Logical empiricism is a philosophic movement rather than a set of doctrines, and it flourished in the 1920s and 30s in several centers in Europe and in the 40s and 50s in the United States. It had several different leaders whose views changed considerably over time. Moreover, these thinkers differed from one another, often sharply. Because logical empiricism is here construed as a movement rather than as doctrine, there is probably no important position that all logical empiricists shared—including, surprisingly enough, empiricism. And while most participants in the movement were empiricists of one form or another, they disagreed on what the best form of empiricism was and on the cognitive status of empiricism. What held the group together was a common concern for scientific methodology and the important role that science could play in reshaping society. Within that scientific methodology the logical empiricists wanted to find a natural and important role for logic and mathematics and to find an understanding of philosophy according to which it was part of the scientific enterprise.
The following discussion of logical empiricism is organized under five headings:
- 1. Mapping the Movement
- 2. Background
- 3. Some Major Participants in the Movement
- 4. Issues
- 5. Impact
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The term ‘logical empiricism’ has no very precise boundaries and still less that distinguishes it from ‘logical positivism’. It is therefore hard to map. ‘Logical empiricism’ here includes three groups: (1) the Vienna Circle, here taken broadly to include those who were part of various private discussion groups, especially that around Moritz Schlick, and also the members of the more public Ernst Mach Society (Verein Ernst Mach), (2) the smaller, but perhaps more influential Berlin Society for Empirical Philosophy (later called the Berlin Society for Scientific Philosophy), and (3) those influenced by or who interacted with members of the first two groups and shared an intellectual kinship with them. Besides Vienna and Berlin, there were important centers of the movement in England, France, Scandinavia, at several universities in the U.S., and even China. This characterization includes thinkers who disagreed with doctrines espoused by members of the original groups and even some who defined themselves in opposition to the movement. This results in a vague boundary, but it suffices to identify a movement in which a large number of able philosophers self-consciously participated and to distinguish logical empiricism from other movements.
It does not, however, distinguish logical empiricism from logical positivism, and it is doubtful that any principled such boundary can be drawn along doctrinal or sociological lines (Uebel 2013). Usually when distinctions are drawn, ‘logical empiricism’ is the wider term. Members of the Berlin group never used the term ‘positivism’ about themselves, but did use it concerning some unnamed Viennese in stressing their differences from the latter. In any case, these differences, even if real, were smaller than the differences within the Vienna Circle on one hand or within the Berlin group on the other. ‘Positivist’ is a term usually applied by opponents of various doctrines. It was used by some of the Viennese logical empiricists about themselves but generally with caution and in stressing the differences between their own views and those of the 19th century positivists. The one philosopher who would have unhesitatingly described himself as (having been) a logical positivist was A.J. Ayer.
Another way of mapping the boundaries of logical empiricism is to list the specific philosophers who were centrally or peripherally part of it. This included many of the most important philosophers of the mid-twentieth century. Hans Hahn, Moritz Schlick, Rudolf Carnap, and Otto Neurath were leaders of the Vienna Circle, and Kurt Gödel regularly attended its meetings. The list of its members, visitors, and interlocutors is staggering, including A.J. Ayer, Herbert Feigl, Philipp Frank, Hans Hahn, Carl Hempel, Karl Menger, Richard von Mises, Ernest Nagel, Karl Popper, W.V. Quine, Frank Ramsay, Hans Reichenbach, Alfred Tarski, Friedrich Waismann, and Ludwig Wittgenstein, among many others. Not all of these would admit to being part of the logical empiricist movement, of course, but a case can be made that all contributed to it. The Berlin Society for Empirical (or Scientific) Philosophy was, as stated, smaller but perhaps more influential. Led by Hans Reichenbach, it included Kurt Grelling, Walter Dubislav, Kurt Lewin, Richard von Mises, Paul Oppenheim, and others. Hempel took his doctorate in Berlin, working with Reichenbach until the latter was forced to leave in 1933. Hempel also spent time in Vienna and Prague. Of course, among the foremost associates of the Berlin Society was Albert Einstein, who was also in Berlin also until 1933.
There was also an important group of logicians in Warsaw of which Alfred Tarski is the best known. Tarski interacted significantly with the logical empiricists in Vienna, Berlin, and the U.S., but it is more reasonable to classify the Polish logicians as an allied group rather than include them within the logical empiricist movement.
Because of the catastrophic dislocations of Europe in the 1930s, the main focus of the logical empiricism moved from central Europe to America by the close of that decade. Erkenntnis, the main journal of the movement, which had been edited by Reichenbach and Carnap, ceased publication by 1940. In 1930 Feigl moved to the U.S., and Carnap moved to Chicago in 1936. Hempel came to Chicago and Menger to Notre Dame in 1937. The ensuing years witnessed a massive exodus to America from central Europe. Reichenbach arrived in the U.S. in 1938 after five years in Turkey. Also in 1938 Gustav Bergmann and Philipp Frank emigrated. Edgar Zilsel came in 1939. Alfred Tarski was on a visit to the U.S. when Poland was invaded in 1939, and so he stayed. And by 1940 Richard von Mises was also in America.
In the U.S., these exiles were joined by the Americans Nelson Goodman, Charles Morris, W.V. Quine, Ernest Nagel, and, after the war, by Reichenbach’s UCLA students Hilary Putnam and Wesley Salmon. Adolf Grünbaum can also be considered as clearly in the Reichenbach lineage. And Wilfrid Sellars was, in his early years, a close associate of Feigl. The American incarnation of the logical empiricist movement enjoyed generally good relations with the American pragmatists, not only because many of the logical empiricists had a strong pragmatist component to their philosophy, but also because the pragmatists and logical empiricists shared a common concern for empirical methodology in the service of social reform. Institutionally, the movement was represented in most major American universities, and such journals as Philosophy of Science (with Carnap and Feigl on the Editorial Board and Reichenbach and Schlick on the Advisory Board) and Philosophical Studies (founded and edited for many years by Feigl and Sellars) provided ample outlet for their publications. In addition, the Inter-Scientific Discussion Group was founded by Philipp Frank at Harvard. That grew into the Institute for the Unity of Science, called by some the Vienna Circle in exile. Meanwhile in Chicago the Encyclopedia of Unified Science was established with Neurath, Carnap, and Morris as its editors.
But even from late 30s onward the movement was hardly limited to America. Ayer remained in England. Wittgenstein returned to Cambridge in 1929, but with regular visits to Vienna, including those on which he discussed issues surrounding a strong version of verificationism with Schlick and Waismann. Popper fled to New Zealand in 1937, and in 1946 moved to the London School of Economics. Neurath fled from Vienna to the Hague and then again in 1940 to England, where he remained till his death in 1945. Friedrich Waismann went to England in 1937. In 1939 Rose Rand, a less well-known member of the Vienna Circle, fled to England and then in 1954 emigrated once more to the U.S. There were like-minded thinkers in Scandinavia (such as Jørgen Jørgensen, Eino Kaila, and Arne Naess) and as far away as Argentina (H.A. Lindemann) and China (Tscha Hung).
It is impossible to say when logical empiricism ceased to be sufficiently cohesive to be identifiable as a continuing movement. Certainly by 1960 a great many philosophers, including many who had earlier clearly been part of the movement, were identifying themselves in opposition to what they took to be logical empiricism. And some members simply changed their minds or pursued different projects. Logical empiricism probably never commanded the assent of the majority of philosophers in either Europe or America, and by 1970 the movement was pretty clearly over—though with lasting influence whether recognized or not. In the 1980s there was a resurgence of historical interest in logical empiricism. That historical interest continues to clear away many of the caricatures and misconceptions about the logical empiricists. Among the major results of this work is the recognition of the tremendous variety and subtlety of views represented within the movement and the fact that many of the arguments later deployed by critics of logical empiricism had been pioneered by the logical empiricists themselves.
Given the emphasis on science and its technical apparatus, social renewal, clarity and rationality of belief, functionality, and above all the palpable sense of doing philosophy in an importantly new way, it is reasonable to associate logical empiricism with other forms of European modernism in the 1920s and 30s, such as Neue Sachlichkeit in art and the Bauhaus in architecture and design, and with mid-century modernism as well as with political liberalism, from the New Deal to the Great Society in the United States. There have been recognizably modernist developments in various fields including philosophy for centuries.
With a movement as large and complex as logical empiricism a great many factors went into raising the questions it would address, making them seem urgent, and making it seem as though the intellectual resources it would need to address these questions were either at hand or could be developed.
One long-term process with profound implications was the steady departure of the various sciences from philosophy to form autonomous disciplines. By early in the twentieth century mathematics, physics, chemistry, biology, and the social sciences were all pursued professionally and independently from philosophy. And psychology was just separating from philosophy. Yes, there were polymaths who could and did pursue a science and philosophy professionally. Those were increasingly rare, though single-discipline scientists did from time to time make philosophic-seeming pronouncements. But they did so from outside the field. This pattern of steady departures raised the pressing question: What sort of thing remained behind? Once mathematics and the empirical sciences all left, what was left for philosophy?
The nature of philosophy was always a vexed philosophic question, but now it was particularly insistent. Surely there was no domain of empirical facts that philosophy could call its own. All that real estate had been parceled out. One answer available at the time that logical empiricism flourished was that the genuinely philosophic remainder after the departure of the sciences is somehow deeper than the empirical sciences and gets at matters, perhaps cultural ones, that are more profound and important than anything that empirical science even can address. This is either because on this conception philosophy has a mode of access or “evidence” that the empirical sciences do not and cannot have, or because the very idea of fidelity to evidence and punctilious argument is somehow small-minded.
The logical empiricists found this answer unappealing. Indeed, this conception of philosophy is precisely what Carnap means by ‘metaphysics’. (As a consequence, what Carnap meant by that word is different from what late twentieth and early twenty-first century philosophers generally mean in describing their own work as analytic metaphysics.) The logical empiricists were eager to conceive of their enterprise as scientific and to engage in philosophy only insofar as it was also scientific. This science need not be empirical and need not include all that was traditional in philosophy that had not been incorporated into the independent sciences. The decision to be scientific can hardly be the end of the story. It requires rather better and more detailed answers to questions about what scientific methods are, how the mathematical (and other apparently non-empirical sciences) fit together with the empirical ones, and what, more precisely, philosophy’s role was.
A second series of developments that raised questions for logical empiricism to address were developments in the sciences themselves, especially the rise of non-Euclidean geometries in mathematics and the establishment of relativity theory in physics. These posed a serious challenge to what would otherwise be an attractive scientific philosophy, namely some version of Kantianism. Kant had recognized that the best of modern science was often mathematical in character and had labored to integrate both geometry and arithmetic into our empirical picture of the world. He had held that we could not represent the world except as a Euclidean structure and hence Euclidean geometry was, a priori, a permanent feature of any future physics. The demonstration that non-Euclidean pure geometrical structures were as consistent as Euclidean ones and that spaces can indeed be represented as a non-Euclidean manifolds was one half of the problem. The other half came when Einstein argued convincingly that physical space was best described as a non-Euclidean manifold of non-constant curvature. Plainly Euclidean geometry could not be guaranteed a future physics. Modern mathematical logic also posed a problem for other Kantian claims, but not in the same wrenching way.
Many logical empiricists started out as neo-Kantians: Reichenbach, Carnap, Schlick, and even Hempel (until he studied with Reichenbach, who by that time had revised his view). The difficulties with geometry and relativity certainly do not refute all forms of neo-Kantianism, but the difficulties are quite real nonetheless. The need is to understand how mathematics can be integrated into what is otherwise an empirical enterprise, i.e., physics, chemistry, biology, etc. Addressing this need was to be a major part of the logical empiricist program.
The background of logical empiricism described so far has been confined to the academic world, but events outside that domain shaped the movement as well. World War I was an unmitigated disaster for central Europe, followed by economic turmoil in the 20s and political upheavals of the 30s. It is hard to exaggerate these changes. Monarchies that had stood for centuries disappeared overnight and their empires disintegrated. This level of political convulsion had not been seen since the French Revolution, and that earlier upheaval was comparatively confined. Cultural changes were equally profound, and these were reflected by radical departures in the arts such as painting, music, and architecture, and even more importantly in new modes of living.
The logical empiricists were no mere bystanders. They, or at least the main leaders of the movement, were politically and culturally engaged. Even more important, this engagement was accompanied by the conviction that their cultures were incapable of the necessary reform and renewal because people were in effect enslaved by unscientific, metaphysical ways of thinking. Such ways of thinking might be exemplified in theology, in the racial hatreds of the day, in conceptions of property, and in traditional ideas about the “proper” roles of men and women in society. So to articulate a “scientific world conception” and to defend it against metaphysics was not just to express an academic position in the narrow sense. It was a political act as well; it was to strike a blow for the liberation of the mind. To articulate scientific methods and a scientific conception of philosophy was the essential first step in the reform of society and in the emancipation of humankind (Carnap 1958/2017, Creath 2009, Uebel 2012.
If all of this sounds like something out of the 18th century Enlightenment, the analogy was not lost on the logical empiricists themselves. André Carus has argued that this is exactly what Carnap had in mind by “explication” (Carus 2007). Neurath frequently drew parallels between the logical empiricists’ anti-metaphysical program and the earlier Enlightenment ambitions. Certainly Kant had inveighed against the metaphysics of his time, and the anti-metaphysical tradition remained strong within the scientific community through the 19th century.
The point so far was not to ask whether the logical empiricists were right in any of this. That question will come up later. So far the issue has been only to see the motivations that the logical empiricists had—and from their point of view—for addressing certain questions and for thinking that answers to those questions were urgently needed. None of this, however, says why the logical empiricists thought they had or could have the means to answer these questions. To that we now turn.
Since Newton the most paradigmatic examples of empirical science were those claims, usually quantitative ones, that were properly inferred from or appropriately confirmed by experience. Speaking very informally, these are the ones that we have good reason to believe or at least better reason to believe than the available alternatives. The problem, of course, is to specify the form of proper inferences, the form of an appropriate confirmation relation, and/or the structure of good reasons. The task is daunting, but logic in a suitably broad sense seems to be the right tool. Still speaking informally, logic seems to give us the structure of (good) reasoning. There are other conceptions of logic, of course, but this is a standard one and pretty well describes what the movement needed.
If logic was the tool that was wanted, it was newly ready for service. The progress of modern mathematical logic from Bolzano through Russell and beyond was truly impressive. Arguably, it could now express all parts of classical mathematics. Besides the first order predicate calculus one would need either set theory or higher order logic, but these were recent developments as well. Logic, like the empirical sciences, was progressive and could be approached cooperatively by more than one investigator. In Our Knowledge of the External World (1914) Russell had even positioned logic as the locus of scientific method in philosophy. It is small wonder then that those who were looking for something scientific in what was left of philosophy turned to logic. Wittgenstein’s no-content theory of logic in the Tractatus (1921/1922) was tantalizingly suggestive about how mathematics could be integrated into an overall empirical theory of the world. Wittgenstein also expressed a radical verificationism in the early 1930s in his conversations with Schlick, Waismann, and other members of the Vienna Circle. Many of the logical empiricists in turn could see in some version of that verificationism the ideal tool with which to carry out their anti-metaphysical program. There was, naturally, much left to accomplish, but even with Gödel’s results one could expect that further impressive strides in logic could be made. Indeed, much was accomplished even if the perfect account of scientific reasoning proved elusive. Perfection is elusive in all the sciences, but that is no reason for despair.
The logical empiricist movement is the sum of the interwoven trajectories of its members, so one way of describing that movement is to trace those various trajectories. To do so in detail for all those involved would take rather longer than the movement lasted. That would be inappropriate for one entry in an encyclopedia, especially one in which entries for many of the members will appear independently. The thumbnail sketches of the work of some representative figures below show the breadth and international character of the movement. While the list is long, it covers only a small fraction of those involved and leaves out many important thinkers.
- A.J. Ayer (1910–1989)
- An English philosopher in the tradition of British empiricism, Ayer visited the Vienna Circle in 1932–33. His book Language, Truth, and Logic (1936) was a best seller after World War II and represents logical positivism to many English speakers
- Rudolf Carnap (1891–1970)
- German by birth, he taught in Vienna, Prague, Chicago, and Los Angeles. He was one of the leaders of the Vienna Circle and of logical empiricism, especially of those within the movement whose formulations were more liberal, e.g., with respect to the criterion of verification. He defended logical and methodological pluralism and worked to develop an epistemic approach to probability.
- Walter Dubislav (1895–1937)
- A German logician and philosopher of science, Dubislav was one of the founders, with Reichenbach and Grelling, of the Berlin Society of Empirical (later Scientific) Philosophy.
- Herbert Feigl (1902–1988)
- Born in what is now the Czech Republic, Feigl studied in Vienna with Schlick and Hahn. He emigrated to the U.S. before most other logical empiricists would do so. He taught at the Universities of Iowa and Minnesota and founded both Philosophical Studies, with Wilfrid Sellars, and the Minnesota Center for the Philosophy of Science. He is best known for his work on the mind-body problem.
- Philipp Frank (1884–1966)
- This Viennese physicist and philosopher of science taught at Vienna, Prague, and Harvard. He was part of a discussion group with Hahn, Neurath, and others that preceded the Vienna Circle. At Harvard he founded the Inter-Scientific Discussion Group that developed into the Institute for the Unity of Science. He was also one of the founders of the Boston Colloquium in the Philosophy of Science.
- Kurt Gödel (1906–1978)
- Born in what is now Slovakia, Gödel took his doctorate under Hahn in Vienna, studying with Carnap and Schlick as well. He also regularly attended Vienna Circle meetings and taught in Vienna. The bulk of his career was spent at the Institute for Advanced Study at Princeton. He is best known for his spectacular incompleteness theorems, and his Platonist orientation toward mathematics. Though a participant in the logical empiricist movement during the Vienna years, Gödel thought that Carnap’s approach to mathematics could be refuted. The alleged proof (Gödel 1995) was not published in Gödel’s lifetime and remains controversial.
- Kurt Grelling (1886–1942)
- Grelling was born in Berlin and took his doctorate in Göttingen under Hilbert. With Leonard Nelson he developed a famous semantic paradox that bears their names. He was one of the founders of the Berlin Society for Empirical (later Scientific) Philosophy. Grelling died in the Holocaust because for bureaucratic and political reasons news of an academic appointment in the U.S. reached him too late.
- Adolf Grünbaum (1923–)
- Grünbaum moved from his native Germany as a teenager, studied under Hempel at Yale, and spent the bulk of his career at the University of Pittsburgh, where he founded the Center for Philosophy of Science. The major themes of his work have been philosophy of space and time, rationality, and psychoanalysis.
- Hans Hahn (1879–1934)
- Hahn, a distinguished mathematician, took his doctorate in his native Vienna in 1902 and began teaching there in 1905. He was part of a group with Frank, Neurath and others that discussed logical and methodological issues prior to World War I. After teaching at Czernowitz (now in the Ukraine) and Bonn he was given a chair in mathematics at Vienna in 1921. He was instrumental in bringing Schlick there in 1922 and so was called by Frank “the actual founder of the Vienna Circle” (Stadler 1997/2001, 642). His most famous student was Gödel.
- Olaf Helmer (1910–2011)
- Helmer took a doctorate in his native Berlin under Reichenbach and a second doctorate under Susan Stebbing in London. He collaborated with other logically minded philosophers. Indeed, the team of Hempel, Helmer, and Oppenheim became known as “H2O”. The bulk of his career was spent at the Rand Corporation.
- Carl G. Hempel (1905–1997)
- Born just north of Berlin, Hempel studied at both Göttingen and Berlin. Most of his doctoral work was completed under Reichenbach when the latter was forced to leave Germany. Hempel taught at a number of American universities, most famously at Princeton and the University of Pittsburgh. He was the doctor father of many prominent philosophers of science, and his work focused on confirmation, explanation, and concept formation.
- Richard Jeffrey (1926–2002)
- This American logician and philosopher of science earned an MA with Carnap (with whom he later collaborated) and a PhD with Hempel (with whom he was for many years a colleague and close friend at Princeton). He developed Jeffrey conditionalization (see below) and defended probabilism.
- Kurt Lewin (1890–1947)
- Born in what is now Poland, Lewin took his doctorate in Berlin in 1916. He lectured there in both philosophy and psychology until 1933 when he emigrated to the U.S. via England. Thereafter he taught at a number of American universities including Cornell, Iowa, MIT, and Duke. Credited with founding modern social psychology, he laid the foundations for what is now called sensitivity training as a way to combat religious and racial prejudices.
- Richard von Mises (1883–1953)
- Born in what is now the Ukraine, Richard von Mises is the brother of the economic and political theorist Ludwig von Mises. Richard was a polymath who ranged over fields as diverse as mathematics, aerodynamics, philosophy, and Rilke’s poetry. He finished his doctorate in Vienna. He was simultaneously active in Berlin, where he was one of the developers of the frequency theory of probability along with Reichenbach, and in Vienna, where he participated in various discussion groups that constituted the Vienna Circle. Eventually it was necessary to escape, first to Turkey, and eventually to MIT and Harvard.
- Charles W. Morris (1901–1979)
- Morris was an American pragmatist and philosopher of language at the University of Chicago when Carnap arrived there. These two, together with Neurath until the latter’s death, were the chief editors of the Encyclopedia of Unified Science. After Carnap left Chicago, Morris moved to the University of Florida.
- Otto Neurath (1882–1945)
- This Austrian philosopher of science and sociologist took his doctorate in political science in Berlin. A member of the First Vienna Circle and a leader of the “left” wing of the Vienna Circle, he was also politically active. He was a significant museum director, and as part of this developed the ISOTYPE picture language. His main philosophic themes were physicalism, anti-metaphysics, and the unity of science. He was the Editor-in-Chief of the Encyclopedia of Unified Science until his death. Eventually he fled to the Netherlands and from there to England.
- Paul Oppenheim (1885–1977)
- A successful industrialist and heir to a substantial fortune, Oppenheim was trained in his native Germany in chemistry and philosophy. He was a close friend of Einstein, and helped to initiate the Berlin Society for Empirical Philosophy. Oppenheim collaborated with many important logicians and philosophers of science both in Europe and the U.S. He also helped many to escape Nazi oppression, and continued to help in a variety of ways even after he settled in Princeton in 1939.
- Karl Popper (1902–1994)
- Born in Vienna and with a doctorate there, Popper was intensely engaged in discussions with members of the Vienna Circle. His main philosophical work, The Logic of Scientific Discovery (1935/1959), appeared in a series edited by Schlick and P. Frank. He did not however, regularly attend meetings of the Vienna Circle and generally considered himself an outsider. Later he claimed to have “killed” logical positivism. From Austria Popper escaped to New Zealand and eventually to the London School of Economics, where he was knighted for his political writings.
- Hilary Putnam (1926–2016)
- This American philosopher of science, mathematics, mind and language earned his doctorate under Reichenbach at UCLA and subsequently taught at Princeton, MIT, and Harvard. He was originally a metaphysical realist, but then argued forcefully against it. He has continued the pragmatist tradition and been politically active, especially in the 1960s and 70s.
- W.V.O. Quine (1908–2000)
- Born in the U.S., Quine took his doctorate and spent his entire career at Harvard. In 1932–33 he visited the Vienna Circle and then Carnap and Warsaw. For the next six years, he said, he was a disciple of Carnap’s and even after they began to disagree, Carnap set the agenda. Eventually they clashed over analyticity, modality, and intensional contexts generally. Many similarities of view with Neurath are apparent, especially on the issues of holism, underdetermination, and naturalism in epistemology.
- Hans Reichenbach (1891–1953)
- Reichenbach was born in Hamburg and, after immersing himself in mathematics, physics, and philosophy, took his doctorate in Erlangen, Germany. He was a founder and the leader for the Berlin Society for Empirical (later Scientific) Philosophy. In 1933 he was forced to leave Berlin. He went to Turkey and then in 1938 to UCLA. Among his many students were Hempel, Putnam, and W. Salmon, and so almost all philosophy of science in the U.S. can trace its academic lineage to Reichenbach. Though interested in social and educational reform, he worked primarily in philosophy of physics. He developed and defended a frequency theory of probability, and emphasized both scientific realism and the importance of causality and causal laws.
- Wesley Salmon (1925–2001)
- Salmon was born in Detroit and, after an initial interest in theology, earned his PhD under Reichenbach at UCLA. He taught at a number of universities including Brown, Indiana, Arizona, and Pittsburgh. His interests centered on causality and explanation, and his statistical relevance model of explanation can be thought of as addressing and in large measure resolving the problem of the single case in frequency theories of probability.
- Moritz Schlick (1882–1936)
- Schlick was born in Berlin and eventually took his doctorate there in mathematical physics under Max Planck. He taught at a number of German universities before he was, at the instigation of Hans Hahn, called to the Chair in the Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences at Vienna, a chair that was previously held by Boltzmann and Mach. Schlick was one of the first philosophers to write about Einstein’s relativity theory. He was close to Wittgenstein and one of the conduits for the latter’s strict verificationism. His work ranges from space and time to general epistemology and ethics. In 1936 he was assassinated on the steps of the university by a deranged student.
- Wilfrid Sellars (1912–1989)
- Wilfrid Sellars was the son of well-known philosopher, Roy Wood Sellars. Wilfrid studied at Buffalo, Oxford, and Harvard before teaching at Iowa, Minnesota, Yale, and Pittsburgh. He was a close associate and collaborator with Feigl at Minnesota. (He once said that he and Feigl were for years discrete parts of a single entity.) He defended scientific realism, pragmatism, and naturalism, and his philosophy of language drew heavily on Carnap’s Logical Syntax (1934/1937)
- Alfred Tarski (1901–1983)
- Born and educated in Warsaw, Tarski earned his doctorate under Lesniewski. He happened to be visiting the U.S. when Poland was invaded and so avoided the fate of so many of his colleagues. He taught at the University of California at Berkeley for more than 30 years. While it is unclear whether he should be counted as a logical empiricist, he visited the Vienna Circle and hosted its members in Warsaw, and his “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages” (1936/1956) was very influential on Carnap and on the development of semantics among the logical empiricists generally.
- Friedrich Waismann (1896–1959)
- Waismann was born in Vienna and earned his doctorate there under the direction of Schlick in 1936. From 1926 to 1933 he held discussions with Wittgenstein, generally in the company of Schlick, but also sometimes Carnap or Feigl. Waismann kept detailed minutes of these conversations. At one point he and Wittgenstein contemplated a joint book, but Wittgenstein later changed his mind. Besides the printed text of the Tractatus these conversations were the main conduit of Wittgenstein’s ideas into the Vienna Circle. In 1937 Waismann was able to emigrate to England. After a couple of years at Cambridge, where he was shunned by Wittgenstein, he moved to Oxford, where he taught until his death.
- Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951)
- Born into an immensely wealthy Viennese family, Wittgenstein studied at Cambridge from 1911, where he formed friendships with Russell, Keynes, and Moore. His Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (1921/1922), which among other things tries to show that logic has no content, was enormously influential on many logical empiricists. Wittgenstein continued to spend much of his time in Austria working variously as an elementary school teacher, a gardener, and as an architect of a house for his sister in Vienna. While there he held influential discussions with Schlick, Waismann, and others. From 1930 he held teaching posts at Cambridge and increasingly distanced himself from the logical empiricists. His later work focused on ordinary language and inspired many other philosophers as well.
It is not possible in an essay of this scope to trace all the issues that the logical empiricists addressed or even to treat any one of them with completeness. What is possible is to highlight some salient issues, clear away some misconceptions about them, and sketch a bit how those issues were developed over time. The first is a related set of concerns: empiricism, verificationism, and anti-metaphysics. The second is the logical empiricists’ treatment of logic and mathematics as analytic. Third is the related issues of the unity of science and reduction. And finally, comes the issue of probability. Given what has already been said, the reader should be aware that none of the doctrines discussed below was shared by all members of the logical empiricist movement.
Since antiquity the idea that natural science rests importantly on experience has been non-controversial. The only real questions about the sources of scientific knowledge are: Are there parts of science that do not rest on experience or rest also on something other than experience? If so what account can we give of those parts? And to the extent that science does rest on experience how can we know that it does? There is another question about science related to these, though not strictly about the sources of science, and that is: Why, in making claims about the world, should we be scientific as opposed to say mystical? The difficulty is that any scientific answer to this last question would reasonably be thought to beg the very question it purports to address.
Long before the twentieth century the prevailing opinion was that Euclidean geometry, standard mathematics, and logic did not rest on experience in any obvious way. They were largely presupposed in our empirical work, and it was difficult to see what if anything might disconfirm them. Geometry was a special case and might be handled in different ways that we shall not discuss here. That leaves logic and mathematics.
If Frege and Russell were right, then mathematics could be thought of as expressing no more than logical truths and handled in whatever way logic was to be treated. For Frege both mathematics and logic were analytic, but that, even if true, does not provide the needed answers. Wittgenstein’s no-content theory of logic suggested that all of the real claims, the ones that had genuine content, could be appropriately supported by experience, and the logical and hence mathematical claims had no content to support. This seemed to open the way for a thoroughgoing empiricism in which the logical and mathematical fit in with the ordinary claims of physics and biology in a harmonious way. The next subsection about analyticity discusses the question of whether the needed distinctions can be drawn.
In developing his theory of types Russell said in effect that some expressions that seem to be sentences in fact say nothing at all. This is because, despite appearances, they are not grammatically well formed. Wittgenstein found this suggestive. In the Tractatus he suggested that much else was nonsense as well including traditional metaphysics and supposed claims about the “higher”. When in late 1929 Wittgenstein proposed (Waismann 1967/1979), in conversations with Schlick and Waismann, a strict verificationism as a basis for identifying the legitimate parts of discourse, this seemed to the logical empiricists to be a very attractive tool for setting aside the unscientific parts of philosophy.
This does not mean, however, that all logical empiricists or even all members of the Vienna Circle accepted the strict verificationist view that in order to be meaningful a claim must be implied by a finite number of observation sentences. Even though those observation sentences need not be true, this view had the drawback that so-called laws of nature would not be meaningful on this criterion. Schlick was prepared to bite the bullet and hold that laws were not statements at all but principles of inference. Others were not prepared to go so far and sought more liberal formulations. This more liberal or “left” wing of the Vienna Circle included Carnap, Philipp Frank, Hahn, and Neurath. Carnap does not seem to have been a strict verificationist even in the Aufbau (1928/1967).
Over the years a great many different formulations of verificationist principles ensued. Most of them came to a bad end rather quickly, and this is sometimes taken as a convincing argument that any form of verificationism is utterly misguided. Perhaps, but we should be cautious. There are undoubtedly many different features joined in any one of the proposals, and even a sequence of failures may not show where to place the blame. The central idea behind verificationism is linking some sort of meaningfulness with (in principle) confirmation, at least for synthetic sentences. The actual formulations embodied not only such a link but various particular accounts of confirmation as well. Now confirmation is a complex matter, and it is unlikely that we shall have the final satisfactory account any time soon. This should not persuade us, however, that there are no satisfactory accounts of confirmation any more than our current lack of the final physics should convince us that there are no physical facts of the matter. So even a string of failures in formulating verificationist principles may mean no more than that the embedded accounts of confirmation are too simple but the link between meaningfulness and confirmation is nevertheless sound.
Even if we set this caution aside, there may be parts of persistently employed strategy that lead to persistent failure. These parts and failures might be avoidable. To see how this may be so we will compare what is perhaps the most famous formulation of the verificationist principle, in Ayer 1936, with a later one, in Carnap 1956. A.J. Ayer had visited the Vienna Circle from late 1932 on into 1933, returning home for the summer term. While in Vienna he attended meetings of the Circle and overlapped for five weeks with Quine. Neither Carnap nor Neurath were there at the time, so the left wing of the Circle was not fully represented. When Ayer returned to England he published Language, Truth, and Logic in 1936. Even immediately it was widely discussed, and after the war sales were spectacular. For many in England this book was the epitome of logical positivism and remains so.
Ayer was careful to restrict his criterion of meaningfulness to synthetic sentences and to demand only in principle confirmation. And the formulation seems very natural: Confirmation is a feature that applies to sentences (or groups of them) and not to sub-sentential parts, and for an empiricist the content that a synthetic sentence has would be empirical content. So it would seem that to have empirical content a sentence, A, should either directly imply some observational sentence or add to the observational content of some other sentence, B. That is, the conjunction of A and B should imply some observational sentence not implied by B alone. This formulation may be natural, but it is also fatally flawed. It would declare any sentence whatsoever as meaningful: For any sentence A and any observation sentence O, A would be meaningful because it could be conjoined to A ⊃ O. The latter would not in general imply O, but the conjunction would.
Other more elaborate formulations followed along the same lines, and other more elaborate counterexamples appeared just as fast. Hempel reviewed the situation twice within about a year (Hempel 1950 and 1951). First he concluded that it was a lively and promising line of research and later concluded that it was not promising at all. In retrospect it may be that the problems arise because we were led by the fact that confirmation is a feature that applies to whole sentences into thinking that the level at which to apply the criterion was the level of whole sentences. Now a sentence with meaningless parts might well pass some test especially if the test involves its being combined with other sentences that can have meaningless parts. So one way to avoid this difficulty is to try to find a formulation that applies the test at the level of basic expressions, those that can be thought of as “not having parts” so to speak.
This is the strategy that Carnap employed in “The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts” (1956). Observational terms are assumed to have empirical content. Logical terms are assumed to have none. And all defined terms are assumed to be replaced by their definitions. If for some basic, non-logical term there is a sentence that contains that term as its only non-logical element and if that sentence implies some observation sentence, then that sentence has empirical content and so does its only non-logical term. If we have established that each term from some set, K, is empirically significant we might test still further terms by seeing whether those further terms can add to what is sayable with terms from K. Carnap’s actual definition is quite complicated, but it does seem to avoid the difficulties of its predecessors. It also allows an account of why those predecessors ran into trouble, viz., that they applied at the level of whole sentences (naturally enough) rather than to elementary terms.
Not long after Carnap’s definition was published David Kaplan devised what seemed to be counterexamples. They became fairly well known, but they were not published until 1975. Shortly thereafter it was shown (Creath 1976) that either Carnap’s definition is not open to the counterexamples as presented or it can be patched in a very natural way so that it avoids them. This does not show that there are no counterexamples or that there are no other features of the definition to which one might object. But it does show that the situation is not as dire as Hempel supposed in 1951.
We need to address another issue in considering verificationism, the persistent criticism that it is self-undercutting. The argument for this claim goes like this: The principle claims that every meaningful sentence is either analytic or verifiable. Well, the principle itself is surely not analytic; we understand the meanings of the words in it perfectly well because we understand our own language. And we still do not think it true, so it cannot be true in virtue of meaning. And it is not verifiable either (whatever we choose ‘verifiable’ to mean).
This sounds more compelling than it is. Ayer understood the principle to be a definition, defining a technical term, ‘meaning’. If so, then the sentence expressing the principle would indeed be analytic. So the self-undercutting charge strictly fails. But so construed and with nothing else said about it the principle would not have the same punch as before. Why should a metaphysician care whether his or her utterances lack some technical feature?
Carnap explicitly takes up the “self-undercutting” charge against verifiability in Philosophy and Logical Syntax (1935), and he is not interested in introducing a new technical term, ‘meaning’, so or in denying this new technical property to unverifiable sentences. Carnap is careful to distinguish the language for which the verifiability principle is given from the meta-language in which we talk about that language. This meta-language would be the language in which the principle would be expressed. This may seem to offer another strategy against the “self-undercutting” charge because the principle applies to a different language than that in which it is expressed. This is not Carnap’s strategy. Carnap fully understands that if the general verificationist strategy is followed, there will also be a verificationist principle expressed in the meta-meta-language governing the meta-language.
Carnap’s real defense of the principle was achieved by changing the nature of the discussion. By 1935 Carnap had introduced an important new element into his philosophy called the Principle of Tolerance. Tolerance is a radical idea. There is no uniquely correct logic (1934/1937 xiv–xv). Empiricism is a convention (Carnap, 1936/1937 33). Perhaps more precisely each of the various versions of empiricism (including some sort of verificationism) is best understood as a proposal for structuring the language of science. Before tolerance, both empiricism and verificationism are announced as if they are simply correct. Correspondingly, what Carnap called metaphysics is then treated as though it is, as a matter of brute fact, unintelligible. But what is announced thus dogmatically can be rejected equally dogmatically. Once tolerance is in place, alternative philosophic positions, including metaphysical ones, are construed as alternative proposals for structuring the language of science.
None of them is the uniquely correct one, and no theoretical argument or evidence can show that it is. Nor can theoretical arguments or evidence show that it is false. Neither proposals nor languages are the sort of thing to be true or false. Instead, proposals call for practical decisions and practical arguments rather than for theoretical reasons or evidence. Carnap believes that there are indeed very good practical reasons for adopting the proposal of verificationism, for choosing a language of science in which all substantive (synthetic) claims can, at least in principle, be brought before the court of public experience. The reason is that if we do not require this, the result is “wearisome controversies” that there is no hope of resolving. That, he thinks, is the sad history of attempts to get beyond science, and it is just too painful.
If the proposals constituting some version of verificationism are adopted, then in the language thus constituted it will be analytically true that there are no synthetic sentences that are both unverifiable and meaningful. The notion of meaning here is not some new technical invention. Rather, ‘meaning’ is used in something like the ordinary sense. No grammatically well-formed sentence of this new language violates the verifiability principle. And the principle itself is completely safe.
Thought of in this way the verifiability principle does not describe natural language, it is not intended to. It is intended to reform language to make it a more useful tool for the purposes of science. Carnap is under no illusion that natural languages are free from metaphysics. Nor is he under the illusion that defenders of the sort of metaphysics he targets will readily step up to the challenge of presenting precise rules of grammar and inference.
There is one other change that tolerance brings to Carnap’s own vocabulary. Before tolerance, verificationism is stated in such a way that violations would count only as unintelligible gibberish. With tolerance in place, Carnap is prepared to imagine non-empiricist languages, though of course he thinks they are very unwise. So instead of saying that sentences in non-empiricist languages are meaningless, he says that they are empirically meaningless. And that has a very different flavor. There is no weakening of his defense of empiricism, but it is put on a somewhat different footing.
Logic, mathematics, and mathematical geometry had traditionally seemed to be confirmationally “different”. Indeed it is hard to indicate any conditions under which any parts of them would be disconfirmed. Leibniz had called them truths of reason. Hume said that they represented relations of ideas. Kant had held that the truths in these areas were a priori. Mathematics and geometry were not analytic for Kant, but logic was. Kant had two criteria of analyticity, apparently thinking them equivalent. First, in subject-predicate sentences, an analytic sentence is one in which the concept of the predicate is contained in that of the subject. Second, an analytic sentence is one whose denial is self-contradictory. This seems to include not only the sentences whose surface logical form would be of the required sort but also those that can be got from such logical truths by making substitutions that were conceptually equivalent. The more modern rough analog of this is to say that the analytic sentences are those that are true in virtue of logic and definition.
Frege certainly developed logic beyond that which was available to Kant, but he did not think of himself as changing the analytic status of it. Logic is after all the only avenue we have for giving meaning to the notion of (logical) contradiction. Of course Frege also attempted to reduce mathematics to logic (including both first and second order logic), and insofar as that reduction was successful it would have implied that mathematics was analytic as well. Frege said little of geometry, but for him it was synthetic a priori.
Carnap had not only studied with Frege, but like many of the logical empiricists he had started out as a neo-Kantian as well. So especially in view of Russell’s relatively more successful attempt at reducing mathematics to logic, it was perhaps natural that Carnap would consider both mathematics and logic as analytic. Geometry could be handled in several different ways that we will not discuss here. But from fairly early on there was widespread agreement among the logical empiricists that there was no synthetic a priori, and that logic and mathematics and perhaps much else that seemed impervious to empirical disconfirmation should be thought of as analytic. The point of drawing the analytic-synthetic distinction, then, is not to divide the body of scientific truths or to divide philosophy from science, but to show how to integrate them into a natural scientific whole. Along the way the distinction clarifies which inferences are to be taken as legitimate and which are not. If, as Carnap and Neurath were, you are impressed by Duhemian arguments to the effect that generally claims must be combined in order to test them, the analytic-synthetic distinction allows you to clarify which combinations of claims are testable.
If analytic, a sentence is true in virtue of the conventions of language. In saying that, however, we must pause to confront two widespread confusions. First, Quine alleges (1963, 385f) that the notion of analyticity was developed and purports to explain for both Kant and Carnap how certainty is possible. In fact certainty has little or nothing to do with analyticity for the leading logical empiricists. In saying that such claims are based on convention they were explicitly calling attention to the revisability of conventions and the sentences that owed their meanings to those conventions. Second, nowadays any talk of convention is likely to prompt the response: “But that cannot be! No proposition can be made true by our conventions or decisions.” Unless it is a proposition about conventions, this second sentence of the response is true. But it is also completely irrelevant. Analyticity applies to sentences rather than propositions. Our conventions and decisions can and do affect what expressions mean and thus what sentences mean. Once the meaning is specified, it may well be that any sentence that has this meaning would be true even if, for example, the point masses of the universe were arranged quite otherwise than they in fact are. These are the analytic sentences. No claim is being made that meaning causes anything or that convention makes anything true. The “making” image here is out of place. It is just that in these cases the truth value of the sentence may well be functionally dependent on meaning alone. If it is, then in this special sense, truth value depends on meaning, and that depends on convention. Other sentences whose meanings are specified might well be true or false depending on how things in the external world, so to speak, are arranged. In this other category of sentence the truth value is not functionally dependent on meaning alone. They are the synthetic sentences. Now this puts matters extremely informally. But at least the nature of the confusions over certainty and convention should be clear.
In the Logical Syntax of Language (1934/1937) Carnap defined ‘analytic’ in a new way in order to circumvent Gödel’s incompleteness results. The method used was to distinguish between a derivation relation (the relation that holds between some premises and what can be got from them in a finite number of steps) and a consequence relation. The latter is an essentially semantic relation that holds between some premises and some other claim such that on all valuations under which the premises are all true, so is that other claim. This definition bears a stronger resemblance to Tarski’s account in (Tarski 1936b/1956). In any case, Carnap is able to show that for any sentence of pure mathematics either it or its negation is a consequence of the null set of premises. This leaves Gödel’s results completely intact as they concerned what is provable, that is, derivable from the null set of premises or from any one consistent axiomatization of mathematical truths.
As noted above, another innovation of Logical Syntax is the Principle of Tolerance. While it reflects a long-standing attitude on Carnap’s part, the principle itself is new. Later Carnap was to say that the Principle of Tolerance was “perhaps better called the principle of conventionality” (Carnap 1942, 247), that is, the conventionality of linguistic forms. Tolerance stabilizes the verification principle as well as Carnap’s empiricism, and it reinforces the idea that the analytic-synthetic distinction is always relative to a particular language (Creath 2009).
In the late 1950s Carnap began exploring (1963a and 1966) how a notion of analyticity might be developed for novel theoretical terms where the theories in which those terms are embedded are presented by means of a system of postulates. It is not clear that the account he developed was intended to supersede his earlier account. In any case Carnap’s suggestion is as follows (where for convenience terms are used autonymously): Let T be the totality of theoretical postulates, and C be the totality of mixed sentences (the sentences of the theory containing both antecedent and novel terms). Also let R(TC) be the Ramsey sentence for TC, that is, the result of replacing each of the non-observational terms in TC with predicate variables and closing that open sentence with corresponding existential quantifiers. R(TC) ⊃ TC can, Carnap says, be thought of as the analytic sentence for the theory, that is, a sentence that gives to the theoretical terms of TC their meaning. Over the last decade, this idea of Carnap’s has provoked considerable discussion that has not yet been resolved. Whatever worries there may be concerning this part of Carnap’s view, they are distinct from the more famous concerns raised by Quine.
Quine began having doubts about analyticity about 1940, though he seems not to have been firmly committed against it until later. In any case his doubts were not published until 1951 in his famous paper “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”. Quine’s readers have understood his arguments in many different ways. The most general form of his complaint is that ‘analytic’ so far lacks the appropriate tie to observational criteria that Carnap’s own account of theoretical terms in empirical science would demand. More specifically, where there has been an attempt at such a general criterion it has resulted in either a “drastic failure as tended to admit all or no sentences as analytic, or there has been a circularity” (Quine 1963, 404) of a kind that defines ‘analytic’ in terms that themselves lack the appropriate empirical criteria and so can be accounted for only by appeal to analyticity itself.
This complaint falls far short, as Quine well understood, of a proof that Carnap’s appeal to analyticity was doomed. First, it relies on the demand that theoretical terms must satisfy some empirical significance criterion. Many people at the time, including some who followed Quine in rejecting analyticity, also rejected any general empirical significance demand for theoretical terms. Second, one could accept the demand for theoretical terms in physics or chemistry and deny, as Carnap did, that the demand applied to his own work. This is because Carnap saw himself as working in an area within metamathematics rather than in empirical linguistics. Third, Quine did not pretend to have considered all of the possibilities for the explication of analyticity. And so it may be possible to meet Quine’s demands to the extent that they are legitimate. Fourth and finally, Quine seems in Roots of Reference (1974) to have provided an explication for ‘analytic’ that meets his demand for empirical/behavioral criteria without inducing either the drastic failure or the circularity envisioned above.
There is another somewhat independent thrust to Quine’s campaign against analyticity. In the last section of “Two Dogmas” (1951) Quine gives an extremely attractive sketch for an alternative epistemology that apparently makes no appeal to analyticity. Insofar as that sketch can be filled out successfully it would constitute a dispensability argument against analyticity. Whether it can be thus filled out, however, remains to be seen.
Quine’s other provocative theses, including especially his claims about the indeterminacy of translation, while relevant to his assessment of analyticity, would carry us too far afield to consider their ramifications here. As with most topics in philosophy there is no uniform agreement in the literature as to whether the notion of analyticity is or can be made sufficiently clear for use in scientific philosophy. Nor is there such agreement that Quine’s epistemological sketch can be satisfactorily filled out. Both approaches have their defenders and their detractors. But between them they seem to be the most promising avenues for integrating the logic-mathematical part of science with the more straightforwardly empirical parts. Since Carnap is and Quine can be argued to be within the logical empiricist tradition, this progress toward such unification can be counted as part of the legacy of the movement.
The commitment of some of the logical empiricists to the unity of science has been in recent years often discussed but less often understood. One hears in conversation that it was a sort of rearguard action designed to preserve as much as possible of a phenomenalist version of ontological reduction. One reads in print that it can be refuted by the obvious fact that the various sciences have quite distinct theoretical vocabularies (Suppes 1978). Both reactions are misplaced.
It was the left wing of the Vienna Circle, and above all Otto Neurath, that championed the unity of science. They also promoted physicalism, anti-foundationalism, and a generally naturalistic viewpoint. A main focus of their activities from the late 30s was The Encyclopedia of Unified Science edited by Neurath in Europe and Carnap and Charles Morris in Chicago. A great many philosophers of many different persuasions participated in that project. The project may have been unified science, but they did not have a completely unified view of what that project was. Here we will discuss the Neurath and Carnap versions of it to see what their central concerns were.
Neurath seems to have had two primary motivations to advance under the banner of the unity of science. First, he was concerned that there be no a priori methodological cleavage between the natural and the social sciences. On the social scientific side he was concerned that these sciences not condone some private, mysterious mode of insight (empathy) whose results could not be checked against more ordinary public observation. Such a methodology would be a harbor for metaphysics. On the natural scientific side, he was concerned to point out that, for Duhemian and other reasons, the situation is much messier than is sometimes supposed, and so invidious comparisons by natural scientists at the expense of social science were unwarranted.
Second, because Neurath was socially and politically engaged he was concerned that the various sciences be connected in such a way that they could be used together to solve complex human and social problems. For this, considerable overlap of vocabulary was needed, and this he called a “universal jargon”.
In recent years it is sometimes claimed that Neurath meant by the unity of science what some contemporary philosophers have defended as the disunity of science. One cannot rule this claim out a priori. But the often substantial differences among the current defenses of disunity make evaluating this claim difficult. It is fair to say, however, that Neurath was suspicious of grand hypotheses, familiar since the 19th century to derive all of chemistry, biology, psychology, and the social sciences (in that order) from a few basic principles of physics. It is unclear whether this stems from a general opposition to system building, since he was eager to develop inferential connections among the various sciences. Perhaps this is better expressed as an opposition to speculative system building and to the idea that there is only one way of systematizing our science than to systematicity as such.
Carnap’s position on unity is different from Neurath’s, but they overlap. Carnap distinguished the unity of the language of science from the unity of the laws of science. He wanted to defend the former and to say what would be required for the latter. As far as the unity of the language of science, Carnap did in the Aufbau try to initiate a program for defining all of scientific concepts on the basis of a very small number of basic concepts, perhaps only one basic concept. That does afford a certain conceptual economy, but it is now generally held by Carnap scholars (see especially Friedman 1987 and Richardson 1998) that ontological reduction and reduction to a phenomenalist basis was far from his motive. Carnap explicitly acknowledged that another system of definitions, one with a physicalist basis, might also be possible. Instead of ontological economy and a phenomenal basis, Carnap’s project seems to have been the more Kantian one of indicating how semantic intersubjectivity is possible: How can it be that, even though I have only my own experiences and you have only yours, we can nevertheless share a common body of concepts? The answer is given in terms of shared inferential structure and identifying any given concept with a unique place within that shared overall structure. This is a highly holistic conception of concepts and it depends on thinking of the body of scientific commitments as a whole, as a unity.
The Aufbau was largely drafted before Carnap joined the Vienna Circle. Once there and under some influence from Neurath, Carnap campaigned more insistently for physicalism and for the unity of science. They seemed often to be two sides of the same coin. From 1933 onward there was a succession of monograph series with ‘Unified Science’ in the title. Until his death in 1945, Neurath was in each case the main editor and Carnap either the associate editor or one of the associate editors. The International Encyclopedia of Unified Science, begun in 1938 is undoubtedly the most famous of these. Carnap’s own essay on this topic “Logical Foundations of the Unity of Science” (1938) was printed as part of the very first number in the encyclopedia.
The dates here are relevant because by the time of this essay Carnap had already decided (Carnap 1936–37) that theoretical terms could not in general be given explicit definitions in the observation language even though the observation reports were already in a physicalist vocabulary. The partially defined theoretical terms could not be eliminated. This seems to have caused Carnap no consternation at all, and it never seems to have occurred to him that there was any conflict whatever between this result and the unity of science. This is because by this point the elimination of concepts was not the point of the exercise; their inferential and evidential integration was.
In the 1936–37 article, “Testability and Meaning” Carnap called the partial definitions themselves “reduction sentences” and the system of definitions of theoretical terms, both partial and complete, as a reduction of the theoretical terms to the observational basis. Plainly he means by the word ‘reduction’ something other than what we currently mean, not that there is anything univocal about current uses of the word. By ‘reduction’ of vocabulary A to vocabulary B Carnap means the specification of the inferential relations that would allow us to say what sentences or combinations of sentences in A would count as evidence for sentences in B.
This is also the key to what Carnap means by the unity of the language of science. The language of science is unified, no matter how different and exotic its various technical vocabularies may be, when each of its terms is reduced to (can be tested in) a common public observation vocabulary. The call for the unity of the language of science, then, amounts to no more than the demand that the various claims of the separate sciences should be publically testable in a common observation language. Controversies will of course arise as to what the observational vocabulary should be and what are the acceptable forms of linkage. Carnap’s demand for unity in the language of science abstracts from those controversies to concentrate on the goal of public testability. That does not seem to be an unreasonable demand.
The unity of the language of science so far discussed is quite a different issue from the unity of the laws of science. And Carnap’s attitudes toward them are quite different. The latter issue concerns the extent to which the laws of one special science can be inferred from those of another. Carnap tries to articulate what would be involved in such a unification, but he nowhere says that such a unity is either possible or mandatory. Finding any sort of inferential connections among sets of laws would be welcome of course. But the question of how much unity there is, if any, among the various sciences is an empirical question that philosophers are ill equipped to answer. Philosophers should not make pronouncements, especially in advance of having putative laws in hand, either that scientific laws are unified or that they are not. A certain modest deference to the empirical facts that philosophers generally do not have, again, does not seem unreasonable.
Taking unity as a working hypothesis, as some philosophers have done, amounts to looking for inferential and nomological connections among various sets of laws, but not to the assertion that such connection will be found. Even if we accept the idea that such connections would be welcome if found, the question of whether one should spend significant effort in looking for them is not thereby answered. That would be a difficult and delicate practical question of how to apportion one’s research effort that for the purposes of this essay we must set aside.
There are two broad approaches to probability represented in logical empiricism. One of these, the so-called frequentist approach, has an extensive 19th century history and was further developed from about 1920 onward by Richard von Mises and Hans Reichenbach. The other is the epistemic approach to probability. This goes back at least to Laplace at the end of the 18th century. In the 20th century Rudolf Carnap, who explored what he called logical probability, and Frank Ramsey and Richard Jeffrey whose accounts can be distinguished from Carnap’s and are often called subjective probability, all defended the epistemic approach. While Ramsey visited the Vienna Circle he was not much influenced by its members on these matters. By contrast, Jeffrey studied and later collaborated with Carnap but also made significant contributions of his own.
It is natural to begin thinking about probabilities with a simple mathematical account that takes as its point of departure various games of chance involving cards, dice, or coins. Bettors have long noted that some outcomes are much more likely than others. In this context it is convenient to take the probability of a kind of outcome to be the ratio of such outcomes to all possible outcomes. Usually for reasons of symmetry in the physical set up, the possible outcomes are assumed to be equally likely. Where that assumption happens to be true or nearly so the empirical results of, say, a great many throws of a pair of dice tends to be close to what the simple mathematical account would suggest. Conversely, where the outcomes deviate from the expected ratios, bettors begin to suspect that the dice, coins, and cards (or the manipulations of them) are not all that they seem. The suspicion is that the outcomes are not equally likely and that the simple mathematical account does not apply.
These facts suggest both two limitations of the simple account and the beginnings of a way around them. The first limitation is that the account applies only where the outcomes can be partitioned into alternatives that are equally likely. This is not the case when dice are loaded or in such real world cases as radioactive decay or weather forecasting. A second limitation is that the account, in describing the possible outcomes as equally likely, implicitly appeals to the very probability notion for which clarification was sought. The realization that we can sometimes discover the falsehood of the assumption of equal likelihood and make a much more reasonable estimate of probability by making a large number of trials is very suggestive. And from his dissertation onward Reichenbach worked out a variety of imagined physical models that could guide ones thinking about probability in useful ways. The result is what is often called the frequency theory of probability (or sometimes the statistical frequency theory or the limit frequency theory).
Even a perfectly fair coin in an odd number of flips will never result in exactly the same number of heads and of tails. When the coin is fair and the number of flips is even, an outcome perfectly balanced between heads and tails is not guaranteed either. So, even on the assumption that the probability of the coin’s coming up heads does not change over the course of the trials, we need to be cautious. A larger number of flips might make us more confident that the ratio we have seen is close to the “actual” value, but there is no finite number of flips after which we can say that the observed ratio is exactly right. We will never make an infinite number of flips either, and in actual cases a large finite number of flips might so erode the coin as to bias the coin and discredit the result. Notwithstanding these limitations on an actual series of trials one can imagine an infinite series of trials and define a notion of probability with respect to it. This raises its own difficulty, namely that ratios are not defined for infinite collections. They would be defined, however, for any finite initial segment of such an infinite series, thus giving a sequence of ratios. If this sequence of ratios settles down on a limit, the probability of the coin showing a head given that it has been flipped can be defined as the limit of the ratio of heads to total flips as the number of flips goes to infinity.
While probability thus defined has a somewhat counterfactual character, that is not an obvious defect. Moreover, this notion of probability applies perfectly well to biased coins and loaded dice, as well as to radioactive decay. On the surface at least it also seem to avoid using the notion of probability in its own definition, and in these respects it seems to be an important improvement over the simple mathematical model with which we began. The definition locates the probability objectively “out in nature” so to speak, and this comports well with Reichenbach’s scientific realism.
A problem that remained troublesome concerns the fact that one often wants to assign probabilities to particular events, events that in the nature of things cannot be repeated in all their particularity. Thus it is unclear how a frequency theory of probability is to be applied to such individual cases. This is often called the problem of the single case. It is a little difficult to assess how serious this is, because in actual practice we often have no difficulty in making probability assignments to single cases. Suppose we are interested in the probability of rain tomorrow. Tomorrow will never be repeated, and we want to estimate the probability now. What we do is to look back through the records to find days relevantly like today and determine in what fraction of those cases those days were followed by rainy days and use that as our estimate. Even if we are comfortable with this practice, however, it is another matter to say why this should give us a reasonable estimate of the value of the limit involved in a logically impossible infinite sequence. This problem of the single case was much discussed, and Wesley Salmon made progress in dealing with it. Indeed, Salmon’s account of statistical explanation can be viewed as a substantial mitigation of the problem of the single case (W. Salmon 1970).
There are residual difficulties in making estimates of the probabilities on the basis of finite evidence. The problem is that even when we are assured that the sequence of ratios has a limit, we have no a priori grounds for saying how close the current ratio is to that limit. We can boldly estimate the limit by means of the so-called “straight rule”. This just takes the most recent ratio as the desired estimate. This is a good practical solution where the number of trials is already high, but this does not really say why the estimate should be good, how good it is supposed to be, or how many trials would be high enough. In addition, the straight rule can yield counterintuitive results where the number of trials is small.
Though there are these issues outstanding, frequency theories define a concept of probability indispensable for quantum theories and for a wide variety of other applications in the natural and social sciences. It was not the only concept of probability to be developed by the logical empiricist tradition. The primary other such concept was the epistemic conception of probability. We will begin with Carnap and then move to those who developed a subjectivist account.
Carnap is addressing a different issue than was addressed by von Mises and Reichenbach. Instead of focusing on physical phenomena and ratios within them, Carnap focuses on arguments and takes as his point of departure the widespread conviction that some arguments are stronger, in varying degrees, than others, even for the same conclusion. Similarly some bodies of evidence can give us more reason to believe a given conclusion than would another body of evidence. Carnap sets as his task the development of a quantitative concept of probability that will clarify and explicate these widespread convictions. Such a quantitative concept would be an extraordinarily useful tool, and it would be a useful successor to our ordinary, somewhat scattered notions of confirmation and induction.
Carnap approaches the problem by first considering extremely limited artificial languages and trying to find a confirmation function that will work for that. If he succeeds he would then try to develop an account that would work for a broader and richer range of languages. In this his approach is like that of a physicist developing a physical theory for the highly artificial situation of a billiard table or air track and then broadening the theory to deal with a wider range of cases. In Carnap’s case, however, it is somewhat unclear what success would be in an artificial language very much unlike our own. In any case, Carnap is not trying to describe our linguistic habits but to clarify or even to replace them with something more useful.
As early as Logical Syntax (Carnap 1934/1937, 244/316–17) Carnap had suggested that Wittgenstein’s remarks in the Tractatus about ranges (Tractatus, 4.463) might be a starting point for thinking about probability. By 1945 Carnap also distinguished the two approaches described here, insisting that they were not competitors but were attempting to explicate two different concepts of probability. One need not choose one as the only concept; both concepts were useful. Reichenbach, by contrast, never conceded that both concepts were needed and insisted that his frequency notion could serve all epistemic purposes for which any notion of probability is needed.
Carnap’s general strategy was first to identify a broad class of confirmation functions, as subjectivists Ramsay and de Finetti were also to do, and then find a natural way of limiting this class still further. The confirmation functions have to meet some basic mathematical conditions. The axioms that state these conditions partially define a function, and this function can be interpreted in a number of ways. Carnap himself lists three in Carnap 1950. In (1955), John Kemeny (one of Carnap’s collaborators and later a co-inventor of BASIC programming language and still later president of Dartmouth College) gave an argument that persuaded Carnap that it was more fruitful to think of the function as indicating fair betting quotients rather than evidential support. This took Carnap even closer in conception to the work of such subjectivists as Ramsey and de Finetti. Indeed, the discussion of fair betting quotients, and related issues of Dutch book arguments had been initiated by de Finetti.
In Logical Foundations of Probability (1950) Carnap had discussed Bayes’ theorem and promised to expand the discussion in a second volume. Carnap’s interest in Baysianism grew, but that second volume never materialized, quite possibly because rapid development of the field was still under way at the time of Carnap’s death. As his work proceeded Carnap tended to explain probabilities by reference to events and propositions rather than speak overtly about sentences. A similar change appears in the rest of Carnap’s work as well. It is not clear, however, whether this amounts to a major change of view or a change in what he sees as the most felicitous mode of expression. As the years progressed Carnap tended to see the remaining differences between himself and his subjectivist co-workers as chiefly differences in emphasis. In any case the subjectivist tradition is now dominant in philosophical discussions of probability (Zabell 2007, 293). Richard Jeffrey whose own work arose out of logical empiricism carried on that tradition for 35 years after Carnap’s death. Jeffrey himself made major contributions including a principle for updating ones beliefs when the evidence one learns is not certain. The world knows this principle as “Jeffrey conditionalization”; he called it simply “probability kinematics”.
Popper’s view of probability, his propensity theory, differs from either of the two approaches discussed above. Unlike the epistemic approach of Carnap and others, Popper was not trying to clarify inductive relations because he did not believe that there are inductive inferences. Theories can be corroborated by their passing severe tests, but they are not thereby inductively confirmed or made more probable. For a discussion of whether there are any significant similarities between Popper’s idea of corroboration and the ideas of inductive confirmation that he rejects, see (Salmon 1967, 1968).
Propensities are thought of as tendencies of a physical event or state to produce another event or state. Because propensities are to be features of external events and not, to use Hume’s phrase, relations of ideas, the propensity theory and the statistical-frequency theory are sometimes grouped together as accounts of chance. Popper has specifically applied propensities to single non-repeatable events (1957), and that suggests that the concept of propensity does not involve any essential reference to long sequences of events. Popper has also taken propensities as producing outcomes with a certain limit frequency (1959). This does suggest a rather closer tie to the statistical frequency approach. Later philosophers developed both sorts of propensity theories, single-case theories and long-run theories. (Gillies 2000) And like other approaches to probability and induction all these views remain controversial. While we will not discuss the relative merits of the various approaches further, those who are interested in Popper’s views in this area should look at the many papers on probability, induction, confirmation, and corroboration, and Popper’s replies, in The Philosophy of Karl Popper (Schilpp 1974).
In 1967 John Passmore reported that: “Logical positivism, then, is dead, or as dead as a philosophical movement ever becomes.” (1967, 57) Earlier in the same article he had equated logical positivism with logical empiricism, so presumably that was dead too. At that time few would have disagreed with Passmore, even though Carnap was still alive and active. But in speaking of this movement Passmore was referring not to a movement but to specific doctrines, and his interpretation of them was much influenced by Ayer. Even so, Passmore conceded that the movement had left a legacy and that “the spirit which inspired the Vienna circle” persisted. It still does.
Part of the movement’s legacy lies in contemporary philosophy of science. In the US nearly all philosophers of science can trace their academic lineages to Reichenbach. Most were either his students or students of his students and so on. His scientific realism inspired a generation of philosophers, even those clearly outside the movement. Even the reaction against various forms of realism that have appeared in recent decades have roots in the logical empiricist movement. Moreover, philosophers of science are expected to know a great deal of the science about which they philosophize and to be cautious in telling practicing scientists what concepts they may or may not use. In these respects and others contemporary philosophers promote a kind of naturalism, and by so doing they follow both the precept and the example of the logical empiricists.
There are other issues where the legacy of logical empiricism is still visible. Two different approaches to probability are still under discussion. One of them explores the objective chances of external events; this investigation follows in the tradition of the frequency theory of Reichenbach and von Mises. The second approach has an epistemic conception of probability as exemplified by Carnap. S.L. Zabell summarizes the current situation as follows:
But although the technical contributions of Carnap and his school remain of considerable interest today, Carnap’s most lasting influence was more subtle but also more important: he largely shaped the way current philosophy views the nature and role of probability, in particular its widespread acceptance of the Bayesian paradigm (as, for example, in Earman, 1992; Howson and Urbach, 1993; and Jeffrey, 2004). (Zabell 2007, 294)
There is also a continuing concern for how the various sciences fit together. Some have scouted theoretical unification and others a more pluralistic model, just as the logical empiricists did. There was for a while a vogue for the disunity of science. Some even said that their conception of the disunity of science is just what Neurath meant by the unity of science. Parts of the discussion were intended as challenges to logical empiricism, but often the arguments used were pioneered by the logical empiricists themselves.
For the 30 years after Passmore’s report metaphysics became ever more visible in philosophy. It was a diverse development, but in the self-conceptions of many of its most prominent practitioners there was no attempt to shun science or logic or to think that metaphysics had access to facts that were deeper than or beyond those that a proper science could reach. So the metaphysics that blossomed was not necessarily of the sort that Carnap and others combated. Most recently there are some in meta-ontology that want to reconsider and reconnect with Carnap’s ontological caution.
Even in its heyday many philosophers who on either doctrinal or sociological grounds can be grouped with the logical empiricists did not see themselves that way. We should not expect philosophers today to identify with the movement either. Each generation finds its place by emphasizing its differences from what has gone before. But the spirit of the movement still has its adherents. There are many who value clarity and who want to understand the methodology of science, its structure, and its prospects. There are many who want to find a natural home within a broad conception of science for conceptual innovation, for logic and mathematics, and for their own study of methodology. And importantly there are those who see in science a prospect for intellectual and social reform and who see in their own study of science some hope for freeing us all from the merely habitual ways of thinking “by which we are now possessed” (Kuhn 1962, 1). These are the motives that define the movement called logical empiricism. As Twain might have said, the reports of its death are greatly exaggerated.
- Ayer, A.J., 1936, Language Truth, and Logic, London: Gollancz.
- Carnap, R., 1928/1967, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, translated by R.A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- –––, 1934/1937, Logische Syntax der Sprache, translated by A. Smeaton as The Logical Syntax of Language, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co.
- –––, 1935, Philosophy and Logical Syntax, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner, & Co.
- –––, 1936–37, “Testability and Meaning”, Philosophy of Science, 3: 419–71, 4: 1–40.
- –––, 1938, “Logical Foundations of the Unity of Science”, International Encyclopedia of Unified Science (Volume 1, Number 1), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 42–62.
- –––, 1942, Introduction to Semantics, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 1950, Logical Foundations of Probability, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- –––, 1958 , “Value Concepts”, transcribed and translated by A. Carus, Synthese 194: 185–94. [Original manuscript available online]
- –––, 1963a, “Carl G. Hempel on Scientific Theories”, in The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, P.A. Schilpp (ed.), LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 958–66.
- –––, 1963b, “K.R. Popper on Probability and Induction”, in The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, P.A. Schilpp (ed.), LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 995–998.
- –––, 1966, Philosophical Foundations of Physics, M. Gardner (ed.), New York: Basic Books.
- Carus, A.W., 2007, Carnap and Twentieth-Century Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Creath, R., 1976, “On Kaplan on Carnap on Significance”, Philosophical Studies, 30: 393–400.
- –––, 2009, “The Gentle Strength of Tolerance: The Logical Syntax of Language and Carnap’s Philosophical Programme”, in Carnap’s Logical Syntax of Language, P. Wagner (ed.), Houndsmills, Basingstoke, UK: Palgrave Macmillan, 203–214.
- Earman, J., 1992, Bayes or Bust: A Critical Examination of Bayesian Confirmation Theory, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Friedman, M., 1987, “Carnap’s Aufbau Reconsidered”, Noûs, 21: 521–45.
- Gillies, D., 2000, “Varieties of Propensity”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 51: 807–835.
- Gödel, K., 1995, “Is Mathematics Syntax of Language?” in K. Gödel, Collected Works (Volume 3), S. Fefferman, et al. (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 334–362.
- Hempel, C.G., 1950, “Problems and Changes in the Empiricist Criterion of Meaning”, Revue International de Philosophie, 11: 41–63.
- –––, 1951, “The Concept of Cognitive Significance: A Reconsideration”, Proceedings of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, 80: 61–77.
- Howson, C. and Urbach, P., 1993, Scientific Reasoning: The Bayesian Approach, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- –––, 2004, Subjective Probability: The Real Thing, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Kaplan, D., 1975, “Significance and Analyticity: A Comment on Some Recent Proposals of Carnap”, in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist, J. Hintikka (ed.), Dordrecht, Boston: Reidel, 87–94.
- Kemeny, J., 1955, “Fair Bets and Inductive Probabilities”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 20: 263–73.
- Kuhn, T., 1962, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, International Encyclopedia of Unified Science (Volume II, Number 2), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Passmore, J., 1967, “Logical Positivism”, The Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 5), P. Edwards (ed.), New York: Macmillan, 52–57.
- Popper, K., 1935/1959, Logik der Forschung, translated by the author as The Logic of Scientific Discovery, New York: Basic Books.
- –––, 1957, “The Propensity Interpretation of the Calculus of Probability”, S. Körner (ed.), The Colston Papers, 9: 65–70.
- –––, 1959, “The Propensity interpretation of Probablity”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 10: 25–42.
- Quine, W.V., 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, Philosophical Review, 60: 20–43.
- –––, 1963, “Carnap and Logical Truth”, in The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, P. Schilpp (ed.), LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 385–406.
- –––, 1974, The Roots of Reference, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Reichenbach, H., 1916/2008, Der Begriff der Wahrscheinlichkeit für die mathematische Darstellung der Wirklichkeit, edited and translated by F. Eberhardt and C. Glymour as The Concept of Probability in the Mathematical Representation of Reality, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- –––, 1938, Experience and Prediction: An Analysis of the Foundations and the Structure of Knowledge, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Richardson, A., 1998, Carnap’s Construction of the World: The Aufbau and the Emergence of Logical Empiricism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Russell, B., 1914, Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Salmon, W., 1967, The Foundations of Scientific Inference, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press.
- –––, 1968, “The Justification of Inductive Rules of Inference”, in The Problem of Inductive Logic, I. Lakatos (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland, 24–43.
- –––, 1970, ““Statistical Explanation”, in Nature and Function of Scientific Theories, R. Colodny (ed.), Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 173–231.
- Schilpp, P. (ed.), 1974, The Philosophy of Karl Popper, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Suppes, P., 1978, “The Plurality of Science”, in PSA 1978: Proceedings of the 1978 Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association (Volume 2), P. Asquith and I. Hacking (eds.), East Lansing, MI: Philosophy of Science Association, 3–16.
- Tarski, A., 1936a/1956, “Der Wahrheitsbegriff in den formalisierten Sprachen”, translated by J.H. Woodger as “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages” in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, by A. Tarski, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 152–278.
- –––, 1936b/1956, “Über den Begriff den logischen Folgerung”, translated by J.H. Woodger as “On the Concept of Logical Consequence”, in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, by A. Tarski, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 409–20.
- Uebel, T., 2012, “Carnap, Philosophy, and ‘Politics in its Broadest Sense’”, in Carnap and the Legacy of Logical Empiricism, R. Creath (ed.), Vienna: Springer, 133–145.
- –––, 2013, “Logical Positivism – Logical Empiricism: What’s in a Name?”, Prespectives of Science, 21: 58–99.
- Waismann, F., 1967/1979, Wittgenstein und der Wiener Kreis, translated by J. Schulte and B. McGinnis as Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Wittgenstein, L., 1921/1922, Logische-Philosophische Abhandlung, translated by C.K. Ogden as Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
- Zabell, S. L., 2007, “Carnap on Probability and Induction”, in The Cambridge Companion to Carnap, M. Friedman and R. Creath (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 273-294.
Selected Secondary Literature
- Awodey, S. and A. W. Carus, 2004, “How Carnap Could Have Replied to Gödel”, in S. Awodey and C. Klein (eds.), Carnap Brought Home: The View From Jena, LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 203-223.
- Blatti, S. and S. Lapointe (eds.), 2016, Ontology After Carnap, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Cartwright, N. , J. Cat, L. Fleck, and T. Übel, 1996, Otto Neurath: Philosophy Between Science and Politics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Carus, A.W., 2007, Carnap and Twentieth-Century Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Friedman, M., 1987, “Carnap’s Aufbau Reconsidered”, Noûs, 21: 521–45.
- –––, 1999, Reconsidering Logical Positivism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2000, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Friedman, M. and R. Creath (eds.), 2007, The Cambridge Companion to Carnap, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Frost-Arnold, G., 2013, Carnap, Tarski, and Quine at Harvard: Conversations of Logic, Mathematics, and Science, Chicago: Open Court.
- Hintikka, J. (ed.), 1962, Logic and Language: Studies Dedicated to Professor Rudolf Carnap on the Occasion of His Seventieth Birthday, Dordrecht: Reidel.
- ––– (ed.), 1975, Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist: Materials and Perspectives, Dordrecht: Reidel.
- Howson, C., 1973, “Must the Logical Probability of Laws be Zero?” British Journal for Philosophy of Science, 24: 153–163.
- Jeffrey, R., 1975, “Probability and Falsification: Critique of the Popper Program”, Synthese, 30: 95–117.
- –––, 2004, Subjective Probability: The Real Thing, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Mancosu, P., “Harvard 1940–41: Tarski, Carnap, and Quine on a Finitistic Language of Mathematics for Science”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 26: 327–57.
- Miller, D., 1997, “Sir Karl Raimund Popper, CH, FBA”, Biographical Memoirs of Fellows of the Royal Society of London”, 43: 367–409.
- Parrini, P., W. Salmon, and M. Salmon (eds.), 2003, Logical Empiricism: Historical and Contemporary Perspectives, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press.
- Rescher, N. (ed.), 1985, The Heritage of Logical Positivism, Lanham, MD: University Presses of America.
- Rescher, N., 2006, “The Berlin School of Logical Empiricism and Its Legacy, Erkenntnis, 64: 281–304.
- Richardson, A., 1998, Carnap’s Construction of the World: The Aufbauand the Emergence of Logical Empiricism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Richardson, A. and Übel, T. (eds.), 2007, The Cambridge Companion to Logical Empiricism, New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Salmon, W. and G. Wolters (eds.), 1994, Language, Logic, and the Structure of Scientific Theories: The Carnap-Reichenbach Centennial, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, and Konstanz, Germany: University of Konstanz Press.
- Sarkar, S., (ed.), 1992, Synthese: Carnap: A Centenary Reappraisal, Volume 93, Numbers 1–2.
- Schilpp, P. (ed.), 1963, The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Spohn, W. (ed.), 1991, Erkenntnis: Special Volume in Honor of Rudolf Carnap and Hans Reichenbach, Volume 35, Numbers 1–3.
- Stadler, F., 1997/2001, Studien zum Wiener Kreis: Entwicklung und Wirkung des Logischen Empiricismus im Kontext, translated by C. Nielsen, et al. as The Vienna Circle: Studies in the Origins, Development and Influence of Logical Empiricism, Vienna: Springer.
- Übel, T., 2007, Empiricism at the Crossroads: The Vienna Circle’s Protocol-Sentence Debate Revisited, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Zabell, S. L., 1996, “Confirming Universal Generalizations”, Erkenntnis, 45: 267–283.
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