (now obsolete) meaning of forwarding, advancing, or promoting a certain result, as in “A little shaking prefers the growth of the tree”. Stuart suggests that this may explain why Locke also describes the will’s exercise, even in E1, as “choosing”, a kind of “mental exertion or impetus” that clearly differs from the merely passive state of being pleased with something. But Locke is not using the locution “prefer X”; rather, he is using the locution “prefer X to Y”. And preferring something to something else, even following 17th century usage, is not a matter of forwarding, advancing, or promoting X over Y. So the text really does suggest that Locke provides a straightforwardly desiderative conception of the will in E1 (see Yaffe 2000: 98–101).

2. Having distinguished so carefully in E2 between the will and desire, it is therefore unfortunate that Locke does not do more to clean up his discussion of the will in E2–5. Numerous references to preferring and being pleased with, as characterizing volition, remain in E2–5, even as Locke inserts new language in an attempt to distance himself from the desiderative conception of the will. For example, Locke continues to treat the question of “whether a Man can will, what he wills” as equivalent to the question of whether a man can “be pleased with what he is pleased with” (E1–5 II.xxi.25: 247). And he claims that the “preferring of Action to its absence, is the willing of it” (E1–5 II.xxi.21: 244).

3. If this is right, then Locke’s category of “involuntary” action captures what current philosophers of action would describe as “non-voluntary” action. For in contemporary philosophy of action, involuntary actions are characterized as actions that are performed by an agent who wills that they not occur. See SEP entry on voluntary euthanasia..

4. Locke also describes “the sitting still even of a Paralytick, whilst he preferrs it to a removal” as “truly voluntary” (E1–5 II.xxi.11: 239). But one might worry that if the paralyzed person knows that he is unable to move, then it is impossible for him to willingly forbear moving (Stuart 2013: 406). Now if the worry here is fed by the concern that the paralyzed person’s immobility is overdetermined, then the answer is the same as the answer to the worry about the man in the locked room: overdetermination does not entail that the volition is not a cause of the immobility. But the worry might be, as Stuart puts it, that

[w]illing the forbearance of an action, where one believes the action to be impossible anyway, is problematic in much the same way as willing an action that one believes to be impossible under the circumstances.

For example, it is just as impossible for me to will to forbear jumping over my house as it is for me to will to jump over my house. But there are problems with this reading of Locke. For there is no good reason to suppose that Locke’s “Paralytick” knows or believes that he is paralyzed. After all, this example comes on the heels of the “locked room” case, in which the man who is locked in does not know or believe that he is unable to leave (having been carried into the room “whilst fast asleep”).

5. Jolley (1999: 129) claims that

for Locke, A is free with respect to doing x just in case if he wants to do x he is able to do x and if he wants not to do x he is able not to do x.

This is close to capturing Locke’s conception of freedom in E1, given that Locke conceives of willing in E1 as a matter of preferring, i.e., wanting, x. But Jolley’s gloss doesn’t fit E2–5, wherein Locke distances himself from the “wanting” conception of willing.

6. Yaffe (2000) argues that Locke takes freedom of action to be insufficient for “full-fledged” freedom, which requires, in addition to freedom of action, the state of having one’s volitions determined by the greatest good (in E1) or the power to bring it about that one’s volitions are determined by the greatest good (in E2–5). Responses to Yaffe include Rickless (2001), Lowe (2004), and Chappell (2004).

7. There is some controversy over whether the power to suspend is active or passive. When one exercises the power to suspend, does this happen as a result of willing to suspend, or does suspension happen to us passively? Included among those who think Locke’s power of suspension is active are Magri 2000, Stuart 2013, Rickless 2014, and Garrett 2015; for a contrary view, see Walsh 2014; and for the view that Locke is agnostic on this question, see LoLordo 2012.

8. Stuart (2013: 464–465) also claims that there is no inconsistency, but his reasons are different. He argues that Locke answers the II.xxi.25 question negatively, but then claims that, for Locke, the power to suspend is not an ability to avoid willing, but rather an ability to will not to perform some action under consideration.

9. For an argument that Locke views the ability to suspend as a prerequisite for moral agency generally, see LoLordo (2012: 46 ff.).

Copyright © 2020 by
Samuel Rickless <>

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