Locke On Freedom

First published Mon Nov 16, 2015; substantive revision Tue Jan 21, 2020

John Locke’s views on the nature of freedom of action and freedom of will have played an influential role in the philosophy of action and in moral psychology. Locke offers distinctive accounts of action and forbearance, of will and willing, of voluntary (as opposed to involuntary) actions and forbearances, and of freedom (as opposed to necessity). These positions lead him to dismiss the traditional question of free will as absurd, but also raise new questions, such as whether we are (or can be) free in respect of willing and whether we are free to will what we will, questions to which he gives divergent answers. Locke also discusses the (much misunderstood) question of what determines the will, providing one answer to it at one time, and then changing his mind upon consideration of some constructive criticism proposed by his friend, William Molyneux. In conjunction with this change of mind, Locke introduces a new doctrine (concerning the ability to suspend the fulfillment of one’s desires) that has caused much consternation among his interpreters, in part because it threatens incoherence. As we will see, Locke’s initial views do suffer from clear difficulties that are remedied by his later change of mind, all without introducing incoherence.

Note on the text: Locke’s theory of freedom is contained in Book II, Chapter xxi of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The chapter underwent five revisions in Locke’s lifetime [E1 (1689), E2 (1694), E3 (1695), E4 (1700), and E5 (1706)], with the last edition published posthumously. Significant changes, including a considerable lengthening of the chapter, occur in E2; and important changes appear in E5.

1. Actions and Forbearances

For Locke, the question of whether human beings are free is the question of whether human beings are free with respect to their actions and forbearances. As he puts it:

[T]he Idea of Liberty, is the Idea of a Power in any Agent to do or forbear any Action, according to the determination or thought of the mind, whereby either of them is preferr’d to the other. (E1–4 II.xxi.8: 237)

In order to understand Locke’s conception of freedom, then, we need to understand his conception of action and forbearance.

There are three main accounts of Locke’s theory of action. According to what we might call the “Doing” theory of action, actions are things that we do (actively), as contrasted to things that merely happen to us (passively). If someone pushes my arm up, then my arm rises, but, one might say, I did not raise it. That my arm rose is something that happened to me, not something I did. By contrast, when I signal to a friend who has been looking for me, I do something inasmuch as I am not a mere passive recipient of a stimulus over which I have no control. According to some interpreters (e.g., Stuart 2013: 405, 451), Locke’s actions are doings in this sense. According to the “Composite” or “Millian” theory of action, an action is “[n]ot one thing, but a series of two things; the state of mind called a volition, followed by an effect” (Mill 1974 [1843]: 55). On this view, for example, the action of raising my hand is composed of (i) willing to produce the effect of my hand’s rising and (ii) the effect itself, where (ii) results from (i). According to some interpreters (arguably, Lowe 1986: 120–121; Lowe 1995: 141—though it is possible that Lowe’s theory applies only to voluntary actions), Locke’s actions are composite in this sense. Finally, according to what we might call the “Deflationary” conception of action, actions are simply motions of bodies or operations of minds.

Some of what Locke says suggests that he holds the “Doing” theory of action: “when [a Body] is set in motion it self, that Motion is rather a Passion, than an Action in it”, for “when the Ball obeys the stroke of a Billiard-stick, it is not any action of the Ball, but bare passion” (E1–5 II.xxi.4: 235—see also E4–5 II.xxi.72: 285–286). Here Locke is clearly working with a sense of “action” according to which actions are opposed to passions. But, on reflection, it is unlikely that this is what Locke means by “action” when he writes about voluntary/involuntary actions and freedom of action. For Locke describes “a Man striking himself, or his Friend, by a Convulsive motion of his Arm, which it is not in his Power…to…forbear” as “acting” (E1–5 II.xxi.9: 238), and describes the convulsive leg motion caused by “that odd Disease called Chorea Sancti Viti [St. Vitus’s Dance]” as an “Action” (E1–5 II.xxi.11: 239). It would be a mistake to think of these convulsive motions as “doings”, for they are clearly things that “happen” to us in just the way that it happens to me that my arm rises when someone else raises it. Examples of convulsive actions also suggest that the Millian account of Locke’s theory of action is mistaken. For in the case of convulsive motion, there is no volition that one’s limbs move; indeed, if there is volition in such cases, it is usually a volition that one’s limbs not move. Such actions, then, cannot be composed of a volition and the motion that is willed, for the relevant volition is absent (more on volition below).

We are therefore left with the Deflationary conception of action, which is well supported by the text. There are, Locke says, “but two sorts of Action, whereof we have any Idea, viz. Thinking and Motion” (E1–5 II.xxi.4: 235—see also E1–5 II.xxi.8: 237 and E4–5 II.xxi.72: 285); “Thinking, and Motion…are the two Ideas which comprehend in them all Action” (E1–5 II.xxii.10: 293). It may be that, in the sense in which “action” is opposed to “passion”, some corporeal motions and mental operations, being produced by external causes rather than self-initiated, are not actions. But that is not the sense in which all motions and thoughts are “called and counted Actions” in Locke’s theory of action (E4–5 II.xxi.72: 285). As seems clear, convulsive motions are actions inasmuch as they are motions, and thoughts that occur in the mind unbidden are actions inasmuch as they are mental operations.

What, then, according to Locke, are forbearances? On some interpretations (close counterparts to the Millian conception of action), Locke takes forbearances to be voluntary not-doings (e.g., Stuart 2013: 407) or voluntary omissions to act (e.g., Lowe 1995: 123). There are texts that suggest as much:

sitting still, or holding one’s peace, when walking or speaking are propos’d, [are] mere forbearances, requiring…the determination of the Will. (E2–5 II.xxi.28: 248)

However, Locke distinguishes between voluntary and involuntary forbearances (E2–5 II.xxi.5: 236), and it makes no sense to characterize an involuntary forbearance as an involuntary voluntary not-doing. So it is unlikely that Locke thinks of forbearances as voluntary not-doings. This leaves the Deflationary conception of forbearance, according to which a forbearance is the opposite of an action, namely an episode of rest or absence of thought. On this conception, to say that someone forbore running is to say that she did not run, not that she voluntarily failed to run. Every forbearance would be an instance of inaction, not a refraining.

In E2–5, Locke stipulates that he uses the word “action” to “comprehend the forbearance too of any Action proposed”, in order to “avoid the multiplying of words” (E2–5 II.xxi.28: 248). The reason he so stipulates is not that he literally takes forbearances to be actions (as he puts it, they “pass for” actions), but that most everything that he wants to say about actions (in particular, the distinction between voluntary and involuntary actions, and the account of freedom of action) applies pari passu to forbearances (see below).

2. Will and Willing

Within the category of actions, Locke distinguishes between those that are voluntary and those that are involuntary. To understand this distinction, we need to understand Locke’s account of the will and his account of willing (or volition). For Locke, the will is a power (ability, faculty—see E1–5 II.xxi.20: 244) possessed by a person (or by that person’s mind). Locke explains how we come by the idea of power (in Humean vein, as the result of observation of constant conjunctions—“like Changes [being] made, in the same things, by like Agents, and by the like ways” (E1–5 II.xxi.1: 233)), but does not offer a theory of the nature of power. What we are told is that “Powers are Relations” (E1–5 II.xxi.19: 243), relations “to Action or Change” (E1–5 II.xxi.3: 234), and that powers are either active (powers to make changes) or passive (powers to receive changes) (E1–5 II.xxi.2: 234). In this sense, the will is an active relation to actions.

Locke’s predecessors had thought of the will as intimately related to the faculty of desire or appetite. For the Scholastics (whose works Locke read as a student at Oxford), the will is the power of rational appetite. For Thomas Hobbes (by whom Locke was deeply influenced even though this was not something he could advertise, because Hobbes was a pariah in Locke’s intellectual and political circles), the will is simply the power of desire itself. Remnants of this desiderative conception of the will remain in Locke’s theory, particularly in the first edition of the Essay. Here, for example, is Locke’s official E1 account of the will:

This Power the Mind has to prefer the consideration of any Idea to the not considering it; or to prefer the motion of any part of the body to its rest. (E1 II.xxi.5: 236)

And here is Locke’s official E1 account of preferring:

Well, but what is this Preferring? It is nothing but the being pleased more with the one, than the other. (E1 II.xxi.28: 248)

So, in E1, the will is the mind’s power to be more pleased with the consideration of an idea than with the not considering it, or to be more pleased with the motion of a part of one’s body than with its remaining at rest. When we lack something that would deliver more pleasure than we currently experience, we become uneasy at its absence. And this kind of uneasiness (or pain: E1–5 II.vii.1: 128), is what Locke describes as desire (E1–5 II.xx.6: 230; E2–5 II.xxi.31–32: 251) (though also as “joined with”, “scarce distinguishable from”, and a “cause” of desire—see Section 8 below). So, in E1, the will is the mind’s power to desire or want the consideration of an idea more than the not considering it, or to desire or want the motion of a part of one’s body more than its remaining at rest. (At E2–5 II.xxi.5: 236, Locke adds “and vice versâ”, to clarify that it can also happen, even according to the E1 account, that one prefers not considering an idea to considering it, or not moving to moving.)[1]

In keeping with this conception of the will as desire, Locke in E1 then defines an exercise of the will, which he calls “willing” or “volition”, as an “actual preferring” of one thing to another (E1 II.xxi.5: 236). For example, I have the power to prefer the upward motion of my arm to its remaining at rest by my side. This power, in E1, is one aspect of my will. When I exercise this power, I actually prefer the upward motion of my arm to its remaining at rest, i.e., I am more pleased with my arm’s upward motion than I am with its continuing to rest. This is what Locke, in E1, thinks of as my willing the upward motion of my arm (or, as he sometimes puts it, my willing or volition to move my arm upward).

In E2–5, Locke explicitly gives up this conception of the will and willing, explaining why he does so, making corresponding changes in the text of the Essay, even while leaving passages that continue to suggest the desiderative conception. He writes: “[T]hough a Man would preferr flying to walking, yet who can say he ever wills it?” (E2–5 II.xxi.15: 241). The thought here is that, as Locke (rightly) recognizes, my being more pleased with flying than walking does not consist in (or even entail) my willing to fly. This is in large part because it is necessarily implied in willing motion of a certain sort that one exert dominion that one takes oneself to have (E2–5 II.xxi.15: 241), that “the mind [endeavor] to give rise…to [the motion], which it takes to be in its power” (E2–5 II.xxi.30: 250). So if I do not believe that it is in my power to fly, then it is impossible for me to will the motion of flying, even though I might be more pleased with flying than I am with any alternative. Locke concludes (with the understatement) that “Preferring which seems perhaps best to express the Act of Volition, does it not precisely” (E2–5 II.xxi.15: 240–241).

In addition, Locke points out that it is possible for “the Will and Desire [to] run counter”. For example, as a result of being coerced or threatened, I might will to persuade someone of something, even though I desire that I not succeed in persuading her. Or, suffering from gout, I might desire to be eased of the pain in my feet, and yet at the same time, recognizing that the translation of such pain would affect my health for the worse, will that I not be eased of my foot pain. In concluding that “desiring and willing are two distinct Acts of the mind”, Locke must be assuming (reasonably) that it is not possible to will an action and its contrary at the same time (E2–5 II.xxi.30: 250).[2]

With what conception of the will and willing does Locke replace the abandoned desiderative conception? The answer is that in E2–5 Locke describes the will as a kind of directive or commanding faculty, the power to direct (or issue commands to) one’s body or mind: it is, he writes,

a Power to begin or forbear, continue or end several actions of our minds, and motions of our Bodies, barely by a thought or preference of the mind ordering, or as it were commanding the doing or not doing such or such particular action. (E2–5 II.xxi.5: 236)

Consonant with this non-desiderative, directive conception of the will, Locke claims that

Volition, or Willing, is an act of the Mind directing its thought to the production of any Action, and thereby exerting its power to produce it, (E2–5 II.xxi.28: 248)


Volition is nothing, but that particular determination of the mind, whereby, barely by a thought, the mind endeavours to give rise, continuation, or stop to any Action, which it takes to be in its power. (E2–5 II.xxi.30: 250)

Every volition, then, is a volition to act or to forbear, where willing to act is a matter of commanding one’s body to move or one’s mind to think, and willing to forbear is a matter of commanding one’s body to rest or one’s mind not to think. Unlike a desiderative power, which is essentially passive (as involving the ability to be more pleased with one thing than another), the will in E2–5 is an intrinsically active power, the exercise of which involves the issuing of mental commands directed at one’s own body and mind.

3. Voluntary vs. Involuntary Action/Forbearance

Within the category of actions/forbearances, Locke distinguishes between those that are voluntary and those that are involuntary. Locke does not define voluntariness and involuntariness in E1, but he does in E2–5:

The forbearance or performance of [an] action, consequent to such order or command of the mind is called Voluntary. And whatsoever action is performed without such a thought of the mind is called Involuntary. (E2–4 II.xxi.5: 236—in E5, “or performance” is omitted from the first sentence)

Locke is telling us that what makes an action/forbearance voluntary is that it is consequent to a volition, and that what makes an action/forbearance involuntary is that it is performed without a volition. The operative words here are “consequent to” and “without”. What do they mean? (Henceforth, following Locke’s lead, I will not distinguish between actions and forbearances unless the context calls for it.)

We can begin with something Locke says only in E1:

Volition, or the Act of Willing, signifies nothing properly, but the actual producing of something that is voluntary. (E1 II.xxi.33: 259)

On reflection, this is mistaken, but it does provide a clue to Locke’s conception of voluntariness. The mistake (of which Locke likely became aware, given that the statement clashes with the rest of his views and was removed from E2–5) is that not every instance of willing an action is followed by the action itself. To use one of Locke’s own examples, if I am locked in a room and will to leave, my volition will not result in my leaving (E1–5 II.xxi.10: 238). So willing cannot signify the “actual producing” of a voluntary action. However, it is reasonable to assume that, for Locke, willing will “produce” a voluntary action if nothing hinders the willed episode of motion or thought. And this makes it likely that Locke takes a voluntary action to be not merely temporally consequent to, but actually caused by, the right kind of volition (Yaffe 2000; for a contrary view, see Hoffman 2005).

Understandably, some commentators have worried about the problem of deviant causation, and whether Locke has an answer to it (e.g., Lowe 1995: 122–123; Yaffe 2000: 104; Lowe 2005: 141–147). The problem is that if I let go of a climbing rope, not as a direct result of willing to let it go, but as a result of being discomfited/paralyzed/shaken by the volition itself, then my letting go of the rope would not count as voluntary even though it was caused by a volition to let go of the rope. The solution to this problem, if there is one, is to claim that, in order for an action to count as voluntary, it is not sufficient for it to be caused by the right kind of volition: in addition, it is necessary that the action be caused in the right way (or non-deviantly) by the right kind of volition. Spelling out the necessary and sufficient conditions for non-deviant causation is a steep climb. Chances are that Locke was no more aware of this problem, and was in no better position to answer it, than anyone else was before Chisholm (1966), Taylor (1966) and Davidson (1980) brought it to the attention of the philosophical community.

Locke’s view, then, is that an action is voluntary inasmuch as its performance is caused by a volition. The volition, as we have so far presumed, must be of the right kind. For example, Locke would not count the motion of my left arm as voluntary if it were caused by a volition that my right arm move (or a volition that my left arm remain at rest). Locke assumes (reasonably) that in order for an action A to be voluntary, it must be caused (in the right way) by a volition that A occur (or, as Locke sometimes puts it, by a volition to do A).

What, then, on Locke’s view, is it for an action to be involuntary? Locke says that an involuntary action is performed “without” a volition. This might suggest that an action of mine is involuntary only when I have no volition that the action occur. Perhaps this is what Locke believes. But it is more reasonable to suppose that Locke would also count as involuntary an action that, though preceded by the right kind of volition, is either not caused by the volition or caused by the volition but not in the right way.[3]

Some commentators have worried that Locke’s “locked room” example is a problematic illustration of his theory of voluntariness, at least as applied to forbearances (e.g., Lowe 1986: 154–157; Stuart 2013: 420). Locke imagines a man who is “carried, while fast asleep, into a Room, where is a Person he longs to see and speak with”, but who is “there locked fast in, beyond his Power to get out: he awakes, and is glad to find himself in so desirable Company” and “stays willingly” in the room. Locke makes clear that, on his view, the man’s remaining in the room is a voluntary forbearance to leave (E1–5 II.xxi.10: 238). But one might worry that if the man is unable to leave the room, then it is false to say that his volition not to leave causes his not leaving. At best, it might be argued, the man’s not leaving is overdetermined (Stuart 2013: 420). But, as some authors have recently argued, cases of overdetermination are rightly described as involving two (or more) causes, not a single joint cause or no cause at all (see, e.g., Schaffer 2003). On such a view of overdetermination, it is unproblematic for Locke to describe the man in the locked room as caused to remain both by his volition to remain and by the door’s being locked.[4]

Another problem that has been raised for Locke stems from his example of a man who falls into a river when a bridge breaks under him. Locke describes the man as willing not to fall, even as he is falling (E1–5 II.xxi.9: 238). The worry here is that Locke holds that the objects of volition are actions or forbearances, so the man would need to be described as willing to forbear from falling. But, it might be argued, falling is not an action, for it is something that merely happens to the man, and not an exercise of his agency; so his willingly forbearing from falling would be willingly forbearing from something that is not an action, and this is impossible (Stuart 2013: 405). The answer to this worry is that falling is an action, according to Locke’s Deflationary conception of action, which counts the motion of one’s body in any direction as a bona fide action (see Section 1 above).

4. Freedom and Necessity

Some commentators think that Lockean freedom (or, as Locke also calls it, “liberty”) is a single power, the power to do what one wills (Yolton 1970: 144; D. Locke 1975: 96; O’Higgins 1976: 119—see Chappell 1994: 103). However, as Locke describes it, freedom is a “two-way” power, really a combination of two conditional powers belonging to an agent, that is, to someone endowed with a will (see Chappell 2007: 142). (A tennis ball, for example, “has not Liberty, is not a free Agent”, because it is incapable of volition (E1–5 II.xxi.9: 238).) In E1, Locke’s definition reflects his conception of the will as a power of preferring X to Y, or being more pleased with X than with Y. But in E2–5, Locke’s definition reflects his modified conception of the will as a power to issue commands to one’s body or mind (see Section 2 above):

[S]o far as a Man has a power to think, or not to think; to move, or not to move, according to the preference or direction of his own mind, so far is a Man Free. (E2–5 II.xxi.8: 237)

So that the Idea of Liberty, is the Idea of a Power in any Agent to do or forbear any particular Action, according to the determination or thought of the mind, whereby either of them is preferr’d to the other. (E2–5 II.xxi.8: 237)

Liberty is not an Idea belonging to Volition, or preferring; but to the Person having the Power of doing, or forbearing to do, according as the Mind shall chuse or direct. (E2–5 II.xxi.10: 238)

Liberty…is the power a Man has to do or forbear doing any particular Action, according as its doing or forbearance has the actual preference in the Mind, which is the same thing as to say, according as he himself wills it. (E1–5 II.xxi.15: 241)

The central claim here is that a human being (person, agent) is free with respect to a particular action A (or forbearance to perform A) inasmuch as (i) if she wills to do A then she has the power to do A and (ii) if she wills to forbear doing A then she has the power to forbear doing A (see, e.g., Chappell 1994: 103).[5] So, for example, a woman in a locked room is not free with respect to the act of leaving (or with respect to the forbearance to leave) because she does not have the power to leave if and when she wills to leave, and a woman who is falling (the bridge under her having crumbled) is not free with respect to the forbearance to fall (or with respect to the act of falling) because she does not have the power to forbear falling if she wills not to fall (E1–5 II.xxi.9–10: 238). (Locke describes agents who are unfree with respect to some action as acting under, or by, necessity—E1–5 II.xxi.8: 238; E1–5 II.xxi.9: 238.) But if the door of the room is unlocked, then the woman in the room is able to stay if she wills to stay, and is able to leave if she wills to leave: she is therefore both free with respect to staying and free with respect to leaving.

Notice that freedom, on Locke’s conception of it, is a property of substances (persons, human beings, agents). This simply follows from the fact that freedom is a dual power and from the fact that “Powers belong only to Agents, and are Attributes only of Substances” (E1–5 II.xxi.16: 241). At no point does Locke offer an account of performing actions or forbearances freely, as if freedom were a way of performing an action or a way of forbearing to perform an action. (For a contrary view, see LoLordo 2012: 27.)

Locke does write that

[w]here-ever any performance or forbearance are not equally in a Man’s power; where-ever doing or not doing, will not equally follow upon the preference of his mind directing it, there he is not Free. (E2–5 II.xxi.8: 237)

The “follow upon” language might suggest a counterfactual analysis of the claim that an agent has the power to do A if she wills to do A, namely, that if she were to will to do A then she would do A (e.g., Lowe 1995: 129; Stuart 2013: 407—for a similar account that trades the subjunctive conditionals for indicative conditionals, see Yaffe 2000: 15). The counterfactual analysis is tempting, but also unlikely to capture Locke’s meaning, especially if he has a Deflationary conception of action/forbearance (see Section 1 above). It might happen, for example, that I am prevented (by chains or a force field) from raising my arm, but that if I were to will that my arm rise, you would immediately (break the chains or disable the force field and) raise my arm. Under these conditions, I would not be free with respect to my arm’s rising, but it would be true that if I were to will that my arm rise, then my arm would rise. So Locke’s dual power conception of freedom of action is not captured by any counterfactual conditional or pair of counterfactual conditionals.

Does Locke think that there is a conceptual connection between freedom of action and voluntary action? It might be thought that freedom with respect to a particular action requires that the action be voluntary, so that if an action is not voluntary then one is not free with respect to it. In defense of this, one might point to Locke’s falling man, whose falling is not voluntary and who is also not free with respect to the act of falling (Stuart 2013: 408). But the falling man’s unfreedom with respect to the act of falling is not explained by the involuntariness of his falling. In general, it is possible for one’s action to be involuntary even as one is free with respect to it. Imagine that you let your four-year old daughter raise your arm (just for fun). According to Locke’s conception of voluntariness, the motion of your arm is not voluntary, because it is not caused by any volition of yours (indeed, we can even imagine that you do not even have a volition that your arm rise). But, according to Locke’s conception of freedom, you are most certainly free with respect to your arm’s rising: (i) if you will that your arm rise, you have the power to raise it, and (ii) if you will that your arm not rise, you have the power to forbear raising it.

Voluntariness, then, is not necessary for freedom; but it is also not sufficient for freedom, as Locke’s “locked room” and “paralytick” cases show. The man in the locked room wills to stay and talk to the other person in the room, and this volition is causally responsible for his staying in the room: on Locke’s theory, his remaining in the room is, therefore, voluntary. But the man in the locked room “is not at liberty not to stay, he has not freedom to be gone” (E1–5 II.xxi.10: 238). The reason is that even if the man wills to leave, he does not have the power to leave. Similarly, if the paralyzed person wills to remain at rest (thinking, mistakenly, that he could move if he willed to move) and his remaining at rest is caused (at least in part) by his volition not to move, then his “sitting still…is truly voluntary”. But in this case, says Locke, “there is want of Freedom” because “a Palsie [hinders] his Legs from obeying the determination of his Mind, if it would thereby transferr his Body to another Place” (E2–5 II.xxi.11: 239): that is, the paralyzed person is unable to move even if he wills to move.

Thus far, we have been focusing on freedom with respect to motion or rest of one’s body. But, as we have seen, Locke thinks that actions encompass acts of mind (in addition to acts of body). So, in addition to thinking that some acts of mind are voluntary (e.g., the mental acts of combining and abstracting ideas involved in the production of abstract ideas of mixed modes—E2–5 II.xxxii.12: 387–388), Locke thinks that we are free with respect to some mental actions (and their forbearances). For example, if I am able to combine two ideas at will, and I am able to forbear combining two ideas if I will not to combine them, then I am free with respect to the mental action of combining two ideas. It can also happen that we are not free with respect to our mental acts:

A Man on the Rack, is not at liberty to lay by the Idea of pain, and divert himself with other Contemplations. (E4–5 II.xxi.12: 239)

In this case, even though the man on the rack might will to be rid of the pain, he does not have the power to avoid feeling it.[6]

5. Free Will

Is the will free? This question made sense to Scholastic philosophers (including, e.g., Bramhall, who engaged in a protracted debate on the subject with Hobbes), who tended not to distinguish between the question of whether the will is free and the question of whether the mind or soul is free with respect to willing, and, indeed, some of whom thought that acts cannot themselves be free (or freely done) unless the will to do them is itself free. But, according to Locke, the question, if literally understood, “is altogether improper” (E1–5 II.xxi.14: 240). This follows directly from Locke’s account of the will and his account of freedom. The will is a power (in E2–5, the power to order the motion or rest of one’s body and the power to order the consideration or non-consideration of an idea—see Section 2 above), and freedom is a power, namely the power to do or not do as one wills (see Section 4 above). But, as Locke emphasizes, the question of whether one power has another power is “a Question at first sight too grosly absurd to make a Dispute, or need an Answer”. The reason is that it is absurd to suppose that powers are capable of having powers, for

Powers belong only to Agents, and are Attributes only of Substances, and not of Powers themselves. (E1–5 II.xxi.16: 241)

The question of whether the will is free, then, presupposes that the will is a substance, rather than a power, and therefore makes no more sense than the question of whether a man’s “Sleep be Swift, or his Vertue square” (E1–5 II.xxi.14: 240). To suppose that the will is free (or unfree!) is therefore to make a category mistake (see Ryle 1949: chapter 1).

6. Freedom in Respect of Willing

The fact that it makes no sense to suppose that the will itself is free (or unfree) does not entail that there are no significant questions to be asked about the relation between freedom and the will. Indeed, Locke thinks that there are two such questions, and that these are the questions that capture “what is meant, when it is disputed, Whether the will be free” (E2–5 II.xxi.22: 245). The first (discussed at E1–5 II.xxi.23–24) is whether agents (human beings, persons) are free with respect to willing-one-way-or-another; more particularly, whether agents are able, if they so will, to avoid willing one way or the other with respect to a proposed action. The second (discussed at E1–5 II.xxi.25) is whether agents are free with respect to willing-a-particular-action. The majority of commentators think that Locke answers both of these questions negatively, at least in E1–4 (see Chappell 1994, Lowe 1995, Jolley 1999, Glauser 2003, Stuart 2013, and Leisinger 2017), and some think that Locke then qualifies his answer(s) in E2–5 in a way that potentially introduces inconsistency into his moral psychology (e.g., Chappell 1994). Other commentators think that Locke answers the first question negatively for most actions, but with one important qualification that is clarified and made more explicit in E5, and that he answers the second question positively, all without falling into inconsistency (Rickless 2000; Garrett 2015). What follows is a summary of the interpretive controversies. In the rest of this Section, we focus on the first question. In the next, we focus on the second question.

In E1–4, Locke states his answer to the first question thus:

[A] Man in respect of willing any Action in his power once proposed to his Thoughts cannot be free. (E1–4 II.xxi.23: 245)

His argument for the necessity of having either a volition that action A occur or a volition that action A not occur, once A has been proposed to one’s thoughts, is simple and clever: (1) Either A will occur or A will not occur; (2) If A occurs, this will be the result of the agent having willed A to occur; (3) If A does not occur, this will be the result of the agent having willed A not to occur; therefore, (4) The agent necessarily wills one way or the other with respect to A’s occurrence (see Chappell 1994: 105–106). It follows directly that “in respect of the act of willing, a Man is not free” (E1–4 II.xxi.23: 245). For, first, “Willing, or Volition [is] an Action” (E1–5 II.xxi.23: 245—this because actions comprise motions of the body and operations of mind, and volition is one of the most important mental operations—E1–5 II.vi.2: 128), and, second, freedom with respect to action A, as Locke defines it, consists in (i) the power to do A if one wills to do A and (ii) the power not to do A if one wills not to do A. Thus, if an agent does not have the power to avoid willing one way or the other with respect to A (even if the agent wills to avoid willing one way or the other with respect to A), then the agent is not free with respect to willing one way or the other with respect to A.

In his New Essays on Human Understanding (ready for publication in 1704, but not published then because that was the year of Locke’s death) Gottfried Leibniz famously questions premise (3) of this argument:

I would have thought that one can suspend one’s choice, and that this happens quite often, especially when other thoughts interrupt one’s deliberation. Thus, although it is necessary that the action about which one is deliberating must exist or not exist, it doesn’t follow at all that one necessarily has to decide on its existence or non-existence. For its non-existence could well come about in the absence of any decision. (Leibniz 1704 [1981]: 181)

Leibniz’s worry is that, even if one is thinking about whether or not to do A, it is often possible to postpone willing whether to do A, and the non-occurrence of A might well result from such postponement. Under these conditions, it would be false to say that A’s non-occurrence results from any sort of volition that A not occur. Leibniz illustrates the claim with an amusing reference to a case that the Areopagites (judges on the Areopagus, the highest court of appeals in Ancient Athens) were having trouble deciding, their solution (i.e., de facto, but not de jure, acquittal) being to adjourn it “to a date in the distant future, giving themselves a hundred years to think about it” (Leibniz 1704 [1981]: 181).

It is something of a concern, then, that Locke himself appears committed to agreeing with Leibniz’s criticism of his own argument, at least in E2–5. For in E2–5 (but not in E1) Locke emphasizes his acceptance of the doctrine of suspension, according to which any agent has the “power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires”, during which time the will is not yet “determined to action” (E2–5 II.xxi.47: 263). That is, Locke acknowledges in E2–5, even as he does not remove or alter the argument of II.xxi.23 in E2–4, that it is possible to postpone willing with respect to whether to will one way or the other with respect to some proposed action (see Chappell 1994: 106–107).

However, Locke makes changes in E5 that have suggested to some commentators how he would avoid Leibniz’s criticism without giving up the doctrine of suspension. Recall Locke’s answer to the first question:

[A] Man in respect of willing any Action in his power once proposed to his Thoughts cannot be free. (E1–4 II.xxi.23: 245)

Here, now, is Locke’s restatement of his answer in E5:

[A] Man in respect of willing, or the Act of Volition, when any Action in his power is once proposed to his Thoughts, as presently to be done, cannot be free. (E5 II.xxi.23: 245—added material italicized)

The crucial addition here is the phrase “as presently to be done”. In E5, Locke is not saying that it is with respect to willing one way or the other with respect to any proposed action that an agent is not free: what he is saying is that it is with respect to willing one way or the other with respect to any proposed action as presently to be done that an agent is not free. Some actions that are proposed to us are to occur at the time of proposal: as I am singing, a friend might propose that I stop singing right now. Other actions that are proposed to us are to occur at a time later than the time of proposal: at the beginning of a long bicycle trip, a friend might propose that we take a rest once we have reached our destination. Locke is telling us in E5 that premise (3) is supposed to apply to the former, not to the latter, sort of actions. If this is right, then it is no accident that Locke’s own illustration of the argument of II.xxi.23 involves “a Man that is walking, to whom it is proposed to give off walking” (E1–5 II.xxi.24: 246).

So, as Locke incipiently recognizes as early as E1 but explicitly underlines in E5, his initial answer to the first question is an overgeneralization, and needs to be restricted to those actions that are proposed to us as presently to be done (see Rickless 2000: 49–55; Glauser 2003: 710; Garrett 2015: 274–277). But it is also possible that Locke comes to recognize, and eventually underline, a second restriction. At the moment, I am sitting in a chair. In a few minutes, my children will walk in and propose that I get up and make dinner. I am busy, my mind is occupied, so I will likely postpone (perhaps only for a few minutes) making a decision about whether to get up. The result of such postponement is that I will not get up right away, but this will not be because I have willed not to get up right away. Again, it seems that premise (3) is false, for reasons similar to the ones described by Leibniz. But this time, the relevant action (getting up) is proposed as presently to be done. Locke’s E5 emendations do not explicitly address this sort of example.

However, in E2–5, but not in E1, Locke emphasizes the fact that in his “walking man” example, the man either “continues the Action [of walking], or puts an end to it” (E2–5 II.xxi.24: 246). This suggests a different restriction, on top of the “as presently to be done” restriction. It may be that Locke is thinking that premise (3) applies, not to actions of all kinds, but only to processes in which one is currently engaged. The walking man is already in motion, constantly putting one leg in front of the other. When it is proposed to him that he give off walking, he has no option but to will one way or the other with respect to whether to give off walking: if he stops walking, this will be because he willed that his walking cease; and if he continues to walk, this will be because he willed that his walking continue. Either way, he must will one way or the other with respect to whether to stop walking. By contrast, when I am sitting in my chair, I am not engaged in a process: I am (or, at least, my body is) simply at rest. It is for this reason that it is possible for me to avoid willing with respect to whether to get up right now: processes require volition to secure their continuation, but mere states (non-processes) do not (see Rickless 2000: 49–55; for a contrary view, see Glauser 2003: 710).

Locke’s considered answer to the first question, then, is this: (i) when an action that is a process in which the agent is currently engaged is proposed as presently to be continued or stopped, the agent is not free with respect to willing one way or the other with respect to its continuing, but (ii) when an action is not a process in which the agent is currently engaged or is proposed as to be done sometime in the future, then it is possible for the agent to be free with respect to willing one way or the other with respect to its performance or non-performance. Given that, as Locke puts it in E5, the vast majority of voluntary actions “that succeed one another every moment that we are awake” (E5 II.xxi.24: 246) are (i)-actions rather than (ii)-actions, it makes sense for him to summarize his answer to the first question as that it is “in most cases [that] a Man is not at Liberty to forbear the act of volition” (E5 II.xxi.56: 270). But, as Locke also emphasizes, one has the ability, at least with respect to (ii)-actions, to suspend willing. So there is no inconsistency at the heart of Locke’s theory of freedom in respect of willing.

7. Freedom to Will

The second question regarding the relation between freedom and the will that Locke takes to be significant is “Whether a Man be at liberty to will which of the two he pleases, Motion or Rest” (E1–5 II.xxi.25: 247). Consider a particular action A. What Locke is asking is whether an agent is free with respect to the action of willing that A occur. For example, suppose that I am sitting in a chair and that A is the action of walking to the fridge. Locke wants to know whether I am free with respect to willing the action of walking to the fridge.

Most commentators think that Locke’s answer to this question is NO. The main evidence for this interpretation is what Locke says about the question immediately after raising it:

This Question carries the absurdity of it so manifestly in it self, that one might thereby sufficiently be convinced, that Liberty concerns not the Will. (E5 II.xxi.25: 247)

It is tempting to suppose that the thought that “Liberty concerns not the Will” is the thought that agents are not free to will, and that Locke is saying that we are driven to this thought because the second question is absurd, in the sense of demanding a negative answer.

But it is difficult to make sense of what Locke goes on to say in II.xxi.25 if he is interpreted as answering the second question negatively. Section 25 continues:

For to ask, whether a Man be at liberty to will either Motion, or Rest; Speaking, or Silence; which he pleases, is to ask, whether a Man can will, what he wills; or be pleased with what he is pleased with. (E1–5 II.xxi.25: 247)

Locke says that the second question reduces to another that can be put in two different ways: whether a man can will what he wills, and whether a man can be pleased with what pleases him. (The reason it can be put in these two different ways, at least in E1, is that Locke there adopts a desiderative theory of willing, according to which willing an action is a matter of being more pleased with the action than with its forbearance.) But asking whether a man can will what he wills, or whether a man can be pleased with what he is pleased with, is similar to asking whether a man can steal what he steals. And the answer to all of these questions is: “OF COURSE!”

It is obvious that whatever it is that a man actually steals he can steal. Similarly, it is obvious that whatever it is that a man actually wills (or is actually pleased with) is something that he can will (or can be pleased with). The reason is that it is a self-evident maxim (just as self-evident as the maxim that whatever is, is—see E1–5 IV.vii.4: 592–594) that whatever is actual is possible. Locke, it seems, wishes to answer the second question in the affirmative!

This raises the issue of what Locke could possibly mean, then, when he describes the second question as “absurd”. One possibility is that, for Locke, a question counts as absurd not only when the answer to it is obviously in the negative (think: “Is the will free?”), but also when the answer to it is obviously in the affirmative (think: “Is it possible for you to do what you are actually doing?”). But it also raises the issue of why Locke would think that the second question actually reduces to an absurd question of the latter sort. One possible solution derives from Locke’s theory of freedom of action. As we have seen, Locke thinks that one is free with respect to action A if and only if (i) if one (actually) wills to do A, then one can do A, and (ii) if one (actually) wills not to do A, then one can avoid doing A. Applying this theory directly to the case in which A is the action of willing to do B, we arrive at the following: one is free with respect to willing to do B if and only if (i) if one (actually) wills to will to do B, then one can will to do B, and (ii) if one (actually) wills to avoid willing to do B, then one can avoid willing to do B. Suppose, then, that willing to will to do an action is just willing to do that action, and willing to avoid willing to do an action is just not willing to do that action. In that case, one is free with respect to willing to do B if and only if (i) if one (actually) wills to do B, then one can will to do B, and (ii) if one (actually) avoids willing to do B, then one can avoid willing to do B. Given that actuality obviously entails possibility, it follows that (i) and (ii) are both obviously true. This is one explanation for why Locke might think that the question of whether one is free with respect to willing to do B reduces to an absurd question, the answer to which is obviously in the affirmative. It may be for this reason that Locke says that the question is one that “needs no answer” (E1–5 II.xxi.25: 247).

Locke goes on to say, at the end of II.xxi.25, that

they, who can make a Question of it [i.e., of the second question], must suppose one Will to determine the Acts of another, and another to determinate that; and so on in infinitum. (E1–5 II.xxi.25: 247)

It is unclear what Locke means by this. One possibility, consistent with the majority interpretation that Locke provides a negative answer to the second question, is that Locke is providing an argument here for the claim that the proposition that it is possible to be free with respect to willing to do an action leads to a vicious infinite regress of wills. The thought here is that being free with respect to willing to do an action, on Locke’s theory, requires being able to will to do an action if one wills to will to do it; that being free with respect to willing to will to do an action then requires being able to will to will to do it if one wills to will to will to do it; and so on, ad infinitum. But another possible interpretation, consistent with the minority interpretation that Locke provides an affirmative answer to the second question, is that Locke’s argument here is not meant to target those who answer the question affirmatively, but is rather designed to target those who would “make a question” of the second question, i.e., those who think that the answer to the second question is unobvious, and worth disputing. These people are the ones who think that willing to will to do A does not reduce to willing to do A, and that willing to avoid willing to do A does not reduce to avoiding willing to do A. These are the people who are committed to the existence of an infinite regress of wills, each determining the volitions of its successor. According to Locke, who accepts the reductions, the infinite regress of wills can’t get started (see Rickless 2000: 56–65; Garrett 2015: 269–274).

8. Determination of the Will

The next important question for Locke is “what is it determines the Will” (E2–5 II.xxi.29: 249—the question is also raised in the same Section in E1). Locke gives one answer to this question in E1, and a completely different answer in E2–5. The E1 answer is that the will is always determined by “the greater Good” (E1 II.xxi.29: 251), though, when he is writing more carefully, Locke says that it is only “the appearance of Good, greater Good” that determines the will (E1 II.xxi.33: 256, E1 II.xxi.38: 270). Regarding the good, Locke is a hedonist:

Good and Evil…are nothing but Pleasure and Pain, or that which occasions, or procures Pleasure or Pain to us. (E1–5 II.xxviii.5: 351—see also E1–5 II.xx.2: 229 and E2–5 II.xxi.42: 259)

So Locke’s E1 view is that the will is determined by what appears to us to promise pleasure and avoid pain.

When in 1692 Locke asks his friend, William Molyneux, to comment on the first (1690) edition of the Essay, Molyneux expressly worries that Locke’s E1 account of freedom appears to “make all Sins to proceed from our Understandings, or to be against Conscience; and not at all from the Depravity of our Wills”, and that “it seems harsh to say, that a Man shall be Damn’d, because he understands no better than he does” (de Beer 1979: 601). Molyneux’s point is well taken, and Locke acknowledges as much in his reply (de Beer 1979: 625). The source of the problem for the E1 account is that, with respect to the good (at least in the future), appearance does not always correspond with reality: it is possible for us to make mistakes about what is apt to produce the greatest pleasure and the least pain. Sometimes this is because we underestimate how pleasurable future pleasures will be (relative to present pleasures) or overestimate how painful present pains are (relative to future pains); and sometimes this is because we just make simple mistakes of fact, thinking, for example, that bloodletting will ease the pain of gout. As Molyneux sees it, we are not responsible for many of these mistakes, and yet it seems clear that we deserve (divine) punishment for making the wrong choices in our lives (e.g., when we choose the present pleasures of debauchery and villainy over the pleasures of heaven). Our sins, in other words, should be understood to proceed from the defective exercise of our wills, rather than from the defective state of our knowledge.

Part of Locke’s answer in E2–5 is that what determines the will is not the appearance of greater good, but rather “always some uneasiness” (E2–4 II.xxi.29: 249—the word “uneasiness” is italicized in E5). “Uneasiness” is Locke’s word for “[a]ll pain of the body of what sort soever, and disquiet of the mind” (E2–5 II.xxi.31: 251). On this view, then, our wills are determined by pains (of the mind or of the body). How this answer is supposed to address Molyneux’s concern is not, as yet, entirely clear.

What, to begin, does Locke mean by “determination”? On a “causal” reading, for a will W to be determined by X is for X to cause W to be exercised in a particular way. One might say, for example, that fear of the tiger caused Bill to choose to run away from it, and, in one sense, that Bill’s volition to run away from the tiger was determined by his fear of it. On a “teleological” reading, for a will W to be determined by X is for the agent to will the achievement or avoidance of X as a goal. One might say, for example, that the pleasure of eating the cake determined my will in the sense of fixing the content of my volition (as the volition to acquire the pleasure of eating the cake) (see Stuart 2013: 439; LoLordo 2012: 55–56).

It would be anachronistic to suppose that Locke is using the word “determine” as we do today when we discuss causal determinism (see the entry on causal determinism). And the desire to avoid anachronism might lead us to adopt the teleological interpretation of determination. But there are many indications in E2–5 II.xxi that Locke has something approaching the causal interpretation in mind. Locke’s picture of bodies, both large and small, is largely a mechanistic one (though he allows for phenomena that can’t be explained mechanistically, such as gravitation, cohesion of body parts, and magnetism): bodies, he writes, “knock, impell, and resist one another,…and that is all they can do” (E1–5 IV.x.10: 624). And there are indications that this mechanistic model of corporeal behavior affects Locke’s model of mental phenomena. Throughout the Sections of II.xxi added in E2–5, Locke talks of uneasiness moving the mind (E2–5 II.xxi.29: 249; E2–5 II.xxi.43–44: 260), setting us upon a change of state or action or work (E2–5 II.xxi.29: 249; E2–5 II.xxi.31: 251; E2–5 II.xxi.37: 255; E2–5 II.xxi.44: 260), working on the mind (E2–5 II.xxi.29: 249; E2–5 II.xxi.33: 252), exerting pressure (E2–5 II.xxi.32: 251; E2–5 II.xxi.45: 262), driving us (E2–5 II.xxi.34: 252; E2–5 II.xxi.35: 253), pushing us (E2–5 II.xxi.34: 252), operating on the will, sometimes forcibly (E2–5 II.xxi.36: 254; E2–5 II.xxi.37: 255; E2–5 II.xxi.57: 271), laying hold on the will (E2–5 II.xxi.38: 256), influencing the will (E2–5 II.xxi.38: 256; E2–5 II.xxi.39: 257), taking the will (E2–5 II.xxi.45: 262), spurring to action (E2–5 II.xxi.40: 258), carrying us into action (E2–5 II.xxi.53: 268), and being counterbalanced by other mental states (E2–5 II.xxi.57: 272; E2–5 II.xxi.65: 277). It is difficult to read all of these statements without thinking that Locke thinks of uneasiness as exerting not merely a pull, but also a push, on the mind.

Locke’s view, then, seems to be that our volitions are caused (though not, perhaps, deterministically, i.e., in a way that is fixed by initial conditions and the laws of nature) by uneasinesses. How is this supposed to work? As Locke sees it, either “all pain causes desire equal to it self” (E2–5 II.xxi.31: 251) or desire is simply identified with “uneasiness in the want [i.e., lack] of an absent good” (E2–5 II.xxi.31: 251). So the desire that either is or is caused by uneasiness is a desire for the removal of that uneasiness, and this is what proximately spurs us to take means to secure that removal.

Locke provides evidence from observation and from “the reason of the thing” for the claim that it is uneasiness, rather than perceived good, that determines the will. Empirically, Locke notes that agents generally do not seek a change of state unless they experience some sort of pain that leads them to will its extinction. A poor, indolent man who is content with his lot, even one who recognizes that he would be happier if he worked his way to greater wealth, is not ipso facto motivated to work. A drunkard who recognizes that his health will suffer and wealth will dissipate if he continues to drink does not, merely as a result of this recognition, stop drinking: but if he finds himself thirsty for drink and uneasy at the thought of missing his drinking companions, then he will go to the tavern. That is, Locke recognizes the possibility of akratic action, i.e., pursuing the worse in full knowledge that it is worse (E II.xxi.35: 253–254). (For more on Locke on akrasia, see Vailati 1990, Glauser 2014, and Moauro and Rickless 2019.)

Regarding “the reason of the thing”, Locke claims that “we constantly desire happiness” (E2–5 II.xxi.39: 257), where happiness is “the utmost Pleasure we are capable of” (E2–5 II.xxi.42: 258). Moreover, he says, any amount of uneasiness is inconsistent with happiness, “a little pain serving to marr all the pleasure” we experience. Locke concludes from this that we are always motivated to get rid of pain before securing any particular pleasure (E2–5 II.xxi.36: 254). Locke also argues that absent goods cannot move the will, because they don’t exist yet; by contrast, on his theory, the will is determined by something that already exists in the mind, namely uneasiness (E2–5 II.xxi.37: 254–255). Finally, Locke argues that if the will were determined by the perceived greater good, every agent would be consistently focused on the attainment of “the infinite eternal Joys of Heaven”. But, as is evidently the case, many agents are far more concerned about other matters than they are about getting into heaven. And this entails that the will must be determined by something other than the perceived greater good, namely, uneasiness (E2–5 II.xxi.38: 255–256). (For interesting criticisms of these arguments, see Stuart 2013: 453–456.)

So far, Locke has argued that the wrong turns we make in life do not usually proceed from defects in our understandings. What spurs us to act or forbear acting is not perception of the greater good, but some uneasiness instead. This answers part, but not the whole, of Molyneux’s worry. What Locke still needs to explain is why agents can be justly held responsible for choices that are motivated by uneasinesses. After all, what level of pain we feel and when we feel it is oftentimes not within our control. Locke’s answer relies on what has come to be known as the “doctrine of suspension”.

9. The Doctrine of Suspension

Having argued that uneasiness, rather than perception of the greater good, is what determines the will, Locke turns to the question of which of all the uneasinesses that beset us “has the precedency in determining the will to the next action”. His answer:

that ordinarily, which is the most pressing of those [uneasinesses], that are judged capable of being then removed. (E2–5 II.xxi.40: 257)

Locke therefore assumes that uneasinesses can be ranked in order of intensity or strength, and that among all the uneasinesses importuning an agent, the one that ordinarily determines her will is the one that exerts the greatest pressure on her mind. The picture with which Locke appears to be working is of a mind that is the playground of various forces of varying strengths exerting different degrees of influence on the will, where the will is determined by the strongest of those forces.

Notice, however, Locke’s use of the word “ordinarily”. Sometimes, as Locke emphasizes, the will is not determined by the most pressing uneasiness:

For the mind having in most cases, as is evident in Experience, a power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires, and so all, one after another, is at liberty to consider the objects of them; examine them on all sides, and weigh them with others. (E2–5 II.xxi.47: 263)

This is the doctrine of suspension. On this view, we agents have the “power to suspend any particular desire, and keep it from determining the will, and engaging us in action” (E2–5 II.xxi.50: 266). As Locke makes clear, this power to prevent the will’s determination, that is, this power to avoid willing, is absent when the action proposed is to be done presently and involves the continuation or stopping of a process in which one is currently engaged (see Section 6 above). But when it comes to “chusing a remote [i.e., future] Good as an end to be pursued”, agents are “at Liberty in respect of willing” (E5 II.xxi.56: 270).[7]

Some commentators (e.g., Chappell 1994: 118) think that, at least in E5, Locke comes to see that the doctrine of suspension conflicts with his answer to the question of whether we are free to will what we will (raised in II.xxi.25). This is because they take Locke’s answer to the latter question to be negative, and take the doctrine of suspension to entail a positive answer to the same question, at least with respect to some actions. But there are good reasons to think that there is no inconsistency here: for Locke’s answer to the II.xxi.25 question is arguably in the affirmative (see Section 7 above).[8]

Commentators also wonder whether the doctrine of suspension introduces an account of freedom that differs from Locke’s official account, both in E1 and in E2–5. The problem is that Locke says that “in [the power to suspend the prosecution of one’s desires] lies the liberty Man has”, that the power to suspend is “the source of all liberty” (E2–5 II.xxi.47: 263), that it is “the hinge on which turns the liberty of intellectual Beings” (E2–5 II.xxi.52: 266), and that it is “the great inlet, and exercise of all the liberty Men have, are capable of, or can be useful to them” (E2–5 II.xxi.52: 267). These passages suggest that Locke takes freedom to be (something intimately related to) the power to suspend our desires, a power that cannot simply be identified with the two-way power that Locke identifies with freedom of action at II.xxi.8 ff. (see Yaffe 2000: 12–74).

But there is a simple interpretation of these passages that does not require us to read Locke as offering a different account of freedom as the ability to suspend. The power to suspend is the power to keep one’s will from being determined, that is, the power to forbear willing to do A if one wills to forbear willing to do A. This is just one part of the freedom to will to do A, according to Locke’s definition of freedom of action applied to the action of willing to do A. (The other part is the power to will to do A if one wills to will to do A.) Thus if, as Locke seems to argue in II.xxi.23–24, we are (except under very unusual circumstances) free with respect to the act of willing with respect to a future course of action, then it follows immediately that we have the power to suspend. Locke’s claims about the power to suspend being the source of all liberty and the hinge on which liberty turns can be understood as claims that the power to suspend is a particularly important aspect of freedom of action as applied to the action of willing. What makes it important is the fact that it is the misuse of this freedom that accounts for our responsibility for actions that conduce to our own unhappiness or misery.

How so? Locke claims that the power of suspension was given to us (by God) for a reason, so that we might “examine, view, and judge, of the good or evil of what we are going to do” (E2–5 II.xxi.47: 263) in order to discover

whether that particular thing, which is then proposed, or desired, lie in the way to [our] main end, and make a real part of that which is [our] greatest good. (E2–5 II.xxi.52: 267)

When we make the kinds of mistakes for which we deserve punishment, such as falling into gluttony or envy or selfishness, it is not because we have, after deliberation and investigation, perhaps through no fault of our own, acquired a mistaken view of the facts; it is because we engage in “a too hasty compliance with our desires” (E2–5 II.xxi.53: 268) and fail to “hinder blind Precipitancy” (E2–5 II.xxi.67: 279). What matters is not that we have failed to will the forbearing to will to go to the movies or clean the fridge. What matters is that we have failed to will the forbearing to prosecute our most pressing desires, allowing ourselves to be guided by uneasinesses that might, for all we know, lead us to evil. If we have the power to suspend the prosecution of our desires (including our most pressing desire), then we misuse it when we do not exercise it (or when we fail to exercise it when its exercise is called for). So, not only is Locke’s doctrine of suspension consistent with his account of the freedom to will, it also provides part of the answer to Molyneux’s worry:

And here we may see how it comes to pass, that a Man may justly incur punishment…: Because, by a too hasty choice of his own making, he has imposed on himself wrong measures of good and evil…He has vitiated his own Palate, and must be answerable to himself for the sickness and death that follows from it. (E2–5 II.xxi.56: 270–271)[9]

10. Compatibilism or Incompatibilism?

Compatibilism is the thesis that free will is compatible with causal determinism, and incompatibilism is the thesis that free will is incompatible with causal determinism. Is Locke a compatibilist or an incompatibilist?

The fact that Locke thinks that freedom of action is compatible with the will’s being determined by uneasiness might immediately suggest that Locke is a compatibilist. But, as we have seen (Section 8 above), it is illegitimate to infer compatibility with causal determinism from compatibility with determination of the will by uneasiness. Still, the evidence strongly suggests that Locke would have embraced compatibilism, if the issue had been put to him directly. Freedom of action, on Locke’s account, is a matter of being able to do what one wills and being able to forbear what one wills to forbear. Although we sometimes act under necessity (compulsion or restraint—E1–5 II.xxi.13: 240), the mere fact (if it is a fact) that our actions are determined by the laws of nature and antecedent events does not threaten our freedom with respect to their performance. As Locke makes clear, if the door to my room is unlocked, I am free with respect to the act of leaving the room, because I have the ability to stay or leave as I will. It is only when the door is locked, or when I am chained, or when my path is blocked, or something else deprives me of the ability to stay or leave, that I am unfree with respect to the act of leaving. Determinism by itself represents no threat to our freedom of action. In this respect, Locke is a forerunner of many other compatibilist theories of freedom, including, for example, those of G.E. Moore (1912) and A.J. Ayer (1954). (For a contrary view, see Schouls 1992: 121. And for a response to Schouls 1992, see Davidson 2003: 213 ff.)


Select Primary Sources

  • de Beer, E.S. (ed), 1979, The Correspondence of John Locke, volume 4, Letters 1242–1701, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, 1704 [1981], New Essays on Human Understanding, edited by Jonathan Bennett and Peter Remnant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Locke, John, 1690, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, edited by Peter H. Nidditch, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975.

Select Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, A.J., 1954, “Freedom and Necessity”, in Philosophical Essays, London: Macmillan, pp. 271–284.
  • Chappell, Vere, 1994, “Locke on the Freedom of the Will”, in Locke’s Philosophy: Content and Context, edited by G.A.J. Rogers, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 101–121.
  • –––, 2004, “Review of Liberty Worth the Name, by Gideon Yaffe”, Mind, 113: 420–424.
  • –––, 2007, “Power in Locke’s Essay”, in The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s “Essay Concerning Human Understanding”, edited by Lex Newman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 130–156.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1966, “Freedom and Action”, in Freedom and Determinism, edited by Keith Lehrer, New York: Random House, pp. 11–44.
  • Davidson, Donald, 1980, “Freedom to Act”, in Essays on Actions and Events, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 63–81.
  • Davidson, Jack D., 2003, “Locke’s Finely Spun Liberty”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 33: 203–227.
  • Dicker, Georges, 2019, Locke on Knowledge and Reality: A Commentary on An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, New York: Oxford University Press, Chapter 9.
  • Garrett, Don, 2015, “Liberty and Suspension in Locke’s Theory of the Will”, in A Companion to Locke, edited by Matthew Stuart, Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 260–278.
  • Glauser, Richard, 2003, “Thinking and Willing in Locke’s Theory of Human Freedom”, Dialogue, 42: 695–724.
  • –––, 2014, ‘Locke and the Problem of Weakness of the Will’, in Mind, Values, and Metaphysics, Anne Reboul (ed.), Cham: Springer, pp. 483–499.
  • Hoffman, Paul, 2005, “Locke on the Locked Room”, Locke Studies, 5: 57–73.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, 1999, Locke: His Philosophical Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Leisinger, Matthew A., 2017, ‘Locke’s Arguments Against the Freedom to Will’, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 25: 642–662.
  • Locke, Don, 1975, “Three Concepts of Free Action, Part 1”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplemental Volume), 49: 95–112.
  • LoLordo, Antonia, 2012, Locke’s Moral Man, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lowe, E.J., 1986, “Necessity and the Will in Locke’s Theory of Action”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 3: 149–163.
  • –––, 1995, Locke on Human Understanding, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2004, “Locke: Compatibilist Event-Causalist or Libertarian Substance-Causalist?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 48: 688–701.
  • –––, 2005, Locke, London: Routledge.
  • Magri, Tito, 2000, “Locke, Suspension of Desire, and the Remote Good”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 8: 55–70.
  • Mill, John Stuart, 1974 [1843], System of Logic: Ratiocinative and Inductive, in Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, Vol. 7, edited by J.M. Robson, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Moauro, Leonardo, and Rickless, Samuel C., 2019, ‘Does Locke Have an Akrasia Problem?’, Journal of Modern Philosophy, 1: 9. doi:10.32881/jomp.39
  • Moore, G.E., 1912, Ethics, London: Williams and Norgate.
  • O’Higgins, J., 1976, “Introduction” and “Notes”, in Determinism and Freewill: Anthony Collins’ A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty, edited by J. O’Higgins, The Hague: Nijhoff, pp. 1–45 and 115–124.
  • Rickless, Samuel C., 2000, “Locke on the Freedom to Will”, Locke Newsletter (now Locke Studies), 31: 43–67.
  • –––, 2001, “Review of Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency, by Gideon Yaffe”, Locke Studies, 1: 235–255.
  • –––, 2014, Locke, Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1949, The Concept of Mind, London: Hutchinson.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan, 2003, “Overdetermining Causes”, Philosophical Studies, 114: 23–45.
  • Schouls, Peter, 1992, Reasoned Freedom: John Locke and Enlightenment, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Stuart, Matthew, 2013, Locke’s Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Taylor, Richard, 1966, Action and Purpose, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Vailati, Ezio, 1990, ‘Leibniz on Locke on Weakness of Will’, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 28: 213–228.
  • Walsh, Julie, 2014, “Locke and the Power to Suspend Desire”, Locke Studies, 14: 121–157.
  • –––, 2018, ‘Locke’s Last Word on Freedom: Correspondence with Limborch’, Res Philosophica, 95: 637–661.
  • Yaffe, Gideon, 2000, Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Yolton, John W., 1970, Locke and the Compass of Human Understanding, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Additional Secondary Sources

  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2006, “A Woman’s Influence? John Locke and Damaris Masham on Moral Accountability”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 489–510.
  • Chappell, Vere, 1994, “Locke on the Intellectual Basis of Sin”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 32: 197–207.
  • –––, 1998, “Locke on the Suspension of Desire”, Locke Newsletter (now Locke Studies), 29: 23–38.
  • Colman, John, 1983, John Locke’s Moral Philosophy, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Corneanu, Sorana, 2011, Regimens of the Mind: Boyle, Locke, and the Early Modern Cultura Animi Tradition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen, 1995, The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’, 1640–1740, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Glauser, Richard, 2009, “Liberté, Compatibilisme et Agnosticisme chez Locke”, Revue Philosophique de Louvain, 107: 675–697.
  • Harris, James, 2005, Of Liberty and Necessity: The Free Will Debate in Eighteenth-Century British Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • LoLordo, Antonia, 2013, “Reply to Rickless”, Locke Studies, 13: 55–64.
  • Marko, Jonathan S., 2017, ‘Why Locke’s Of Power Is Not a Metaphysical Pronouncement: Locke’s Response to Molyneux’s Critique’, Philosophy and Theology: Marquette University Quarterly, 29: 41–68.
  • Rickless, Samuel C., 2013, “Locke on Active Power, Freedom, and Moral Agency”, Locke Studies, 13: 33–54.
  • –––, 2013, ‘Will and Motivation’, in The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Seventeenth Century, Peter R. Anstey (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 393–414.
  • Schindler, D. C., 2017, Freedom from Reality: The Diabolical Character of Modern Liberty, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, Chapter 1.
  • Sleigh, Robert, Vere Chappell, and Michael Della Rocca, 1998, ‘Determinism and Human Freedom’, in The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Volume 2: 1195–1278.
  • Walsh, Julie, 2010, “‘Things’ for ‘Actions’: Locke’s Mistake in ‘Of Power’”, Locke Studies, 10: 85–94.
  • Wolfe, Charles T, 2009, “Locke’s Compatibilism: Suspension of Desire of Suspension of Determinism?” in Action, Ethics and Responsibility, edited by Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O’Rourke, and Harry Silverstein, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 109–126.
  • Yaffe, Gideon, 2001, “Locke on Refraining, Suspending, and the Freedom to Will”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 18: 373–391.

Other Internet Resources

  • Locke: Ethics entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Julie Walsh.

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