First published Fri Apr 8, 2005; substantive revision Fri Aug 11, 2017

This essay focuses on personal love, or the love of particular persons as such. Part of the philosophical task in understanding personal love is to distinguish the various kinds of personal love. For example, the way in which I love my wife is seemingly very different from the way I love my mother, my child, and my friend. This task has typically proceeded hand-in-hand with philosophical analyses of these kinds of personal love, analyses that in part respond to various puzzles about love. Can love be justified? If so, how? What is the value of personal love? What impact does love have on the autonomy of both the lover and the beloved?

1. Preliminary Distinctions

In ordinary conversations, we often say things like the following:

  1. I love chocolate (or skiing).
  2. I love doing philosophy (or being a father).
  3. I love my dog (or cat).
  4. I love my wife (or mother or child or friend).

However, what is meant by ‘love’ differs from case to case. (1) may be understood as meaning merely that I like this thing or activity very much. In (2) the implication is typically that I find engaging in a certain activity or being a certain kind of person to be a part of my identity and so what makes my life worth living; I might just as well say that I value these. By contrast, (3) and (4) seem to indicate a mode of concern that cannot be neatly assimilated to anything else. Thus, we might understand the sort of love at issue in (4) to be, roughly, a matter of caring about another person as the person she is, for her own sake. (Accordingly, (3) may be understood as a kind of deficient mode of the sort of love we typically reserve for persons.) Philosophical accounts of love have focused primarily on the sort of personal love at issue in (4); such personal love will be the focus here.

Even within personal love, philosophers from the ancient Greeks on have traditionally distinguished three notions that can properly be called “love”: eros, agape, and philia. It will be useful to distinguish these three and say something about how contemporary discussions typically blur these distinctions (sometimes intentionally so) or use them for other purposes.

Eros’ originally meant love in the sense of a kind of passionate desire for an object, typically sexual passion (Liddell et al., 1940). Nygren (1953a,b) describes eros as the “‘love of desire,’ or acquisitive love” and therefore as egocentric (1953b, p. 89). Soble (1989b, 1990) similarly describes eros as “selfish” and as a response to the merits of the beloved—especially the beloved’s goodness or beauty. What is evident in Soble’s description of eros is a shift away from the sexual: to love something in the “erosic” sense (to use the term Soble coins) is to love it in a way that, by being responsive to its merits, is dependent on reasons. Such an understanding of eros is encouraged by Plato’s discussion in the Symposium, in which Socrates understands sexual desire to be a deficient response to physical beauty in particular, a response which ought to be developed into a response to the beauty of a person’s soul and, ultimately, into a response to the form, Beauty.

Soble’s intent in understanding eros to be a reason-dependent sort of love is to articulate a sharp contrast with agape, a sort of love that does not respond to the value of its object. ‘Agape’ has come, primarily through the Christian tradition, to mean the sort of love God has for us persons, as well as our love for God and, by extension, of our love for each other—a kind of brotherly love. In the paradigm case of God’s love for us, agape is “spontaneous and unmotivated,” revealing not that we merit that love but that God’s nature is love (Nygren 1953b, p. 85). Rather than responding to antecedent value in its object, agape instead is supposed to create value in its object and therefore to initiate our fellowship with God (pp. 87–88). Consequently, Badhwar (2003, p. 58) characterizes agape as “independent of the loved individual’s fundamental characteristics as the particular person she is”; and Soble (1990, p. 5) infers that agape, in contrast to eros, is therefore not reason dependent but is rationally “incomprehensible,” admitting at best of causal or historical explanations.[1]

Finally, ‘philia’ originally meant a kind of affectionate regard or friendly feeling towards not just one’s friends but also possibly towards family members, business partners, and one’s country at large (Liddell et al., 1940; Cooper, 1977). Like eros, philia is generally (but not universally) understood to be responsive to (good) qualities in one’s beloved. This similarity between eros and philia has led Thomas (1987) to wonder whether the only difference between romantic love and friendship is the sexual involvement of the former—and whether that is adequate to account for the real differences we experience. The distinction between eros and philia becomes harder to draw with Soble’s attempt to diminish the importance of the sexual in eros (1990).

Maintaining the distinctions among eros, agape, and philia becomes even more difficult when faced with contemporary theories of love (including romantic love) and friendship. For, as discussed below, some theories of romantic love understand it along the lines of the agape tradition as creating value in the beloved (cf. Section 4.2), and other accounts of romantic love treat sexual activity as merely the expression of what otherwise looks very much like friendship.

Given the focus here on personal love, Christian conceptions of God’s love for persons (and vice versa) will be omitted, and the distinction between eros and philia will be blurred—as it typically is in contemporary accounts. Instead, the focus here will be on these contemporary understandings of love, including romantic love, understood as an attitude we take towards other persons.[2]

In providing an account of love, philosophical analyses must be careful to distinguish love from other positive attitudes we take towards persons, such as liking. Intuitively, love differs from such attitudes as liking in terms of its “depth,” and the problem is to elucidate the kind of “depth” we intuitively find love to have. Some analyses do this in part by providing thin conceptions of what liking amounts to. Thus, Singer (1991) and Brown (1987) understand liking to be a matter of desiring, an attitude that at best involves its object having only instrumental (and not intrinsic) value. Yet this seems inadequate: surely there are attitudes towards persons intermediate between having a desire with a person as its object and loving the person. I can care about a person for her own sake and not merely instrumentally, and yet such caring does not on its own amount to (non-deficiently) loving her, for it seems I can care about my dog in exactly the same way, a kind of caring which is insufficiently personal for love.

It is more common to distinguish loving from liking via the intuition that the “depth” of love is to be explained in terms of a notion of identification: to love someone is somehow to identify yourself with him, whereas no such notion of identification is involved in liking. As Nussbaum puts it, “The choice between one potential love and another can feel, and be, like a choice of a way of life, a decision to dedicate oneself to these values rather than these” (1990, p. 328); liking clearly does not have this sort of “depth” (see also Helm 2010; Bagley 2015). Whether love involves some kind of identification, and if so exactly how to understand such identification, is a central bone of contention among the various analyses of love. In particular, Whiting (2013) argues that the appeal to a notion of identification distorts our understanding of the sort of motivation love can provide, for taken literally it implies that love motivates through self-interest rather than through the beloved’s interests. Thus, Whiting argues, central to love is the possibility that love takes the lover “outside herself”, potentially forgetting herself in being moved directly by the interests of the beloved. (Of course, we need not take the notion of identification literally in this way: in identifying with one’s beloved, one might have a concern for one’s beloved that is analogous to one’s concern for oneself; see Helm 2010.)

Another common way to distinguish love from other personal attitudes is in terms of a distinctive kind of evaluation, which itself can account for love’s “depth.” Again, whether love essentially involves a distinctive kind of evaluation, and if so how to make sense of that evaluation, is hotly disputed. Closely related to questions of evaluation are questions of justification: can we justify loving or continuing to love a particular person, and if so, how? For those who think the justification of love is possible, it is common to understand such justification in terms of evaluation, and the answers here affect various accounts’ attempts to make sense of the kind of constancy or commitment love seems to involve, as well as the sense in which love is directed at particular individuals.

In what follows, theories of love are tentatively and hesitantly classified into four types: love as union, love as robust concern, love as valuing, and love as an emotion. It should be clear, however, that particular theories classified under one type sometimes also include, without contradiction, ideas central to other types. The types identified here overlap to some extent, and in some cases classifying particular theories may involve excessive pigeonholing. (Such cases are noted below.) Part of the classificatory problem is that many accounts of love are quasi-reductionistic, understanding love in terms of notions like affection, evaluation, attachment, etc., which themselves never get analyzed. Even when these accounts eschew explicitly reductionistic language, very often little attempt is made to show how one such “aspect” of love is conceptually connected to others. As a result, there is no clear and obvious way to classify particular theories, let alone identify what the relevant classes should be.

2. Love as Union

The union view claims that love consists in the formation of (or the desire to form) some significant kind of union, a “we.” A central task for union theorists, therefore, is to spell out just what such a “we” comes to—whether it is literally a new entity in the world somehow composed of the lover and the beloved, or whether it is merely metaphorical. Variants of this view perhaps go back to Aristotle (cf. Sherman 1993) and can also be found in Montaigne ([E]) and Hegel (1997); contemporary proponents include Solomon (1981, 1988), Scruton (1986), Nozick (1989), Fisher (1990), and Delaney (1996).

Scruton, writing in particular about romantic love, claims that love exists “just so soon as reciprocity becomes community: that is, just so soon as all distinction between my interests and your interests is overcome” (1986, p. 230). The idea is that the union is a union of concern, so that when I act out of that concern it is not for my sake alone or for your sake alone but for our sake. Fisher (1990) holds a similar, but somewhat more moderate view, claiming that love is a partial fusion of the lovers’ cares, concerns, emotional responses, and actions. What is striking about both Scruton and Fisher is the claim that love requires the actual union of the lovers’ concerns, for it thus becomes clear that they conceive of love not so much as an attitude we take towards another but as a relationship: the distinction between your interests and mine genuinely disappears only when we together come to have shared cares, concerns, etc., and my merely having a certain attitude towards you is not enough for love. This provides content to the notion of a “we” as the (metaphorical?) subject of these shared cares and concerns, and as that for whose sake we act.

Solomon (1988) offers a union view as well, though one that tries “to make new sense out of ‘love’ through a literal rather than metaphoric sense of the ‘fusion’ of two souls” (p. 24, cf. Solomon 1981; however, it is unclear exactly what he means by a “soul” here and so how love can be a “literal” fusion of two souls). What Solomon has in mind is the way in which, through love, the lovers redefine their identities as persons in terms of the relationship: “Love is the concentration and the intensive focus of mutual definition on a single individual, subjecting virtually every personal aspect of one’s self to this process” (1988, p. 197). The result is that lovers come to share the interests, roles, virtues, and so on that constitute what formerly was two individual identities but now has become a shared identity, and they do so in part by each allowing the other to play an important role in defining his own identity.

Nozick (1989) offers a union view that differs from those of Scruton, Fisher, and Solomon in that Nozick thinks that what is necessary for love is merely the desire to form a “we,” together with the desire that your beloved reciprocates. Nonetheless, he claims that this “we” is “a new entity in the world…created by a new web of relationships between [the lovers] which makes them no longer separate” (p. 70). In spelling out this web of relationships, Nozick appeals to the lovers “pooling” not only their well-beings, in the sense that the well-being of each is tied up with that of the other, but also their autonomy, in that “each transfers some previous rights to make certain decisions unilaterally into a joint pool” (p. 71). In addition, Nozick claims, the lovers each acquire a new identity as a part of the “we,” a new identity constituted by their (a) wanting to be perceived publicly as a couple, (b) their attending to their pooled well-being, and (c) their accepting a “certain kind of division of labor” (p. 72):

A person in a we might find himself coming across something interesting to read yet leaving it for the other person, not because he himself would not be interested in it but because the other would be more interested, and one of them reading it is sufficient for it to be registered by the wider identity now shared, the we.[3]

Opponents of the union view have seized on claims like this as excessive: union theorists, they claim, take too literally the ontological commitments of this notion of a “we.” This leads to two specific criticisms of the union view. The first is that union views do away with individual autonomy. Autonomy, it seems, involves a kind of independence on the part of the autonomous agent, such that she is in control over not only what she does but also who she is, as this is constituted by her interests, values, concerns, etc. However, union views, by doing away with a clear distinction between your interests and mine, thereby undermine this sort of independence and so undermine the autonomy of the lovers. If autonomy is a part of the individual’s good, then, on the union view, love is to this extent bad; so much the worse for the union view (Singer 1994; Soble 1997). Moreover, Singer (1994) argues that a necessary part of having your beloved be the object of your love is respect for your beloved as the particular person she is, and this requires respecting her autonomy.

Union theorists have responded to this objection in several ways. Nozick (1989) seems to think of a loss of autonomy in love as a desirable feature of the sort of union lovers can achieve. Fisher (1990), somewhat more reluctantly, claims that the loss of autonomy in love is an acceptable consequence of love. Yet without further argument these claims seem like mere bullet biting. Solomon (1988, pp. 64ff) describes this “tension” between union and autonomy as “the paradox of love.” However, this a view that Soble (1997) derides: merely to call it a paradox, as Solomon does, is not to face up to the problem.

The second criticism involves a substantive view concerning love. Part of what it is to love someone, these opponents say, is to have concern for him for his sake. However, union views make such concern unintelligible and eliminate the possibility of both selfishness and self-sacrifice, for by doing away with the distinction between my interests and your interests they have in effect turned your interests into mine and vice versa (Soble 1997; see also Blum 1980, 1993). Some advocates of union views see this as a point in their favor: we need to explain how it is I can have concern for people other than myself, and the union view apparently does this by understanding your interests to be part of my own. And Delaney, responding to an apparent tension between our desire to be loved unselfishly (for fear of otherwise being exploited) and our desire to be loved for reasons (which presumably are attractive to our lover and hence have a kind of selfish basis), says (1996, p. 346):

Given my view that the romantic ideal is primarily characterized by a desire to achieve a profound consolidation of needs and interests through the formation of a we, I do not think a little selfishness of the sort described should pose a worry to either party.

The objection, however, lies precisely in this attempt to explain my concern for my beloved egoistically. As Whiting (1991, p. 10) puts it, such an attempt “strikes me as unnecessary and potentially objectionable colonization”: in love, I ought to be concerned with my beloved for her sake, and not because I somehow get something out of it. (This can be true whether my concern with my beloved is merely instrumental to my good or whether it is partly constitutive of my good.)

Although Whiting’s and Soble’s criticisms here succeed against the more radical advocates of the union view, they in part fail to acknowledge the kernel of truth to be gleaned from the idea of union. Whiting’s way of formulating the second objection in terms of an unnecessary egoism in part points to a way out: we persons are in part social creatures, and love is one profound mode of that sociality. Indeed, part of the point of union accounts is to make sense of this social dimension: to make sense of a way in which we can sometimes identify ourselves with others not merely in becoming interdependent with them (as Singer 1994, p. 165, suggests, understanding ‘interdependence’ to be a kind of reciprocal benevolence and respect) but rather in making who we are as persons be constituted in part by those we love (cf., e.g., Rorty 1986/1993; Nussbaum 1990).

Along these lines, Friedman (1998), taking her inspiration in part from Delaney (1996), argues that we should understand the sort of union at issue in love to be a kind of federation of selves:

On the federation model, a third unified entity is constituted by the interaction of the lovers, one which involves the lovers acting in concert across a range of conditions and for a range of purposes. This concerted action, however, does not erase the existence of the two lovers as separable and separate agents with continuing possibilities for the exercise of their own respective agencies. [p. 165]

Given that on this view the lovers do not give up their individual identities, there is no principled reason why the union view cannot make sense of the lover’s concern for her beloved for his sake.[4] Moreover, Friedman argues, once we construe union as federation, we can see that autonomy is not a zero-sum game; rather, love can both directly enhance the autonomy of each and promote the growth of various skills, like realistic and critical self-evaluation, that foster autonomy.

Nonetheless, this federation model is not without its problems—problems that affect other versions of the union view as well. For if the federation (or the “we”, as on Nozick’s view) is understood as a third entity, we need a clearer account than has been given of its ontological status and how it comes to be. Relevant here is the literature on shared intention and plural subjects. Gilbert (1989, 1996, 2000) has argued that we should take quite seriously the existence of a plural subject as an entity over and above its constituent members. Others, such as Tuomela (1984, 1995), Searle (1990), and Bratman (1999) are more cautious, treating such talk of “us” having an intention as metaphorical.

3. Love as Robust Concern

As this criticism of the union view indicates, many find caring about your beloved for her sake to be a part of what it is to love her. The robust concern view of love takes this to be the central and defining feature of love (cf. Taylor 1976; Newton-Smith 1989; Soble 1990, 1997; LaFollette 1996; Frankfurt 1999; White 2001). As Taylor puts it:

To summarize: if x loves y then x wants to benefit and be with y etc., and he has these wants (or at least some of them) because he believes y has some determinate characteristics ψ in virtue of which he thinks it worth while to benefit and be with y. He regards satisfaction of these wants as an end and not as a means towards some other end. [p. 157]

In conceiving of my love for you as constituted by my concern for you for your sake, the robust concern view rejects the idea, central to the union view, that love is to be understood in terms of the (literal or metaphorical) creation of a “we”: this concern for you is fundamentally my concern, even if it is for your sake and so not egoistic.[5]

At the heart of the robust concern view is the idea that love “is neither affective nor cognitive. It is volitional” (Frankfurt 1999, p. 129). Frankfurt continues:

That a person cares about or that he loves something has less to do with how things make him feel, or with his opinions about them, than with the more or less stable motivational structures that shape his preferences and that guide and limit his conduct.

This account analyzes caring about someone for her sake as a matter of being motivated in certain ways, in part as a response to what happens to one’s beloved. Of course, to understand love in terms of desires is not to leave other emotional responses out in the cold, for these emotions should be understood as consequences of desires. Thus, just as I can be emotionally crushed when one of my strong desires is disappointed, so too I can be emotionally crushed when things similarly go badly for my beloved. In this way Frankfurt (1999) tacitly, and White (2001) more explicitly, acknowledge the way in which my caring for my beloved for her sake results in my identity being transformed through her influence insofar as I become vulnerable to things that happen to her.

Not all robust concern theorists seem to accept this line, however; in particular, Taylor (1976) and Soble (1990) seem to have a strongly individualistic conception of persons that prevents my identity being bound up with my beloved in this sort of way, a kind of view that may seem to undermine the intuitive “depth” that love seems to have. (For more on this point, see Rorty 1986/1993.) In the middle is Stump (2006), who follows Aquinas in understanding love to involve not only the desire for your beloved’s well-being but also a desire for a certain kind of relationship with your beloved—as a parent or spouse or sibling or priest or friend, for example—a relationship within which you share yourself with and connect yourself to your beloved.[6]

One source of worry about the robust concern view is that it involves too passive an understanding of one’s beloved (Ebels-Duggan 2008). The thought is that on the robust concern view the lover merely tries to discover what the beloved’s well-being consists in and then acts to promote that, potentially by thwarting the beloved’s own efforts when the lover thinks those efforts would harm her well-being. This, however, would be disrespectful and demeaning, not the sort of attitude that love is. What robust concern views seem to miss, Ebels-Duggan suggests, is the way love involves interacting agents, each with a capacity for autonomy the recognition and engagement with which is an essential part of love. In response, advocates of the robust concern view might point out that promoting someone’s well-being normally requires promoting her autonomy (though they may maintain that this need not always be true: that paternalism towards a beloved can sometimes be justified and appropriate as an expression of one’s love). Moreover, we might plausibly think, it is only through the exercise of one’s autonomy that one can define one’s own well-being as a person, so that a lover’s failure to respect the beloved’s autonomy would be a failure to promote her well-being and therefore not an expression of love, contrary to what Ebels-Duggan suggests. Consequently, it might seem, robust concern views can counter this objection by offering an enriched conception of what it is to be a person and so of the well-being of persons.

Another source of worry is that the robust concern view offers too thin a conception of love. By emphasizing robust concern, this view understands other features we think characteristic of love, such as one’s emotional responsiveness to one’s beloved, to be the effects of that concern rather than constituents of it. Thus Velleman (1999) argues that robust concern views, by understanding love merely as a matter of aiming at a particular end (viz., the welfare of one’s beloved), understand love to be merely conative. However, he claims, love can have nothing to do with desires, offering as a counterexample the possibility of loving a troublemaking relation whom you do not want to be with, whose well being you do not want to promote, etc. Similarly, Badhwar (2003) argues that such a “teleological” view of love makes it mysterious how “we can continue to love someone long after death has taken him beyond harm or benefit” (p. 46). Moreover Badhwar argues, if love is essentially a desire, then it implies that we lack something; yet love does not imply this and, indeed, can be felt most strongly at times when we feel our lives most complete and lacking in nothing. Consequently, Velleman and Badhwar conclude, love need not involve any desire or concern for the well-being of one’s beloved.

This conclusion, however, seems too hasty, for such examples can be accommodated within the robust concern view. Thus, the concern for your relative in Velleman’s example can be understood to be present but swamped by other, more powerful desires to avoid him. Indeed, keeping the idea that you want to some degree to benefit him, an idea Velleman rejects, seems to be essential to understanding the conceptual tension between loving someone and not wanting to help him, a tension Velleman does not fully acknowledge. Similarly, continued love for someone who has died can be understood on the robust concern view as parasitic on the former love you had for him when he was still alive: your desires to benefit him get transformed, through your subsequent understanding of the impossibility of doing so, into wishes.[7] Finally, the idea of concern for your beloved’s well-being need not imply the idea that you lack something, for such concern can be understood in terms of the disposition to be vigilant for occasions when you can come to his aid and consequently to have the relevant occurrent desires. All of this seems fully compatible with the robust concern view.

One might also question whether Velleman and Badhwar make proper use of their examples of loving your meddlesome relation or someone who has died. For although we can understand these as genuine cases of love, they are nonetheless deficient cases and ought therefore be understood as parasitic on the standard cases. Readily to accommodate such deficient cases of love into a philosophical analysis as being on a par with paradigm cases, and to do so without some special justification, is dubious.

Nonetheless, the robust concern view as it stands does not seem properly able to account for the intuitive “depth” of love and so does not seem properly to distinguish loving from liking. Although, as noted above, the robust concern view can begin to make some sense of the way in which the lover’s identity is altered by the beloved, it understands this only an effect of love, and not as a central part of what love consists in.[8]

4. Love as Valuing

A third kind of view of love understands love to be a distinctive mode of valuing a person. As the distinction between eros and agape in Section 1 indicates, there are at least two ways to construe this in terms of whether the lover values the beloved because she is valuable, or whether the beloved comes to be valuable to the lover as a result of her loving him. The former view, which understands the lover as appraising the value of the beloved in loving him, is the topic of Section 4.1, whereas the latter view, which understands her as bestowing value on him, will be discussed in Section 4.2.

4.1 Love as Appraisal of Value

Velleman (1999, 2008) offers an appraisal view of love, understanding love to be fundamentally a matter of acknowledging and responding in a distinctive way to the value of the beloved. (For a very different appraisal view of love, see Kolodny 2003.) Understanding this more fully requires understanding both the kind of value of the beloved to which one responds and the distinctive kind of response to such value that love is. Nonetheless, it should be clear that what makes an account be an appraisal view of love is not the mere fact that love is understood to involve appraisal; many other accounts do so, and it is typical of robust concern accounts, for example (cf. the quote from Taylor above, Section 3). Rather, appraisal views are distinctive in understanding love to consist in that appraisal.

In articulating the kind of value love involves, Velleman, following Kant, distinguishes dignity from price. To have a price, as the economic metaphor suggests, is to have a value that can be compared to the value of other things with prices, such that it is intelligible to exchange without loss items of the same value. By contrast, to have dignity is to have a value such that comparisons of relative value become meaningless. Material goods are normally understood to have prices, but we persons have dignity: no substitution of one person for another can preserve exactly the same value, for something of incomparable worth would be lost (and gained) in such a substitution.

On this Kantian view, our dignity as persons consists in our rational nature: our capacity both to be actuated by reasons that we autonomously provide ourselves in setting our own ends and to respond appropriately to the intrinsic values we discover in the world. Consequently, one important way in which we exercise our rational natures is to respond with respect to the dignity of other persons (a dignity that consists in part in their capacity for respect): respect just is the required minimal response to the dignity of persons. What makes a response to a person be that of respect, Velleman claims, still following Kant, is that it “arrests our self-love” and thereby prevents us from treating him as a means to our ends (p. 360).

Given this, Velleman claims that love is similarly a response to the dignity of persons, and as such it is the dignity of the object of our love that justifies that love. However, love and respect are different kinds of responses to the same value. For love arrests not our self-love but rather

our tendencies toward emotional self-protection from another person, tendencies to draw ourselves in and close ourselves off from being affected by him. Love disarms our emotional defenses; it makes us vulnerable to the other. [1999, p. 361]

This means that the concern, attraction, sympathy, etc. that we normally associate with love are not constituents of love but are rather its normal effects, and love can remain without them (as in the case of the love for a meddlesome relative one cannot stand being around). Moreover, this provides Velleman with a clear account of the intuitive “depth” of love: it is essentially a response to persons as such, and to say that you love your dog is therefore to be confused.

Of course, we do not respond with love to the dignity of every person we meet, nor are we somehow required to: love, as the disarming of our emotional defenses in a way that makes us especially vulnerable to another, is the optional maximal response to others’ dignity. What, then, explains the selectivity of love—why I love some people and not others? The answer lies in the contingent fit between the way some people behaviorally express their dignity as persons and the way I happen to respond to those expressions by becoming emotionally vulnerable to them. The right sort of fit makes someone “lovable” by me (1999, p. 372), and my responding with love in these cases is a matter of my “really seeing” this person in a way that I fail to do with others who do not fit with me in this way. By ‘lovable’ here Velleman seems to mean able to be loved, not worthy of being loved, for nothing Velleman says here speaks to a question about the justification of my loving this person rather than that. Rather, what he offers is an explanation of the selectivity of my love, an explanation that as a matter of fact makes my response be that of love rather than mere respect.

This understanding of the selectivity of love as something that can be explained but not justified is potentially troubling. For we ordinarily think we can justify not only my loving you rather than someone else but also and more importantly the constancy of my love: my continuing to love you even as you change in certain fundamental ways (but not others). As Delaney (1996, p. 347) puts the worry about constancy:

while you seem to want it to be true that, were you to become a schmuck, your lover would continue to love you,…you also want it to be the case that your lover would never love a schmuck.

The issue here is not merely that we can offer explanations of the selectivity of my love, of why I do not love schmucks; rather, at issue is the discernment of love, of loving and continuing to love for good reasons as well as of ceasing to love for good reasons. To have these good reasons seems to involve attributing different values to you now rather than formerly or rather than to someone else, yet this is precisely what Velleman denies is the case in making the distinction between love and respect the way he does.

It is also questionable whether Velleman can even explain the selectivity of love in terms of the “fit” between your expressions and my sensitivities. For the relevant sensitivities on my part are emotional sensitivities: the lowering of my emotional defenses and so becoming emotionally vulnerable to you. Thus, I become vulnerable to the harms (or goods) that befall you and so sympathetically feel your pain (or joy). Such emotions are themselves assessable for warrant, and now we can ask why my disappointment that you lost the race is warranted, but my being disappointed that a mere stranger lost would not be warranted. The intuitive answer is that I love you but not him. However, this answer is unavailable to Velleman, because he thinks that what makes my response to your dignity that of love rather than respect is precisely that I feel such emotions, and to appeal to my love in explaining the emotions therefore seems viciously circular.

Although these problems are specific to Velleman’s account, the difficulty can be generalized to any appraisal account of love (such as that offered in Kolodny 2003). For if love is an appraisal, it needs to be distinguished from other forms of appraisal, including our evaluative judgments. On the one hand, to try to distinguish love as an appraisal from other appraisals in terms of love’s having certain effects on our emotional and motivational life (as on Velleman’s account) is unsatisfying because it ignores part of what needs to be explained: why the appraisal of love has these effects and yet judgments with the same evaluative content do not. Indeed, this question is crucial if we are to understand the intuitive “depth” of love, for without an answer to this question we do not understand why love should have the kind of centrality in our lives it manifestly does.[9] On the other hand, to bundle this emotional component into the appraisal itself would be to turn the view into either the robust concern view (Section 3) or a variant of the emotion view (Section 5.1).

4.2 Love as Bestowal of Value

In contrast to Velleman, Singer (1991, 1994, 2009) understands love to be fundamentally a matter of bestowing value on the beloved. To bestow value on another is to project a kind of intrinsic value onto him. Indeed, this fact about love is supposed to distinguish love from liking: “Love is an attitude with no clear objective,” whereas liking is inherently teleological (1991, p. 272). As such, there are no standards of correctness for bestowing such value, and this is how love differs from other personal attitudes like gratitude, generosity, and condescension: “love…confers importance no matter what the object is worth” (p. 273). Consequently, Singer thinks, love is not an attitude that can be justified in any way.

What is it, exactly, to bestow this kind of value on someone? It is, Singer says, a kind of attachment and commitment to the beloved, in which one comes to treat him as an end in himself and so to respond to his ends, interests, concerns, etc. as having value for their own sake. This means in part that the bestowal of value reveals itself “by caring about the needs and interests of the beloved, by wishing to benefit or protect her, by delighting in her achievements,” etc. (p. 270). This sounds very much like the robust concern view, yet the bestowal view differs in understanding such robust concern to be the effect of the bestowal of value that is love rather than itself what constitutes love: in bestowing value on my beloved, I make him be valuable in such a way that I ought to respond with robust concern.

For it to be intelligible that I have bestowed value on someone, I must therefore respond appropriately to him as valuable, and this requires having some sense of what his well-being is and of what affects that well-being positively or negatively. Yet having this sense requires in turn knowing what his strengths and deficiencies are, and this is a matter of appraising him in various ways. Bestowal thus presupposes a kind of appraisal, as a way of “really seeing” the beloved and attending to him. Nonetheless, Singer claims, it is the bestowal that is primary for understanding what love consists in: the appraisal is required only so that the commitment to one’s beloved and his value as thus bestowed has practical import and is not “a blind submission to some unknown being” (1991, p. 272; see also Singer 1994, pp. 139ff).

Singer is walking a tightrope in trying to make room for appraisal in his account of love. Insofar as the account is fundamentally a bestowal account, Singer claims that love cannot be justified, that we bestow the relevant kind of value “gratuitously.” This suggests that love is blind, that it does not matter what our beloved is like, which seems patently false. Singer tries to avoid this conclusion by appealing to the role of appraisal: it is only because we appraise another as having certain virtues and vices that we come to bestow value on him. Yet the “because” here, since it cannot justify the bestowal, is at best a kind of contingent causal explanation. [10] In this respect, Singer’s account of the selectivity of love is much the same as Velleman’s, and it is liable to the same criticism: it makes unintelligible the way in which our love can be discerning for better or worse reasons. Indeed, this failure to make sense of the idea that love can be justified is a problem for any bestowal view. For either (a) a bestowal itself cannot be justified (as on Singer’s account), in which case the justification of love is impossible, or (b) a bestowal can be justified, in which case it is hard to make sense of value as being bestowed rather than there antecedently in the object as the grounds of that “bestowal.”

More generally, a proponent of the bestowal view needs to be much clearer than Singer is in articulating precisely what a bestowal is. What is the value that I create in a bestowal, and how can my bestowal create it? On a crude Humean view, the answer might be that the value is something projected onto the world through my pro-attitudes, like desire. Yet such a view would be inadequate, since the projected value, being relative to a particular individual, would do no theoretical work, and the account would essentially be a variant of the robust concern view. Moreover, in providing a bestowal account of love, care is needed to distinguish love from other personal attitudes such as admiration and respect: do these other attitudes involve bestowal? If so, how does the bestowal in these cases differ from the bestowal of love? If not, why not, and what is so special about love that requires a fundamentally different evaluative attitude than admiration and respect?

Nonetheless, there is a kernel of truth in the bestowal view: there is surely something right about the idea that love is creative and not merely a response to antecedent value, and accounts of love that understand the kind of evaluation implicit in love merely in terms of appraisal seem to be missing something. Precisely what may be missed will be discussed below in Section 6.

4.3 An Intermediate Position?

Perhaps there is room for an understanding of love and its relation to value that is intermediate between appraisal and bestowal accounts. After all, if we think of appraisal as something like perception, a matter of responding to what is out there in the world, and of bestowal as something like action, a matter of doing something and creating something, we should recognize that the responsiveness central to appraisal may itself depend on our active, creative choices. Thus, just as we must recognize that ordinary perception depends on our actively directing our attention and deploying concepts, interpretations, and even arguments in order to perceive things accurately, so too we might think our vision of our beloved’s valuable properties that is love also depends on our actively attending to and interpreting him. Something like this is Jollimore’s view (2011). According to Jollimore, in loving someone we actively attend to his valuable properties in a way that we take to provide us with reasons to treat him preferentially. Although we may acknowledge that others might have such properties even to a greater degree than our beloved does, we do not attend to and appreciate such properties in others in the same way we do those in our beloveds; indeed, we find our appreciation of our beloved’s valuable properties to “silence” our similar appreciation of those in others. (In this way, Jollimore thinks, we can solve the problem of fungibility, discussed below in Section 6.) Likewise, in perceiving our beloved’s actions and character, we do so through the lens of such an appreciation, which will tend as to “silence” interpretations inconsistent with that appreciation. In this way, love involves finding one’s beloved to be valuable in a way that involves elements of both appraisal (insofar as one must thereby be responsive to valuable properties one’s beloved really has) and bestowal (insofar as through one’s attention and committed appreciation of these properties they come to have special significance for one).

One might object that this conception of love as silencing the special value of others or to negative interpretations of our beloveds is irrational in a way that love is not. For, it might seem, such “silencing” is merely a matter of our blinding ourselves to how things really are. Yet Jollimore claims that this sense in which love is blind is not objectionable, for (a) we can still intellectually recognize the things that love’s vision silences, and (b) there really is no impartial perspective we can take on the values things have, and love is one appropriate sort of partial perspective from which the value of persons can be manifest. Nonetheless, one might wonder about whether that perspective of love itself can be distorted and what the norms are in terms of which such distortions are intelligible. Furthermore, it may seem that Jollimore’s attempt to reconcile appraisal and bestowal fails to appreciate the underlying metaphysical difficulty: appraisal is a response to value that is antecedently there, whereas bestowal is the creation of value that was not antecedently there. Consequently, it might seem, appraisal and bestowal are mutually exclusive and cannot be reconciled in the way Jollimore hopes.

Whereas Jollimore tries to combine separate elements of appraisal and of bestowal in a single account, Helm (2010) and Bagley (2015) offer accounts that reject the metaphysical presupposition that values must be either prior to love (as with appraisal) or posterior to love (as with bestowal), instead understanding the love and the values to emerge simultaneously. Thus, Helm presents a detailed account of valuing in terms of the emotions, arguing that while we can understand individual emotions as appraisals, responding to values already their in their objects, these values are bestowed on those objects via broad, holistic patterns of emotions. How this amounts to an account of love will be discussed in Section 5.2, below. Bagley (2015) instead appeals to a metaphor of improvisation, arguing that just as jazz musicians jointly make determinate the content of their musical ideas through on-going processes of their expression, so too lovers jointly engage in “deep improvisation”, thereby working out of their values and identities through the on-going process of living their lives together. These values are thus something the lovers jointly construct through the process of recognizing and responding to those very values. To love someone is thus to engage with them as partners in such “deep improvisation”. (This account is similar to Helm (2008, 2010)’s account of plural agency, which he uses to provide an account of friendship and other loving relationships; see the discussion of shared activity in the entry on friendship.)

5. Emotion Views

Given these problems with the accounts of love as valuing, perhaps we should turn to the emotions. For emotions just are responses to objects that combine evaluation, motivation, and a kind of phenomenology, all central features of the attitude of love.

Many accounts of love claim that it is an emotion; these include: Wollheim 1984, Rorty 1986/1993, Brown 1987, Hamlyn 1989, Baier 1991, and Badhwar 2003.[11] Thus, Hamlyn (1989, p. 219) says:

It would not be a plausible move to defend any theory of the emotions to which love and hate seemed exceptions by saying that love and hate are after all not emotions. I have heard this said, but it does seem to me a desperate move to make. If love and hate are not emotions what is?

The difficulty with this claim, as Rorty (1980) argues, is that the word, ‘emotion,’ does not seem to pick out a homogeneous collection of mental states, and so various theories claiming that love is an emotion mean very different things. Consequently, what are here labeled “emotion views” are divided into those that understand love to be a particular kind of evaluative-cum-motivational response to an object, whether that response is merely occurrent or dispositional (‘emotions proper,’ see Section 5.1, below), and those that understand love to involve a collection of related and interconnected emotions proper (‘emotion complexes,’ see Section 5.2, below).

5.1 Love as Emotion Proper

An emotion proper is a kind of “evaluative-cum-motivational response to an object”; what does this mean? Emotions are generally understood to have several objects. The target of an emotion is that at which the emotion is directed: if I am afraid or angry at you, then you are the target. In responding to you with fear or anger, I am implicitly evaluating you in a particular way, and this evaluation—called the formal object—is the kind of evaluation of the target that is distinctive of a particular emotion type. Thus, in fearing you, I implicitly evaluate you as somehow dangerous, whereas in being angry at you I implicitly evaluate you as somehow offensive. Yet emotions are not merely evaluations of their targets; they in part motivate us to behave in certain ways, both rationally (by motivating action to avoid the danger) and arationally (via certain characteristic expressions, such as slamming a door out of anger). Moreover, emotions are generally understood to involve a phenomenological component, though just how to understand the characteristic “feel” of an emotion and its relation to the evaluation and motivation is hotly disputed. Finally, emotions are typically understood to be passions: responses that we feel imposed on us as if from the outside, rather than anything we actively do. (For more on the philosophy of emotions, see entry on emotion.)

What then are we saying when we say that love is an emotion proper? According to Brown (1987, p. 14), emotions as occurrent mental states are “abnormal bodily changes caused by the agent’s evaluation or appraisal of some object or situation that the agent believes to be of concern to him or her.” He spells this out by saying that in love, we “cherish” the person for having “a particular complex of instantiated qualities” that is “open-ended” so that we can continue to love the person even as she changes over time (pp. 106–7). These qualities, which include historical and relational qualities, are evaluated in love as worthwhile.[12] All of this seems aimed at spelling out what love’s formal object is, a task that is fundamental to understanding love as an emotion proper. Thus, Brown seems to say that love’s formal object is just being worthwhile (or, given his examples, perhaps: worthwhile as a person), and he resists being any more specific than this in order to preserve the open-endedness of love. Hamlyn (1989) offers a similar account, saying (p. 228):

With love the difficulty is to find anything of this kind [i.e., a formal object] which is uniquely appropriate to love. My thesis is that there is nothing of this kind that must be so, and that this differentiates it and hate from the other emotions.

Hamlyn goes on to suggest that love and hate might be primordial emotions, a kind of positive or negative “feeling towards,” presupposed by all other emotions.[13]

The trouble with these accounts of love as an emotion proper is that they provide too thin a conception of love. In Hamlyn’s case, love is conceived as a fairly generic pro-attitude, rather than as the specific kind of distinctively personal attitude discussed here. In Brown’s case, spelling out the formal object of love as simply being worthwhile (as a person) fails to distinguish love from other evaluative responses like admiration and respect. Part of the problem seems to be the rather simple account of what an emotion is that Brown and Hamlyn use as their starting point: if love is an emotion, then the understanding of what an emotion is must be enriched considerably to accommodate love. Yet it is not at all clear whether the idea of an “emotion proper” can be adequately enriched so as to do so.

5.2 Love as Emotion Complex

The emotion complex view, which understands love to be a complex emotional attitude towards another person, may initially seem to hold out great promise to overcome the problems of alternative types of views. By articulating the emotional interconnections between persons, it could offer a satisfying account of the “depth” of love without the excesses of the union view and without the overly narrow teleological focus of the robust concern view; and because these emotional interconnections are themselves evaluations, it could offer an understanding of love as simultaneously evaluative, without needing to specify a single formal object of love. However, the devil is in the details.

Rorty (1986/1993) does not try to present a complete account of love; rather, she focuses on the idea that “relational psychological attitudes” which, like love, essentially involve emotional and desiderative responses, exhibit historicity: “they arise from, and are shaped by, dynamic interactions between a subject and an object” (p. 73). In part this means that what makes an attitude be one of love is not the presence of a state that we can point to at a particular time within the lover; rather, love is to be “identified by a characteristic narrative history” (p. 75). Moreover, Rorty argues, the historicity of love involves the lover’s being permanently transformed by loving who he does.

Baier (1991), seeming to pick up on this understanding of love as exhibiting historicity, says (p. 444):

Love is not just an emotion people feel toward other people, but also a complex tying together of the emotions that two or a few more people have; it is a special form of emotional interdependence.

To a certain extent, such emotional interdependence involves feeling sympathetic emotions, so that, for example, I feel disappointed and frustrated on behalf of my beloved when she fails, and joyful when she succeeds. However, Baier insists, love is “more than just the duplication of the emotion of each in a sympathetic echo in the other” (p. 442); the emotional interdependence of the lovers involves also appropriate follow-up responses to the emotional predicaments of your beloved. Two examples Baier gives (pp. 443–44) are a feeling of “mischievous delight” at your beloved’s temporary bafflement, and amusement at her embarrassment. The idea is that in a loving relationship your beloved gives you permission to feel such emotions when no one else is permitted to do so, and a condition of her granting you that permission is that you feel these emotions “tenderly.” Moreover, you ought to respond emotionally to your beloved’s emotional responses to you: by feeling hurt when she is indifferent to you, for example. All of these foster the sort of emotional interdependence Baier is after—a kind of intimacy you have with your beloved.

Badhwar (2003, p. 46) similarly understands love to be a matter of “one’s overall emotional orientation towards a person—the complex of perceptions, thoughts, and feelings”; as such, love is a matter of having a certain “character structure.” Central to this complex emotional orientation, Badhwar thinks, is what she calls the “look of love”: “an ongoing [emotional] affirmation of the loved object as worthy of existence…for her own sake” (p. 44), an affirmation that involves taking pleasure in your beloved’s well-being. Moreover, Badhwar claims, the look of love also provides to the beloved reliable testimony concerning the quality of the beloved’s character and actions (p. 57).

There is surely something very right about the idea that love, as an attitude central to deeply personal relationships, should not be understood as a state that can simply come and go. Rather, as the emotion complex view insists, the complexity of love is to be found in the historical patterns of one’s emotional responsiveness to one’s beloved—a pattern that also projects into the future. Indeed, as suggested above, the kind of emotional interdependence that results from this complex pattern can seem to account for the intuitive “depth” of love as fully interwoven into one’s emotional sense of oneself. And it seems to make some headway in understanding the complex phenomenology of love: love can at times be a matter of intense pleasure in the presence of one’s beloved, yet it can at other times involve frustration, exasperation, anger, and hurt as a manifestation of the complexities and depth of the relationships it fosters.

This understanding of love as constituted by a history of emotional interdependence enables emotion complex views to say something interesting about the impact love has on the lover’s identity. This is partly Rorty’s point (1986/1993) in her discussion of the historicity of love (above). Thus, she argues, one important feature of such historicity is that love is “dynamically permeable” in that the lover is continually “changed by loving” such that these changes “tend to ramify through a person’s character” (p. 77). Through such dynamic permeability, love transforms the identity of the lover in a way that can sometimes foster the continuity of the love, as each lover continually changes in response to the changes in the other.[14] Indeed, Rorty concludes, love should be understood in terms of “a characteristic narrative history” (p. 75) that results from such dynamic permeability. It should be clear, however, that the mere fact of dynamic permeability need not result in the love’s continuing: nothing about the dynamics of a relationship requires that the characteristic narrative history project into the future, and such permeability can therefore lead to the dissolution of the love. Love is therefore risky—indeed, all the more risky because of the way the identity of the lover is defined in part through the love. The loss of a love can therefore make one feel no longer oneself in ways poignantly described by Nussbaum (1990).

By focusing on such emotionally complex histories, emotion complex views differ from most alternative accounts of love. For alternative accounts tend to view love as a kind of attitude we take toward our beloveds, something we can analyze simply in terms of our mental state at the moment.[15] By ignoring this historical dimension of love in providing an account of what love is, alternative accounts have a hard time providing either satisfying accounts of the sense in which our identities as person are at stake in loving another or satisfactory solutions to problems concerning how love is to be justified (cf. Section 6, especially the discussion of fungibility).

Nonetheless, some questions remain. If love is to be understood as an emotion complex, we need a much more explicit account of the pattern at issue here: what ties all of these emotional responses together into a single thing, namely love? Baier and Badhwar seem content to provide interesting and insightful examples of this pattern, but that does not seem to be enough. For example, what connects my amusement at my beloved’s embarrassment to other emotions like my joy on his behalf when he succeeds? Why shouldn’t my amusement at his embarrassment be understood instead as a somewhat cruel case of schadenfreude and so as antithetical to, and disconnected from, love? Moreover, as Naar (2013) notes, we need a principled account of when such historical patterns are disrupted in such a way as to end the love and when they are not. Do I stop loving when, in the midst of clinical depression, I lose my normal pattern of emotional concern?

Presumably the answer requires returning to the historicity of love: it all depends on the historical details of the relationship my beloved and I have forged. Some loves develop so that the intimacy within the relationship is such as to allow for tender, teasing responses to each other, whereas other loves may not. The historical details, together with the lovers’ understanding of their relationship, presumably determine which emotional responses belong to the pattern constitutive of love and which do not. However, this answer so far is inadequate: not just any historical relationship involving emotional interdependence is a loving relationship, and we need a principled way of distinguishing loving relationships from other relational evaluative attitudes: precisely what is the characteristic narrative history that is characteristic of love?

Helm (2009, 2010) tries to answer some of these questions in presenting an account of love as intimate identification. To love another, Helm claims, is to care about him as the particular person he is and so, other things being equal, to value the things he values. Insofar as a person’s (structured) set of values—his sense of the kind of life worth his living—constitutes his identity as a person, such sharing of values amounts to sharing his identity, which sounds very much like union accounts of love. However, Helm is careful to understand such sharing of values as for the sake of the beloved (as robust concern accounts insist), and he spells this all out in terms of patterns of emotions. Thus, Helm claims, all emotions have not only a target and a formal object (as indicated above), but also a focus: a background object the subject cares about in terms of which the implicit evaluation of the target is made intelligible. (For example, if I am afraid of the approaching hailstorm, I thereby evaluate it as dangerous, and what explains this evaluation is the way that hailstorm bears on my vegetable garden, which I care about; my garden, therefore, is the focus of my fear.) Moreover, emotions normally come in patterns with a common focus: fearing the hailstorm is normally connected to other emotions as being relieved when it passes by harmlessly (or disappointed or sad when it does not), being angry at the rabbits for killing the spinach, delighted at the productivity of the tomato plants, etc. Helm argues that a projectible pattern of such emotions with a common focus constitute caring about that focus. Consequently, we might say along the lines of Section 4.3, while particular emotions appraise events in the world as having certain evaluative properties, their having these properties is partly bestowed on them by the overall patterns of emotions.

Helm identifies some emotions as person-focused emotions: emotions like pride and shame that essentially take persons as their focuses, for these emotions implicitly evaluate in terms of the target’s bearing on the quality of life of the person that is their focus. To exhibit a pattern of such emotions focused on oneself and subfocused on being a mother, for example, is to care about the place being a mother has in the kind of life you find worth living—in your identity as a person; to care in this way is to value being a mother as a part of your concern for your own identity. Likewise, to exhibit a projectible pattern of such emotions focused on someone else and subfocused on his being a father is to value this as a part of your concern for his identity—to value it for his sake. Such sharing of another’s values for his sake, which, Helm argues, essentially involves trust, respect, and affection, amounts to intimate identification with him, and such intimate identification just is love. Thus, Helm tries to provide an account of love that is grounded in an explicit account of caring (and caring about something for the sake of someone else) that makes room for the intuitive “depth” of love through intimate identification.

6. The Value and Justification of Love

Why do we love? It has been suggested above that any account of love needs to be able to answer some such justificatory question. Although the issue of the justification of love is important on its own, it is also important for the implications it has for understanding more clearly the precise object of love: how can we make sense of the intuitions not only that we love the individuals themselves rather than their properties, but also that my beloved is not fungible—that no one could simply take her place without loss. Different theories approach these questions in different ways, but, as will become clear below, the question of justification is primary.

One way to understand the question of why we love is as asking for what the value of love is: what do we get out of it? One kind of answer, which has its roots in Aristotle, is that having loving relationships promotes self-knowledge insofar as your beloved acts as a kind of mirror, reflecting your character back to you (Badhwar, 2003, p. 58). Of course, this answer presupposes that we cannot accurately know ourselves in other ways: that left alone, our sense of ourselves will be too imperfect, too biased, to help us grow and mature as persons. The metaphor of a mirror also suggests that our beloveds will be in the relevant respects similar to us, so that merely by observing them, we can come to know ourselves better in a way that is, if not free from bias, at least more objective than otherwise.

Brink (1999, pp. 264–65) argues that there are serious limits to the value of such mirroring of one’s self in a beloved. For if the aim is not just to know yourself better but to improve yourself, you ought also to interact with others who are not just like yourself: interacting with such diverse others can help you recognize alternative possibilities for how to live and so better assess the relative merits of these possibilities. Whiting (2013) also emphasizes the importance of our beloveds’ having an independent voice capable of reflecting not who one now is but an ideal for who one is to be. Nonetheless, we need not take the metaphor of the mirror quite so literally; rather, our beloveds can reflect our selves not through their inherent similarity to us but rather through the interpretations they offer of us, both explicitly and implicitly in their responses to us. This is what Badhwar calls the “epistemic significance” of love.[16]

In addition to this epistemic significance of love, LaFollette (1996, Chapter 5) offers several other reasons why it is good to love, reasons derived in part from the psychological literature on love: love increases our sense of well-being, it elevates our sense of self-worth, and it serves to develop our character. It also, we might add, tends to lower stress and blood pressure and to increase health and longevity. Friedman (1993) argues that the kind of partiality towards our beloveds that love involves is itself morally valuable because it supports relationships—loving relationships—that contribute “to human well-being, integrity, and fulfillment in life” (p. 61). And Solomon (1988, p. 155) claims:

Ultimately, there is only one reason for love. That one grand reason…is “because we bring out the best in each other.” What counts as “the best,” of course, is subject to much individual variation.

This is because, Solomon suggests, in loving someone, I want myself to be better so as to be worthy of his love for me.

Each of these answers to the question of why we love understands it to be asking about love quite generally, abstracted away from details of particular relationships. It is also possible to understand the question as asking about particular loves. Here, there are several questions that are relevant:

  1. What, if anything, justifies my loving rather than not loving this particular person?
  2. What, if anything, justifies my coming to love this particular person rather than someone else?
  3. What, if anything, justifies my continuing to love this particular person given the changes—both in him and me and in the overall circumstances—that have occurred since I began loving him?

These are importantly different questions. Velleman (1999), for example, thinks we can answer (1) by appealing to the fact that my beloved is a person and so has a rational nature, yet he thinks (2) and (3) have no answers: the best we can do is offer causal explanations for our loving particular people. (Setiya (2014) similarly thinks (1) has an answer, but points not to the rational nature of persons but rather to the other’s humanity, where such humanity differs from personhood in that not all humans need have the requisite rational nature for personhood, and not all persons need be humans.) And, as will become clear below, the distinction between (2) and (3) will become important in resolving puzzles concerning whether our beloveds are fungible, though it should be clear that (3) potentially raises questions concerning personal identity (which will not be addressed here).

It is important not to misconstrue these justificatory questions. Thomas (1991), for example, rejects the idea that love can be justified: “there are no rational considerations whereby anyone can lay claim to another’s love or insist that an individual’s love for another is irrational” (p. 474). This is because, Thomas claims (p. 471):

no matter how wonderful and lovely an individual might be, on any and all accounts, it is simply false that a romantically unencumbered person must love that individual on pain of being irrational. Or, there is no irrationality involved in ceasing to love a person whom one once loved immensely, although the person has not changed.

However, as LaFollette (1996, p. 63) correctly points out,

reason is not some external power which dictates how we should behave, but an internal power, integral to who we are.… Reason does not command that we love anyone. Nonetheless, reason is vital in determining whom we love and why we love them.

That is, reasons for love are pro tanto: they are a part of the overall reasons we have for acting, and it is up to us in exercising our capacity for agency to decide what on balance we have reason to do or even whether we shall act contrary to our reasons. To construe the notion of a reason for love as compelling us to love, as Thomas does, is to misconstrue the place such reasons have within our agency.[17]

Most philosophical discussions of the justification of love focus on question (1), thinking that answering this question will also, to the extent that we can, answer question (2), which is typically not distinguished from (3). The answers given to these questions vary in a way that turns on how the kind of evaluation implicit in love is construed. On the one hand, those who understand the evaluation implicit in love to be a matter of the bestowal of value (such as Telfer 1970–71; Friedman 1993; Singer 1994) typically claim that no justification can be given (cf. Section 4.2). As indicated above, this seems problematic, especially given the importance love can have both in our lives and, especially, in shaping our identities as persons. To reject the idea that we can love for reasons may reduce the impact our agency can have in defining who we are.

On the other hand, those who understand the evaluation implicit in love to be a matter of appraisal tend to answer the justificatory question by appeal to these valuable properties of the beloved. This acceptance of the idea that love can be justified leads to two further, related worries about the object of love.

The first worry is raised by Vlastos (1981) in a discussion Plato’s and Aristotle’s accounts of love. Vlastos notes that these accounts focus on the properties of our beloveds: we are to love people, they say, only because and insofar as they are objectifications of the excellences. Consequently, he argues, in doing so they fail to distinguish “disinterested affection for the person we love” from “appreciation of the excellences instantiated by that person” (p. 33). That is, Vlastos thinks that Plato and Aristotle provide an account of love that is really a love of properties rather than a love of persons—love of a type of person, rather than love of a particular person—thereby losing what is distinctive about love as an essentially personal attitude. This worry about Plato and Aristotle might seem to apply just as well to other accounts that justify love in terms of the properties of the person: insofar as we love the person for the sake of her properties, it might seem that what we love is those properties and not the person. Here it is surely insufficient to say, as Solomon (1988, p. 154) does, “if love has its reasons, then it is not the whole person that one loves but certain aspects of that person—though the rest of the person comes along too, of course”: that final tagline fails to address the central difficulty about what the object of love is and so about love as a distinctly personal attitude.

The second worry concerns the fungibility of the object of love. To be fungible is to be replaceable by another relevantly similar object without any loss of value. Thus, money is fungible: I can give you two $5 bills in exchange for a $10 bill, and neither of us has lost anything. Is the object of love fungible? That is, can I simply switch from loving one person to loving another relevantly similar person without any loss? The worry about fungibility is commonly put this way: if we accept that love can be justified by appealing to properties of the beloved, then it may seem that in loving someone for certain reasons, I love him not simply as the individual he is, but as instantiating those properties. And this may imply that any other person instantiating those same properties would do just as well: my beloved would be fungible. Indeed, it may be that another person exhibits the properties that ground my love to a greater degree than my current beloved does, and so it may seem that in such a case I have reason to “trade up”—to switch my love to the new, better person. However, it seems clear that the objects of our loves are not fungible: love seems to involve a deeply personal commitment to a particular person, a commitment that is antithetical to the idea that our beloveds are fungible or to the idea that we ought to be willing to trade up when possible.[18]

In responding to these worries, Nozick (1989) appeals to the union view of love he endorses (see the section on Love as Union):

The intention in love is to form a we and to identify with it as an extended self, to identify one’s fortunes in large part with its fortunes. A willingness to trade up, to destroy the very we you largely identify with, would then be a willingness to destroy your self in the form of your own extended self. [p. 78]

So it is because love involves forming a “we” that we must understand other persons and not properties to be the objects of love, and it is because my very identity as a person depends essentially on that “we” that it is not possible to substitute without loss one object of my love for another. However, Badhwar (2003) criticizes Nozick, saying that his response implies that once I love someone, I cannot abandon that love no matter who that person becomes; this, she says, “cannot be understood as love at all rather than addiction” (p. 61).[19]

Instead, Badhwar (1987) turns to her robust-concern account of love as a concern for the beloved for his sake rather than one’s own. Insofar as my love is disinterested — not a means to antecedent ends of my own—it would be senseless to think that my beloved could be replaced by someone who is able to satisfy my ends equally well or better. Consequently, my beloved is in this way irreplaceable. However, this is only a partial response to the worry about fungibility, as Badhwar herself seems to acknowledge. For the concern over fungibility arises not merely for those cases in which we think of love as justified instrumentally, but also for those cases in which the love is justified by the intrinsic value of the properties of my beloved. Confronted with cases like this, Badhwar (2003) concludes that the object of love is fungible after all (though she insists that it is very unlikely in practice). (Soble (1990, Chapter 13) draws similar conclusions.)

Nonetheless, Badhwar thinks that the object of love is “phenomenologically non-fungible” (2003, p. 63; see also 1987, p. 14). By this she means that we experience our beloveds to be irreplaceable: “loving and delighting in [one person] are not completely commensurate with loving and delighting in another” (1987, p. 14). Love can be such that we sometimes desire to be with this particular person whom we love, not another whom we also love, for our loves are qualitatively different. But why is this? It seems as though the typical reason I now want to spend time with Amy rather than Bob is, for example, that Amy is funny but Bob is not. I love Amy in part for her humor, and I love Bob for other reasons, and these qualitative differences between them is what makes them not fungible. However, this reply does not address the worry about the possibility of trading up: if Bob were to be at least as funny (charming, kind, etc.) as Amy, why shouldn’t I dump her and spend all my time with him?

A somewhat different approach is taken by Whiting (1991). In response to the first worry concerning the object of love, Whiting argues that Vlastos offers a false dichotomy: having disinterested affection for someone—for her sake rather than my own—essentially involves an appreciation of her excellences as such. Indeed, Whiting says, my appreciation of these as excellences, and so the underlying commitment I have to their value, just is a disinterested commitment to her because these excellences constitute her identity as the person she is. The person, therefore, really is the object of love. Delaney (1996) takes the complementary tack of distinguishing between the object of one’s love, which of course is the person, and the grounds of the love, which are her properties: to say, as Solomon does, that we love someone for reasons is not at all to say that we only love certain aspects of the person. Thus, Whiting’s rejection of Vlastos’ dichotomy can be read as saying that what makes my attitude be one of disinterested affection—one of love—for the person is precisely that I am thereby responding to her excellences as the reasons for that affection.[20]

Of course, more needs to be said about what it is that makes a particular person be the object of love. Implicit in Whiting’s account is an understanding of the way in which the object of my love is determined in part by the history of interactions I have with her: it is she, and not merely her properties (which might be instantiated in many different people), that I want to be with, it is she, and not merely her properties, on whose behalf I am concerned when she suffers and whom I seek to comfort, etc. This addresses the first worry, but not the second worry about fungibility, for the question still remains whether she is the object of my love only as instantiating certain properties, and so whether or not I have reason to “trade up.”

To respond to the fungibility worry, Whiting and Delaney appeal explicitly to the historical relationship. Thus, Whiting claims, although there may be a relatively large pool of people who have the kind of excellences of character that would justify my loving them, and so although there can be no answer to question (2) about why I come to love this rather than that person within this pool, once I have come to love this person and so have developed a historical relation with her, this history of concern justifies my continuing to love this person rather than someone else (1991, p. 7). Similarly, Delaney claims that love is grounded in “historical-relational properties” (1996, p. 346), so that I have reasons for continuing to love this person rather than switching allegiances and loving someone else. In each case, the appeal to both such historical relations and the excellences of character of my friend is intended to provide an answer to question (3), and this explains why the objects of love are not fungible.

There seems to be something very much right with this response. Relationships grounded in love are essentially personal, and it would be odd to think of what justifies that love to be merely non-relational properties of the beloved. Nonetheless, it is still unclear how the historical-relational propreties can provide any additional justification for subsequent concern beyond that which is already provided (as an answer to question (1)) by appeal to the excellences of the beloved’s character (cf. Brink 1999). The mere fact that I have loved her in the past does not seem to justify my continuing to love her in the future. When we imagine that she is going through a rough time and begins to lose the virtues justifying my initial love for her, why shouldn’t I dump her and instead come to love someone new having all of those virtues more fully? Intuitively (unless the change she undergoes makes her in some important sense no longer the same person she was), we think I should not dump her, but the appeal to the mere fact that I loved her in the past is surely not enough. Yet what historical-relational properties could do the trick? (For an interesting attempt at an answer, see Kolodny 2003.)

If we think that love can be justified, then it may seem that the appeal to particular historical facts about a loving relationship to justify that love is inadequate, for such idiosyncratic and subjective properties might explain but cannot justify love. Rather, it may seem, justification in general requires appealing to universal, objective properties. But such properties are ones that others might share, which leads to the problem of fungibility. Consequently it may seem that love cannot be justified. In the face of this predicament, accounts of love that understand love to be an attitude towards value that is intermediate between appraisal and bestowal, between recognizing already existing value and creating that value (see Section 4.3) might seem to offer a way out. For once we reject the thought that the value of our beloveds must be either the precondition or the consequence of our love, we have room to acknowledge that the deeply personal, historically grounded, creative nature of love (central to bestowal accounts) and the understanding of love as responsive to valuable properties of the beloved that can justify that love (central to appraisal accounts) are not mutually exclusive (Helm 2010; Bagley 2015).


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Other Internet Resources

  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, translated by W.D. Ross.
  • Moseley, A., “Philosophy of Love,” in J. Fieser (ed.), Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

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