Malebranche’s Theory of Ideas and Vision in God

First published Mon Nov 10, 2003; substantive revision Mon Feb 28, 2022

The seventeenth-century French philosopher Nicolas Malebranche (1638–1715) famously argued that ‘we see all things in God.’ This doctrine of ‘Vision in God’ is intended as an account both of sense perception of material things and of the purely intellectual cognition of mathematical objects and abstract truths. The theological motivation for this doctrine is clear: Vision in God places us in immediate contact with God in our everyday experience of the world and in our most private thoughts and musings. Like his other signature doctrine, ‘Occasionalism’ or the view that God is the only genuine cause, Vision in God is also rooted in Malebranche’s conviction that we utterly depend on God in every way.

Although Malebranche was widely revered by his contemporaries as one of their leading lights – an equal to Descartes, Locke, and Leibniz – the theological spirit of his philosophy tarnished his reputation among Anglo-American philosophers in the last century. Scholarship over the past thirty-five years, however, has begun to restore his credentials as a philosopher of first rank by unveiling the philosophical motivations for his doctrines, and by stressing his ingenuity in solving problems bequeathed to him by his two great philosophical forebears, Augustine and Descartes. Both of these virtues are manifest in the doctrine of Vision in God.

1. The Nature and Scope of the Doctrine

The doctrine of Vision in God is easily misunderstood. It is not the view that we see God’s essence – that vision in God is vision of God – though Malebranche’s chief critic, the Cartesian Antoine Arnauld, charged that it was. It is also not the view that corporeal objects, such as olive trees and Old English sheepdogs, reside in God, or that God himself is corporeal. The former would make Malebranche an idealist or an immaterialist, the latter a Spinozist, but he rejects all such epithets.

To appreciate Malebranche’s epistemological theory, one must remember that he was an orthodox Cartesian dualist and an orthodox Christian. Like Descartes, he maintained that there are two kinds of created substance – minds and bodies – and that the essence of bodies is extension (or spatial dimension). God, in turn, is an infinite, all-perfect, spiritual being. On this traditional Christian conception, it would be heresy to identify God with his creatures, to suppose that God was extended, or to pretend to fathom God’s essence. Concerning the latter, Malebranche stressed that we don’t see God as he is in himself, for God’s essence is perfectly simple, and by his grace we see only the diversity of particular beings. God’s simplicity also entails that he is not extended:

God’s essence is his own absolute being, and minds do not see the divine substance taken absolutely but only as relative to creatures and to the degree that they can participate in it. What they see in God is very imperfect, whereas God is most perfect. They see matter that is shaped, divisible, and so on, but there is nothing divisible or shaped in God, for God is all being, since he is infinite and comprehends everything; but he is no being in particular. Yet what we see is but one or more particular beings, and we do not understand this perfect simplicity of God, which includes all beings. (Search 3.2.6, OC 1:439; LO 231)

Here Malebranche underscores another feature of God: the divine substance is not any particular being but ‘all being’ or what he elsewhere calls ‘being in general.’ We can see material beings in God precisely because he is indeterminate; in seeing creatures we are seeing how they determinately ‘participate in’ or ‘imitate’ his perfections.

In conceiving God as ‘being in general’ Malebranche borrows much from the thirteenth-century scholastic thinker St. Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas also conceives God as simple and indeterminate, and thinks it follows from this that we, with our finite minds, cannot fathom God’s essence, and so must know him through his effects. Malebranche qualifies this last point somewhat by saying that we know God through his possible (material) effects, that is, relative to what he can produce. Indeed, Malebranche holds that in God we see an infinity of possible worlds:

When you contemplate … extension, you still see only the archetype both of the material world in which we live, and of an infinity of other possible worlds. You are then actually seeing the divine substance, for that alone is visible or capable of enlightening the mind. But you do not see it in itself or as it really is. You see it only in its relation to material creatures, only as it is participable by or representative of them. Consequently, it is not strictly speaking God whom you see, but only the matter he can produce. (Dialogue 2, OC 12:51; JS 21)

As we have seen, there are no particular beings in God, for God is simple and general. But still Malebranche will insist that we see material objects in God. How is this possible? The answer to this question involves another aspect of his doctrine not yet broached – the theory of ideas. Malebranche defends a representational theory of ideas, which holds that we don’t see material objects directly but only via the ideas that represent them. On his version of this theory, material objects are unintelligible in themselves and can be known only via something spiritual and immediately present to the mind. Malebranche was not alone in the seventeenth-century in endorsing representationalism; in fact, it is often thought that he inherited this position from Descartes. Where they clearly differ is in the ontological status they accord to ideas. Descartes develops a ‘Christianized’ version of the Platonic theory of innate ideas, according to which ideas are created with us at birth and constitute the very structure of our mind. Malebranche, in contrast, vehemently denies that ideas are created or that they are modifications of finite minds, and instead regards them as eternal, necessary, and immutable realities that reside in God. To say, then, that we perceive material things in God means that we immediately perceive ideas in God, and via these ideas, we indirectly perceive corporeal objects. Ideas in God are the ‘archetypes’ or models that he uses to create things. Thus, we can be assured that our knowledge of material things is of the highest order.

As already noted, Malebranche restricts the doctrine of Vision in God to our sensory perception of material objects and their properties and to the abstract thought of mathematical essences. It does not encompass knowledge of God’s essence, for as we have seen he thinks we know God only indirectly, by way of the material things that he can create. But what about our knowledge of other things, especially the self or the mind, or other minds? Why is that sort of knowledge excluded from the doctrine, especially since as a faithful Cartesian dualist he maintains that there are both bodies and minds?

Given his theory of divine archetypes for creation, Malebranche must allow that there is an idea of the mind in God, but he does not think God gives us access to this idea. We lack, therefore, what Descartes would call a clear and distinct idea of the mind. And since ideas for Malebranche are the essences or natures of things, he denies that we have knowledge of the mind’s essence. To be sure, he endorses Descartes’ cogito, or the claim that one knows one’s own existence. But here Malebranche distinguishes two kinds of knowledge (connoître) – knowledge through ideas as afforded by Vision in God and knowledge through consciousness – the latter being inferior. I have knowledge through consciousness of the existence of my mind and its modifications, which is just to say that I know them by an inner awareness (sentiment intérieur) that attends all of my thoughts, beliefs, sensations, passions, etc. But this awareness is limited to their bare existence and fails to reveal their underlying nature. Indeed, although sensations and other such modifications of the mind are typically strong and lively in their affects, they are ‘confused modalities … full of darkness’ (Dialogue 3, OC 12:65; JS 33). Malebranche’s negative view of knowledge of the mind is the natural complement to his theory of Vision in God. Following Augustine, Malebranche often stresses that the human mind is not a light unto itself, and that God (or what he sometimes calls ‘universal Reason’) is the only true light, that is, the only source of truth and knowledge: ‘Man is not a light unto himself. His substance, far from enlightening him, is itself unintelligible to him. He knows nothing except by the light of universal Reason which enlightens all minds, by the intelligible ideas which it discloses to them in its entirely luminous substance’ (Dialogue 3, OC 12:64; JS 32). The human mind is so utterly devoid of cognitive resources, and thus so completely dependent on God, that it cannot even know its own nature (for Malebranche on self-knowledge, see Jolley 2000, Nolan and Whipple 2005, and Schmaltz 1996).

Malebranche thinks that knowledge of other minds is even more impoverished (if this seems possible), for here we must rely on conjecture. Other minds are not immediately present to us in the way that our own mind and its modifications are, and so they cannot even be known by consciousness. Instead, we must conjecture, on the basis of our sensory perception of the behavior of bodies similar to our own, that they are united to minds and that these minds are affected with the same sorts of sensations and passions as ours. Such knowledge, however, is ‘very liable to error’ (Search 3.2.7, OC 1:455; LO 239). One might wonder why Malebranche calls this ‘knowledge’ (la connoissance) at all, and not ‘opinion’ or ‘belief,’ in keeping with the philosophical tradition. The simple answer is that he is using the term broadly here to refer to different forms of cognition – i.e., ways of perceiving (manières de voir) God, bodies, the self, and other minds.

2. The Distinction between Ideas and Sensations

In the last section, we learned that there are no particular things in God, but what about particular ideas? Malebranche sometimes writes as if there are, and one commentator has argued that he was committed to such a view in the first edition of the Search (Gueroult 1955–9, vol. 1, 63f). This has since been disputed (see Schmaltz 2000, 72 and note 39), but whatever the case, Malebranche tends in later editions of the Search and in his later writings generally to treat ideas as general and abstract. This is true both of the various geometrical ideas that we see in God and of the idea of extension: ‘when I said that we see different bodies through the knowledge we have of God’s perfections that represent them, I did not exactly mean that there are in God certain particular ideas that represent each body individually …’ (Elucidation 10, OC:154; LO 627). Beginning with the Elucidations, Malebranche employs the term ‘intelligible extension’ to denote the general idea of extension, and to distinguish it from actual extension, which again is unintelligible in itself. In addition to being general, ideas in God are also ‘pure’ in the Cartesian sense that they are non-sensuous. Intelligible extension, then, is just the idea of geometrical extension and its properties, or what in the seventeenth-century came to be known as the ‘primary qualities.’ Malebranche reduces these to two – figure (i.e., size and shape) and motion.

These two characteristic features of ideas raise the following questions:

If intelligible extension is pure, then how can it represent sensible objects? Following Descartes, Malebranche wanted to highlight the intellectual character of sense perception, but has he done so at the expense of its sensory component?

Supposing that intelligible extension does represent sensible objects how, as a general idea, can it represent particular objects?

To answer these questions we must first uncover an important distinction that Malebranche draws between ideas on the one hand and sensations on the other. As we have already discovered, ideas are in God and are cosubstantial with his substance. Sensations of colors, sounds, odors, heat, pleasure, etc., on the other hand, are modifications of finite minds. Another important difference is that ideas are intrinsically representational, whereas sensations are not. The idea of a pyramid, for example, represents an actual pyramid in the sense that it resembles it, but the sensation of pain that one experience’s when, say, accidentally lacerating one’s arm, in no way resembles the wounded tissue. Ideas and sensations, then, are very different kinds of entity, but Malebranche maintains that sense perception combines elements of each.

When we perceive something sensible, two things are found in our perception: sensation and pure idea. The sensation is a modification of our soul, and it is God who causes it in us. As for the idea found in conjunction with the sensation, it is in God, and we see it because it pleases God to reveal it to us. (Search 3.2.6, OC 1:445; LO 234)

The composite character of sense perception provides answers to both of our questions. Malebranche explains:

intelligible extension becomes visible and represents a certain body in particular only by means of color, because it is only by the variety of colors that we judge the difference between the objects we see…. [A]s the sensations of color are essentially different, by means of them we judge the variety of bodies. If I distinguish your hand from your coat and both from the air surrounding them, this is because the sensations of light or color that I have of them are very different (Dialogue 1, OC 12:46–7; JS 17).

we see or sense a given body when its ideas, i.e., when some figure composed of intelligible and general extension, becomes sensible and particular through color or some other sensible perception by which its idea affects the soul and that the soul ascribes to it, for the soul almost always projects its sensations on an idea that strikes it in lively fashion. (Elucidation 10, OC 3:152; LO 626)

In sense perception the mind ‘projects’ its sensations onto intelligible extension, or some determinate part of it, thereby rendering sensible what is otherwise abstract and general. It was a common view in the seventeenth century that sensations of color and light, in particular, also serve another function in sense perception: they enable us to discriminate shapes and, correlatively, individual bodies. As illusionists of the age were well aware, one can make a woman appear headless if her head is covered with something that blends into the background (such as a black hood against a black curtain) and she is dressed in clothing that is color-contrasting. In these passages, Malebranche applies this general point to explain how the sensations of color and light individuate intelligible extension and thereby yield sensory perceptions of particular objects. Sensations both ‘sensualize’ and ‘particularize’ intelligible extension, and thus make it possible for us to see particular sensible objects in it.

In characterizing the relation between ideas and sensations here, Malebranche relies partially on metaphors. He speaks of ‘projecting’ our sensations onto ideas and elsewhere he compares intelligible extension to a canvas onto which sensations are ‘painted’ (OC 6:78). Some commentators have attempted to unpack these metaphors and to offer a more specific account of the relation between ideas and sensations in sense perception. They attribute an ‘adverbial theory’ of sensation to Malebranche. Since sensations are nonrepresentational, they do not constitute an extra object of perception over and above the general idea of extension and the material objects they represent. In other words, we do not perceive sensations; we directly perceive ideas and via these ideas we indirectly perceive corporeal objects. Given this account of the intentionality of perception, sensations are best understood adverbially, that is, as a way of perceiving objects in the world. For example, when observing the setting sun, it would be most accurate to say not that one senses ‘red,’ but that one senses redly (see Jolley 2000, 37f; Nadler 1992, 64; Pyle 2003, 57, 63–5 and Radner 1978, 89). However, more recent discussions have cast serious doubts on whether Malebranche could be committed to an adverbial theory of sense perception, for a variety of different reasons (see Nolan 2012, Ott 2014, and Simmons 2009).

In addition to the roles already discussed, sensations play one other important function in Malebranche’s epistemology. They provide a kind of ‘natural revelation’ of the existence of bodies. It is important to remember here that the idea of extension in God does not reveal anything about the existence of bodies, only their essence. Speaking once again of the composite character of sense perception, he writes: ‘There is always a clear idea and a confused sensation in the view we have of sensible objects. The idea represents their essence, and the sensation informs us of their existence’ (Dialogue 5, OC 12:113; JS 74). More strongly, sensations ‘make us judge’ that there is an object in the world corresponding to our perception (Elucidation 10, OC 3:143; LO 621). ‘God joins the sensation to the idea when objects are present so that we may believe them to be present….’ (Search, 6.2.6, OC 3:152; LO 234).

Although sensations provide a ‘strong propensity’ to believe in the existence of bodies, they do not provide conclusive proof or even evidence of their existence, for the senses often deceive us (Elucidation 6, OC 3:55f; LO 569f). Malebranche notes, for example, that ‘our eyes represent colors to us on the surface of bodies and … our ears make us hear sounds as if spread out through the air and in the resounding bodies; and if we believe what the senses report, heat will be in fire, sweetness will be in sugar, musk will have an odor….’ (ibid., OC 3:55–6; LO 569). Like many of the mechanical philosophers in the seventeenth century, Malebranche holds that so-called sensible qualities (colors, sounds, odors, heat and cold, etc.) are not in bodies – which again are to be conceived in terms of geometrical extension alone – but are modifications of the mind. However, his point in the passage cited is that the senses deceptively entice us to attribute them to bodies. If they deceive us in this way, then it is at least possible that they also deceive us about the existence of bodies.

If the senses do not provide absolute certainty about the existence of bodies, one might wonder why God uses them at all for this purpose, especially since Malebranche also contends ‘faith obliges us to believe that there are bodies’ (ibid., OC 3:62; LO 573). Why then don’t the revelations of Scripture suffice? Why do we need the ‘natural revelations’ of sense? The answer is that like most Cartesians, Malebranche holds that the main purpose of the senses is to aid and preserve one’s mind-body union. If a lion is chasing me or if I am in danger of being consumed by a raging fire, I do not need to be absolutely certain that the lion or the fire exists in order to know that it is in my best interests to flee. So whereas faith obliges me to believe in the existence of bodies generally, sensations inform me of the existence of those particular bodies, such as my own body and those in its vicinity, which may affect it positively or negatively.

3. Descartes, Augustine, and the Argument from Properties

Malebranche’s philosophy generally owes much to the thought of Descartes and Augustine. This is particularly true in the case of Vision in God, which bears a striking resemblance to Augustine’s theory of divine illumination, but which is also informed by Cartesian views about the role of ideas in cognition and the intellectual character of sensory perception. One way of gaining insight into the doctrine of Vision in God then is by regarding it as a synthesis of Descartes and Augustine’s philosophies of cognition. By integrating their views, and using each as a corrective to the other, Malebranche produces a new doctrine that attempts to preserve and extend their philosophical insights while avoiding their limitations and problems.

Let us pursue this inroad into Malebranche’s theory of cognition, beginning with his Cartesian inheritance. Descartes is often read as holding a representative theory of perception, according to which our perception of material objects is mediated by ideas. Ideas are the immediate objects of perception and, via these ideas, we are able to perceive bodies in the world. He encourages such a reading in the Third Meditation, where he famously says that all ideas are ‘as it were the images of things’ (CSM 2:25, AT 7:37). Descartes explicitly denies that ideas are mental images; however, he suggests here that they are like images in the sense that they represent objects in the world.

Why would someone hold such a view, especially as it seems to violate commonsense? In cases where I am looking directly at an object that is before me, such as a tree, I am inclined to think that what I perceive directly is the tree itself, not some ideational proxy for the tree. Proponents of the representative theory, however, are often motivated by cases of non-veridical perception. In endorsing this theory himself, Malebranche is no exception. When I hallucinate a pink elephant nothing in the world corresponds to my perception; nevertheless, my perception has an intentional character, i.e., it is ‘of’ or ‘about’ some object. Indeed, Malebranche maintains that all thought takes an object, on the grounds that ‘To see nothing is not to see; to think of nothing is not to think’ (OCM 2:99, LO:320). Call this ‘the principle of intentionality.’ If, in hallucinating the pink elephant, there were not some object of my hallucination I would not be having a perception at all. Ideas are introduced as a way of explaining how my perception can be intentional even in such cases. Absent a material thing, there must be some immaterial surrogate – call it an ‘idea’ – toward which my perception is immediately directed.

Having established this result in the case of hallucinations, dreams, sensory illusions, etc., the representationalist must find a ground for extending this conclusion to veridical perception. For in veridical perception the principle of intentionality could be preserved without appealing to ideas. One could say that the immediate object of my perception is some material thing in the world. Malebranche eliminates this possibility by appealing to the principle that all the immediate objects of perception must be of the same ontological kind. One set of perceptions cannot have ideas as their objects, while another set of perceptions is directed toward material things. If non-veridical perceptions derive their intentional character from being directed toward ideas, then so must all perceptions; otherwise this principle would be violated (see Nadler 1992, 83).

The Argument from Properties: Establishing the representative theory of perception is just one part of Malebranche’s task in defending the doctrine of Vision in God. Having argued that ideas are the immediate objects of perception and thought, he must now deal with a further question: ‘where’ are ideas? What is their locus? Malebranche’s answer of course is that ideas reside in God, but in affirming this claim he is making his first important break with Descartes. It is fair to say that this is one place where Malebranche sees himself as correcting Descartes and using Augustine to do so. Descartes had taught that ideas are modifications of human minds. Indeed, Descartes would say that the ideas that figure most prominently in Malebranche’s doctrine – viz. the idea of extension and the ideas of various mathematical objects – are innate, part of the very structure of the mind bestowed upon us by God. This means that Cartesian ideas are 1) finite mental items and 2) created. Malebranche rejects both of these claims but, ironically, he does so on grounds that appear to be at least partially inspired by Descartes’ own writings.

In the Third Meditation, Descartes stresses that insofar as they represent things to us, ideas are real beings, even if the objects they represent do not exist outside thought. The ‘representational reality’ of ideas falls short of the actual being of things in the world but, nevertheless, it is not nothing (AT 7:41, CSM 2:29). He reaffirms this point in the Fifth Meditation and adds that the ideas of various geometrical figures have ‘immutable and eternal’ essences, as is clear from the fact that these ideas resist efforts by our mind to deform them. For example, once I have recognized that having angles equal to two right angles is part of the content of the idea of triangle, I am compelled to recognize this property ‘whether I want to or not’ (AT 7:64, CSM 2:45). In general, Descartes holds that so-called ‘clear and distinct ideas’ are such that I cannot add anything to them or subtract anything from them (AT 7:51, 117–8; CSM 2:35, 83–4). Although he does not mention Descartes as his source, Malebranche develops these points in a way that leads to some very anti-Cartesian conclusions. He too wishes to stress that ideas are real beings and that they resist our mind’s efforts to alter them:

I am thinking of a number, of a circle, of a room, of your chairs, in a word, of particular beings. I am also thinking of being or of the infinite, of undetermined being. All these ideas have some reality while I think of them. You do not doubt this, because nothingness has no properties and they do. (Dialogue 1, OC 12:37; JS:10)

You believe this floor exists because you feel it resist you…. But do you think your ideas do not resist you? Find me then two unequal diameters in a circle, or three equal ones in an ellipse. Find me the square root of eight and the cube root of nine…. [M]ake two feet of intelligible extension equal no more than one. Certainly the nature of this extension cannot countenance that. It resists your mind. Do not, therefore, doubt its reality. (ibid., OC 12:41–2; JS:13–14)

So far, Malebranche has not said anything with which Descartes would disagree: the fact that ideas have properties and resist our thought demonstrates their reality. But Descartes also speaks of ideas as ‘immutable and eternal.’ Malebranche concurs with this as well, and adds that they are ‘necessary,’ ‘universal,’ and ‘infinite’. The idea of extension, for example, is ‘necessary, eternal, immutable, and common to all minds….’ (ibid., OC 12:42; JS:14) To say that ideas are ‘necessary’ just means that ‘it is impossible that they should not be as they are,’ and this is something that Malebranche thinks is discoverable in thought (Elucidation 10, OC 3:130; LO 614). Ideas are infinite in the sense that they are ‘inexhaustible.’ One can discover in the idea of extension, for example, ‘infinite numbers of intelligible triangles, tetragons, pentagons, and other such figures,’ as well as an infinite number of truths that can be demonstrated of them (ibid.). The ideas of extension and the various geometrical figures are also immutable (or unchanging) and eternal in the sense that they did not come into being, and will not go out of being. And although cultural norms and tastes may vary among cultures, races, and periods, the truths of mathematics are universal and common to all intelligences in the sense that all minds will, upon reflection, discover the same ones. Such truths are not the product of convention but are intellectual givens that impose themselves on our thought.

From the claim that ideas are necessary, eternal, immutable, etc., Malebranche draws his first and most important anti-Cartesian conclusion, namely, that ideas must reside in God and be ‘coeternal and consubstantial with Him’ (Elucidation 10, OC 3:131; LO 614). Indeed, since Descartes affirms some or all of these properties himself, consistency would seem to require that he abandon his view that ideas are created modes of finite minds. If ideas are necessary and eternal then they cannot be created, as created things are contingent and have a beginning. Ideas also cannot be modes of the soul, for ‘it is clear that the soul’s modes are changeable but ideas are immutable; that its modes are particular, but ideas are universal and general to all intelligences; that its modes are contingent, but ideas are eternal and necessary….’ (Search, OC 2:103; LO 322–3). Malebranche expresses his positive conclusion at times by referring to God once again as ‘universal Reason’ or the intelligible realm of ideas:

But if it is true that the Reason in which all men participate is universal, that it is infinite, that it is necessary and immutable, then it is certainly not different from God’s own reason, for only the infinite and universal being contains in itself an infinite and universal reason. All creatures are particular beings; universal reason, therefore, is not created. No creature is infinite; infinite reason, therefore, is not a creature. (Elucidation 10, OC 3:131; LO:614)

Although he appears to draw these results from tensions within Descartes’ theory of ideas, Malebranche finds additional support and inspiration for the doctrine of Vision in God in Augustine’s theory of divine illumination. Indeed, it is often said that Vision in God combines Descartes’ representationalism with an Augustinian or Neoplatonic ontology of ideas. The exact degree to which Augustine directly influenced Malebranche here, however, is difficult to gauge and one commentator has argued that the influence was minimal at most (See Connell 1967). That having been said, Malebranche often writes as if the lineage was direct and tends to minimize his philosophical differences with Augustine over the nature of cognition:

It therefore must be, as St. Augustine says in 500 hundred places, that ideas are eternal, immutable, necessary, common to all souls, so that there are most certainly truth and falsehood, justice and injustice, eternal truths and laws; and that our souls are enlightened by the same ideas in consequence of the union that they have with this universal Reason which contains them all in its substance, which alone is the life and light of all intelligences…. (OC 9:933)

Despite what he regards as general agreement, Malebranche differentiates his view from Augustine’s in two ways. First, whereas Augustine spoke of seeing ‘truths’ in God, Malebranche speaks primarily of (immediately) seeing ‘ideas.’ This minor difference stems from Malebranche’s tendency to privilege ideas and to understand truth in terms of them. Truth is but a relation among ideas, though on his scheme relations need not be anything real, over and above ideas, for in perceiving any two ideas we can also grasp the relations between them.

We are of the opinion, then, that truths (… such as that twice two is four) are not absolute beings, much less that they are God Himself. For clearly, this truth consists only in the relation of equality between twice two and four. Thus, we do not claim, as does Saint Augustine, that we see God in seeing truths, but in seeing the ideas of these truths – for ideas are real, whereas the equality between the ideas, which is the truth, is nothing real …. Thus, our view is that we see God when we see eternal truths, and not that these truths are God, because the ideas on which these truths depend are in God – it might even be that this was Saint Augustine’s meaning. (Search 3.2.6, OC 1:444; LO 234)

Malebranche speaks rather baldly here. He seems to deny truths any reality whatsoever, but what he really wants is something weaker. Elsewhere he draws a distinction between real relations like truth and imaginary relations such as falsehood. He denies reality only to the latter, and wants to reduce real relations to ideas (Search 6.1.5, OC 2:286; LO 433). Thus, the difference between Augustine and Malebranche on whether we directly perceive truths or ideas in God may be only nominal, for Malebranche is not denying the reality of truths but merely reducing them to ideas.

Second, and more significantly, Malebranche self-consciously extends Augustine’s theory of divine illumination to material things. Where Augustine limited his account to the intellectual apprehension of truths that are eternal and necessary, Malebranche conceives Vision in God as an all-encompassing theory of cognition that includes the sensory perception of sensible objects in the world. Malebranche believes that Augustine was prevented from seeing how the theory of illumination could be extended in this way as a result of two philosophical prejudices. First, he maintained that we see bodies directly, without the aid of ideas. Second, like most philosophers prior to the scientific revolution he thought that colors, sounds, pains, heat, and other sensory qualities are in bodies. But of course these qualities change. If these two prejudices are combined, as Malebranche believed they were in Augustine’s thinking, then to say that we see material things in God would mean that God contains objects that are changeable and corruptible. But this violates God’s immutability. Malebranche, however, thinks he has the resources for avoiding this result:

We further believe that changeable and corruptible things are known in God, though Saint Augustine speaks only of immutable and incorruptible things, because for this to be so, no imperfection need be placed in God, since, as we have already said, it is enough that God should reveal to us what in Him is related to these things. (Search 3.2.6, OC 1:444–5; LO 234)

Malebranche is able to extend the scope of Augustine’s theory of illumination as a result of what were then two recent philosophical developments, courtesy of Descartes. First, the representational theory of ideas allowed Malebranche to say that what we see directly in God are not changeable objects but ideas or essences. In the case of material things we see intelligible extension, which is immutable and incorruptible, in keeping with the divine nature. Second, Malebranche took from Descartes the view that colors and the other so-called ‘secondary qualities’ are not qualities of bodies but sensations or modifications of the mind (whether Descartes actually held this position himself is controversial). Since bodies do not have these qualities, the idea of extension need not represent them, and once again God is spared from having to accommodate changeable entities. It is interesting to note here that by reducing secondary qualities to sensations, Malebranche can also explain the variations we see in the primary qualities of extension. Even if bodies are not colored, they still change their size, shape, motion, and position. How can intelligible extension represent those variations without violating God’s immutability? The answer is that it need not, for as we have already discussed, color and light sensations ‘particularize’ extension and enable the mind to discriminate shapes and, correlatively, all the other primary qualities – sizes, positions, motions, etc. Sensations, then, are responsible for all the variations we see in material objects.

4. Other Arguments for Vision in God

In the previous section, we examined Malebranche’s most mature argument for locating ideas in God in the Argument from Properties. This argument, which first appeared in Elucidations of The Search After Truth, highlights the Neoplatonic and Augustinian character of Malebranchean ideas and reveals his efforts to correct Descartes. When coupled with the Cartesian view that all perception is representational, it provides one of Malebranche’s strongest supports for Vision in God.

When first introducing the doctrine of Vision in God in the Search, however, he takes a different tack. There he presents a negative, or eliminative, argument in which he enumerates five competing theories of how material objects are known, and then systematically eliminates each one until only Vision in God remains. For such an argument to succeed, one must ensure that the enumeration is complete – that it exhausts all possible theories. Malebranche clearly thinks that he satisfies this requirement, though critics from John Locke onwards have complained that it does not. Some recent commentators have attempted to show why Malebranche’s enumeration is, indeed, complete or at least why he thinks it is (Connell 1967, 162; Nadler 1992, 138–140).

But rather than pursue that line of thought, we might note something else about Malebranche’s strategy: he does not rest content with the standard structure of an eliminative argument. After raising doubts about the four other theories, he marshals various positive arguments in support of vision in God. One might think that Malebranche is simply making as strong a case as possible for his preferred theory or, since he has these other arguments ready to hand, displaying them for his readers’ edification. But when his positive arguments are examined carefully, one finds that many of the same reasons are used to cast doubt upon the rival theories. It would appear that as much as trying to convince the reader of Vision in God, the Argument from Elimination lays the groundwork for that doctrine by prefiguring the positive reasons in favor of it or, to put it somewhat differently, by revealing what is required for us to have knowledge of material objects. Malebranche holds that once one appreciates the requirements or preconditions for knowledge, she will be forced to conclude that only Vision in God satisfies all of them. Thus, behind the surface of Malebranche’s eliminative argument lies a deeper, more positive approach. Given this understanding of Malebranche’s strategy, and in the interests of brevity, we shall focus here on the positive arguments that he adduces in favor of Vision in God.

Malebranche’s arguments appeal primarily (but not exclusively) to facts about the divine nature and about the relation between God – the infinite substance – and his finite creation. This reflects the theological spirit of Malebranche’s philosophy generally, but it is also a common strategy of the modern rationalists (most notably, Descartes, Spinoza, Malebranche, and Leibniz) to derive conclusions about finite beings from considerations about infinite being. Malebranche identifies five main reasons in support of the claim that ‘we see all things in God.’ Before developing these reasons, however, he reminds the reader of two other considerations, introduced previously, that provide a prima facie case in favor of Vision in God. First, there must be ideas of all created beings in God, for otherwise he would not have been able to create. The view that ‘blind creation’ is impossible is part of Malebranche’s Augustinian heritage, and relies on the intuition that in order to create something one must have models or archetypes of what one is going to create. Ideas, then, serve as these archetypes, but they must be in God himself prior to creation for otherwise there would something external to God constraining what he could create, which would violate his omnipotence or supreme power. God can have the ideas of all things within him because he contains an infinite number of perfections and, as discussed in section 2, he sees all possible beings by considering how his perfections can be imitated in finite ways. There is a deeper intuition here as well, and that is that if God is truly wise or omniscient then creation must be an intelligible and rational process whereby God acts in accordance with certain standards. Malebranche rejects Descartes’ doctrine that the created universe is an arbitrary product of God’s indifferent will. Ideas in God, then, constitute these eternal and immutable standards.

Second, Malebranche holds that created minds enjoy an intimate union with God even in this life, as a result of our complete and utter dependence on the creator. As a result of this union, God is always ‘present’ to our mind. Speaking metaphorically, Malebranche says that God is, in a sense, the ‘place’ of minds as space is the place of bodies. On the basis of these two considerations, Malebranche concludes that God could, if he saw fit, cause finite minds to see all things in him: ‘the mind surely can see what in God represents created beings, since what in God represents created beings is very spiritual, intelligible, and present to the mind. Thus, the mind can see God’s works in Him, provided that God wills to reveal to it what in Him represents them’ (Search 3.2.6, OC 1:437; LO 230). Since the ideas of all things are already in God and our minds enjoy an intimate union with him at all times, it is easy to see how God could make us see all things in him. But, again, Malebranche does not intend these considerations to be decisive, only to show how Vision in God is possible and ‘conforms to reason’ (ibid., OC 1:438; LO 230). The introduction of these considerations is primarily strategic, for he then proceeds to develop and reinforce them in his five main arguments, to which we now turn:

  1. The Simplicity of the Divine Ways: Having already highlighted the rational character of creation in the first consideration, Malebranche begins this argument with another such point that once again underscores God’s wisdom. God always creates in the simplest of ways. This is a consequence not only of his simplicity, but also of his wisdom and power.

    God never does in very complicated fashion what can be done in a very simple and straightforward way. For God never does anything uselessly and without reason. His power and wisdom are not shown by doing lesser things with greater means – that is contrary to reason and indicates a limited intelligence. Rather, they are shown by doing greater things with very simple and straightforward means (ibid.).

    How is Vision in God simpler? And simpler than what? One of the alternative theories that he considers in the Argument from Elimination is that God creates a complete set of innate ideas within each mind. But our mind is capable of thinking of an infinite number of figures, numbers, etc. Thus, if this alternative theory were true, it would mean God would have to create an infinite set of ideas for every finite mind. But as God already contains within his understanding a complete set of ideas or archetypes for creation, it is far simpler for him to reveal them to us, to allow us to see all things in him.

    One should not underestimate the intended force of this argument. Malebranche is not conceding that God could have stocked every mind with a complete set of innate ideas but just happened to act in accordance with his simplicity. One commentator has noted that in the first four editions of the Search, Malebranche begins the argument by saying, ‘although it is not absolutely denied that God can make an infinity of infinite numbers of entities representative of things with each mind he creates, nevertheless one ought not to believe that he does….’ Daisie Radner concludes on the basis of this statement that the appeal to simplicity is ‘not considered even by Malebranche to be one of the stronger arguments for seeing all things in God,’ for it does not rule out the alternative view, absolutely speaking (1978, 52). But this conclusion misunderstands the sentence above that Malebranche subsequently excised in later editions. To get a grip on what he means we must compare similar language, and a similar point about divine simplicity, to which Malebranche appeals in his theodicy (i.e., his solution to the problem of evil). He attempts to justify the existence of evil in the world by saying that although God wished to create the best of all possible worlds absolutely speaking, he was constrained to act in such ways as honor his attributes or perfections – especially his simplicity: ‘His ways must bear the character of His attributes, as well as His work. It is not enough that His work honor Him by its excellence; it is necessary in addition that His ways glorify Him by their Divinity’ (Dialogue 9, OC 12:214; JS 163). For Malebranche, God’s works and his ways (or means of creating) must honor him; he therefore strikes a balance between the ‘beauty of the work’ and the ‘simplicity of his ways’ (Dialogue 9, OC 12:215; JS 164). This is not the best of all possible worlds that God could create, absolutely speaking, but it is the best relative to the simplicity of his ways (Jolley 2004). In making this point, Malebranche is not claiming that God could have made a better world, for that would require violating his simplicity. On the supposition that he is going to create anything, God must act so as to honor his perfections; otherwise he would not be an all-perfect being, which is impossible. The same point applies to Malebranche’s epistemology; here too divine simplicity constitutes a side constraint on God’s actions, such that there is no genuine sense in which he could have created each mind with a complete set of ideas. Divine simplicity demands Vision in God.

  2. Dependence: It is a mark of Christian philosophy generally to stress the dependence of created beings on God. This emphasis manifests itself primarily in the traditional doctrine of divine concurrence, according to which God not only creates but also continually conserves finite minds and bodies in their existence. But Malebranche thinks this doctrine has an air of mystery to it, and fails to capture the magnitude and character of our dependence: ‘that general and confused term concourse, by means of which we would explain creatures’ dependence on God, rouses not a single distinct idea in an attentive mind’ (OC 1:440, LO 231). A proper conception of God entails that we depend on God in every way possible, not just ontologically but cognitively as well. Vision in God is the only theory that does justice to the latter, for on this account God not only causes us to see material objects but he is the one in whom we see them: ‘He is truly the mind’s light and the father of lights’ (ibid.).

    The view that created beings depend completely on God informs Malebranche’s entire philosophy. Indeed, Malebranche acknowledges this at the end of the chapter we are discussing, where he returns to the theme of dependence and invokes the words of St. Paul which he sees his philosophy as vindicating: ‘In God we live, move, and have our being’ (Acts 17:28). It is sometimes said that Vision in God is the ‘epistemological correlate’ of Malebranche’s Occasionalism, according to which God is the only true cause (McCracken 1983, 66; Nadler 1992, 141; Pyle 2003, 56). Where Occasionalism stresses our dependence on God’s power, Vision in God underscores our dependence on his wisdom. Without God, we are both causally and cognitively impotent.

  3. Infinite Cognitive Capacity: In his first argument, Malebranche appealed to the fact that we are capable of thinking of an infinite number of things, at least in principle, and this is obvious he thinks from considerations of mathematical objects, which are infinite in number. The question raised by the third argument – which Malebranche declares to be his ‘strongest’ – is how this infinite capacity is possible. He might have ended the argument here by concluding that we must see all things in God, for a finite mind is incapable of containing an infinity of beings. Instead, he attempts to strengthen his case by observing a further wrinkle in the nature of cognition. Malebranche asserts that whenever we desire to think of some particular object we must first survey all beings and then focus on the object we wish to think about. If we did not already have at least a general and confused apprehension of the object we wished to consider, then we could not direct our attention to it. Malebranche takes this to be a datum of our experience, but the underlying principle is of Platonic origin. Plato famously argues in the Meno that all knowledge is recollection, for it is impossible to inquire about that of which one is ignorant. One must be at least dimly aware of all things one seeks to know, and thus learning is more like remembering than discovering something entirely new (cf. McCracken 1983, 66). Augustine (On the Teacher10.33) had already adapted this argument for his own ends, and here Malebranche is following suit.

    So each of us is capable of thinking of an infinite number of things and, more importantly, in thinking of any particular thing one must grasp this infinity. It is at this point that Malebranche concludes (for the reason given above) that this infinity of beings must be in God, and that it is only through our union with God that these beings are present to us in thought. How does God contain this infinity? Not by literally being composed of an infinity of particular ideas, for again God is perfectly simple. On Malebranche’s conception, God is ‘being in general,’ ‘infinite being,’ or ‘being without restriction’ (3.2.8, OC 1:456; LO 241). In him, ‘all beings [are] contained in one’ precisely because he is infinite and indeterminate. This point allows him to further clarify the nature of cognition: ‘not only does the mind have the idea of the infinite, it even has it before that of the finite…. In order for us to conceive of a finite being, something must necessarily be eliminated from this general notion of being, which consequently must come first’ (3.2.6, OC 1:441; LO 232). Here Malebranche follows Descartes in affirming that the idea of the infinite is conceptually prior to the idea of the finite, but then adds a twist that pushes him away from Descartes (and closer to Spinoza), namely that we conceive particular things by limiting or negating the idea of the infinite.

  4. Causal Efficacy: In this argument, Malebranche begins by noting that ideas are causally efficacious ‘since they act upon the mind and enlighten it’ and ‘make it happy or unhappy through pleasant or unpleasant perceptions by which they affect it’ (3.2.6, OC 1:442; LO 232). To establish that these ideas are in God, he then invokes an Augustinian principle, namely that ‘nothing can act immediately upon the mind unless it is superior to it.’ To make sense of this principle, one must envisage, as Augustine did, a hierarchy of being in which minds are higher than bodies and God constitutes the upper limit of moral perfection. For Malebranche, these are the only substances there are. So it follows that only God can act on the soul and, insofar as they are efficacious, ideas must be the very substance of God.

  5. The Purpose of Creation: In his final argument, Malebranche appeals once again to creation, focusing this time on its purpose. He maintains that as an absolutely perfect being, God can act only for his own glory. There is nothing that he lacks for which created beings somehow compensate. Thus, God created the universe so that his works would reflect his perfections and, as much as possible, be directed toward him. As conscious beings whose thoughts point beyond themselves, minds are especially well suited to this purpose for only they are capable of knowing his perfections. But don’t we know other things besides God? Yes, Malebranche will answer, but given God’s aim in creation we can know his works only if we also see him to some extent (3.2.6, OC 1:442–3; LO 233). Vision in God satisfies this requirement, for it affirms that we see all things in God by way of ideas that are identical with his substance.

5. Efficacious Ideas

Malebranche is a philosopher whose thought developed markedly over time. In part this was due to his lively engagement with critics and his attempts to respond to their objections, and also to his recognition that his doctrines required further articulation than he had provided in earlier writings. One of the most significant developments to the theory of Vision in God was the view that ideas are causally efficacious. Malebranche had already argued that ideas have properties – necessity, eternality, immutability, universality, etc. – but in response to an objection by his Cartesian critic Pierre-Sylvain Régis, he came to ascribe causal powers to them as well. This new theory is introduced in the context of the claim that the mind is united to God, even in this life. It is because of this union, Malebranche maintains, that Vision in God is possible. We are always in immediate contact with being in general and so can focus our attention on the idea of intelligible extension at any time or immediately perceive it in sense perception.

Régis was rightly curious about the nature of this union with God. Malebranche had spoken metaphorically of the ‘presence’ of God to the mind, but without ever specifying what he meant. Régis noted that this union cannot be understood on the model of the union of one body with another, for that requires actual physical contact; nor should it be thought to resemble the mind’s union with the body, for that would make the mind and God mutually dependent on each other, and the infinite being depends on nothing. No, Régis argued, the only viable way to understand the God-mind union is on the model of cause to effect, respectively. At this point he uncovers an important objection that he had been anticipating: if mind-God union is to be understood causally, then it is still possible that we perceive bodies by means of ideas that are in us, but caused by bodies themselves, as Descartes himself had taught (SG 1:188; also see Schmaltz 2000, 76–7).

In his response, Malebranche attempts to exploit Régis’ suggestion but without leaving the door open to Cartesianism. Lacking causal efficacy and being ‘invisible’ in themselves, bodies cannot act directly on the mind in the way that Régis had indicated. In virtue of being in God, however, the idea of extension can ‘affect’ or ‘touch’ the mind in various ways (OC 17–1, 282–3). In changes made to previously published works, two years later (1695), Malebranche even more explicitly ties the intelligibility of ideas to their causal efficacy (Robinet 1965, 259, note 2). Readers are told for the first time that the reason ideas are intelligible and bodies are not is because only the former can act on the mind.

The theory that ideas are efficacious becomes Malebranche’s mature position, and to mark this development changes are made to later editions of the Search and to other writings. With the advent of this theory, it becomes easier to see the relation between Vision in God and Malebranche’s other main doctrine of Occasionalism, or the view that God is the only genuine cause. Indeed, one can regard Vision in God as a corollary to Occasionalism. As the only true cause, God produces minds, bodies, and the various changes they endure. The mind’s nature is to think and to perceive, and God produces those modifications via ideas, which are the instruments by which he enlightens us.

Make no mistake about it, the theory of efficacious ideas marks a significant development in the doctrine of Vision in God. One commentator aptly notes that Malebranche’s epistemology shifts from being a vision in God to a vision by God (Alquié 1974, 209). Ideas are no longer the direct objects of perception, passively awaiting our reflection upon them, but the active agents of cognition. Moreover, whereas on Malebranche’s earlier view ideas figured exclusively in the intellectual side of perception, on the new version of the doctrine they cause both our sensations and what he came to call our ‘pure perceptions’ (perceptions pures). Malebranche had been reluctant previously to say that ideas are ‘sensible’ lest he attribute colors and other sensible qualities to God. But on the revamped doctrine he can say that ideas are both sensible and intelligible insofar as they causally affect our mind in different ways (Schmaltz 2000, 80). ‘When the idea of extension affects or modifies the soul with a pure perception, then the soul conceives simply this extension. But when the idea of extension touches the soul more sharply, and affects it with a sense perception, then the soul sees, or senses extension’ (Christian Conversations3, OC 4:75–6). Thus, the theory of efficacious ideas enables Malebranche to offer a more unified theory of cognition.

6. Skepticism

One of the hallmarks of Descartes’ epistemological project is its obsession with refuting skepticism. Descartes begins his Meditations by entertaining the widest and most radical doubts possible so that he can defeat them once and for all. Some commentators have suggested that Malebranche’s doctrine of Vision in God is also designed to refute skepticism, at least concerning our knowledge of the essence of material things, but in fact the relation of his epistemology to skepticism is more complex, and he is best read as aiming for something more modest. Although Malebranche is as obsessed as Descartes with finding the correct method for discovering the truth, nothing like the Cartesian method of universal doubt can be found in his writings. There is a very simple reason for this: Malebranche refuses to take seriously some of the more radical forms of skepticism. He never doubts that certain types of knowledge are possible. The task of the doctrine of Vision in God then is not to refute skepticism, but to show how such knowledge is possible. The problem with rival theories of cognition, especially Descartes’, is that they encourage skepticism and fail to account for the knowledge we clearly have.

At times, Descartes seems to allow that there are some truths – such as the simple propositions of mathematics – that can never be doubted, but in darker moods that carry the day he worries whether an omnipotent deceiver might beguile us even about these. Malebranche, however, is more impressed by Descartes’ first inclination. That I exist, that I have various thoughts, and that twice two equals four are not subject to deception but are known by what Malebranche calls ‘simple perception,’ by which the mind ‘perceives a simple thing without any relation to anything else whatsoever’ (Search 1.2, OC 1:49; LO 7). He opposes simple perception to reasoning or inference: whereas the former consists in a direct or immediate grasp of something, reasoning constitutes an indirect apprehension and involves more than one mental act (Schmaltz 1996, 24). Because of the latter, reasoning requires the use of memory, which is subject to error and deception:

For when we reason, the memory acts; and where there is memory, there can be error, should there be some evil genius on whom we depend in our knowledge who amuses himself by deceiving us…. [But] I am quite persuaded that he could not deceive me in my knowledge through simple perception…. For even if I should really suppose such a God, a God as powerful as I can imagine, I feel that in this extravagant supposition I could not doubt that I am, or that twice two equals four, because I perceive these things through simple perception without the use of memory. (Search 6.2.6, OC 2:370; LO 480–1)

Malebranche does not quite say here why he thinks things known through simple perception are impervious to the omnipotent-deceiver doubt, though his examples provide some indication. Descartes himself had said that even a malicious demon could not make him doubt his own existence, at least while he is presently attending to this question. Such doubts are self-defeating: if the demon deceives me about anything then I must exist in order to be deceived. Rather than offering an explanation of this kind, Malebranche is content here simply to report on his own psychological response to the ‘extravagant supposition’ of a deceiving God, which fails to instill doubts in him about such simple truths. This supposition, however, does cause him to doubt things that depend on inference and here he is quite explicit that this is due to the fallibility of memory.

To defeat doubts of the latter variety, Malebranche thinks, ‘It is … necessary to know by simple perception and not by inference that God is not a deceiver, because reasoning can always be mistaken if we assume God to be a deceiver’ (ibid., OC 2:371; LO 481). Malebranche is indicating here his own analysis of, and solution to, the infamous Cartesian Circle. As he sees it, the Circle results from ‘ordinary proofs of the existence and the perfections of God’ that involve inferences and hence are subject to the very doubts that their conclusions are designed to dispel. Since on his view, simple perceptions are not subject to doubts of this or any kind, the only way to defeat the omnipotent deceiver doubt is by establishing that God exists and is perfectly benevolent from ‘proofs’ by simple perception. The term ‘proofs’ here may seem confusing, given Malebranche’s distinction between simple perception and inference, but he uses it loosely to refer to his version of the ontological ‘argument,’ where God’s existence is established directly from the idea of an infinite or supremely perfect being. Malebranche thinks that one of the virtues of the doctrine of Vision in God is that it provides such a proof by simple perception. Recall from our earlier discussion in section 4 that Malebranche thinks we have an infinite cognitive capacity; for example, we can think of any one of an infinite number of geometrical figures. A precondition for this capacity, he maintains, is that we be in constant and immediate union with the idea of being in general, which we then delimit in various ways when thinking ‘square,’ ‘circle,’ etc. But the idea of being in general or the infinite can’t be in any finite thing such as our mind. It can only be in God – more precisely, it can only be God himself, for there can be only one infinite or all-encompassing being:

we can only apprehend the infinite in the infinite itself…. For the first principle of our knowledge is that nothingness is not perceptible, whence if follows that, if we think of the infinite, it must exist. We also see that God is not a deceiver, because, knowing that He is infinitely perfect and that the infinite cannot lack any perfection, we clearly see that He does not want to beguile us…. (ibid., OC 2:372; LO 481–2)

Although Malebranche sometimes refers to the ‘idea’ of God, strictly speaking, ‘The infinite is its own idea’ (Dialogue 2, OC 12:53; JS 23). And we can explain our infinite cognitive capacity only by our union with this infinite being, who must therefore exist.

In addition to thinking that there are some truths that are impervious to doubt, Malebranche also has a different understanding of Descartes’ principle that whatever one clearly and distinctly is true. Descartes maintains that when I clearly and distinctly perceive something my will is causally compelled to affirm it. So, for example, if I understand the proposition that five is the sum of two added to three then I will spontaneously affirm its truth. But as one commentator has noted, Malebranche has a normative, rather than a causal-psychological conception, of clear and distinct perceptions (Lennon 2000). Reason ‘obliges,’ rather than causally compels, my will to assent. Indeed, I can resist a clear and distinct perception, but only at the risk of ‘feeling an inward pain and the secret reproaches of reason’ (Search 1.2, OC 1:55; LO 10). This is significant because it explains why Malebranche refuses to take some forms of skepticism seriously: skepticism with respect to things perceived through clear and distinct perceptions is simply perverse, for it violates norms to which reason demands adherence (Lennon 2000, 19).

So far, we have seen that Malebranche is concerned to defeat some forms of skepticism and is contemptuous and dismissive of others. Although Vision in God plays a prominent role in defeating skepticism of the first variety, regarding inference, its more primary task is to explain how knowledge is possible. This point is evident in some of the demonstrations that Malebranche marshals in support of the doctrine, which have the character of ‘transcendental arguments.’ Transcendental arguments typically begin with some claim about knowledge that is taken as given. The transcendental move then involves showing that such knowledge is possible only if some condition, or set of conditions, has been satisfied. We might view the Argument from Properties, discussed in section 3, as an example of such an argument. Malebranche argues that the condition for the possibility of knowledge of truths that are necessary, immutable, and common to all minds or intelligences is that we see all things in God:

No one disagrees that all men can know the truth, and even the least enlightened of philosophers agree that man participates in a certain Reason that they do not determine …. I see, for example, that twice two is four, and that my friend is to be valued more than my dog; and I am certain that no one in the world does not see this as well as I…. There must, therefore, be a universal Reason that enlightens me and all other intelligences. For if the reason I consult were not the same that answers the Chinese, it is clear that I could not be as certain as I am that the Chinese see the same truths as I do. (Elucidation 10, OC 3:129; LO 613)

Malebranche begins here by assuming that we have knowledge of mathematical and moral truths. The problem involves showing how this knowledge is possible, and he resolves it by appealing to Vision in God. The Argument from Properties is not the only demonstration in Malebranche’s arsenal that has a transcendental flavor. Indeed, one can view all of his positive arguments for Vision in God, including those discussed in section 4, as constituting an over-arching transcendental argument. Viewed in this way, each of the considerations that he puts forth are not so much separate arguments as they are separate conditions for the possibility of knowledge that only Vision in God can jointly satisfy.

Malebranche’s primary objection to other theories of cognition, then, is that they fail to satisfy these conditions and, in the case of Descartes’ theory in particular, encourage the skeptic’s claim that we lack knowledge. Descartes’ very conception of ideas as perceptions, or modifications of finite minds, makes it impossible to guarantee that they accurately represent their objects:

For if our ideas were only our perceptions, if our modes were representative, how would we know that things correspond to our ideas, since God does not think, and consequently does not act, according to our perceptions but according to His own; and therefore He did not create the world according to our perceptions but in accordance with His ideas, on its eternal model that He finds in His essence (Search 4.11, OC 2:99; LO 320).

[T]o maintain that ideas that are eternal, immutable, and common to all intelligences, are only perceptions or momentary particular modifications of the mind, is to establish Pyrrhonism and to make room for the belief that what is moral or immoral is not necessarily so, which is the most dangerous error of all. (Elucidation 10, OC 3:140; LO 620)

As discussed in section 3, Descartes insists that our ideas of geometrical figures and the like are ‘eternal’ and ‘immutable’ (and Malebranche takes him also to hold that they are ‘common to all intelligences’), but Malebranche wonders here how this can be possible if they are merely fleeting modes of finite minds. To identify ideas with such modes suggests that they are merely subjective representations that vary among perceivers, and whose correspondence to reality can never be established. It thus invites skepticism (or ‘Pyrrhonism,’ an ancient form of skepticism, though here the term just means radical or universal skepticism) regarding our knowledge of the essences of created things.

Again, the virtue of Vision in God is that rather than encouraging skepticism, it shows how knowledge is possible. If ideas are eternal and immutable realities in God that serve as his archetypes for creation, then there is no problem about whether they conform to their objects. On the contrary, created objects must conform to them:

It is certain that things conform to the idea that God has of them. For since God created them, He can only have made them according to the idea that He has of them. Now according to the opinion that I maintain, the idea that I have of extension in length, breadth, and depth is not a modification of my soul: it is eternal, immutable, necessary, common to God and all intelligences, and this idea is the model of created extension from which all bodies are formed. I can thus affirm with truth of created extension what I see contained in this uncreated idea. (OCM 9:925–6)

7. Objections and Replies

Although Malebranche had his share of admirers and imitators, he also had his share of critics. The theory of Vision in God was subjected to severe and sometimes bitter attacks by some of his contemporaries, especially Cartesians such as Arnauld and Régis who saw themselves as defending the legacy of Descartes against a corrupting influence. Fortunately for us, Malebranche was eager to defend himself and his replies to criticisms often help elucidate and amplify his original doctrine, as stated in the first edition (1674) of the Search After Truth. In some cases, these replies are quite extensive. Although the dispute with Arnauld ranged over other topics, and was originally sparked by theological differences, it lasted some 11 years and occupies several volumes (four of Malebranche’s, two of Arnauld’s) of their collected works. Some of Malebranche’s critics were dismissive of his doctrine. ‘[Vision in God] is an opinion that spreads not and is like to die of itself, or at least do no great harm,’ John Locke was reported as saying three days before his death (quoted in Cranston 1957, 478). Malebranche, however, could be equally disparaging of his opponents. To his critic Simon Foucher, he quipped: ‘When one criticizes a book, it seems to me necessary at least to have read it’ (OC 2:496). But once the dust from the ad hominems settled, several important philosophical issues became apparent. We shall begin here by discussing objections to the doctrine that were prevalent in Malebranche’s own time and his replies to them. We’ll focus on internal criticisms, that is, objections that purport to expose incoherencies, unsound arguments, and inconsistencies with larger aspects of his philosophy (as opposed to complaints, for example, about his Cartesian infidelities). Toward the end of this section, we shall examine a few objections that have been raised by recent commentators.

Let’s begin with an objection that may have already occurred to the reader. Malebranche claims that the idea of the infinite cannot be a modification of our mind, for our mind is finite; it can only reside in God, the sole infinite being. But anyone familiar with Descartes’ causal argument for God’s existence, from the Third Meditation, knows that he argued otherwise. We have an innate idea of an actually infinite being that has been implanted in us by God himself. How, as finite beings, can we contain such an idea? To answer this question, Descartes drew an important distinction between two aspects of an idea – its so-called ‘formal’ being and its ‘objective,’ or representational, being. Formal being is the kind of being or reality that ideas have in virtue of being modes or modifications of one’s mind. As such, they all have the same degree of finite reality. Whether I am thinking of the sun, my own mind, or an infinite substance, my ideas in this case are all finite, formally speaking. However, insofar as they represent different things to my mind, my ideas have different degrees of what he calls ‘objective reality,’ exploiting a notion prevalent among scholastic philosophers. The idea of myself as a thinking thing, for example, has a finite degree of objective reality, while the idea of God has an infinite degree of such reality. The level of objective reality of an idea is determined by the level of reality that the object it represents has formally. So Descartes thought that as a finite being, my ideas must all have a finite degree of formal reality, but they can have varying degrees of objective reality all the way up to the infinite level. He would thus reject Malebranche’s claim that insofar as my ideas represent something infinite, they must reside in God.

One should not suppose that Malebranche was unaware of Descartes’ distinction between formal and objective reality. On the contrary, he casts the distinction in even starker terms: the mind’s perceptions have formal reality, and only formal reality, for they do not represent anything beyond themselves. Objective reality is reserved for ideas in God, the only representative beings. But why can’t ideas be perceptions in finite minds? In particular, why can’t our mind have an idea with infinite objective reality? As faithful Cartesians, Arnauld and Régis both raise this objection against Malebranche, though using slightly different technical vocabulary. Instead of speaking of formal and objective reality, they speak of something being finite or infinite in essendo as opposed to finite or infinite in repraesentando, respectively. Addressing Malebranche directly, Arnauld writes:

[I]t is not true that a modality of our soul, which is finite, cannot represent an infinite thing; and it is true, on the contrary, that however finite our perceptions may be, there are some which must pass for infinite in this sense, that they represent the infinite. This is what M. Régis correctly maintained to you, and what he meant by these terms, that they are finite in essendo, and infinite in repraesentando. You are not happy with this distinction. Too bad for you. (OA 40:88–9; also see Régis SG 1:194)

Malebranche responds:

[S]ince [the modalities of our soul] are finite, we cannot find the infinite there, since nothingness is not visible, and one cannot perceive in the soul what is not there. Similarly, from the fact that I perceive in a circle an infinity of equal diameters, or rather, from the fact that there are equal diameters therein in repraesentando, I must concede that they are really there in essendo. For, in effect, a circle contains the reality of an infinity of diameters. In order, then for a reality to be present to the mind, for it to affect the mind, for the mind to perceive or receive it, it necessarily must really be there. (OC 9:954)

Malebranche’s reply is subtle and lends itself to multiple interpretations (see e.g., Nadler 1992, 41f; Radner 1978, 107–8, 110–18 and Schmaltz 2000, 73). One way to understand it is to compare it to a causal principle that Descartes invokes in his argument for God’s existence in the Third Meditation. He claims that the objective reality of an idea (such as that of God) must have a cause with at least as much formal reality. Using this principle, he concludes that only a being with infinite formal reality can be the cause of the (infinite) objective reality of my idea of such being. Now, Malebranche is not concerned with causes in this context but with what is required for something to be present to the mind; nevertheless, he is making the same general point: something cannot give what reality it does not have. In perceiving a general idea, such as a circle, we are able to perceive an infinite number of possible diameters (and thus an infinity of possible particular circles). Thus, the general idea of circle contains an infinite degree of reality. If this idea were a modification of my mind, my mind itself would have to be infinite, which it clearly is not.

How should we assess Malebranche’s reply? To the contemporary reader, the suggestion that ideas and things can have different levels of reality or being sounds bizarre, but to his seventeenth-century readers, especially his Cartesian adversaries, this was a common view. Evaluated from that perspective, Malebranche’s response holds up well.

Let us now consider a second objection, related to the first. A good general source of objections to Vision in God is Malebranche’s own Elucidations, which was first appended to the Search in 1678, only four years after the original edition. There he faces objections that had already been raised against the doctrine, but also anticipates criticisms that were to be developed later, such as Arnauld’s worry that Vision in God reduces to Vision of God, which we have already discussed. One of the objections canvassed there raises a cluster of difficulties. Malebranche claims that God is the locus of intelligibility, but why couldn’t this ‘intelligible world’ (monde intelligible) reside in our own mind? God supposedly sees all possible creatures in his own perfections, but why couldn’t the mind see extension at least in its own being? Malebranche subscribes to what might be called a ‘cognitive resemblance thesis,’ which holds that the immediate object of cognition must have the same nature as the mind, which is immaterial or spiritual. According to this principle, in order for the mind to see material things in themselves, it would have to be material. But how is God any better off here, as he too is immaterial? ‘The soul is not material, admitted. But God, though he is a pure spirit, sees bodies in himself; why could not the soul, then, see them by considering itself, even though it itself is spiritual?’ (OC 3:147, LO 624).

To answer this objection, Malebranche stresses the distinction between infinite and finite natures, as he understands it: whereas the mind is a limited, particular being, God is ‘universal being’ or ‘being without restriction’ that consists of an infinity of perfections. Because he is infinite and indeterminate, God can contain the perfections of materials things in an ‘eminent’ or higher sense, without thereby becoming extended. ‘But as the soul is a particular being, a limited being, it cannot have extension in it without becoming material, without being composed of two substances’ (OC 3:148, ibid.). The thesis that God contains the perfections of created beings ‘eminently,’ as opposed to ‘formally’ or literally, is one that Malebranche borrows from Descartes, but he puts his own spin on it by conceiving God as a general being. Recall that Malebranche appropriates this conception from St. Thomas Aquinas and, indeed, invokes the saint’s name here:

God’s ideas of creatures are, as Saint Thomas says, only his essence, insofar as it is participable or imperfectly imitable, for God contains every creaturely perfection, though in a divine and infinite way; he is one and he is all…. But the soul … is a particular being, a very limited and imperfect being. Certainly it cannot see in itself what is not there in any way at all. How could we see in one species of being all species of being, or in a finite and particular being a triangle in general and infinite triangles? (OC 3:149, LO 625)

The claim that God is ‘being in general,’ however, invites further objections, both theological and philosophical. The God of Christianity is supposed to be a personal savior who hears our prayers and absolves us of sin, not an abstract universal.[1] It may be difficult to save Malebranche (or Aquinas) from this objection, but one should note that the ‘God of the philosophers,’ conceived of in purely intellectual terms as an infinite and all perfect being, is already removed from the more churchly conception. To add that God is universal being takes us even further from that conception, though the Christian philosopher can always insist that scripture need not be taken literally. Malebranche himself maintains that his view of God follows from divine infinity, which of course has a scriptural basis.

The conception of God as being in general also offended the philosophical sensibilities of the seventeenth century, which tended to favor a nominalist or conceptualist account of universals. According to this anti-Platonistic view, which had adherents among rationalists (e.g., Descartes) and empiricists (e.g., Locke) alike, the only things that exist are particulars, and so-called universals such as numbers or geometric objects are merely concepts or names. To conceive God as a universal violates this creed and, in the view of Locke specifically, makes God a bare abstraction (McCracken 1983, 139). Malebranche, however, maintains that the existence of God or being in general is necessary to explain the very possibility of abstract thought:

the mind would be incapable of representing universal ideas of genus, species, and so on, to itself had it not seen all beings contained in one…. [S]ense can be made of the way the mind knows certain abstract and general truths only through the presence of Him who can enlighten the mind in an infinity of different ways. (Search 3.2.6, OC 1:441; LO 232)

It is not clear, however, that the possibility of abstract cognition demands Vision in God. Some rival theories of abstract cognition, prevalent in the period, did not require a Platonistic ontology, and arguably were more philosophically satisfying.

This brings us to yet another objection, concerning the ontology of ideas in God. Following Descartes, Malebranche proclaims throughout his work that everything that exists is either a substance or a modification of a substance. Thus, it would seem that if ideas are in God then they too must be either substances in their own right or divine modifications. Malebranche explicitly denies the latter, for God is immutable and thus ‘incapable of modifications’ (Elucidation 10, OC 3:149; LO 625). But they cannot be substances either for that would violate the theological doctrine that God is perfectly simple (more on this below). Malebranche, it would appear, is forced to abandon his substance-mode ontology: ‘I believe that intelligible extension is neither a substance nor a modification of substance, notwithstanding the axiom of the Philosophers [that everything is a either a substance or a mode]’ (OC 6:245). One must be careful, however, not to read this remark as conceding defeat, for in the continuation of this reply to Arnauld and in the passage above, he identifies ideas with God’s substance: ‘God’s ideas of creatures are … only His essence, insofar as it is participable or imperfectly imitable’ (Elucidation 10, OC 3:149; LO 625). Perhaps Malebranche is not inconsistent after all for, as it turns out, ideas are substances, just not distinct substances. They are God’s substance conceived of in a certain way. The problem, unfortunately, goes beyond the issue of whether Malebranche is inconsistent. We are never given a clear account of the ontology of ideas; even in identifying them with God he must rely on the Platonic metaphor of participation.

There is also considerable pressure in Malebranche’s philosophy against identifying ideas with God (even with all of the qualifications that identification usually assumes). In holding that God creates via archetypes, Malebranche seems committed to the position that ideas are discrete, and not just as we perceive them but for God himself. This may require only one idea of extension, but there also must be an idea of the mind. This again raises the problem of reconciling the theory of ideas with divine simplicity, a doctrine to which Malebranche is strongly committed and, ironically, to which he appeals in arguing for Vision in God (see section 4). Even two discrete ideas in God would be sufficient to violate his simplicity, and sometimes Malebranche speaks as if there are more. He recognizes that there is a problem here: ‘there is a great deal of difficulty in reconciling the Divine Being’s simplicity with this variety of intelligible ideas that He contains in His wisdom’ (ibid., OC 3:137, LO 618). But his only solution is to appeal to divine incomprehensibility. ‘[T]he divine substance in its simplicity … is beyond our reach….’ (Dialogue 2, OC 12:52; JS 22).

Far from trying to reconcile divine simplicity with his theory of ideas, Malebranche seems to exacerbate the problem in some of the ways he characterizes ideas. In Elucidation 10 and elsewhere, for example, he speaks of the ‘parts’ of intelligible extension (see e.g., Elucidation 10, OC 3:152–3; LO 627). This locution led Arnauld and others to worry not just about divine simplicity but whether Malebranche was a Spinozistic pantheist who identified God with extension. Malebranche replied that by ‘parts’ he meant intelligible parts, not spatial ones (Dialogue 4, OC 12:95, JS 58), but it is not clear how this solves the problem, especially since these so-called intelligible parts continue to function like spatial ones within his theory, becoming larger or smaller depending on the object we are perceiving and our perspective on it (Radner 1978, 117f). The charge of Spinozism would continue to haunt Malebranche throughout his career and was developed with even greater zeal by a former student named Dortuous de Mairan toward the end of his life.

One recent commentator has tried to make sense of Malebranche’s talk of intelligible parts, in a way that preserves God’s simplicity and avoids the dangers of pantheism, by conceiving intelligible extension as a set of “point-like entities” that correspond to material extension. Jasper Reid stresses that the former are not real points and that the relation between them is not one of actual distance. Indeed, he maintains that these intelligible points are points only in relation to the intellect that conceives intelligible extension in a partial manner. One virtue of this interpretation, he argues, is that it establishes an isomorphism or identity of structure between intelligible extension and the corporeal world without making the former materially extended (2003, 600). Reid’s view is motivated in part by the conviction that Malebranche conceived representation in terms of resemblance. Intelligible extension can represent the material world only if it resembles it in some way. He sees Malebranche’s talk of intelligible parts as gesturing at the aforementioned structural resemblance. Reid’s view is very ingenious but it suffers from philosophical and textual shortcomings. Although one other commentator (Watson 1966) has argued that Malebranche conceived representation in terms of resemblance, the textual basis for such a claim is rather dubious (see Nadler 1992, 46f). More fatally, Reid’s view requires that one conceive of material extension as consisting of a system of extensionless points, but, like other mathematical objects, points are abstractions or idealizations that do not exist in nature. As Malebranche notes in the Search, “Nature is not abstract: the levers and balls of mechanics are not the lines and circles of mathematics” (OC 2:277; LO 428). In short, Reid’s view works only if one idealizes material extension, something Malebranche refuses to do.

Recent commentators have developed some of the traditional criticisms of the doctrine of Vision in God and proposed new ones of their own. These days many commentators are impressed by the link between Malebranchean ideas and logical concepts (e.g., Jolley 1990, McCracken 1983, Nadler 1992, Pyle 2003). Whereas Cartesian ideas were psychological entities or modes of finite minds, Malebranchean ideas are abstract, logical entities residing in a third realm (over and above minds and bodies). The virtue of this conception is that it explains how two or more people can be said to be thinking of the same abstract object, such as the number ‘two,’ and how various properties, such as the Pythagorean Theorem, can be said to follow logically from the idea of a right triangle. It also pushes Malebranche closer to Frege, Kant, and other more recent philosophical heroes, and makes him appear prescient with respect to certain insights characteristic of contemporary analytic philosophy.

On the other hand, it also resurrects with renewed vigor some of the problems considered above. Most notably, if ideas are abstract, logical entities, then they are even more difficult to reconcile with Malebranche’s substance-mode ontology. Indeed, one commentator has argued that, to avoid inconsistency, Malebranche ought to have made a clean break with the Cartesian assumption that everything is either a substance or a mode in favor of a more ‘trialistic’ view that grants that ideas, qua third realm entities, are sui generis (Jolley 1990, 79). As abstract entities, it is also difficult to understand how ideas can have causal powers, in keeping with the doctrine of efficacious ideas, or how they can be identical with God’s substance (Jolley 1990, 76f). In Malebranche’s defense, one might note that the latter problem arises only from regarding ideas as logical entities. Perhaps ideas in God should not be conceived in this manner (Pepper-Bates 2005, 93).

Among recent objections to Vision in God, one of the most important concerns the relation of intelligible extension to sensations. As we have seen, Malebranche draws an important distinction between these but also thinks that sense perception combines elements of each. To the sensory component Malebranche accords a crucial role in explaining how intelligible extension is ‘particularized’ or individuated, so as to represent a material object in the world. Sensations of color and light, he says, are ‘projected’ or ‘painted’ onto intelligible extension as if it were an artist’s canvas. The problem, however, is in understanding how these radically disparate entities – ideas and sensations – can have any commerce with each other. Even if we reject the reading that ideas are logical entities, they are nevertheless general and pure, and thus different in kind from sensations.

One proposed solution to this difficulty involves the notion of ‘seeing as’ (see Nolan 2012, 27–32). Malebranche’s painting analogy is merely a metaphor. Sensations of course are not literally painted onto intelligible extension. In fact, intelligible extension is not altered by our perception of it since, like all things in God, it is immutable. Rather, we see intelligible extension as a particular object, such as a tree or a mountain, even though its intrinsic nature is very different. These different ways of perceiving nevertheless qualify as cases of seeing intelligible extension because, according to the doctrine of efficacious ideas, it causes us to perceive it in these different ways. In fact, when intelligible extension affects our mind with one set of sensations, we see it as a mountain; when it produces another set of sensations in us, we see it as a white-winged bird flying against a blue sky, etc. Malebranche writes:

there need be in God no sensible bodies or real figures in intelligible extension in order for us to see them in God or for God to see them in Himself. It is enough that His substance, insofar as the corporeal creature can participate in it, should be able to be perceived in different ways. (Elucidation 10, OC 3:152; LO 626; emphasis added)

Later in the same work he adds: “we see all things in God through the efficacy of his substance, and particularly sensible things, through God’s applying intelligible extension to our mind in a thousand different ways” (OC 3:154, LO 628).

One attraction of this interpretation is that it also provides a satisfying reply to de Mairan’s objection, considered above, that Malebranche succumbs to Spinozism by ascribing parts to intelligible extension. Once again, Malebranche could avail himself of the notion of seeing as: we see intelligible extension as having parts even though it lacks real parts because it causes us to do so. Given Malebranche’s representationalism, seeing intelligible extension in this way explains how we see the material world as divided into discrete bodies (see Nolan 2012, 35–37).


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Other Internet Resources

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