Independence Friendly Logic

First published Mon Feb 9, 2009; substantive revision Thu Sep 15, 2022

Independence friendly logic (IF logic, IF first-order logic) is an extension of first-order logic. In it, more quantifier dependencies and independencies can be expressed than in first-order logic. Its quantifiers range over individuals only; semantically IF first-order logic, however, has the same expressive power as existential second-order logic. IF logic lacks certain metaproperties that first-order logic has (axiomatizability, Tarski-type semantics). On the other hand, IF logic admits a self-applied truth-predicate – a property that first-order logic notoriously does not enjoy. Philosophical issues discussed in connection with IF logic include reformulating the logicist program, the question of truth in axiomatic set theory, and the nature of negation. Work in IF logic has also inspired alternative generalizations of first-order logic: slash logic and dependence logic.

1. Introduction: Quantifier Dependence

In mathematical prose, one can say things such as ‘for all real numbers \(a\) and for all positive real numbers \(\varepsilon\), there exists a positive real number \(\delta\) depending on \(\varepsilon\) but not on \(a\), such that…’ What is important here is quantifier dependence. The existential quantifier ‘there exists \(\delta\)’ is said to depend on the universal quantifier ‘for all \(\varepsilon\)’ but not on the universal quantifier ‘for all \(a\).’ It was an essential part of Karl Weierstrass’s (1815–1897) work in the foundations of analysis that he defined the notions of limit, continuity, and derivative in terms of quantifier dependence.[1] For a concrete example, a function \(f : D \rightarrow \mathbf{R}\) is continuous, if for all \(a\) in the set \(D\) and for all \(\varepsilon \gt 0\) there exists \(\delta \gt 0\) such that for all \(x\) in \(D\), if \(|x - a| \lt \delta\), then \(|f(x) - f(a)| \lt \varepsilon\). The definition of uniform continuity is obtained from that of continuity by specifying that the quantifier ‘there exists \(\delta\)’ depends only on the quantifier ‘for all \(\varepsilon\),’ not on the quantifier ‘for all \(a\).’[2]

Independence friendly first-order logic (a.k.a. IF first-order logic, IF logic) was introduced by Jaakko Hintikka and Gabriel Sandu in their article ‘Informational Independence as a Semantical Phenomenon’ (1989); other early sources are Hintikka’s booklet Defining Truth, the Whole Truth, and Nothing but the Truth (1991) and Sandu’s Ph.D. thesis (1991).[3] IF first-order logic is an extension of first-order logic, involving a specific syntactic device ‘/’ (slash, independence indicator), which has at the object language level the same effect as the meta-level modifier ‘but does not depend on’ has in the example just considered. In the notation of IF logic, the logical form of the statement that a function \(f\) is uniformly continuous would be \((\forall a)(\forall \varepsilon)(\exists \delta /\forall a)(\forall x) R\), to be contrasted with the form of the statement that \(f\) merely is continuous, \((\forall a)(\forall \varepsilon)(\exists \delta)(\forall x) R\).

In the introductory examples in the present and the following section, let us confine attention to formulas in prenex form: a string of quantifiers followed by a quantifier-free first-order formula. If in a first-order sentence of such a form an existential quantifier \(\exists y\) lies in the syntactic scope of a universal quantifier \(\forall x\), then by the semantics \(\exists y\) automatically depends on \(\forall x\). This is so e.g. with the sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y) R(x, y)\). The dependence of \(\exists y\) on \(\forall x\) means that the witness of \(\exists y\) may vary with the value interpreting \(\forall x\). In order for the sentence to be true in a model \(M\), it suffices that there be a function \(f\) such that \(R(a, f(a))\) holds in \(M\), for any \(a\) interpreting \(\forall x\). Such functions, spelling out the dependencies of witnesses for existential quantifiers on interpretations of universal quantifiers, are known in logical literature as Skolem functions.[4] For comparison, in the sentence \((\exists y)(\forall x) R(x, y)\) the quantifier \(\exists y\) does not depend on the quantifier \(\forall x.\) For this sentence to be true in \(M\), one and the same witness \(c\) for \(\exists y\) must be good against any interpretation \(a\) of \(\forall x\), so that \(R(a, c)\) holds in \(M\). The corresponding Skolem function is a constant.[5]

In IF first-order logic, syntactic scopes no longer determine the semantic relation of dependence. In the sentence \((\forall x)(\forall y)(\exists z/\forall y) R(x, y, z)\), for instance, \(\exists z\) is syntactically subordinate to both \(\forall x\) and \(\forall y\), but is marked as independent of \(\forall y\), and is hence dependent only on \(\forall x\). Semantically this means that the witness of \(\exists z\) must be given by a function taking as an argument the interpretation of \(\forall x\), but not that of \(\forall y\). In order for \((\forall x)(\forall y)(\exists z/\forall y) R(x, y, z)\) to be true in \(M\), there must be a function \(f\) of one argument such that \(R(a, b, f(a))\) holds in \(M\), for any \(a\) interpreting \(\forall x\) and any \(b\) interpreting \(\forall y\).

What is gained with the slash notation? After all, clearly e.g. \((\forall x)(\forall y)(\exists z/\forall y) R(x, y, z)\) is true in a model \(M\) iff[6] the first-order sentence \((\forall x)(\exists z)(\forall y) R(x, y, z)\) is true therein. As a matter of fact, the expressive power of IF logic exceeds that of first-order logic. Consider the sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y)(\forall z)(\exists w/\forall x) R(x, y, z, w)\). Its truth-condition is of the following form: there are one-argument functions \(f\) and \(g\) such that \(R(a, f(a), b, g(b))\) holds in \(M\), for any \(a\) interpreting \(\forall x\) and \(b\) interpreting \(\forall z\).[7] So the sentence is true iff the following sentence (*) containing a finite partially ordered quantifier is true:

\[\tag{*} \begin{matrix} \forall x \exists y \\ \forall z \exists w \end{matrix} R(x,y,z,w) \]

For, by definition (*) is true in a model \(M\) iff the second-order sentence \((\exists f)(\exists g)(\forall x)(\forall z) R(x, f(x), z, g(z))\) is true therein. The latter may be termed the Skolem normal form of (*). It says that Skolem functions providing witnesses for the quantifiers \(\exists y\) and \(\exists w\) in (*) exist. Finite partially ordered quantifiers – a.k.a. Henkin quantifiers or branching quantifiers – were proposed by Leon Henkin (1961) and have been subsequently studied extensively.[8] They are two-dimensional syntactic objects

\[\begin{matrix} Q_{11} \ldots Q_{1n} \\ \vdots \\ Q_{m1} \ldots Q_{mn} \end{matrix}\]

where each \(Q_{ij}\) is either \(\exists x_{ij}\) or \(\forall x_{ij}\). They are naturally interpreted by making systematic use of Skolem functions.

Let us denote by \(\mathbf{FPO}\) the logic of finite partially ordered quantifiers obtained from first-order logic as follows: if \(\phi\) is a first-order formula and \(\mathbf{Q}\) is a finite partially ordered quantifier, then \(\mathbf{Q}\phi\) is a formula of \(\mathbf{FPO}\).[9] With \(\mathbf{FPO}\) it is possible to express properties that are not definable in first-order logic. The first example was provided by Andrzej Ehrenfeucht (cf. Henkin 1961): a sentence that is true in a model iff the size of its domain is infinite. It turns out that \(\mathbf{FPO}\) can be translated into IF logic (see Subsect. 4.1). Therefore IF logic is more expressive than first-order logic.

The deepest reason for IF logic, as Hintikka saw it, is that the relations of dependence and independence between quantifiers are the only way of expressing relations of dependence and independence between variables on the first-order level (Hintikka 1996: 34–35, 73–74; 2002a: 404–405; 2006a: 71, 515). To understand this remark properly, recall that relations of quantifier (in)dependence are semantic relations, but syntactically expressed. More precisely, in IF logic the (in)dependence relations are syntactically expressed by the interplay of two factors: syntactic scope and the independence indicator ‘/’. In a given sentence, an existential quantifier \(\exists x\), say, depends on precisely those universal quantifiers within whose scope \(\exists x\) lies, but of which \(\exists x\) is not marked as independent using the slash sign. What Hintikka means when he speaks of (in)dependence relations between variables, are functional dependencies between quantities in a model. The kinetic energy of a material body depends on its mass and its speed, but does not depend on the particular material body being considered. This fact can be expressed in IF logic by the sentence

\((\forall b)(\forall m)(\forall v)(\exists e/\forall b)\)(if \(b\) is a material body which moves at the velocity \(v\) and has the mass \(m\), then the kinetic energy \(e\) of \(b\) equals \(\frac{1}{2} mv^2 )\).

That this sentence states the existence of a functional dependence of kinetic energy on mass and speed is particularly clearly seen from the fact that if the sentence is true, the unique Skolem function for the quantifier \(\exists e\) actually is the physical law connecting masses, speeds and kinetic energies (cf. Hintikka 1996: 34–35).

While first-order logic can only express some relations between variables, IF first-order logic with its greater expressive power can express more. Actually, IF logic is calculated to capture all such relations (Hintikka 1996: 75–77; 2002a: 404–405; 2002b: 197; 2006a: 72). This idea must, in its full generality, be seen as programmatic. For a more general framework, cf. Hintikka (2006a: 515, 536, 752; 2008), Sandu & Sevenster (2010), Sandu (2013), Sandu (2014).

Among philosophical issues that have been addressed in connection with IF logic are the reconstruction of mathematical reasoning on the first-order level (Hintikka 1996, 1997), definability of a self-applied truth predicate (Hintikka 1991, 1996, 2001; Sandu 1998), truth and axiomatic set theory (Hintikka 1996, 2004a), and insights into the nature of negation (Hintikka 1991, 1996, 2002; Hintikka & Sandu 1989; Sandu 1994). These issues will be discussed in Sections 4 and 5.

2. The Background of IF Logic: Game-theoretical Semantics

2.1. Semantic games

Inspired by Ludwig Wittgenstein’s idea of a language-game, Hintikka (1968) introduced the basic framework of what came to be known as game-theoretical semantics (a.k.a. GTS). The basic lesson Hintikka adopts from Wittgenstein is that words – in particular quantifiers – are associated with activities that render them meaningful: words often have meaning only in the context of certain types of action (Hintikka 1968: 55–56). Wittgenstein said that by ‘language-game’ he means ‘the whole, consisting of language and the actions into which it is woven’ (Wittgenstein 1953: I, Sect. 7).

It becomes natural to ask which are the activities that go together with quantifiers. As Hintikka explains (see Hintikka 2006a: 41, 67), Wittgenstein had taken it as a criterion for something to be an object that it can be looked for and found. Applying this idea to quantifiers with such objects as values, Hintikka was led to formulate semantic games for quantifiers. Crucially, these semantic games can be formulated as games in the strict sense of game theory; but at the same time they are exact codifications of language-games in Wittgenstein’s sense, at least if one accepts that the activities associated with quantifiers are ‘looking for’ and ‘finding.’[10]

Semantic games \(G(\phi , M)\) for first-order sentences \(\phi\) are two-player zero-sum games of perfect information, played on a given model \(M\). Let us call the two players simply player 1 and player 2.[11] The games are most easily explained for sentences in prenex form. Universal quantifiers mark a move of player 1, while existential quantifiers prompt a move by player 2. In both cases, the relevant player must choose an individual from the domain \(\rM\) of \(M\).[12] If

\[ \phi = (\forall x)(\exists y)(\forall z)(\exists w) R(x, y, z, w), \]

the game is played as follows. First, player 1 picks out an individual \(a\), whereafter player 2 chooses an individual \(b\). Then player 1 proceeds to choose a further individual \(c\), to which player 2 responds by picking out an individual \(d\). Thereby a play of the game has come to an end. The tuple \((a, b, c, d)\) of individuals chosen determines the winner of the play. If the quantifier-free formula \(R(a, b, c, d)\) holds in \(M\), player 2 wins, if not, player 1 wins.

The fact that one of the players wins a single play of game \(G(\phi , M)\) does not yet tell us anything about the truth-value of the sentence \(\phi\). Truth and falsity are characterized in terms of the notion of winning strategy. The sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y)(\forall z)(\exists w) R(x, y, z, w)\) is true in \(M\) if there is a winning strategy for player 2 in the game just described: a recipe telling player 2 what to do, when (a specified amount of) information about the opponent’s earlier moves is given. Technically, the requirement is that there be strategy functions \(f\) and \(g\), such that for any choices \(a\) and \(c\) by player \(1, R(a, f(a), c, g(a, c))\) holds in \(M\). Observe that strategy function \(f\) is a Skolem function for the quantifier \(\exists y\) in \(\phi\), and similarly \(g\) is a Skolem function for the quantifier \(\exists w\). The sentence \(\phi\) is false in \(M\) if there is a winning strategy (set of strategy functions) for player 1 in the corresponding game: a constant \(c\) and a function \(h\) such that for any choices \(b\) and \(d\) by player \(2, R(c, b, h(b), d)\) fails to hold in \(M\).

Game-theoretical interpretation of quantifiers was already suggested by Henkin (1961; cf. Hintikka 1968: 64). Henkin also pointed out, in effect, the connection between a full set of Skolem functions and a winning strategy for player 2. Hintikka (1968) noted that conjunctions are naturally interpreted by a choice between the two conjuncts, made by player 1; similarly, disjunctions can be interpreted by a choice by player 2 between the two disjuncts.[13] Further, Hintikka proposed to interpret negation as a transposition of the roles of ‘verifier’ and ‘falsifier’ (for more details, see Subsect. 3.2).

The game-theoretical description of semantic games does not mention the activities of searching and finding; for such an abstract description it suffices to speak of the players making a move. Also, the characterization of truth and falsity as the existence of a winning strategy for player 2 and player 1, respectively, does not refer to efforts on the part of the players – say efforts to establish truth or to find witnesses. The truth or falsity of a sentence is a matter of ‘combinatorics’: it is an issue of the existence of a set of functions with certain properties (cf. Hintikka 1968, 1996; Hodges 2013). So what happened to the original philosophical conception according to which the meanings of quantifiers are tied to the activities of searching and finding? Hintikka’s idea is that asserting a sentence involving quantifiers is to make a claim about what can and what cannot happen when a certain language-game is played; using language involving quantifiers requires mastering the rules of the corresponding semantic games (Hintikka 1968: Sect. 8, 1996: 128, 2006a: 538). What is the content of such a claim in connection with the sentence \(\forall x\exists y R(x, y)\)? That whichever individual player 1 chooses from the domain for \(\forall x\), player 2 can find a witness individual for \(\exists y\). In other words, given a value for \(\forall x\) (which itself can be seen as the result of the search by player 1), if player 2 is allowed to search free from any practical constraints, she will find a value for \(\exists y\) so that player 2 wins the resulting play. Even though semantic games themselves can be defined without recourse to activities such as looking for or finding, these activities play an important conceptual role when the language user reasons about these games.

Hintikka (1973a) initiated the application of GTS to the study of natural language. This work was continued notably by Hintikka & Kulas (1983, 1985), where game-theoretical rules for such items as negation, anaphoric pronouns, genitives, tenses, intensional verbs, certain prepositional constructions, and proper names were given, and the distinction between abstract meaning and strategic meaning drawn.[14]

2.2. Imperfect information

The framework of GTS enables asking questions of a game-theoretical nature about semantic evaluation. Hintikka (1973a) observed that semantic games with imperfect information are devised without any difficulty. As logical examples he used \(\mathbf{FPO}\) sentences. (For examples related to natural languages, see Subsect. 5.4.)

From the vantage point of GTS, independence friendly first-order logic differs from first-order logic in that semantic games correlated with formulas of the former are, in general, games of imperfect information, while any game associated with a first-order formula is a game of perfect information. Consider the game for \(\forall x\exists y\forall z(\exists w/\forall x) R(x, y, z, w)\), played on a model \(M\). A play of this game proceeds exactly as plays of the game corresponding to \(\forall x\exists y\forall z\exists w R(x, y, z, w)\). First, player 1 chooses an individual \(a\), whereafter player 2 chooses an individual \(b\). Then player 1 proceeds to pick out a further individual \(c\), to which player 2 responds by choosing an individual \(d\). So a play of the game has come to an end. The play is won by player 2, if indeed \(R(a, b,c, d)\) holds in \(M\); otherwise it is won by player 1. But \(\exists w\) was marked as independent of \(\forall x\) – why does not this fact show in any way in the course of a play?

One might be tempted to add to the description of a play: ‘player 2 chooses a value for \(\exists w\) in ignorance of the value for \(\forall x\).’ However, such a paraphrase would not clarify the conceptual situation. It makes no sense to speak of the independence of a move from other given moves with reference to a single play; this can only be done with reference to a multitude of plays. Quantifier independence can be conceptualized in game-theoretical terms making use of the notion of strategy. In the example, a strategy of player 2 is a set \(\{f, g\}\) of strategy functions, function \(f\) providing a value for \(\exists y\) depending on the value of \(\forall x\), and function \(g\) providing a value for \(\exists w\) depending on the value chosen for \(\forall z\) but not on the value chosen for \(\forall x\). The strategy \(\{f, g\}\) is, then, a winning strategy for player 2, iff \(R(a, f(a), c, g(c))\) holds in \(M\), for all values \(a\) chosen for \(\forall x\) and \(c\) chosen for \(\forall z\). One precise way of implementing the idea that player 2 is ‘ignorant’ of the move player 1 made for \(\forall x\) is to say that (a) strategy functions always only take as arguments the opponent’s moves, and (b) the strategy function corresponding to \(\exists w\) may not take as its argument the move player 1 made for \(\forall x\).

A sentence of IF first-order logic is by definition true in a model \(M\) iff there is a winning strategy for player 2 in the correlated game, and false iff there is a winning strategy for player 1 in the correlated game. There are sentences which under these criteria are neither true nor false; they are called non-determined (see Subsect. 3.3).

In Hintikka’s judgement, the game-theoretical semantics of quantifiers can be taken to have the same rationale that was mentioned as the deepest reason for IF first-order logic at the end of Section 1: GTS is a method of representing, on the first-order level, the (in)dependence relations between variables by means of informational (in)dependence in the sense of game theory (Hintikka 1991: 12–13, 2006a: 535).

3. The Syntax and Semantics of IF First-order Logic

In the literature one can find essentially different formulations of ‘IF first-order logic.’ The differences are not restricted to syntax – examples of applying different semantic ideas can be found as well.

As already noted, there is a systematic connection between the Skolem functions and strategy functions of player 2. In connection with formulas in prenex form, a Skolem function for an existential quantifier is a function of the values assigned to the preceding universal quantifiers, but not a function of the values assigned to the preceding existential quantifiers.[15] Skolem functions are strategy functions taking as arguments exclusively moves made by player 1. Generally a strategy for a player in a two-player game can perfectly well make use of the previous choices of either player. Hodges (2007) stresses that it makes a difference on which notion – Skolem function or strategy function – the semantics of imperfect information is based. Hodges (1997a) adopted the notational convention of writing, say, \((\exists y/x)\) where Hintikka writes \((\exists y/\forall x)\), hence marking the difference between semantic games formulated in terms of arbitrary strategy functions and those whose strategy functions are in effect Skolem functions; the variable \(x\) in \((\exists y/x)\) can be ‘bound’ by any syntactically preceding quantifier carrying the variable \(x\). Hodges proposed to employ the former formulation, while in Hintikka (1991, 1995, 1996, 2002) and Sandu (1993, 1994) the latter formulation is employed. Hodges (2007: 119) writes:

[W]e refer to the logic with my notation and the general game semantics as slash logic. During recent years many writers in this area (but never Hintikka himself) have transferred the name ‘IF logic’ to slash logic, often without realising the difference. Until the terminology settles down, we have to beware of examples and proofs that don’t make clear which semantics they intend.

The distinction that Hodges makes between slash logic and IF logic serves to bring order to the mishmash of different formulations of IF first-order logic to be found in the literature.[16]

3.1. Syntax

IF first-order logic is an extension of first-order logic. Now, any first-order formula is equivalent to a first-order formula in which no variable occurs both free and bound, and in which no two nested quantifiers carry the same variable. Formulas meeting these two syntactic conditions will be termed regular. Henceforth we systematically restrict attention to regular first-order formulas.[17] A vocabulary (signature, non-logical terminology) is any countable set \(\tau\) of relation symbols (each of which carries a fixed arity), function symbols (again each with a fixed arity), and constant symbols. The first-order logic of vocabulary \(\tau\) will be referred to as \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\). It is assumed here that among the logical symbols of first-order logic there is the identity symbol (=). The identity symbol is syntactically a binary relation symbol, but its semantic interpretation is fixed in a way that the interpretations of the items in the non-logical terminology are not.

A formula of \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\) is in negation normal form, if all occurrences of the negation symbol \({\sim}\) immediately precede an atomic formula. The set of formulas of IF first-order logic of vocabulary \(\tau\) (or \(\mathbf{IFL}[\tau])\) can be defined as the smallest set such that:

  1. If \(\phi\) is a formula of \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\) in negation normal form, \(\phi\) is a formula.
  2. If \(\phi\) is a formula and in \(\phi\) a token of \((\exists x)\) occurs in the syntactic scope of a number of universal quantifiers which include \((\forall y_1),\ldots ,(\forall y_n)\), the result of replacing in \(\phi\) that token of \((\exists x)\) by \((\exists x/\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) is a formula.
  3. If \(\phi\) is a formula and in \(\phi\) a token of \(\vee\) occurs in the syntactic scope of a number of universal quantifiers which include \((\forall y_1),\ldots ,(\forall y_n)\), the result of replacing in \(\phi\) that token of \(\vee\) by \((\vee /\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) is a formula.
  4. If \(\phi\) is a formula and in \(\phi\) a token of \((\forall x)\) occurs in the syntactic scope of a number of existential quantifiers which include \((\exists y_1),\ldots ,(\exists y_n)\), the result of replacing in \(\phi\) that token of \((\forall x)\) by \((\forall x/\exists y_1 ,\ldots ,\exists y_n)\) is a formula.
  5. If \(\phi\) is a formula and in \(\phi\) a token of \(\wedge\) occurs in the syntactic scope of a number of existential quantifiers which include \((\exists y_1),\ldots ,(\exists y_n)\), the result of replacing in \(\phi\) that token of \(\wedge\) by \((\wedge /\exists y_1 ,\ldots ,\exists y_n)\) is a formula.

Clauses (2) and (3) allow the degenerate case that the list of universal quantifiers is empty \((n = 0)\). The resulting expressions \((\exists x\)/) and \((\vee\)/) are identified with the usual existential quantifier \((\exists x)\) and the usual disjunction \(\vee\), respectively. Similar stipulations are made about clauses (4) and (5).

In a suitable vocabulary, each of the following is a formula:

  • \((\forall x)(\forall y)(\exists z/\forall x) R(x, y, z, v)\),
  • \((\forall x)(\forall y)(x = y \; (\vee /\forall x) \; Q(x, y))\),
  • \((\exists x)(S(x) \; (\wedge /\exists x) \; T(x))\),
  • \((\forall x)(\exists y)(\forall z/\exists y)(\exists v/\forall x) R(x, y, z, v)\).

By contrast, none of the following sequences of symbols is a formula:

  • \((\exists y/\forall x) P(x, y)\),
  • \((\exists x)(\exists y/\exists x) P(x, y)\),
  • \((\forall x)(\forall y/\forall x) P(x, y)\),
  • \((\forall x)(S(x) \; (\vee /\exists y) \; T(x))\).

If \(\phi\) is an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formula, generated by the above clauses from some \(\mathbf{FO}\) formula \(\phi^*\), the free variables of \(\phi\) are simply the free variables of \(\phi^*\). \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formulas without free variables are \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences.[18]

3.2. Semantics

Defining the semantics of a logic using GTS is a two-step process. The first step is to define the relevant semantic games. The second step is to define the notions of ‘true’ and ‘false’ in terms of the semantic games; this happens by reference to the notion of winning strategy. Semantic games may be defined by specifying recursively the alternative ways in which a game associated with a given formula \(\phi\) can be begun.[19]

For every vocabulary \(\tau\), \(\mathbf{IFL}[\tau]\) formula \(\phi\), model \((\tau\) structure) \(M\), and variable assignment \(g\), a two-player zero-sum game \(G(\phi , M, g)\) between player 1 and player 2 is associated.[20] If \(g\) is a variable assignment, \(g[x/a]\) is the variable assignment which is otherwise like \(g\) but maps the variable \(x\) to the object \(a\).

  1. If \(\phi = R(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n)\) and \(M, g \vDash R(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n)\), player 2 wins (and player 1 loses); otherwise player 1 wins (and player 2 loses).
  2. If \(\phi = t_1 = t_2\) and \(M, g \vDash t_1 = t_2\), player 2 wins (and player 1 loses); otherwise player 1 wins (and player 2 loses).
  3. If \(\phi = {\sim}R(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n)\) and \(M, g \not\vDash R(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n)\), player 2 wins (and player 1 loses); otherwise player 1 wins (and player 2 loses).
  4. If \(\phi = {\sim}t_1 = t_2\) and \(M, g \not\vDash t_1 = t_2\), player 2 wins (and player 1 loses); otherwise player 1 wins (and player 2 loses).
  5. If \(\phi = (\psi \; (\wedge /\exists y_1 ,\ldots ,\exists y_n) \; \chi)\), player 1 chooses \(\theta \in \{\psi ,\chi \}\) and the rest of the game is as in \(G(\theta , M, g)\).
  6. If \(\phi = (\psi \; (\vee /\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n) \; \chi)\), player 2 chooses \(\theta \in \{\psi ,\chi \}\) and the rest of the game is as in \(G(\theta , M, g)\).
  7. If \(\phi = (\forall x/\exists y_1 ,\ldots ,\exists y_n)\psi\), player 1 chooses an element \(a\) from \(\rM\), and the rest of the game is as in \(G(\psi , M, g[x/a]\)).
  8. If \(\phi = (\exists x/\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\psi\), player 2 chooses an element \(a\) from \(\rM\), and the rest of the game is as in \(G(\psi , M, g[x/a]\)).

Observe that the independence indications play no role in the game rules. Indeed, quantifier independence will be implemented on the level of strategies.

If a token of \((\vee /\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) or \((\exists x/\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) appears in the formula \(\phi\) in the scope of the universal quantifiers \(\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n,\forall z_1 ,\ldots ,\forall z_m\) (and only these universal quantifiers), a strategy function of player 2 for this token in game \(G(\phi , M, g)\) is any function \(f\) satisfying the following:

The arguments of \(f\) are the elements \(a_1 ,\ldots ,a_m\) that player 1 has chosen so as to interpret the quantifiers \(\forall z_1 ,\ldots ,\forall z_m\). The value \(f(a_1 ,\ldots ,a_m)\) is the left or the right disjunct when the token is a disjunction; and an element of the domain when the token is an existential quantifier.

The notion of the strategy function of player 1 for tokens of \((\wedge /\exists y_1 ,\ldots ,\exists y_n)\) and \((\forall x/\exists y_1 ,\ldots ,\exists y_n)\) can be defined dually. Strategy functions are construed as Skolem functions – the more general notion of strategy function operative in slash logic is not considered here (cf. the beginning of Sect. 3 and Subsect. 6.1). Quantifier independence will be implemented directly in terms of the arguments of the strategy functions.

A strategy of player 2 in game \(G(\phi , M, g)\) is a set \(F\) of her strategy functions, one function for each token of \((\vee /\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) and \((\exists x/\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) appearing in \(\phi\). Player 2 is said to follow the strategy \(F\), if for each token of \((\vee /\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) and \((\exists x/\forall y_1 ,\ldots ,\forall y_n)\) for which she must make a move when game \(G(\phi , M, g)\) is played, she makes the move determined by the corresponding strategy function. A winning strategy for player 2 in \(G(\phi , M, g)\) is a strategy \(F\) such that against any sequence of moves by player 1, following strategy \(F\) yields a win for player 2. The notions of strategy and winning strategy can be similarly defined for player 1.[21]

The satisfaction and dissatisfaction of the \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formula \(\phi\) in the model \(M\) under the assignment \(g\) are then defined as follows:[22]

  • (Satisfaction) \(\phi\) is satisfied in \(M\) under \(g\) iff there is a winning strategy for player 2 in game \(G(\phi , M, g)\).
  • (Dissatisfaction) \(\phi\) is dissatisfied in \(M\) under \(g\) iff there is a winning strategy for player 1 in game \(G(\phi , M, g)\).

As with \(\mathbf{FO}\), variable assignments do not affect the (dis)satisfaction of sentences, i.e., formulas containing no free variables. Indeed, we may define:[23]

  • (Truth) \(\phi\) is true in \(M\) iff there is a winning strategy for player 2 in game \(G(\phi , M)\).
  • (Falsity) \(\phi\) is false in \(M\) iff there is a winning strategy for player 1 in game \(G(\phi , M)\).

The fact that \(\phi\) is true in \(M\) will be denoted by ‘\(M \vDash \phi\).’ Writing \(M \not\vDash \phi\) indicates, then, that \(\phi\) is not true in \(M\). This does not mean that \(\phi\) would in the above-defined sense be false in \(M\). As mentioned in the end of Section 2, there are semantic games in which neither player has a winning strategy.

The syntax of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) can be generalized by removing the restriction according to which the negation sign may only appear as prefixed to an atomic formula.[24]. In order to interpret negation in GTS, two roles are added as a new ingredient in the specification of the games: those of ‘verifier’ and ‘falsifier.’ Initially, player 1 has the role of ‘falsifier’ and player 2 that of ‘verifier.’ The roles may get switched, but only for one reason: when an occurrence of the negation symbol is encountered. All clauses defining semantic games must be rephrased in terms of roles instead of players. It is the player whose role is ‘verifier’ who makes a move for disjunctions and existential quantifiers, and similarly the player whose role is ‘falsifier’ who moves for conjunctions and universal quantifiers. When a formula \({\sim}\psi\) is encountered, the players change roles and the game continues with \(\psi\). Finally, if the encountered atomic formula is true, ‘verifier’ wins and ‘falsifier’ loses, otherwise the payoffs are reversed. The negation \({\sim}\) is variably referred to as strong negation, dual negation, or game-theoretical negation.[25] It works as one would expect: \(\phi\) is false in \(M\) iff its negation \({\sim}\phi\) is true therein (cf. Sandu 1993).

3.3. Basic properties and notions

Failure of bivalence. There are sentences \(\phi\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) and models \(M\) such that \(\phi\) is neither true nor false in \(M\). Consider evaluating the sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y/\forall x) x = y\) on a model whose domain has exactly two elements, \(a\) and \(b\). Player 1 has no winning strategy. If he chooses \(a\) to interpret \(\forall x\), he loses the play in which player 2 chooses \(a\) to interpret \((\exists y/\forall x)\). Similarly, if player 1 chooses \(b\), he loses the play in which player 2 likewise chooses \(b\). Neither does player 2 have a winning strategy. Her strategy functions for \((\exists y/\forall x)\) are constants (zero-place functions). There are two such constants available: \(a\) and \(b\). Whichever one of these strategy functions player 2 assumes, there is a move by player 1 defeating it. If player 2 opts for \(a\), player 1 wins the play in which he chooses \(b\); and if player 2 applies \(b\), player 1 wins the play in which he chooses \(a\). Game \(G(\phi , M)\) is non-determined: neither player has a winning strategy.[26] The notion of non-determinacy may be extended to formulas as well:

  • (Non-determinacy) \(\phi\) is non-determined in \(M\) under \(g\) iff there is no winning strategy for player 1, nor for player 2, in game \(G(\phi , M, g)\).

In \(\mathbf{IFL}\), falsity does not ensue from non-truth. That is, bivalence fails in \(\mathbf{IFL}\). However, it should be noted that it does not fail due to the postulation of a third truth-value or a truth-value gap (cf. Hintikka 1991: 20, 55).[27] Rather, the failure is a consequence of the basic assumptions of the entire semantic theory (GTS). Non-determinacy corresponds to a structural property: the fact that certain kinds of functions do not exist on the model considered.

Due to the failure of bivalence, the logical law of excluded middle fails for the dual negation \({\sim}\). Actually, \(\phi\) is non-determined in \(M\) iff \(M \not\vDash(\phi \vee{\sim}\phi)\).

Logical equivalence. Sentences \(\psi\) and \(\chi\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) are truth equivalent if they are true in precisely the same models, and falsity equivalent if they are false in precisely the same models. Sentences \(\psi\) and \(\chi\) are logically equivalent if they are both truth equivalent and falsity equivalent.[28] Due to the failure of bivalence, in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) truth equivalence does not guarantee logical equivalence.

Truth, falsity, and independence indications. The syntax of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) allows formulas in which both universal and existential quantifiers appear slashed, e.g.,

\[ \phi : (\forall x)(\exists y/\forall x)(\forall z/\exists y) R(x, y, z). \]

On the other hand, quantifier independence is implemented at the level of strategies. Consequently independence indications following a universal quantifier are vacuous, when the satisfaction of a formula (truth of a sentence) is considered. Similarly, independence indications following an existential quantifier are vacuous when the dissatisfaction of a formula (falsity of a sentence) is at stake. The sentence \(\phi\) is true in the model \(M\) iff player 2 has a winning strategy \(F=\{c\}\) in game \(G(\phi , M)\). This, again, means that whichever elements \(a\) and \(b\) player 1 chooses to interpret \((\forall x)\) and \((\forall z/\exists y)\), respectively, the constant interpretation \(c\) of \((\exists y/\forall x)\) given by the (zero-place) strategy function \(c\) satisfies \(R(a, c, b)\) in \(M\). But this amounts to the same as requiring that whichever elements \(a\) and \(b\) player 1 chooses to interpret \((\forall x)\) and \((\forall z)\), respectively, the constant interpretation \(c\) of \((\exists y/\forall x)\) satisfies \(R(a, c, b)\) in \(M\). Indeed, \(\phi\) is truth equivalent to a sentence containing no slashed universal quantifiers:

\(\phi\) is true in a model \(M\) iff the sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y/\forall x)(\forall z) R(x, y, z)\) is true in \(M\).

Similarly, \(\phi\) is falsity equivalent to a sentence containing no slashed existential quantifiers: \(\phi\) is false in a model \(M\) iff the sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y)(\forall z/\exists y) R(x, y, z)\) is false therein.

3.4. Extended IF first-order logic

If \(\phi\) is a sentence of \(\mathbf{FO}\), \(\phi\) is false in a model \(M\) iff \({\sim}\phi\) is true in \(M\) iff \(\phi\) is not true in \(M\). By contrast, in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) falsity and non-truth do not coincide. An extension of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) can be introduced, where it is possible to speak of the non-truth of sentences. To this end, let us introduce a new negation symbol, \(\neg\), referred to as weak negation, contradictory negation or classical negation.[29] The set of formulas of extended IF first-order logic (to be denoted \(\mathbf{EIFL})\) is obtained from the set of formulas of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) by closing it under the operations \(\neg\), \(\wedge\), and \(\vee\):[30]

  • All formulas of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) are formulas of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\).
  • If \(\phi\) and \(\psi\) are formulas of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\), then so are \(\neg \phi , (\phi \wedge \psi)\) and \((\phi \vee \psi)\).

So if \(\phi\) and \(\psi\) are \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formulas, e.g. \(\neg \phi\) and \((\neg \phi \vee \psi)\) are \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) formulas; by contrast \((\forall x)\neg \phi\) is not. For the crucial restriction that \(\neg\) may not occur in the scope of a quantifier, see Hintikka (1991: 49; 1996: 148). For counterexamples to this restriction see, however, Hintikka (1996: 148; 2002c) and especially Hintikka (2006b) in which the so-called fully extended IF first-order logic (FEIFL) is considered. In FEIFL, any occurrences of \(\neg\) are allowed which are subject to the following syntactic condition: if (Q\(x/W)\) is a quantifier in the syntactic scope of an occurrence of \(\neg\), then all quantifiers listed in \(W\) are likewise in the syntactic scope of that occurrence of \(\neg\).

The semantics of an \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) formula formed by contradictory negation is simply this:

\[ M, g \vDash \neg \phi \text{ iff } M, g \not\vDash \phi. \]

From the viewpoint of GTS, the connective \(\neg\) behaves in an unusual way. For all connectives of \(\mathbf{IFL}\), there is a game rule (which can be seen as specifying the meaning of the connective). For contradictory negation there is no game rule, and its semantics is not explained in terms of plays of semantic games. A formula \(\neg \phi\) serves to say, globally, something about an entire game \(G(\phi , M, g)\). If \(\phi\) is a sentence, to say that \(\neg \phi\) is true in \(M\) is to say that player 2 does not have a winning strategy in game \(G(\phi , M)\). If, again, there is indeed a winning strategy for player 2 in \(G(\phi , M)\), by stipulation \(\neg \phi\) is false in \(M\).[31]

Not only is \(\neg \phi\) not itself a formula of \(\mathbf{IFL}\), but it cannot in general even be expressed in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (see Subsect. 4.2). The law of excluded middle holds for the contradictory negation: for all sentences \(\phi\) and all models \(M\), indeed \(M \vDash(\phi \vee \neg \phi)\). In Section 5 it will be seen how Hintikka has proposed to make use of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) when discussing issues in the philosophy of mathematics.

4. Metalogical Properties of IF First-order Logic

The metalogical properties of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) have been discussed in several publications, by Hintikka as well as Sandu.[32] When presenting them, reference will be made to existential second-order logic \((\mathbf{ESO})\);[33] further important notions are those of the skolemization and Skolem normal form of an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formula. For precise definitions of these notions, the supplementary document can be consulted. In brief, \(\mathbf{ESO}\) is obtained from \(\mathbf{FO}\) by allowing existential quantification over relation and function symbols in a first-order formula. The skolemization \(\mathrm{sk}[\phi]\) of an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formula \(\phi\) is a first-order formula of a larger vocabulary. It explicates in terms of function symbols how existential quantifiers and disjunction symbols of \(\phi\) depend on preceding universal quantifiers. For example, a skolemization of the \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence \(\phi = (\forall x)(\exists y)(\forall z)(\exists v/\forall x)R(x, y, z, v)\) of vocabulary \(\{R\}\) is the \(\mathbf{FO}\) sentence \(\mathrm{sk}[\phi] = (\forall x)(\forall z)R(x, f(x), z, h(z))\) of vocabulary \(\{R, f, h\}\). Its Skolem normal form, again, is the \(\mathbf{ESO}\) sentence \(\mathrm{SK}[\phi] = (\exists f)(\exists h)(\forall x)(\forall z)R(x, f(x), z, h(z))\). The first-order sentence \(\mathrm{sk}[\phi]\) must not be confused with the second-order sentence \(\mathrm{SK}[\phi]\).

4.1. First-order logic and existential second-order logic

Game-theoretical vs. Tarskian semantics of FO. The set of formulas of \(\mathbf{FO}\) is a proper subset of the set of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formulas. The standard semantics of \(\mathbf{FO}\) is not the one provided by GTS, but the Tarskian semantics specifying recursively the satisfaction relation \(M, g \vDash \phi\). If the Axiom of Choice is assumed,[34] the two semantics of \(\mathbf{FO}\) coincide:

Theorem (assuming AC). (Hodges 1983: 94, Hintikka & Kulas 1985: 6–7) Let \(\tau\) be any vocabulary, \(M\) any \(\tau\) structure, \(g\) any variable assignment and \(\phi\) any \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\) formula. Then \(M, g \vDash \phi\) holds in the standard sense iff there is a winning strategy for player 2 in game \(G(\phi , M, g)\).[35]

Relation to ESO. \(\mathbf{IFL}\) and \(\mathbf{ESO}\) are intertranslatable:[36]

Theorem (assuming AC) \(\mathbf{ESO}\) and \(\mathbf{IFL}\) have the same expressive power.

That is, (1) for every \(\mathbf{IFL}[\tau]\) formula \(\phi\) there is an \(\mathbf{ESO}[\tau]\) formula \(\phi'\) such that for all \(\tau\) structures \(M\) and variable assignments \(g\), we have: \(M, g \vDash \phi\) iff \(M, g \vDash \phi'\). Actually, \(\mathrm{SK}[\phi]\) is a suitable \(\mathbf{ESO}\) formula. And (2) for every \(\mathbf{ESO}[\tau]\) formula \(\psi\) there is an \(\mathbf{IFL}[\tau]\) formula \(\psi'\) such that \(M, g \vDash \psi\) iff \(M, g \vDash \psi'\), for all \(\tau\) structures \(M\) and variable assignments \(g\). This follows from the fact that \(\mathbf{ESO}\) can be translated into \(\mathbf{FPO}\) (Enderton 1970, Walkoe 1970), which again can be translated into \(\mathbf{IFL}\).

Hintikka suggests that \(\mathbf{IFL}\) is, substantially speaking, a first-order logic: the entities its quantified variables range over are individuals, and so are all entities with which the players of the semantic games operate. (See Subsect. 5.1 for a discussion of this idea.) A part of the interest of the intertranslatability theorem lies in the fact that if Hintikka’s controversial claim is accepted, this would mean that the expressive power of \(\mathbf{ESO}\) can actually be achieved on the first-order level.

IFL is more expressive than FO. The following are examples of properties expressible in \(\mathbf{ESO}\) – and therefore in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) – but not in \(\mathbf{FO}\): Dedekind-infinity of the domain, non-completeness of a linear order, ill-foundedness of a binary relation, disconnectedness of a graph, equicardinality of the extensions of two first-order formulas \(\phi(x)\) and \(\psi(x)\), infinity of the extension of a first-order formula \(\phi(x)\), and the topological notion of open set (see, e.g., Hintikka 1996, Väänänen 2007).

As an example, the Dedekind-infinity of the domain may be considered. A set \(S\) is Dedekind-infinite precisely when there exists an injective function from \(S\) to its proper subset. Let \(\phi_{inf}\) be the following sentence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\):[37]

\[ (\exists t)(\forall x)(\exists z)(\forall y)(\exists v/\forall x)((x = y \leftrightarrow z = v) \wedge z \ne t). \]

The Skolem normal form of \(\phi_{inf}\) is

\[ (\exists f)(\exists g)(\exists t)(\forall x)(\forall y)((x = y \leftrightarrow f(x) = g(y)) \wedge f(x) \ne t). \]

Relative to a model \(M\), this \(\mathbf{ESO}\) sentence asserts the existence of functions \(f\) and \(g\) and an element \(t\) such that \(f = g\) (implication from left to right), this function is injective (implication from right to left), and its domain is the whole domain of \(M\) but the element \(t\) does not appear in its range. Consequently the range is a proper subset of the domain of \(M\). In other words, the sentence \(\phi_{inf}\) is true in a model \(M\) iff the domain of \(M\) is infinite.

Be it still noted that when attention is restricted to finite models, Ronald Fagin’s famous theorem (1974) connects \(\mathbf{ESO}\) and the complexity class \(\mathbf{NP}\): a computational problem is solvable by an algorithm running in non-deterministic polynomial time iff it is definable in \(\mathbf{ESO}\) relative to the class of all finite structures. The following are \(\mathbf{NP}\)-complete properties and hence expressible in \(\mathbf{IFL}\), over the class of all finite models: evenness of the domain, oddness of the domain, 3-colorability of a graph, and the existence of a Hamiltonian path on a graph.[38]

Properties in common with FO. IF first-order logic shares many metalogical properties with first-order logic.[39]

Compactness. A set of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences has a model iff all its finite subsets have a model.

Löwenheim-Skolem property. Suppose \(\phi\) is an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence that has an infinite model, or arbitrarily large finite models. Then \(\phi\) has models of all infinite cardinalities.

The separation theorem holds in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) in a strengthened form; the ‘separation sentence’ \(\theta\) is in particular a sentence of \(\mathbf{FO}\).

Separation theorem. Suppose \(\phi\) is an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence of vocabulary \(\tau\), and \(\psi\) an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence of vocabulary \(\tau'\). Suppose further that \(\phi\) and \(\psi\) have no models in common. Then there is a first-order sentence \(\theta\) of vocabulary \(\tau \cap \tau'\) such that every model of \(\phi\) is a model of \(\theta\), but \(\theta\) and \(\psi\) have no models in common.

It is well known that for \(\mathbf{FO}\) there is a sound and complete proof procedure. Because a first-order sentence \(\phi\) is inconsistent (non-satisfiable) iff its negation \({\sim}\phi\) is valid (true in all models), trivially \(\mathbf{FO}\) also has a sound and complete disproof procedure.[40] The latter property extends to \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (while the former does not, see Subsect. 4.3):

Existence of a complete disproof procedure. (Hintikka 1996: 68–70, 82) The set of inconsistent \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences is recursively enumerable.

4.2. Intricacies of negation

In Subsection 3.4, the contradictory negation \(\neg\) was distinguished from the strong negation \({\sim}\). In \(\mathbf{FO}\) the two coincide: for any first-order sentence \(\phi\), we have \(M \vDash{\sim}\phi\) iff \(M \vDash \neg \phi\).

Strong negation fails as a semantic operation. Let us write \([\phi]\) for the set of models of sentence \(\phi\). In the special case of \(\mathbf{FO}\), the strong negation \({\sim}\) clearly defines a semantic operation: whenever \(\chi\) and \(\theta\) are sentences such that \([\chi] = [\theta]\), we have \([{\sim}\chi] = [{\sim}\theta]\). Burgess (2003) observed that in the context of IF logic this property is lost in a very strong sense. In fact there are IF sentences \(\chi\) and \(\theta\) such that while \([\chi] = [\theta]\), the sets \([{\sim}\chi]\) and \([{\sim}\theta]\) are not only distinct but even disjoint.

Inexpressibility of contradictory negation. In \(\mathbf{IFL}\) the strong negation \({\sim}\) and the contradictory negation \(\neg\) do not coincide: we may have \(M \vDash \neg \phi\) without having \(M \vDash{\sim}\phi\). This fact by itself still leaves open the possibility that the contradictory negation of every sentence \(\phi\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) could be defined in \(\mathbf{IFL}\), i.e., that there was a sentence \(neg(\phi)\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) such that \(M \vDash\) \(neg(\phi)\) iff \(M \not\vDash \phi\), for all models \(M\). All we know by the failure of the law of excluded middle is that not in all cases can \(neg(\phi)\) be chosen to be \({\sim}\phi\). However, as a matter of fact contradictory negation is inexpressible in \(\mathbf{IFL}\). There are sentences \(\phi\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) such that \(\neg \phi\) (which is a sentence of \(\mathbf{EIFL})\) is not truth equivalent to any sentence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). This follows from the well-known fact that \(\mathbf{ESO}\) is not closed under negation and \(\mathbf{IFL}\) has the same expressive power as \(\mathbf{ESO}\).[41]

Strong inexpressibility of contradictory negation. As a corollary to the separation theorem, the result holds in a much stronger form. If \(\phi\) and \(\psi\) are sentences of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) such that \(M \vDash \phi\) iff \(M \not\vDash \psi\), then each of \(\phi\) and \(\psi\) is truth equivalent to a sentence of \(\mathbf{FO}\). Hence the contradictory negation \(\neg \phi\) is only expressible in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) for those \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences \(\phi\) that are truth equivalent to an \(\mathbf{FO}\) sentence.[42]

Determined fragment. Let us say that an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence \(\phi\) is determined if it satisfies: \(M \vDash(\phi \vee{\sim}\phi)\), for all models \(M\). The determined fragment of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) is the set of determined \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences. In the determined fragment contradictory negation is syntactically expressible by the strong negation. By the strong inexpressibility of contradictory negation, the determined fragment of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) has the same expressive power as \(\mathbf{FO}\). Membership in the determined fragment is a sufficient but not necessary condition for an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence to have its contradictory negation expressible in \(\mathbf{IFL}\). The sentence \((\forall y)(\exists x/\forall y) x = y\) is not determined;[43] yet its contradictory negation \((\forall x)(\exists y) x \ne y\) is expressible in \(\mathbf{IFL}\).

Contradictory negation and GTS. The truth-conditions that GTS yields are of the form ‘there are strategy functions \(f_1 ,\ldots ,f_n\) such that —,’ i.e., it gives rise to truth-conditions expressible in \(\mathbf{ESO}\). By the strong inexpressibility of contradictory negation, there is no single \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence, not translatable into \(\mathbf{FO}\), whose contradictory negation has a truth-condition of that form. This fact makes it understandable why contradictory negation should not be expected to admit of a game-theoretical interpretation along the same lines in which the other logical operators are interpreted. Different ways of assigning a game-theoretical interpretation to contradictory negation can, however, be developed. To this end, in the context of fully extended IF first-order logic (FEIFL, cf. Subsect. 3.4), Hintikka has proposed to use semantic games with subgames. (See Hintikka 2002c, 2006b; for subgames, see Carlson & Hintikka 1979, Hintikka & Kulas 1983.) This approach leads to mixing the play level with the strategy level: choices of individuals made in a subgame may depend on strategy functions chosen in earlier subgames. In Tulenheimo (2014), a game-theoretical semantics is formulated for the fragment of FEIFL that consists of formulas in prenex form. Plays of the correlated games do not involve choosing any second-order objects, such as strategy functions. Contradictory negation \((\neg)\) is interpreted by introducing an additional component in game positions: a mode. At the play level, the negation \(\neg\) triggers not only a role switch (like the dual negation \({\sim})\), but it also involves changing the mode from positive to negative or vice versa. The semantic effect of modes becomes visible at the strategy level: modes regulate the way in which the truth condition of a sentence involves existentially or universally quantifying over strategy functions. Like independence indications, also occurrences of \(\neg\) are, then, interpreted in terms of conditions that act on the strategy level. For related research, see Figueira et al. (2011, 2014).

Contradictory negation and finite models. Certain major open questions in logic and theoretical computer science can be formulated in terms of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). It is an open question in complexity theory whether \(\mathbf{NP} = \mathbf{coNP}\), that is, whether the class of \(\mathbf{NP}\)-solvable problems is the same as the class of problems whose complement is solvable in \(\mathbf{NP}\). By Fagin’s theorem (1974), this open problem can be equivalently formulated as follows: Is \(\mathbf{IFL}\) closed under negation over finite models? That is, is there for every IF sentence \(\phi\) another IF sentence \(neg(\phi)\) such that for any finite model \(M\), \(neg(\phi)\) is true in \(M\) iff \(\phi\) is not true in \(M\)? Proving that the answer is negative would settle the notorious \(\mathbf{P} = \mathbf{NP}\) problem, i.e., establish that there are computational problems for which one can efficiently verify whether a proposed solution is correct although one cannot efficiently find a solution.[44]

4.3 Failure of axiomatizability

As is well known, \(\mathbf{FO}\) admits of a sound and complete proof procedure: there is a mechanical way of generating precisely those first-order sentences that are valid (true in all models). This fact can also be expressed by saying that \(\mathbf{FO}\) is axiomatizable, or that the set of valid sentences of \(\mathbf{FO}\) is recursively enumerable.[45] Due to its greater expressive power, axiomatizability fails for \(\mathbf{IFL}\). In other words, \(\mathbf{IFL}\) is semantically incomplete.[46]

One way to show this is as follows. Suppose for the sake of contradiction that the set of valid \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences is recursively enumerable. Recall that the sentence \(\phi_{inf}\) discussed in Subsection 4.1 is true in all and only infinite models. Note, then, that an \(\mathbf{FO}\) sentence \(\chi\) is true in all finite models iff the \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence \((\phi_{inf} \vee \chi)\) is valid. Given a valid \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence, it can be effectively checked whether the sentence is syntactically of the form \((\phi_{inf} \vee \chi)\), where \(\chi\) is a first-order sentence. Hence the recursive enumeration of all valid \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentences yields a recursive enumeration of first-order sentences \(\chi\) true in all finite models. But this contradicts Trakhtenbrot’s theorem, according to which the set of \(\mathbf{FO}\) sentences true in all finite models is not recursively enumerable.[47]

What is the relevance of the failure of axiomatizability of \(\mathbf{IFL}\)? Discussing finite partially ordered quantifiers, Quine (1970: 89–91) suggests that we should refuse to give the status of logic to any generalization of \(\mathbf{FO}\) which does not have a sound and complete proof procedure both for validity and for inconsistency. For Quine, any such generalization belongs to mathematics rather than logic. Since \(\mathbf{FPO}\) is not axiomatizable, it falls outside the realm of logic, thus delineated.[48]

Hintikka finds this type of allegation unfounded. First, \(\mathbf{IFL}\) shares many of the important metalogical results with \(\mathbf{FO}\) (cf. Subsect. 4.1). Second, just like \(\mathbf{IFL}\), also \(\mathbf{FO}\) can be translated into second-order logic. The only difference is that in the former case a larger variety of quantifier (in)dependencies must be encoded by Skolem functions than in the latter. Why would the former translation render \(\mathbf{IFL}\) a part of mathematics while the latter would allow \(\mathbf{FO}\) to remain a logic (Hintikka 1991: 26–27)? Third, one must make a distinction between what is needed to understand an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence, and what is needed to mechanically deal with the validities (logical truths) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). Due to its non-axiomatizability, there are no mechanical rules for generating the set of all validities of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). However, to understand a sentence is to know what things are like when it is true, not to know what things are like when it is logically true (Hintikka 1995: 13–14). Fourth, because of non-axiomatizability, the valid inference patterns in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) cannot be exhausted by any recursive enumeration. Insofar as important mathematical problems can be reduced to questions about the validity of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) formulas (Subsect. 5.3), progress in mathematics can be seen to consist (not of the discovery of stronger set-theoretical axioms but) of ever more powerful rules for establishing validity in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (Hintikka 1996: 100; 2000: 135–136).

4.4 Compositionality and the failure of Tarski-type semantics

The principle of compositionality (a.k.a. Frege principle) states that semantic attributes of a complex expression \(E\) are determined by the semantic attributes of its constituent expressions and the structure of \(E\). In particular, the semantic attribute of interest (e.g., truth) may be determined in terms of one or more auxiliary semantic attributes (e.g., satisfaction).[49] Hintikka has argued that compositionality amounts to semantic context-independence: semantic attributes of a complex expression depend only on the semantic attributes of its constituent expressions, plus its structure – they do not depend on the sentential context in which the expression is embedded. Semantic context-independence makes it possible to carry out semantic analysis from inside out – from simpler expressions to more complex ones.[50] This is what is needed for recursive definitions of semantic attributes – such as Tarski-type definitions of truth and satisfiability – to be possible.[51] By contrast, the GTS analysis of sentences is an outside in process: a semantic game starts with an entire sentence, and stepwise analyzes the sentence into simpler and simpler components, eventually reaching an atomic formula (together with an appropriate variable assignment). Therefore GTS allows accounting for semantic context-dependencies that violate the principle of compositionality.[52]

In \(\mathbf{IFL}\) an existential quantifier may depend only on some of the universal quantifiers in whose scope it lies. Accordingly, its interpretation depends on its relation to quantifiers outside its own scope. Such an existential quantifier is context-dependent.[53] On the face of it, then, \(\mathbf{IFL}\) cannot but violate the principle of compositionality and does not admit of a Tarski-type truth-definition.

Hodges (1997a,b) showed, however, that \(\mathbf{IFL}\) can be given a compositional semantics.[54] The semantics is given by recursively defining the satisfaction relation ‘\(M \vDash_X \phi\)’ (read: \(\phi\) is satisfied in \(M\) by \(X)\), where \(X\) is a set of variable assignments. While the Tarskian semantics for \(\mathbf{FO}\) is in terms of single variable assignments, Hodges’s semantics employs sets of variable assignments. The game-theoretical semantics of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) is captured by this compositional semantics: for every formula \(\phi\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\), player 2 has a winning strategy in \(G(\phi , M, g)\) iff the condition \(M \vDash_{\{g\}} \phi\) holds. Due to Hodges’s semantic clauses for existential quantifiers and disjunctions involving independence indications, the evaluation of \(\phi\) relative to the singleton set \(\{g\}\) generally leads to evaluating syntactic components of \(\phi\) relative to sets of (possibly infinitely) many variable assignments. Hintikka remarks (2006a: 65) that if one is sufficiently ruthless, one can always save compositionality by building the laws of semantic interaction of different expressions into the respective meanings of those expressions.[55]

It is methodologically worth pointing out that compositionality is not needed for defining \(\mathbf{IFL}\). The very existence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) proves that rejecting compositionality is no obstacle for the formulation of a powerful logic (Hintikka 1995). It should also be noted that what makes Hodges’s result work is its type-theoretical ascent. Let us say that a Tarski-type compositional semantics is a compositional semantics which interprets each formula \(\phi(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n)\) of \(n\) free variables in terms of an \(n\)-tuple of elements of the domain. Hence the standard semantics of \(\mathbf{FO}\) is Tarski-type, but Hodges’s semantics employing the satisfaction relation ‘\(M \vDash_X \phi\)’ is not, because the latter evaluates a formula \(\phi(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n)\) of \(n\) free variables relative to an entire set of \(n\)-tuples of elements. Cameron & Hodges (2001) proved that actually there is \(no\) Tarski-type compositional semantics for \(\mathbf{IFL}\).

The notion of compositionality can be refined by imposing constraints on the auxiliary semantic attributes. Sandu and Hintikka (2001: 60) suggested, by analogy with \(\mathbf{FO}\), that ‘satisfaction by a single variable assignment’ would be a natural auxiliary attribute in connection with \(\mathbf{IFL}\). By the result of Cameron and Hodges, no semantics for \(\mathbf{IFL}\) exists that would be compositional in this restricted sense.

4.5 Defining truth

The definability of truth can only be discussed in connection with languages capable of speaking of themselves. Let us consider an arithmetical vocabulary \(\tau\) and restrict attention to the standard model \(N\) of Peano’s axioms. Each sentence \(\phi\) of vocabulary \(\tau\) can then be represented by a natural number \(\ulcorner \phi \urcorner\), its Gödel number. It is assumed that \(\tau\) contains a numeral \(\boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \phi {}^\urcorner}\) for each number \(\ulcorner \phi \urcorner\). If \(L\) and \(L'\) are abstract logics of vocabulary \(\tau\), such as \(\mathbf{FO}\) or \(\mathbf{IFL}\), and \(\TRUE(x)\) is a formula of \(L'\) such that every sentence \(\phi\) of \(L\) satisfies:

\[ N \vDash \phi \text{ iff } N \vDash \TRUE(\boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \phi {}^\urcorner}), \]

then \(\TRUE(x)\) is said to be a truth-predicate (explicit truth-definition) of logic \(L\) in logic \(L'\) for the model \(N\). By Alfred Tarski’s famous theorem of the undefinability of truth (Tarski 1933), there is no truth-predicate for \(\mathbf{FO}\) in \(\mathbf{FO}\) itself for the model \(N\). More generally, Tarski showed that under certain assumptions, a truth-definition for a logic \(L\) can only be given in a metalanguage which is essentially stronger than \(L\). One of the assumptions is that the negation used behaves like contradictory negation. On the other hand, Tarski also pointed out that an implicit truth-definition for \(\mathbf{FO}\) in \(\mathbf{FO}\) itself is possible. Let \(\tau\) be an arithmetical vocabulary, and let us stay with the standard model \(N\) of Peano’s axioms. Let ‘\(\TRUE\)’ be a unary predicate not appearing in \(\tau\). An \(\mathbf{FO}\) formula \(\psi(x)\) of vocabulary \(\tau \cup \{\TRUE\}\) is an implicit truth-definition for \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\) in \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau \cup \{\TRUE\}]\) for \(N\), if for every \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\) sentence \(\phi\), the following holds:

\(N \vDash \phi\) iff there is an interpretation \(\TRUE^N\) of the unary predicate \(\TRUE\) such that \((N, \TRUE^N ) \vDash \psi(\boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \phi {}^\urcorner})\).[56]

Intuitively, \(\TRUE^N\) is the set of those natural numbers that are Gödel numbers of true arithmetic sentences of vocabulary \(\tau\); and \(\psi(x)\) says that \(x\) is a Gödel number in the extension of the predicate \(\TRUE\). The formula \(\psi(x)\) is a conjunction including clauses that mimic, on the object-language level, the metalogical recursive clauses of the Tarski-type truth-definition for \(\mathbf{FO}\). E.g., one of the conjuncts is

\[\begin{align*} (\forall y)(\forall z)(y = \boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \chi {}^\urcorner} &\wedge z = \boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \theta {}^\urcorner} \wedge x = \boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner (\chi \wedge \theta) {}^\urcorner} \rightarrow \\ &[\TRUE(x) \leftrightarrow (\TRUE(y) \wedge \TRUE(z))]). \end{align*}\]

The implicit nature of the truth-definition is seen from the fact that the predicate \(\TRUE\) appears on both sides of the equivalence sign in these clauses.[57] The above implicit truth-definition of \(\mathbf{FO}\) for \(N\) is of the form ‘there is a set \(S\) interpreting the predicate \(\TRUE\) such that \(\psi(x)\).’ Thus the implicit truth-definition of \(\mathbf{FO}\) in \(\mathbf{FO}\) gives rise to the explicit truth-definition \(\exists \TRUE\, \psi(x)\) of \(\mathbf{FO}[\tau]\) in \(\mathbf{ESO}[\tau]\) for \(N\). Since \(\mathbf{ESO}\) and \(\mathbf{IFL}\) have the same expressive power, a truth-predicate of \(\mathbf{FO}\) for \(N\) can be formulated in \(\mathbf{IFL}\).

The same reasoning can be applied to \(\mathbf{ESO}\) itself, and thereby to \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (Hintikka 1991, 1996; Hyttinen & Sandu 2000; Sandu 1996, 1998). Namely, an \(\mathbf{ESO}\) formula \(\chi(x)\) of vocabulary \(\tau \cup \{\TRUE\}\) can be formulated which is an implicit truth-definition of \(\mathbf{ESO}[\tau]\) for \(N\). Therefore the \(\mathbf{ESO}[\tau]\) formula \(\exists \TRUE\, \chi(x)\) is an explicit truth-definition of \(\mathbf{ESO}[\tau]\) for \(N\). Here the truth-predicate is formulated in the very same language whose notion of truth is being defined: \(\mathbf{ESO}\). Hence \(\mathbf{ESO}\), and thereby \(\mathbf{IFL}\), is capable of explicitly defining its own truth-predicate relative to \(N\).[58] This result does not contradict Tarski’s undefinability result, because here non-determined sentences are possible; the negation used is not contradictory negation.[59]

Tarski (1983) adopted a view according to which truth cannot be defined for natural languages. It has been argued in Hintikka & Sandu (1999) that this was due to Tarski’s belief that compositionality fails in natural languages.[60] \(\mathbf{IFL}\) does not have a Tarski-type compositional semantics, but it admits of formulating a self-applied truth-predicate. The proposed reason why Tarski believed it not to be possible to discuss the notion of truth in natural languages themselves cannot, then, be entertained from the viewpoint of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). For, the case of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) shows that the failure of Tarski-type compositionality for a language does not entail the impossibility for the language to define its own truth-predicate.[61]

4.6 Properties of extended IF first-order logic

Expressive power. Since \(\mathbf{IFL}\) is not closed under contradictory negation, \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) is strictly more expressive than \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (cf. Subsect. 4.2).[62] The following properties are expressible in \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) but not in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (Hintikka 1996: 188–190): finiteness of the domain, well-foundedness of a binary relation, connectedness of a graph, principle of mathematical induction, Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem, and the topological notion of continuity.

Metalogical properties. The nice metatheorems that \(\mathbf{IFL}\) shares with \(\mathbf{FO}\) are lost: Compactness, Löwenheim-Skolem property, separation theorem, and the existence of a complete disproof procedure all fail for \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) (Hintikka 1991: 49, 1996: 189). No self-applied truth-predictate is possible for \(\mathbf{EIFL}\). The definition of such a truth-predicate would have to contain the clause

\[\begin{align*} (\forall y)(y = \boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \theta {}^\urcorner} &\wedge x = \boldsymbol{{}^\ulcorner \neg \theta {}^\urcorner} \rightarrow \\ &[\TRUE(x) \leftrightarrow \neg \TRUE(y)]). \end{align*}\]

But this clause is not a well-formed formula of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\), since \(\neg\) appears in the scope of the universal quantifier \((\forall y)\) (cf. Hintikka 1996: 151).

The validity and satisfiability problems of the full second-order can be effectively reduced to the corresponding problems concerning \(\mathbf{EIFL}\). Namely, why cannot a second-order sentence simply be thought of as a two-sorted first-order sentence? Because in order to capture the standard interpretation of second-order logic,[63] it must be said that for every extensionally possible set of \(n\)-tuples of elements of sort 1 there exists a member of sort 2 having those and only those elements as members, for all arities \(n\) such that the second-order sentence contains a quantifier \((\exists R)\) where \(R\) is \(n\)-ary.[64] Now, such additional conditions can be expressed by a finite conjunction \(X\) of \(\mathbf{USO}\) sentences, where \(\mathbf{USO}\) (universal second-order logic) is obtained from \(\mathbf{FO}\) by allowing universal quantification over relation and function symbols in a first-order formula. Each of these \(\mathbf{USO}\) sentences can be expressed as the contradictory negation of an \(\mathbf{ESO}\) sentence and therefore as the contradictory negation of an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence. Consequently, there is an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence \(Y\) such that \(X\) itself is logically equivalent to \(\neg Y\). And here \(\neg Y\) is a sentence of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\). Therefore, if \(\phi\) is a second-order sentence and \(\phi^*\) its reconstruction in two-sorted first-order logic, we have: \(\phi\) is satisfiable iff \((X \wedge \phi^*)\) is satisfiable iff \((\neg Y \wedge \phi^*)\) is satisfiable. And: \(\phi\) is valid iff \(\phi^*\) is a logical consequence of \(X\) iff \((\neg X \vee \phi^*)\) is valid iff \((Y \vee \phi^*)\) is valid. Here, both \((\neg Y \wedge \phi^*)\) and \((Y \vee \phi^*)\) are sentences of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\), the latter even a sentence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). It follows that the satisfiability (validity) of any second-order sentence can be expressed as the satisfiability (respectively, validity) of a sentence of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\).[65]

Algebraic structure. The two negations available in \(\mathbf{EIFL}, \neg\) and \({\sim}\), agree on true sentences, as well as on false ones: if \(\phi\) is true (false) in \(M\), then both \({\sim}\phi\) and \(\neg \phi\) are false (true) in \(M\). By contrast, if \(\phi\) is non-determined in \(M\), then \({\sim}\phi\) is non-determined as well, but \(\neg \phi\) is true. The combination \(\neg{\sim}\) of the two negations applied to a sentence \(\phi\) asserts that \(\phi\) is not false.[66]

The propositional part of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) involves the four operators \(\neg , {\sim}, \wedge\), and \(\vee\). Hintikka (2004b) raises the question of the algebraic structure induced by these operators, when any two truth equivalent sentences are identified. The operators \(\neg , \wedge\), and \(\vee\) give rise to a Boolean algebra – but what does the strong negation \({\sim}\) add to this structure?

Restricting attention to truth equivalence, \({\sim}\) is definable from the operators \(\neg\) and \(\neg{\sim}\). For, \({\sim}\phi\) is true in \(M\) iff \(\neg(\neg{\sim}\phi)\) is true in \(M\). Instead of \({\sim}\), the operator \(\neg{\sim}\) may then be considered. Hintikka points out that the propositional part of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) (formulated in terms of the operators \(\vee , \wedge , \neg\) and \(\neg{\sim})\) is a Boolean algebra with an operator in the sense of Jónsson & Tarski (1951). The additional operator \(\neg{\sim}\) is a closure operator.

Jónsson and Tarski (1951, Thm. 3.14) showed that any closure algebra is isomorphic to an algebraic system formed by a set equipped with a reflexive and transitive relation.[67] As a matter of fact, the relevant algebraic structure is precisely that of the propositional modal logic \(\mathbf{S4}\). Hence the propositional part of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) has the same algebraic structure as \(\mathbf{S4}\). By a well-known result due to Gödel (1933) and McKinsey & Tarski (1948), intuitionistic propositional logic can be interpreted in \(\mathbf{S4}\), via a translation \(t\) such that \(\phi\) is intuitionistically provable iff \(t(\phi)\) is a valid \(\mathbf{S4}\) formula. Thus, intuitionistic propositional logic is interpretable in \(\mathbf{EIFL}\).[68]

5. Philosophical Consequences

Hintikka (2006a: 73–77) takes the following to be among consequences of the novel insights made possible by (extended) IF first-order logic: reconstruction of normal mathematical reasoning on the first-order level, a novel perspective on the notion of truth in axiomatic set theory, insights into the nature of negation, and the formulation of a self-applied truth-predicate. A related topic of general interest is the phenomenon of informational independence in natural languages. The ideas related to negation and definability of truth have been discussed in Subsections 4.2 and 4.5, respectively. Let us consider here the remaining issues.

5.1 Place in type hierarchy

Hintikka maintains that the only reasonable way of making a distinction between first-order logic and higher-order logic is by reference to the entities that one’s quantified variables range over. A first-order logic is, then, a logic in which all quantifiers range over individuals, in contrast to higher-order entities (e.g., subsets of the domain). On this basis Hintikka holds that substantially speaking, \(\mathbf{IFL}\) and even \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) are first-order logics.[69] Solomon Feferman (2006: 457–461) criticizes the criterion that Hintikka employs for judging the first-order status of a logic. Feferman makes use of generalized quantifiers in his argument.[70] The formulas

\[ Q[z_1] \ldots [z_k] (\phi_1 ,\ldots ,\phi_k) \]

involving generalized quantifiers are syntactically first-order, insofar as the quantified variables \(z_{i1},\ldots ,z_{in_i} = [z_i]\) are first-order \((1 \le i \le k)\). The semantics of a generalized quantifier \(Q\) is formulated by associating with each domain M a \(k\)-ary relation \(Q_M\) on M, with \(Q_M \subseteq\) M\(^{n_1} \times \ldots \times\) M\(^{n_k}\). E.g., for any infinite cardinal \(\kappa\), there is a generalized quantifier \(Q_{\ge \kappa}\) such that \(Q_{\ge \kappa}z P(z)\) is true in a model \(M\) iff there are at least \(\kappa\) elements that satisfy the predicate \(P\). Hence generalized quantifiers can be semantically higher-order. (The notion of cardinality is a higher-order notion.) The fact that the variables in a formula range over individuals only, does not offer a reliable criterion for the logic’s first-order status.

Hintikka’s criterion could be reformulated by saying that a logic is of first order, if any play of a semantic game associated with a formula of this logic only involves (in addition to choices interpreting conjunctions and disjunctions) choices of individuals, as opposed to choices of higher-order entities. By this criterion \(\mathbf{IFL}\) (and even \(\mathbf{EIFL})\) are first-order logics, but the logic of generalized quantifiers such as \(Q_{\ge \kappa}\) is not.[71] Feferman (2006: 461) anticipates the possibility of such a reply, but finds it unconvincing.

By a result of Hintikka (1955), the problem of deciding whether a sentence of second-order logic is valid can be effectively reduced to the validity problem of \(\mathbf{IFL}\).[72] Väänänen (2001) has shown that the set of valid sentences of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) has the same very high complexity as the set of validities of the full second-order logic.[73] Väänänen (2001) and Feferman (2006) conclude that speaking of validity in \(\mathbf{IFL}\) leads to a strong commitment to full second-order logic. Hintikka (2006a: 476–477) looks at these results from the opposite direction: for him they mean that indeed one can speak of validity in full second-order logic in terms of validity in \(\mathbf{IFL}\). What is more, Hintikka (1997) affirms that even \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) is a first-order logic. If so, any mathematical theory that can be expressed by the truth of an \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) sentence is likewise free from problems of set existence.

Hintikka’s position leads to a puzzle. If \(\phi\) is a sentence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) not truth equivalent to any \(\mathbf{FO}\) sentence, the truth-condition of the sentence \(\neg \phi\) of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) cannot be formulated without recourse to the set of all strategies of player 2: \(\neg \phi\) is true in model \(M\) iff for all strategies of player 2 in game \(G(\phi , M)\), there is a sequence of moves by player 1 such that player 1 wins the resulting play. The set of all strategies of player 2 is undeniably a higher-order entity. How can commitment to entities other than individuals be said to have been avoided here? Can the meaning of the sentence \(\neg \phi\) be well understood without presupposing the genuinely second-order idea of all strategies of a given player?[74] Rather than being nominalistic, Hintikka’s position appears to be a variant of universalia in rebus. While rules of semantic games pertain to actions performed on first-order objects, combinatorial properties of sets of plays can only be formulated in second-order terms. As soon as game rules are defined for a language fragment, also the corresponding combinatorial properties are fully determined, among them the properties labeled as truth and falsity.

5.2 Philosophy of set theory

According to Hintikka, our pretheoretical idea of the truth of a quantified sentence \(\phi\) (in negation normal form) is that there exist ‘witness individuals’ for the existential quantifiers, usually depending on values corresponding to the preceding universal quantifiers.[75] It is the existence of such witnesses that constitutes the truth of \(\phi\). Providing witnesses is precisely what Skolem functions for \(\phi\) do.[76] The truth of a quantified sentence \(\phi\) amounts to the existence of a full set of Skolem functions for \(\phi\). In Hintikka’s view, then, our ordinary notion of first-order truth is conceptualized in terms of (existential) second-order logic. What happens when this idea is applied to axiomatic set theory, say Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the Axiom of Choice \((\mathbf{ZFC})\)? It should be borne in mind that the very idea of axiomatic set theory is to dispense with higher-order logic; its underlying logic is taken to be \(\mathbf{FO}\). Hintikka argues as follows.[77]

For each sentence \(\phi\) of \(\mathbf{ZFC}\), there is another sentence \(\phi^* = (\exists f_1)\ldots(\exists f_n)\psi^*\) of \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) which says, intuitively, that ‘Skolem functions’ for \(\phi\) exist. These ‘Skolem functions’ are certain individuals of the domain of a model of \(\mathbf{ZFC}\). Here both \(\phi^*\) and \(\phi\) are first-order sentences. But if for every sentence \(\phi\) of \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) we have \(\phi\) and \(\phi^*\) being logically equivalent, why could the sentences \(\phi^*\) not be used for formulating a truth-predicate for \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) in \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) itself? However, by Tarski’s undefinability result, no such truth-predicate exists.[78] So there must be a model of \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) and a sentence \(\phi\) true in that model such that \(\phi^*\) is false: not all ‘Skolem functions’ asserted to exist by \(\phi^*\) actually exist in the model.

This reasoning shows that \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) does not fully capture the idea of truth according to which the truth of a sentence \(\phi\) means that the Skolem functions for \(\phi\) exist. Furthermore, it also shows that the standard interpretation of higher-order logic is not fully captured by \(\mathbf{ZFC}\). To see this, observe that for every sentence \(\phi\) there is a logically equivalent second-order sentence \(\phi^{**} = (\exists F_1)\ldots(\exists F_n)\psi^{**}\) actually asserting the existence of Skolem functions for \(\phi\). The first-order sentence \(\phi^* = (\exists f_1)\ldots(\exists f_n)\psi^*\) must not be confused with the second-order sentence \(\phi^{**} = (\exists F_1)\ldots(\exists F_n)\psi^{**}\). The Skolem functions \(F_i\) of which the sentence \(\phi^{**}\) speaks are sets built out of individuals of the set-theoretical universe, while the ‘Skolem functions’ \(f_i\) spoken of by \(\phi^*\) are individuals.[79]

The conclusion of Hintikka’s argument is that our ordinary notion of truth is misrepresented by \(\mathbf{ZFC}\). Furthermore, by Tarski’s undefinability result the situation cannot be improved by adding further axioms to \(\mathbf{ZFC}\). In Hintikka’s judgment, axiomatic set theory is a systematic but futile attempt to capture on the first-order level truths of standardly interpreted second-order logic. Like Gödel (1947), also Hintikka holds that the concepts needed to state, say, the continuum hypothesis are sufficiently well-defined to determine the truth-value of this conjecture. The continuum hypothesis does not receive its meaning from phrasing it in \(\mathbf{ZFC}\). Gödel and Hintikka agree that the independence results due to Gödel himself and Paul Cohen do not by themselves show anything about the truth or falsity of the continuum hypothesis. But unlike Gödel, Hintikka finds the derivability of any conjecture whatever in \(\mathbf{ZFC}\) (or in any of its extensions) simply irrelevant for the truth of the conjecture. For Hintikka, it is a ‘combinatorial’ question whether every infinite subset of the reals is either countable or else has the cardinality of the set of all reals – a question properly conceptualized within second-order logic. This is what Hintikka takes to be the pretheoretical sense of the truth of the continuum hypothesis, and that is not captured by \(\mathbf{ZFC}\).[80]

5.3 Extended IF first-order logic and mathematical theorizing

Hintikka sees \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) as allowing to reconstruct all normal mathematical reasoning on the first-order level. This result is essentially dependent on the acceptability of Hintikka’s claim that \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) is ontologically committed to individuals only (Subsect. 5.1). But how would \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) serve to reconstruct an important part of all mathematical reasoning?

Hintikka (1996: 194–210) discusses mathematical theories (or mathematical axiomatizations) and mathematical problems (or questions of logical consequence) separately.

Any higher-order mathematical theory \(T\) gives rise to a many-sorted first-order theory \(T^*\). If the theory is finite, there is a finite conjunction \(J\) formulated in \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) – equivalent to a sentence of \(\mathbf{USO}\) and therefore equivalent to the contradictory negation of an \(\mathbf{ESO}\) sentence and so indeed equivalent to the contradictory negation of an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence – expressing the requirement that the standard interpretation of higher-order logic is respected. The question of the truth of the higher-order theory \(T\) is thus reduced to the truth of the sentence \((J \wedge T^*)\) of \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) (cf. Subsect. 4.6).

The mathematical problem of whether a given sentence \(C\) is a logical consequence of a finite higher-order theory \(T\) coincides with the problem of whether the second-order sentence \((\neg(J \wedge T^*) \vee C^*)\) is valid. Recalling that there is a sentence \(\chi\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) such that \(J\) is equivalent to \(\neg \chi\), it follows that \(\neg(J \wedge T^*)\) is equivalent to a sentence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\). Consequently there is a sentence of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) which is valid iff the sentence \((\neg(J \wedge T^*) \vee C^*)\) is valid (cf. Subsect. 4.6). Mathematical problems can be understood as questions of the validity of an \(\mathbf{IFL}\) sentence. Among mathematical problems thus reconstructible using \(\mathbf{IFL}\) are the continuum hypothesis, Goldbach’s conjecture, Souslin’s conjecture, the existence of an inaccessible cardinal, and the existence of a measurable cardinal.[81]

As conceptualizations apparently transcending the proposed framework – not expressible in a higher-order logic – Hintikka considers the maximality assumption expressed by David Hilbert’s so-called axiom of completeness. The axiom says that no mathematical objects can be added to the intended models without violating the other axioms.[82]

If indeed problems related to the idea of all subsets are avoided in \(\mathbf{EIFL}\) (Hintikka 1997), it offers a way of defending a certain form logicism. Unlike in historical logicism, the idea is not to consider logic as an axiom system on the same level as mathematical axiom systems (Hintikka 1996: 183),[83] and to attempt to reduce mathematics to logic. Rather, Hintikka (1996: 184) proposes to ask: (a) Can the crucial mathematical concepts be defined in logical terms? (b) Can the modes of semantically valid logical inferences used in mathematics be expressed in logical terms? The idea is not to concentrate on deductive rules of logic: no complete set of deductive rules exist anyway for \(\mathbf{IFL}\). Because the status of higher-order logic is potentially dubious – due to the problems associated with the notion of powerset – a positive solution to questions (a) and (b) calls for a first-order logic more powerful than \(\mathbf{FO}\).

The suggested reduction of all mathematics expressible in higher-order logic to the first-order level would be philosophically significant in showing that mathematics is not a study of general concepts, but of structures consisting of particulars (Hintikka 1996: 207). This is not to say that actual mathematics would be best carried out in terms of \(\mathbf{IFL}\), only that it could in principle be so carried out (Hintikka 1996: 205, 2006a: 477). For a critique of Hintikka’s conclusions, see Väänänen (2001), Feferman (2006), and Bazzoni (2015).

5.4 Informational independence in natural languages

When Hintikka began to apply GTS to the study of natural language (Hintikka 1973a), he took up the question of whether branching quantifiers occur in natural languages. He was led to ask whether there are semantic games with imperfect information. He detected various types of grammatical constructions in English that involve informational independence.[84] An often cited example is the sentence

Some relative of each villager and some relative of each townsman hate each other,

true under its relevant reading when the choice of a relative of each townsman can be made independently of the individual chosen for ‘each villager.’[85] Hintikka (1973a) sketched an argument to the effect that actually every \(\mathbf{FPO}\) sentence can be reproduced as a representation of an English sentence. From this it would follow that the logic of idiomatic English quantifiers is much stronger than \(\mathbf{FO}\), and that no effective procedure exists for classifying sentences as analytical or nonanalytical, synonymous or nonsynonymous.[86] This would be methodologically a very important result, showing that syntactic methods are even in principle insufficient in linguistic theorizing. Jon Barwise (1979) suggested that particularly convincing examples supporting Hintikka’s thesis can be given in terms of generalized quantifiers.

Lauri Carlson and Alice ter Meulen (1979) were the first to observe cases of informational independence between quantifiers and intensional operators. Consider the question[87]

Who does everybody admire?

Under one of its readings, the presupposition of this question is \((\forall x)(\exists y)\) admires\((x, y)\). The desideratum of this question is

I know who everybody admires.

Writing ‘\(K_I\)’ for ‘I know,’[88] the desideratum has a reading whose logical form is

\(K_I (\forall x)(\exists y/K_I)\) admires\((x, y)\).

This desideratum is satisfied by an answer pointing out a function \(f\) which yields for each person a suitable admired person. Such a function can be his or her father. Importantly, the value \(f(b)\) of this function only depends on the person \(b\) interpreting ‘everybody,’ but does not depend on the scenario \(w\), compatible with the questioner’s knowledge, that interprets the construction ‘I know.’ Interestingly, the desideratum \(K_I (\forall x)(\exists y/K_I)\) admires\((x, y)\) is not expressible without an explicit independence indicator. It is also worth noting that this case cannot be represented in the notation of \(\mathbf{FPO}\). This is because several types of semantic interactions are possible among quantifiers and intensional operators, and blocking interactions of one type does not automatically block interactions of other types. In the example, the witness of \(\exists y\) must not vary with the scenario \(w\) interpreting the operator \(K_I\), but still the values of both variables \(x\) and \(y\) must belong to the domain of the particular scenario \(w\) chosen to interpret \(K_I\).[89]

Hintikka’s ideas on desiderata of wh-questions were influenced by his exchange with the linguist Elisabet Engdahl.[90] These wh-questions, again, functioned as important test cases for the appearance of informational independence in natural languages.

Hintikka and Sandu (1989) took up the task of formulating an explicit unified formal treatment for the different varieties of informational independence in natural language semantics. They posed the question of which are the mechanisms that allow English to exceed the expressive power of \(\mathbf{FO}\). For, natural languages typically do not resort to higher-order quantifiers. Hintikka and Sandu suggested that informational independence plays a key role in increasing the expressive power of natural languages.[91]

In GTS as developed for English in Hintikka & Kulas (1983, 1985), game rules are associated with a great variety of linguistic expressions (cf. Subsect. 2.1). As Hintikka (1990) has stressed, informational independence is a cross-categorical phenomenon: it can occur in connection with expressions of widely different grammatical categories. Hintikka and Sandu (1989) propose several examples from English calculated to show that there is an abundance of instances of informational independence in natural languages. Among examples are wh-questions of the kind discussed above, and the distinction between the de dicto and de re readings of certain English sentences. Hintikka and Sandu suggest that representing such readings in terms of IF logic is more truthful to the syntax of English than the alternative, non-IF representations are.

In connection with knowledge, a de dicto attribution such as

\(K_{\textit{Ralph}} (\exists x) (x\) is a spy)

can be turned into a de re attribution by marking the existential quantifier as independent of the knowledge-operator (cf. Hintikka and Sandu 1989):

\(K_{\textit{Ralph}} (\exists x/K_{\textit{Ralph}}) (x\) is a spy).

Because knowledge is a factive attitude (the actual world is among Ralph’s epistemic alternatives), this amounts indeed to the same as the condition

\((\exists x) K_{\textit{Ralph}} (x\) is a spy).

Rebuschi & Tulenheimo (2011) observed that independent quantifiers are of special interest in connection with non-factive attitudes such as belief. The logical form of a statement ascribing to Ralph a belief pertaining to a specific but non-existent object is

\(B_{\textit{Ralph}} (\exists x/B_{\textit{Ralph}}) (x\) is a spy),

where ‘\(B_{\textit{Ralph}}\)’ stands for ‘Ralph believes that.’[92]

Attitudes of this form were dubbed de objecto attitudes. Since the (intentional) object of such an attitude need not exist actually, the de objecto attitude is weaker than the de re attitude

\((\exists x) B_{\textit{Ralph}} (x\) is a spy).

On the other hand, the pattern of operators \(B_{\textit{Ralph}} (\exists x/B_{\textit{Ralph}})\) requires that the witness of the existential quantifier \(\exists x\) be the same relative to all doxastic alternatives of Ralph, so the de objecto attitude is stronger than the de dicto attitude

\(B_{\textit{Ralph}} (\exists x) (x\) is a spy).

Janssen (2013) discusses the possibility of providing in terms of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) a compositional analysis of the de re / de dicto ambiguity in natural languages. Brasoveanu and Farkas (2011) argue that scopal properties of natural language indefinites are best elucidated in terms of a semantics inspired by \(\mathbf{IFL}\), more precisely by formulating the semantics relative to sets of variable assignments as done in Hodges’s compositional semantics for slash logic.

As a rule, informational independence is not indicated syntactically in English.[93] Methodological consequences of this fact are discussed in Hintikka (1990), where he tentatively puts forward the Syntactic Silence Thesis, according to which sufficiently radical cross-categorical phenomena are not likely to be marked syntactically in natural languages. Evidence for this thesis would, for its part, be evidence against the sufficiency of syntax-oriented approaches to semantics.

6. Related logics

6.1 Slash logic

Syntactically slash logic uses quantifiers like \((\exists x/y)\) instead of quantifiers such as \((\exists x/\forall y)\). Semantically slash logic is otherwise like \(\mathbf{IFL}\) except that its game-theoretical semantics is based on the idea that a player’s strategy functions may utilize as their arguments any preceding moves made in the current play, save for those whose use is, by the slash notation, explicitly indicated as forbidden (cf. Sect. 3). That is, also a player’s own earlier moves may appear as arguments of a strategy function. This can make a difference in the presence of imperfect information. For example, consider evaluating the slash-logic sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y)(\exists z/x) x = z\) containing the vacuous quantifier \(\exists y\). This sentence is true on a two-element domain, since player 2 can copy as the value of \(y\) the value that player 1 has chosen for \(x\), and then select the value of \(z\) using a strategy function whose only argument is the value of \(y\). (For this phenomenon of ‘signaling,’ see Hodges 1997a, Sandu 2001, Janssen & Dechesne 2006, Barbero 2013.) By contrast, the IF sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y)(\exists z/\forall x) x = z\) fails to be true on such a domain, since there a strategy function for \((\exists z/\forall x)\) must be a constant, and no such strategy function can guarantee a win for player 2 against both possible values that player 1 can choose for \(x\). As mentioned in Subsection 4.4, Hodges (1997a,b) showed that slash logic admits of an alternative, compositional semantics. This requires evaluating formulas relative to sets of variable assignments, instead of single assignments as in connection with \(\mathbf{FO}\).

All authors having studied slash logic, apart from Hodges himself, have opted for not following Hodges’s terminological recommendation mentioned at the beginning of Section 3: they have referred to slash logic as ‘IF logic.’

Kuusisto (2013) studies the expressive power of fragments of slash logic whose formulas are formed without employing the identity symbol. Kontinen et al. (2014) investigate the complexity-theoretic properties of the two-variable fragment of slash logic and compare this fragment to the corresponding fragment of dependence logic. Hodges (1997a,b) and Figueira et al. (2009, 2011, 2014) discuss an extension of slash logic in which the contradictory negation of slash-logic sentences can be expressed.

In Sevenster (2014), patterns of quantifier dependence and independence in quantifier prefixes of slash-logical formulas are systematically studied in order to determine which quantifier prefixes allow slash logic to gain the expressive power of \(\mathbf{ESO}\). Sevenster identifies two such patterns – the signaling pattern and the Henkin pattern – and proves that they are able to express \(\mathbf{NP}\)-hard decision problems. He further shows that these two are the only patterns allowing slash logic to exceed the expressive power of \(\mathbf{FO}\) insofar as attention is confined to formulas in prenex form. An example of the signaling pattern would be \( (\forall u)(\exists v)(\exists w/u) \) and of the Henkin pattern \( (\forall x)(\exists u)(\forall y)(\exists v/x,u) \).[94]

Barbero (2021) and Barbero et al. (2021) take up the task of investigating fragments of the general syntax of slash logic (not all of whose formulas are in prenex form). Thereby these authors wish to study systematically those expressive resources of slash logic that allow it to exceed the expressive power of \(\mathbf{FO}\) and that do not simply derive from its capacity to mimick Henkin quantifiers. While many of the features studied in these two papers depend on the Eigenart of slash logic, the phenomenon of signaling by disjunction occurs in IF logic, as well. In Section 3.3, it was seen that the IF-logical sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y/\forall x) x = y\) is non-determined in any model whose domain has exactly two elements. The slash-logical sentence \((\forall x)(\exists y/ x) x = y\) is likewise non-determined in such a model. Now, consider the result of replacing in the latter sentence the expression \((\exists y/ x) x = y\) by the disjunction \(((\exists y/x) x = y \vee (\exists y/ x) x = y))\), with a token of the initial expression in both disjuncts: \[ (\forall x)((\exists y/ x) x = y \vee (\exists y/x) x = y). \] The sentence that has been thus obtained is actually true in a model whose domain consists of the objects \(a\) and \(b\). Let \(f\), \(g\), and \(h\) be respectively the strategy functions of player 2 for the unique token of the disjunction symbol, the left token of the existential quantifier, and the right token of the existential quantifier – defined as follows. First, \(f\) selects the left disjunct if player 1 has chosen \(a\) as a value of \(x\), selecting the right disjunct otherwise. Further, \(g\) and \(h\) are constants (zero-place functions): \(g= a\) and \(h= b\). The set \(\{f, g, h\}\) is clearly a winning strategy for player 2. Either of the tokens of the existential quantifier occur in a specific disjunct. Using the strategy function \(f\) to arrive at such a disjunct makes sure that the disjunct arrived at reveals the choice that player 1 has made to interpret \(\forall x\). The constants \(g\) and \(h\) are selected so as to render this information explicit. Thus, the resulting values of \(x\) and \(y\) indeed satisfy the formula \(x= y\). By the same reasoning it is seen that the sentence \((\forall x)((\exists y/ \forall x) x = y \vee (\exists y/\forall x) x = y)\) of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) is true in the model considered.

6.2 Dependence logic

Jouko Väänänen (2007) formulated a new approach to IF logic that he dubbed dependence logic \((\mathbf{DL})\); for further work on \(\mathbf{DL}\), see e.g. Kontinen et al. (2013). The syntax of \(\mathbf{DL}\) is obtained from that of \(\mathbf{FO}\) by allowing atomic formulas of the following special form:

\[ =(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n; x_{n+1}). \]

Intuitively such a formula means that the value of \(x_{n+1}\) depends only on the values of \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\). The semantics of \(\mathbf{DL}\) cannot be formulated relative to single variable assignments like that of \(\mathbf{FO}\): we cannot explicate what it means for the value of \(x_{n+1}\) to depend on those of \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n\) with reference to a single assignment on the variables \(x_1 ,\ldots ,x_{n+1}\). For example, consider the assignment described below:

\(x_1\) \(x_2\) \(x_3\)
7 5 8

Relative to this assignment, all of the following claims hold: whenever the value of \(x_1\) equals 7, the value of \(x_3\) equals 8; whenever the value of \(x_2\) equals 5, the value of \(x_3\) equals 8; whenever the value of \(x_1\) equals 7 and the value of \(x_2\) equals 5, the value of \(x_3\) equals 8; irrespective of the values of \(x_1\) and \(x_2\), the value of \(x_3\) equals 8. The question of dependence only becomes interesting and non-vacuous relative to a set of assignments:

\(x_1\) \(x_2\) \(x_3\)
7 5 8
9 5 6
7 11 8
7 3 8
9 19 6

The set \(X\) consisting of the above five assignments satisfies the formula \(=(x_1\); \(x_3)\): the value of \(x_3\) depends only on the value of \(x_1\). As is readily observed, any two assignments in \(X\) which assign the same value to \(x_1\) assign also the same value to \(x_3\). The interesting novelty of \(\mathbf{DL}\) is that claims about variable dependencies are made at the atomic level. Quantifiers of \(\mathbf{IFL}\) and those of slash logic with their independence indications easily lead to somewhat messy formulas, whereas \(\mathbf{DL}\) looks exactly like \(\mathbf{FO}\), apart from its greater flexibility in forms of atomic formulas.

7. Conclusion

In this entry IF first-order logic and extended IF first-order logic have been surveyed. Their metalogical properties have been explained and the philosophical relevance of these properties has been discussed. The suggested consequences of these logics for philosophical issues such as the existence of a self-applied truth-predicate, the logicist program, the philosophical relevance of axiomatic set theory, and informational independence in natural languages have been covered as well. Slash logic and dependence logic – both closely related to \(\mathbf{IFL}\) and inspired by it – were also briefly considered.


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