Baruch Spinoza

First published Fri Jun 29, 2001; substantive revision Wed Nov 8, 2023

Bento (in Hebrew, Baruch; in Latin, Benedictus) Spinoza is one of the most important philosophers—and certainly the most radical—of the early modern period. His thought combines a commitment to a number of Cartesian metaphysical and epistemological principles with elements from ancient Stoicism, Hobbes, and medieval Jewish rationalism into a nonetheless highly original system. His extremely naturalistic views on God, the world, the human being and knowledge serve to ground a moral philosophy centered on the control of the passions leading to virtue and happiness. They also lay the foundations for a strongly democratic political thought and a deep critique of the pretensions of Scripture and sectarian religion. Of all the philosophers of the seventeenth century, Spinoza is among the most relevant today.

1. Biography

Bento (in Hebrew, Baruch; in Latin, Benedictus: all three names mean “blessed”) Spinoza was born in 1632 in Amsterdam. He was the middle son in a prominent family of moderate means in Amsterdam’s Portuguese-Jewish community. As a boy he had undoubtedly been one of the star pupils in the congregation’s Talmud Torah school. He was intellectually gifted, and this could not have gone unremarked by the congregation’s rabbis. It is possible that Spinoza, as he made progress through his studies, was being groomed for a career as a rabbi. But he never made it into the upper levels of the curriculum, those which included advanced study of Talmud. At the age of seventeen, he was forced to cut short his formal studies to help run the family’s importing business.

And then, on July 27, 1656, Spinoza was issued the harshest writ of herem, ban or excommunication, ever pronounced by the Sephardic community of Amsterdam; it was never rescinded. We do not know for certain what Spinoza’s “monstrous deeds” and “abominable heresies” were alleged to have been, but an educated guess comes quite easy. No doubt he was giving utterance to just those ideas that would soon appear in his philosophical treatises. In those works, Spinoza denies the immortality of the soul; strongly rejects the notion of a transcendent, providential God—the God of Abraham, Isaac and Jacob; and claims that the Law (i.e., the commandments of the Torah and rabbinic legal principles) was neither literally given by God nor any longer binding on Jews. Can there be any mystery as to why one of history’s boldest and most radical thinkers was sanctioned by an orthodox Jewish community?

To all appearances, Spinoza was content finally to have an excuse for departing from the community and leaving Judaism behind; his faith and religious commitment were, by this point, gone. Within a few years, he left Amsterdam altogether. By the time his extant correspondence begins, in 1661, he is living in Rijnsburg, not far from Leiden. While in Rijnsburg, he worked on the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, an essay on philosophical method, and the Short Treatise on God, Man and His Well-Being, an initial but aborted effort to lay out his metaphysical, epistemological and moral views. His critical exposition of Descartes’s Principles of Philosophy, the only work he published under his own name in his lifetime, was completed in 1663, after he had moved to Voorburg, outside The Hague. By this time, he was also working on what would eventually be called the Ethics, his philosophical masterpiece. However, when he saw the principles of toleration in Holland being threatened by reactionary forces, including political meddling by the Dutch Reformed Church, he put it aside to complete his “scandalous” Theological-Political Treatise, published anonymously and to great alarm in 1670 (one overwrought critic called it “a book forged in hell by the devil himself”). When Spinoza died in 1677, in The Hague, he was still at work on his Political Treatise; this was soon published by his friends along with his other unpublished writings, including a Compendium of Hebrew Grammar.

2. Ethics

The Ethics is an ambitious and multifaceted work. It is also bold to the point of audacity, as one would expect of a systematic and unforgiving critique of the traditional philosophical and theological conceptions of God, the human being and the universe, especially as these serve as the foundation of the major organized religions and their moral and ceremonial rules. What Spinoza intends to demonstrate (in the strongest sense of that word) is the truth about God, nature and especially ourselves, and the most certain and useful principles of society, religion and the good life. Despite the great deal of metaphysics, physics, anthropology and psychology that take up Parts One through Three, Spinoza took the crucial message of the work to be ethical in nature. It consists in showing that our happiness and well-being lie not in a life enslaved to the passions and to the transitory goods we ordinarily pursue, nor in the related unreflective attachment to the superstitions that pass as religion, but rather in the life of reason. To clarify and support these broadly ethical conclusions, however, Spinoza must first demystify the universe and show it for what it really is. This requires laying out some metaphysical foundations, the project of Part One.

2.1 God or Nature

“On God” begins with some deceptively simple definitions of terms that would be familiar to any seventeenth century philosopher. “By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself”; “By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence”; “By God I understand a being absolutely infinite, i.e., a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.” The definitions of Part One are, in effect, simply clear concepts that ground the rest of his system. They are followed by a number of axioms that, he assumes, will be regarded as obvious and unproblematic by the philosophically informed (“Whatever is, is either in itself or in another”; “From a given determinate cause the effect follows necessarily”). From these, the first proposition necessarily follows, and every subsequent proposition can be demonstrated using only what precedes it. (References to the Ethics will be by part (I–V), proposition (p), definition (d), scholium (s) and corollary (c).)

In propositions one through fifteen of Part One, Spinoza presents the basic elements of his picture of God. God is the infinite, necessarily existing (that is, self-caused), unique substance of the universe. There is only one substance in the universe; it is God; and everything else that is, is in God.

Proposition 1: A substance is prior in nature to its affections.

Proposition 2: Two substances having different attributes have nothing in common with one another. (In other words, if two substances differ in nature, then they have nothing in common).

Proposition 3: If things have nothing in common with one another, one of them cannot be the cause of the other.

Proposition 4: Two or more distinct things are distinguished from one another, either by a difference in the attributes [i.e., the natures or essences] of the substances or by a difference in their affections [i.e., their accidental properties].

Proposition 5: In nature, there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.

Proposition 6: One substance cannot be produced by another substance.

Proposition 7: It pertains to the nature of a substance to exist.

Proposition 8: Every substance is necessarily infinite.

Proposition 9: The more reality or being each thing has, the more attributes belong to it.

Proposition 10: Each attribute of a substance must be conceived through itself.

Proposition 11: God, or a substance consisting of infinite attributes, each of which expresses eternal and infinite essence, necessarily exists. (The proof of this proposition consists simply in the classic “ontological proof for God’s existence”. Spinoza writes that “if you deny this, conceive, if you can, that God does not exist. Therefore, by axiom 7 [‘If a thing can be conceived as not existing, its essence does not involve existence’], his essence does not involve existence. But this, by proposition 7, is absurd. Therefore, God necessarily exists, q.e.d.”)

Proposition 12: No attribute of a substance can be truly conceived from which it follows that the substance can be divided.

Proposition 13: A substance which is absolutely infinite is indivisible.

Proposition 14: Except God, no substance can be or be conceived.

This proof that God—an infinite, eternal (necessary and self-caused), indivisible being—is the only substance of the universe proceeds in three simple steps. First, establish that no two substances can share an attribute or essence (Ip5). Then, prove that there is a substance with infinite attributes (i.e., God) (Ip11). It follows, in conclusion, that the existence of that infinite substance precludes the existence of any other substance. For if there were to be a second substance, it would have to have some attribute or essence. But since God has all possible attributes, then the attribute to be possessed by this second substance would be one of the attributes already possessed by God. But it has already been established that no two substances can have the same attribute. Therefore, there can be, besides God, no such second substance.

If God is the only substance, and (by axiom 1) whatever is, is either a substance or in a substance, then everything else must be in God. “Whatever is, is in God, and nothing can be or be conceived without God” (Ip15). Those things that are “in” God (or, more precisely, in God’s attributes) are what Spinoza calls ‘modes’ (or ‘affections’).

As soon as this preliminary conclusion has been established, Spinoza immediately reveals the objective of his attack. His definition of God—condemned since his excommunication from the Jewish community as a “God existing in only a philosophical sense”—is meant to preclude any anthropomorphizing of the divine being. In the scholium to proposition fifteen, he writes against “those who feign a God, like man, consisting of a body and a mind, and subject to passions. But how far they wander from the true knowledge of God, is sufficiently established by what has already been demonstrated.” Besides being false, such an anthropomorphic conception of God standing as judge over us can have only deleterious effects on human freedom and activity, insofar as it fosters a life enslaved to hope and fear and the superstitions to which such emotions give rise.

Much of the technical language of Part One is, to all appearances, right out of Descartes. But even the most devoted Cartesian would have had a hard time understanding (and, certainly, accepting) the full import of propositions one through fifteen. What does it mean to say that God is substance and that everything else is “in” God? Is Spinoza saying that rocks, tables, chairs, birds, mountains, rivers and human beings are all properties of God, and hence can be predicated of God (just as one would say that the table “is red”)? It seems very odd to think that objects and individuals—what we ordinarily think of as independent “things”—are, in fact, merely properties of a thing, items that inhere in something else. Spinoza was sensitive to the strangeness of this kind of talk, not to mention the philosophical problems to which it gives rise. When a person feels pain, does it follow that the pain is ultimately just a property of God, and thus that God feels pain? All of this has given rise to a great deal of scholarly debate as to what Spinoza means by saying all things being modes of or “in” God. They may also explain why, as of Proposition Sixteen, there is a subtle but important shift in Spinoza’s language. God is now described not so much as the underlying substance of all things, but as the universal, immanent and sustaining cause of all that exists: “From the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many modes, (i.e., everything that can fall under an infinite intellect)”.

According to the traditional Judeo-Christian conception of divinity, God is a transcendent creator, a being who causes a world distinct from himself to come into being by creating it out of nothing. God produces that world by a spontaneous act of free will, and could just as easily have not created anything outside himself. By contrast, Spinoza’s God is the cause of all things because all things follow causally and necessarily from the divine nature. Or, as he puts it, from God’s infinite power or nature “all things have necessarily flowed, or always followed, by the same necessity and in the same way as from the nature of a triangle it follows, from eternity and to eternity, that its three angles are equal to two right angles” (Ip17s1). The existence of the world is, thus, mathematically necessary. It is impossible that God should exist but not the world. This does not mean that God does not cause the world to come into being freely, since nothing outside of God constrains him to bring it into existence. But Spinoza does deny that God creates the world by some arbitrary and undetermined act of free will. God could not have done otherwise. There are no alternatives to the actual world—no other possible worlds—and there is no contingency or spontaneity within the world. Nothing could possibly have been otherwise. Everything is absolutely and necessarily determined.

(Ip29): In nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way.

(Ip33): Things could have been produced by God in no other way, and in no other order than they have been produced.

There are, however, differences in the way things depend on God. As an infinite being, God has infinite “attributes”. An attribute is best understood as a most basic way of being, a general nature that is expressed in determinate ways by particular things. We have knowledge of only two of these attributes: thought and extension. Some features of the universe follow necessarily from God—or, more precisely, from the absolute nature of one of God’s attributes—in a direct and unmediated manner. These are the universal and eternal aspects of the world, and they do not come into or go out of being; Spinoza calls them “infinite modes”. They include the most general principles of the universe, together governing all things in all ways. From the attribute of extension there follow the principles governing all extended objects (the truths of geometry) and laws governing the motion and rest of bodies (the laws of physics); from the attribute of thought, there follow laws of thought (understood by commentators to be either the laws of logic or the laws of psychology). Particular and individual things are causally more remote from God. They are nothing but “affections of God’s attributes, or modes by which God’s attributes are expressed in a certain and determinate way” (Ip25c). More precisely, they are finite modes.

There are two causal orders or dimensions governing the production and actions of particular things. On the one hand, they are determined by the general laws of the universe that follow immediately from God’s natures. On the other hand, each particular thing is determined to act and to be acted upon by other particular things. Thus, the actual behavior of a body in motion is a function not just of the universal laws of motion, but also of the other bodies in motion and rest surrounding it and with which it comes into contact.

Spinoza’s metaphysics of God is neatly summed up in a phrase that occurs in the Latin (but not the original Dutch) edition of the Ethics: “God, or Nature”, Deus, sive Natura: “That eternal and infinite being we call God, or Nature, acts from the same necessity from which he exists” (Part IV, Preface). It is an ambiguous phrase, since Spinoza could be read as trying either to divinize nature or to naturalize God. But for the careful reader there is no mistaking Spinoza’s intention. The friends who, after his death, published his writings left out the “or Nature” clause from the more widely accessible Dutch version, probably out of fear of the reaction that this identification would, predictably, arouse among a vernacular audience.

There are, Spinoza insists, two sides of Nature. First, there is the active, productive aspect of the universe—God and his attributes, from which all else follows. This is what Spinoza, employing the same terms he used in the Short Treatise, calls Natura naturans, “naturing Nature”. Strictly speaking, this is identical with God. The other aspect of the universe is that which is produced and sustained by the active aspect, Natura naturata, “natured Nature”.

By Natura naturata I understand whatever follows from the necessity of God’s nature, or from any of God’s attributes, i.e., all the modes of God’s attributes insofar as they are considered as things that are in God, and can neither be nor be conceived without God. (Ip29s).

There is some debate in the literature as to whether God is also to be identified with Natura naturata. The more likely reading is that God, as Nature, is both Natura naturans and Natura naturata, and that the infinite and finite modes are not just effects of God or Nature’s power but actually inhere in and express that infinite substance. Be that as it may, Spinoza’s fundamental insight in Book One is that Nature is an indivisible, eternal or self-caused, substantial whole—in fact, it is the only substantial whole. Outside of Nature, there is nothing, and everything that exists is a part of Nature and is brought into being by Nature with a deterministic necessity. This unified, unique, productive, necessary being just is what is meant by ‘God’. Because of the necessity inherent in Nature, there is no teleology in the universe. God or Nature does not act for any ends, and things do not exist for any set purposes. There are no “final causes” (to use the common Aristotelian phrase). God does not “do” things for the sake of anything else. The order of things just follows from God’s essences with an inviolable determinism. All talk of God’s purposes, intentions, goals, preferences or aims is just an anthropomorphizing fiction.

All the prejudices I here undertake to expose depend on this one: that men commonly suppose that all natural things act, as men do, on account of an end; indeed, they maintain as certain that God himself directs all things to some certain end, for they say that God has made all things for man, and man that he might worship God. (I, Appendix)

God is not some goal-oriented planner who then judges things by how well they conform to his purposes. Things happen only because of Nature and its laws. “Nature has no end set before it … All things proceed by a certain eternal necessity of nature.” To believe otherwise is to fall prey to the same superstitions that lie at the heart of the organized religions.

People] find—both in themselves and outside themselves—many means that are very helpful in seeking their own advantage, e.g., eyes for seeing, teeth for chewing, plants and animals for food, the sun for light, the sea for supporting fish … Hence, they consider all natural things as means to their own advantage. And knowing that they had found these means, not provided them for themselves, they had reason to believe that there was someone else who had prepared those means for their use. For after they considered things as means, they could not believe that the things had made themselves; but from the means they were accustomed to prepare for themselves, they had to infer that there was a ruler, or a number of rulers of nature, endowed with human freedom, who had taken care of all things for them, and made all things for their use.

And since they had never heard anything about the temperament of these rulers, they had to judge it from their own. Hence, they maintained that the Gods direct all things for the use of men in order to bind men to them and be held by men in the highest honor. So it has happened that each of them has thought up from his own temperament different ways of worshipping God, so that God might love them above all the rest, and direct the whole of Nature according to the needs of their blind desire and insatiable greed. Thus this prejudice was changed into superstition, and struck deep roots in their minds. (I, Appendix)

A judging God who has plans and acts purposively is a God to be obeyed and placated. Opportunistic preachers are then able to play on our hopes and fears in the face of such a God. They prescribe ways of acting that are calculated to avoid being punished by that God and earn his rewards. But, Spinoza insists, to see God or Nature as acting for the sake of ends—to find purpose in Nature—is to misconstrue Nature and “turn it upside down” by putting the effect (the end result) before the true cause.

Nor does God perform miracles, since there are no, and cannot be, departures whatsoever from the necessary course of nature. This would be for God or Nature to act against itself, which is absurd. The belief in miracles is due only to ignorance of the true causes of phenomena.

If a stone has fallen from a room onto someone’s head and killed him, they will show, in the following way, that the stone fell in order to kill the man. For if it did not fall to that end, God willing it, how could so many circumstances have concurred by chance (for often many circumstances do concur at once)? Perhaps you will answer that it happened because the wind was blowing hard and the man was walking that way. But they will persist: why was the wind blowing hard at that time? why was the man walking that way at that time? If you answer again that the wind arose then because on the preceding day, while the weather was still calm, the sea began to toss, and that the man had been invited by a friend, they will press on—for there is no end to the questions which can be asked: but why was the sea tossing? why was the man invited at just that time? And so they will not stop asking for the causes of causes until you take refuge in the will of God, i.e., the sanctuary of ignorance. (I, Appendix)

This is strong language, and Spinoza is clearly aware of the risks of his position. The same preachers who take advantage of our credulity will fulminate against anyone who tries to pull aside the curtain and reveal the truths of Nature. “One who seeks the true causes of miracles, and is eager, like an educated man, to understand natural things, not to wonder at them, like a fool, is generally considered and denounced as an impious heretic by those whom the people honor as interpreters of nature and the Gods. For they know that if ignorance is taken away, then foolish wonder, the only means they have of arguing and defending their authority is also taken away.”

For centuries, Spinoza has been regarded—by his enemies and his partisans, in the scholarly literature and the popular imagination—as a “pantheist”. It is not clear, however, that this is the proper way to look at his conception of God. Of course, Spinoza is not a traditional theist, for whom God is a transcendent and providential being. But does Spinoza’s identification of God with Nature mean that he is, as so many have insisted for so long, from the early eighteenth century up through the most recent edition of the Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy, a pantheist?

In general, pantheism is the view that rejects the transcendence of God. According to the pantheist, God is, in some way, identical with the world. There may be aspects of God that are ontologically or epistemologically distinct from the world, but for pantheism this must not imply that God is essentially separate from the world. The pantheist is also likely to reject any kind of anthropomorphizing of God, or attributing to the deity psychological and moral characteristics modeled on human nature. The pantheist’s God is (usually) not a personal God.

Within this general framework, it is possible to distinguish two varieties of pantheism. First, pantheism can be understood as the denial of any distinction whatsoever between God and the natural world and the assertion that God is in fact identical with everything that exists. “God is everything and everything is God.” On this view, God is the world and all its natural contents, and nothing distinct from them. This is reductive pantheism. Second, pantheism can be understood as asserting that God is distinct from the world and its natural contents but nonetheless contained or immanent within them, perhaps in the way in which water is contained in a saturated sponge. God is everything and everywhere, on this version, by virtue of being within everything. This is immanentist pantheism; it involves that claim that nature contains within itself, in addition to its natural elements, an immanent supernatural and divine element.

Is Spinoza, then, a pantheist? Any adequate analysis of Spinoza’s identification of God and Nature will show clearly that Spinoza cannot be a pantheist in the second, immanentist sense. For Spinoza, there is nothing but Nature and its attributes and modes. And within Nature there can certainly be nothing that is supernatural. If Spinoza is seeking to eliminate anything, it is that which is above or beyond nature, which escapes the laws and processes of nature. But is he a pantheist in the first, reductive sense?

The issue of whether God is to be identified with the whole of Nature (i.e., Natura naturans and Natura naturata) or only a part of Nature (i.e., Natura naturans alone), which has occupied a good deal of the recent literature, might be seen as crucial to the question of Spinoza’s alleged pantheism. After all, if pantheism is the view that God is everything, then Spinoza is a pantheist only if he identifies God with all of Nature. Indeed, this is exactly how the issue is often framed. Both those who believe that Spinoza is a pantheist and those who believe that he is not a pantheist focus on the question of whether God is to be identified with the whole of Nature, including the infinite and finite modes of Natura naturata, or only with substance and its attributes (Natura naturans) but not the modes. Thus, it has been argued that Spinoza is not a pantheist, because God is to be identified only with substance and its attributes, the most universal, active causal principles of Nature, and not with any modes of substance. Other scholars have argued that Spinoza is a pantheist, just because he does identify God with the whole of nature.

However, this debate about the extent of Spinoza’s identification of God with Nature is not really to the point when the question is about Spinoza’s alleged pantheism. To be sure, if by ‘pantheism’ is meant the idea that God is everything, and if one reads Spinoza as saying that God is only Natura naturans, then Spinoza’s God is not everything and consequently Spinoza is not a pantheist, at least in the ordinary sense. Finite things, on this reading, while caused by the eternal, necessary and active aspects of Nature, are not identical with God or substance, but rather are its effects. But this is not the interesting sense in which Spinoza is not a pantheist. For even if Spinoza does indeed identify God with the whole of Nature, it does not follow that Spinoza is a pantheist. The real issue is not what is the proper reading of the metaphysics of Spinoza’s conception of God and its relationship to finite modes. On either interpretation, Spinoza’s move is a naturalistic and reductive one. God is identical either with all of Nature or with only a part of Nature; for this reason, Spinoza shares something with the reductive pantheist. But—and this is the important point—even the atheist can, without too much difficulty, admit that God is nothing but Nature. Reductive pantheism and atheism maintain extensionally equivalent ontologies.

Rather, the question of Spinoza’s pantheism is really going to be answered on the psychological side of things, with regard to the proper attitude to take toward Deus sive Natura. And however one reads the relationship between God and Nature in Spinoza, it is a mistake to call him a pantheist in so far as pantheism is still a kind of religious theism. What really distinguishes the pantheist from the atheist is that the pantheist does not reject as inappropriate the religious psychological attitudes demanded by theism. Rather, the pantheist simply asserts that God—conceived as a being before which one is to adopt an attitude of worshipful awe—is or is in Nature. And nothing could be further from the spirit of Spinoza’s philosophy. Spinoza does not believe that worshipful awe or religious reverence is an appropriate attitude to take before God or Nature. There is nothing holy or sacred about Nature, and it is certainly not the object of a religious experience. Instead, one should strive to understand God or Nature, with the kind of adequate or clear and distinct intellectual knowledge that reveals Nature’s most important truths and shows how everything depends essentially and existentially on higher natural causes. The key to discovering and experiencing God, for Spinoza, is philosophy and science, not religious awe and worshipful submission. The latter give rise only to superstitious behavior and subservience to ecclesiastic authorities; the former leads to enlightenment, freedom and true blessedness (i.e., peace of mind).

2.2 The Human Being

In Part Two, Spinoza turns to the nature of the human being. The two attributes of God of which we have knowledge are extension and thought. This, in itself, involves what would have been an astounding thesis in the eyes of his contemporaries, one that was usually misunderstood and vilified. When Spinoza claims in Proposition Two that “Extension is an attribute of God, or God is an extended thing”, he was almost universally—but erroneously—interpreted as saying that God is literally corporeal. For just this reason, “Spinozism” became, for his critics, synonymous with materialism.

According to one interpretation, God is indeed material, even matter itself, but this does not imply that God is or has a body. Another interpretation, however, one which will be adopted here, is that what is in God is not matter per se, but extension as an essence. And extension and thought are two distinct essences or natures that have absolutely nothing in common. The modes or expressions of extension are physical bodies; the modes of thought are ideas. Because extension and thought have nothing in common, the two realms of matter and mind are causally closed systems. Everything that is extended follows from the attribute of extension alone. Every bodily event is part of an infinite causal series of bodily events and is determined only by the nature of extension and its laws, in conjunction with its relations to other extended bodies. Similarly, every idea or mental event follows only from the attribute of thought. Any idea is an integral part of an infinite series of ideas and is determined by the nature of thought and its laws, along with its relations to other ideas. There is, in other words, no causal interaction between bodies and ideas, between the physical and the mental. There is, however, a thoroughgoing correlation and parallelism between the two series. For every mode in extension that is a relatively stable collection of matter (an individual body), there is a corresponding mode in thought (an idea or mind). In fact, he insists, “a mode of extension and the idea of that mode are one and the same thing, but expressed in two ways” (IIp7s). Because of the fundamental and underlying unity of Nature or Substance and its attributes, thought and extension are just two different ways in which one and the same Nature expresses itself. Every material thing (every determinate expression of Nature through extension) thus has its own particular idea (a determinate expression of Nature through thought)—an eternal adequate idea—that corresponds to and represents it. Since that idea is just a mode of one of God’s attributes—thought—it is in God, and the infinite series of ideas constitutes God’s mind or infinite intellect. As he explains,

A circle existing in nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing, which is explained through different attributes. Therefore, whether we conceive nature under the attribute of Extension, or under the attribute of Thought, or under any other attribute, we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes, i.e., that the same things follow one another. (IIp7s)

It follows from this, Spinoza argues, that the causal relations between bodies is mirrored in the logical relations between God’s ideas. Or, as Spinoza notes in Proposition Seven, “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things”.

One kind of extended body, however, is significantly more complex than any others in its composition and in its dispositions to act and be acted upon. That complexity is reflected in its corresponding idea. The body in question is the human body; and its corresponding idea is the human mind or soul. The human mind, then, like any other idea, is simply one particular mode of God’s attribute, thought. Whatever happens in the body is reflected or expressed in the mind. In this way, the mind perceives, more or less obscurely, what is taking place in its body. And through its body’s interactions with other bodies, the mind is aware of what is happening in the physical world around it. But the human mind no more interacts with its body than any mode of thought interacts with a mode of extension.

One of the pressing questions in seventeenth-century philosophy, and perhaps the most celebrated legacy of Descartes’s dualism, is the problem of how two radically different substances such as mind and body enter into a union in a human being and cause effects in each other. How can the extended body causally engage the unextended mind, which is incapable of contact or motion, and “move” it, that is, cause mental effects such as pains, sensations and perceptions? And how can an immaterial thing like a mind or soul, which does not have motion, put a body (the human body) into motion? Spinoza, in effect, denies that the human being is a union of two substances. The human mind and the human body are two different expressions—under thought and under extension—of one and the same thing: the person. And because there is no causal interaction between the mind and the body, the so-called mind-body problem does not, technically speaking, arise.

2.3 Knowledge

The human mind, like God, contains ideas. Some of these ideas—sensory images, qualitative “feels” (like pains and pleasures), perceptual data—, and figments of the imagination are imprecise qualitative phenomena, being the expression in thought of states of the body as it is affected by the bodies surrounding it. Such ideas do not convey adequate and true knowledge of the world, but only a relative, partial and subjective picture of how things presently seem to be to the perceiver. There is no systematic order to these perceptions, nor any critical oversight by reason. “As long as the human Mind perceives things from the common order of nature, it does not have an adequate, but only a confused and mutilated knowledge of itself, of its own Body, and of external bodies” (IIp29c). Under such circumstances, we are simply determined in our ideas by our fortuitous and haphazard encounter with things in the external world. This superficial acquaintance will never provide us with knowledge of the essences of those things. In fact, it is an invariable source of falsehood and error. This “knowledge from random experience” is also the origin of great delusions, since we—thinking ourselves free—are, in our ignorance, unaware of just how we are determined by causes.

Adequate ideas, on the other hand, are formed in a rational and orderly manner, and are necessarily true and revelatory of the essences of things. “Reason”, the second kind of knowledge (after “random experience”), is the apprehension of the essence of a thing through a discursive, inferential procedure. “A true idea means nothing other than knowing a thing perfectly, or in the best way”(IIp43s). It involves grasping a thing’s causal and conceptual connections not just to other objects but, more importantly, to the attributes of God, the infinite modes (the laws of nature) that follow immediately from them, and the “common notions” that pick out features present in all modes of an attribute. The adequate idea of a thing clearly and distinctly situates its object in all of its causal nexuses and conceptual relations, and shows not just that it is, but what it is and how and why it is. The person who truly knows a thing sees the reasons why the thing was determined to be and could not have been otherwise. “It is of the nature of Reason to regard things as necessary, not as contingent” (IIp44). The belief that some thing is accidental or spontaneous can be based only on an inadequate grasp of the thing’s causal explanation, on a partial and “mutilated” familiarity with it. To perceive by way of adequate ideas is to perceive the necessity inherent in Nature.

Sense experience alone could never provide the information conveyed by an adequate idea. The senses present things only as they appear from a given perspective at a given moment in time. An adequate idea, on the other hand, by showing how a thing follows necessarily from one or another of God’s attributes, presents it in its “eternal” aspects—sub specie aeternitatis, as Spinoza puts it—without any relation to time. “It is of the nature of Reason to regard things as necessary and not as contingent. And Reason perceives this necessity of things truly, i.e., as it is in itself. But this necessity of things is the very necessity of God’s eternal nature. Therefore, it is of the nature of Reason to regard things under this species of eternity” (IIp44). The third kind of knowledge, intuition, takes what is known by Reason and grasps it in a single, perspicacious act of the mind.

Spinoza’s conception of adequate knowledge reveals an unrivaled optimism in the cognitive powers of the human being. Not even Descartes believed that we could know all of Nature and its innermost secrets with the degree of depth and certainty that Spinoza thought possible. Most remarkably, because Spinoza thought that the adequate knowledge of any object, and of Nature as a whole, involves a knowledge of God’s essence and of how things relate to God and its attributes, he also had no scruples about claiming that we can, at least in principle, know God perfectly and adequately. “The knowledge of God’s eternal and infinite essence that each idea involves is adequate and perfect” (IIp46). “The human Mind has an adequate knowledge of God’s eternal and infinite essence” (IIp47). No other philosopher in history has been willing to make this claim. But, then again, no other philosopher so forthrightly identified God with Nature.

2.4 Passion and Action

Spinoza engages in such a detailed analysis of the composition of the human being because it is essential to his goal of showing how the human being is a part of Nature, existing within the same deterministic causal nexuses as other extended and mental beings. This has serious ethical implications. First, it implies that a human being is not endowed with freedom, at least in the ordinary sense of that term. Because our minds and the events in our minds are simply ideas that exist within the causal series of ideas that follows from God’s attribute of thought, our actions and volitions are as necessarily determined as any other natural events. “In the Mind there is no absolute, or free, will, but the Mind is determined to will this or that by a cause that is also determined by another, and this again by another, and so to infinity” (IIp48).

What is true of the will (and, of course, of our bodies) is true of all the phenomena of our psychological lives. Spinoza believes that this is something that has not been sufficiently understood by previous thinkers, who seem to have wanted to place the human being on a pedestal outside of (or above) nature.

Most of those who have written about the Affects, and men’s way of living, seem to treat, not of natural things, which follow the common laws of nature, but of things that are outside nature. Indeed they seem to conceive man in nature as a dominion within a dominion. For they believe that man disturbs, rather than follows, the order of nature, that he has absolute power over his actions, and that he is determined only by himself. (III, Preface)

Descartes, for example, believed that if the freedom of the human being is to be preserved, the soul must be exempt from the kind of deterministic laws that rule over the material universe.

Spinoza’s aim in Parts Three and Four is, as he says in his Preface to Part Three, to restore the human being and his volitional and emotional life to their proper place in nature. For nothing stands outside of nature, not even the human mind.

Nature is always the same, and its virtue and power of acting are everywhere one and the same, i.e., the laws and rules of nature, according to which all things happen, and change from one form to another, are always and everywhere the same. So the way of understanding the nature of anything, of whatever kind, must also be the same, viz. through the universal laws and rules of nature.

Our affects—our love, anger, hate, envy, pride, jealousy, etc.—“follow from the same necessity and force of nature as the other singular things”. Spinoza, therefore, explains these emotions—as determined in their occurrence as are a body in motion and the properties of a mathematical figure—just as he would explain any other things in nature. “I shall treat the nature and power of the Affects, and the power of the Mind over them, by the same Method by which, in the preceding parts, I treated God and the Mind, and I shall consider human actions and appetites just as if it were a Question of lines, planes, and bodies.”

Our affects are divided into actions and passions. When the cause of an event lies wholly in our own nature—more particularly, our knowledge or adequate ideas— and we are the “adequate cause” of it, then it is a case of the mind acting. On the other hand, when something happens in us the cause of which lies outside of our nature, then we are passive and being acted upon. Usually what takes place, both when we are acting and when we are being acted upon, is some change in our mental and physical capacities, what Spinoza calls “an increase or decrease in our power of acting” or in our “power to persevere in being”. All beings are naturally endowed with such a power or striving. This conatus, a kind of existential inertia, constitutes the “essence” of any being. “Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its being.” An affect just is any change in this power, for better or for worse. Affects that are actions are changes in this power that have their source (or adequate cause) in our nature alone; affects that are passions are those changes in this power that originate at least partly outside of us.

What we should strive for is to learn how to moderate and restrain the passions and become active, autonomous beings. If we can achieve this, then we will be “free” to the extent that whatever happens to us will result not from our relations with things outside us, but from our own nature (as that follows from, and is ultimately and necessarily determined by, the attributes of God of which our minds and bodies are modes). We will, consequently, be truly liberated from the troublesome emotional ups and downs of this life. The way to bring this about is to increase our knowledge, our store of adequate ideas, and reduce as far as possible the power or strength of our inadequate ideas, which follow not from the nature of the mind alone but from its being an expression of how our body is affected by other bodies. In other words, we need to free ourselves from a reliance on the senses and the imagination, since a life guided by the senses and the imagination is a life being affected and led by the objects around us, and rely as much as we can only on our rational faculties.

Because of our innate striving to persevere—which, in the human being, is called “will” or “appetite”—we naturally pursue those things that we believe will benefit us by increasing our power of acting and shun or flee those things that we believe will harm us by decreasing our power of acting. This provides Spinoza with a foundation for cataloging the human passions. For the passions are all functions of the ways in which external things affect our powers or capacities. Joy (Laetitiae, sometimes translated as “pleasure”), for example, is simply the movement or passage to a greater capacity for action. “By Joy … I shall understand that passion by which the Mind passes to a greater perfection” (IIIp11s). When joy is a passion, it is always brought about by some external object. Sadness (Tristitiae, or “pain”), on the other hand, is the passage to a lesser state of perfection, also occasioned by a thing outside us. Love is simply Joy accompanied by an awareness of the external cause that brings about the passage to a greater perfection. We love that object that benefits us and causes us joy. Hate is nothing but “sadness with the accompanying idea of an external cause”. Hope is simply “an inconstant joy which has arisen from the image of a future or past thing whose outcome we doubt”. We hope for a thing whose presence, as yet uncertain, will bring about joy. We fear, however, a thing whose presence, equally uncertain, will bring about sadness. When that whose outcome was doubtful becomes certain, hope is changed into confidence, while fear is changed into despair.

All of the human emotions, in so far as they are passions, are constantly directed outward, towards things and their capacities to affect us one way or another. Aroused by our passions and desires, we seek or flee those things that we believe cause joy or sadness. “We strive to further the occurrence of whatever we imagine will lead to Joy, and to avert or destroy what we imagine is contrary to it, or will lead to Sadness.” Our hopes and fears fluctuate depending on whether we regard the objects of our desires or aversions as remote, near, necessary, possible or unlikely. But the objects of our passions, being external to us, are completely beyond our control. Thus, the more we allow ourselves to be controlled by them, the more we are subject to passions and the less active and free we are. The upshot is a fairly pathetic picture of a life mired in the passions and pursuing and fleeing the changeable and fleeting objects that occasion them: “We are driven about in many ways by external causes, and … like waves on the sea, driven by contrary winds, we toss about, not knowing our outcome and fate” (IIIp59s). The title for Part Four of the Ethics reveals with perfect clarity Spinoza’s evaluation of such a life for a human being: “On Human Bondage, or the Powers of the Affects”. He explains that the human being’s “lack of power to moderate and restrain the affects I call Bondage. For the man who is subject to affects is under the control, not of himself, but of fortune, in whose power he so greatly is that often, though he sees the better for himself, he is still forced to follow the worse”. It is, he says, a kind of “sickness of the mind” to suffer too much love for a thing “that is liable to many variations and that we can never fully possess.”

2.5 Virtue and Happiness

The solution to this predicament is an ancient one. Since we cannot control the objects that we tend to value and that we allow to influence our well-being, we ought instead to try to control our evaluations themselves and thereby minimize the sway that external objects and the passions have over us. We can never eliminate the passive affects entirely. We are essentially a part of nature, and can never fully remove ourselves from the causal series that link us to external things. But we can, ultimately, counteract the passions, control them, and achieve a certain degree of relief from their turmoil.

The path to restraining and moderating the affects is through virtue. Spinoza is a psychological and ethical egoist. All beings naturally seek their own advantage—to preserve their own being and increase their power—and it is right for them do so. This is what virtue consists in. Since we are thinking beings, endowed with intelligence and reason, what is to our greatest advantage is knowledge. Our virtue, therefore, consists in the pursuit of knowledge and understanding, of adequate ideas. The best kind of knowledge is a purely intellectual intuition of the essences of things. This “third kind of knowledge”—beyond both random experience and ratiocination—sees things not in their temporal dimension, not in their durational existence and in relation to other particular things, but under the aspect of eternity (sub specie aeternitatis), that is, abstracted from all considerations of time and place and situated in their relationship to God and its attributes. They are apprehended, that is, in their conceptual and causal relationship to the universal essences (thought and extension) and the eternal laws of nature.

We conceive things as actual in two ways: either insofar as we conceive them to exist in relation to a certain time and place, or insofar as we conceive them to be contained in God and to follow from the necessity of the divine nature. But the things we conceive in this second way as true, or real, we conceive under a species of eternity, and to that extent they involve the eternal and infinite essence of God. (Vp29s)

But this is just to say that, ultimately, we strive for a knowledge of God. The concept of any body involves the concept of extension; and the concept of any idea or mind involves the concept of thought. But thought and extension just are God’s attributes. So the proper and adequate conception of any body or mind necessarily involves the concept or knowledge of God. “The third kind of knowledge proceeds from an adequate idea of certain attributes of God to an adequate knowledge of the essence of things, and the more we understand things in this way, the more we understand God” (Vp25d). Knowledge of God is, thus, the mind’s greatest good and its greatest virtue.

What we see when we understand things through the third kind of knowledge, under the aspect of eternity and in relation to God, is the deterministic necessity of all things. We see that all bodies and their states follow necessarily from the essence of matter and the universal laws of physics; and we see that all ideas, including all the properties of minds, follow necessarily from the essence of thought and its universal laws. This insight can only weaken the power that the passions have over us. We are no longer hopeful or fearful of what shall come to pass, and no longer anxious or despondent over our possessions. We regard all things with equanimity, and we are not inordinately and irrationally affected in different ways by past, present or future events. The result is self-control and a calmness of mind.

The more this knowledge that things are necessary is concerned with singular things, which we imagine more distinctly and vividly, the greater is this power of the Mind over the affects, as experience itself also testifies. For we see that Sadness over some good which has perished is lessened as soon as the man who has lost it realizes that this good could not, in any way, have been kept. Similarly, we see that [because we regard infancy as a natural and necessary thing], no one pities infants because of their inability to speak, to walk, or to reason, or because they live so many years, as it were, unconscious of themselves. (Vp6s)

Our affects or emotions themselves can be understood in this way, which further diminishes their power over us.

Spinoza’s ethical theory is, to a certain degree, Stoic, and recalls the doctrines of thinkers such as Cicero and Seneca:

We do not have an absolute power to adapt things outside us to our use. Nevertheless, we shall bear calmly those things that happen to us contrary to what the principle of our advantage demands, if we are conscious that we have done our duty, that the power we have could not have extended itself to the point where we could have avoided those things, and that we are a part of the whole of nature, whose order we follow. If we understand this clearly and distinctly, that part of us which is defined by understanding, i.e., the better part of us, will be entirely satisfied with this, and will strive to persevere in that satisfaction. For insofar as we understand, we can want nothing except what is necessary, nor absolutely be satisfied with anything except what is true. (IV, Appendix)

What, in the end, replaces the passionate love for ephemeral “goods” is an intellectual love for an eternal, immutable good that we can fully and stably possess, God. The third kind of knowledge generates a love for its object, and in this love consists not a passionate joy but an active one, even blessedness itself. Taking his cue from Maimonides’s view of human eudaimonia, Spinoza argues that the mind’s intellectual love of God is our understanding of the universe, our virtue, our happiness, our well-being and our “salvation”. It is also our freedom and autonomy, as we approach the condition wherein what happens to us follows from our nature (as a determinate and determined mode of one of God’s attributes) alone and not as a result of the ways external things affect us. Spinoza’s “free person” is one who bears the gifts and losses of fortune with equanimity and does only those things that he believes to be “the most important in life”. He also, despite the fundamental egoism, engages in behavior toward others that is typically regarded as “ethical”, even altruistic. He takes care for the well-being and virtuous flourishing of other human beings. He does what he can through rational benevolence (as opposed to pity or some other passion) to insure that they, too, achieve relief from the disturbances of the passions through understanding, and thus that they become more like him (and therefore most useful to him). He does this not from altruistic motives but egoistic ones: he sees that it is in his own best interest to be in communion with other rationally virtuous individuals. Moreover, the free person is not anxious about death. The free person neither hopes for any eternal, otherworldly rewards nor fears any eternal punishments. He knows that the soul is not immortal in any personal sense, but is endowed only with a certain kind of eternity. The more the mind consists of true and adequate ideas (which are eternal), the more of it remains—within God’s attribute of thought—after the death of the body and the disappearance of that part of the mind that corresponds to the body’s duration. This understanding of his place in the natural scheme of things brings to the free individual true peace of mind, even salvation.

There are a number of social and political ramifications that follow from Spinoza’s ethical doctrines of human action and well-being. Because disagreement and discord between human beings is always the result of our different and changeable passions, “free” individuals—who all share the same nature and act on the same principles—will naturally and effortlessly form a harmonious society. “Insofar as men are torn by affects that are passions, they can be contrary to one another …[But] insofar as men live according to the guidance of reason, they must do only those things that are good for human nature, and hence, for each man, i.e., those things that agree with the nature of each man. Hence, insofar as men live according to the guidance of reason, they must always agree among themselves” (IVp34–35). Free human beings will be mutually beneficial and useful, and will be tolerant of the opinions and even the errors of others. However, human beings do not generally live under the guidance of reason. The state or sovereign, therefore, is required in order to insure—not by reason, but by the threat of force—that individuals are protected from the unrestrained pursuit of self-interest on the part of other individuals. The transition from a state of nature, where each seeks his own advantage without limitation, to a civil state involves the universal renunciation of certain natural rights—such as “the right everyone has of avenging himself, and of judging good and evil”—and the investment of those prerogatives in a central authority. As long as human beings are guided by their passions, the state is necessary to bring it about that they “live harmoniously and be of assistance to one another”.

3. Theological-Political Treatise

The ostensive aim of the Theological-Political Treatise (TTP), widely vilified in its time, is, as its subtitle proclaims, to show that “the freedom to philosophize can not only be granted without injury to piety and the peace of the Commonwealth, but that the peace of the Commonwealth and Piety are endangered by the suppression of this freedom.” But Spinoza’s ultimate intention is reveal the truth about Scripture and religion, and thereby to undercut the political power exercised in modern states by religious authorities. He also defends, at least as a political ideal, the tolerant, secular, and democratic polity.

3.1 On Religion and Scripture

Spinoza begins the TTP by alerting his readers, through a kind of “natural history of religion”, to just those superstitious beliefs and behaviors that clergy, by playing on ordinary human emotions, encourage in their followers. A person guided by fear and hope, the main emotions in a life devoted to the pursuit of temporal advantages, turns, in the face of the vagaries of fortune, to behaviors calculated to secure the goods he desires. Thus, we pray, worship, make votive offerings, sacrifice and engage in all the various rituals of popular religion. But the emotions are as fleeting as the objects that occasion them, and thus the superstitions grounded in those emotions subject to fluctuations. Ambitious and self-serving clergy do their best to stabilize this situation and give some permanence to those beliefs and behaviors. “Immense efforts have been made to invest religion, true or false, with such pomp and ceremony that it can sustain any shock and constantly evoke the deepest reverence in all its worshippers” (TTP, Preface, G III.6–7/S 2–3). Religious leaders are generally abetted in their purposes by the civil authority, which threatens to punish all deviations from theological orthodoxy as “sedition”. The result is a state religion that has no rational foundations, a mere “respect for ecclesiastics” that involves adulation and mysteries but no true worship of God.

The solution to this state of affairs, Spinoza believes, is to examine the Bible anew and find the doctrines of the “true religion”. Only then will we be able to delimit exactly what we need to do to show proper respect for God and obtain blessedness. This will reduce the sway that religious authorities have over our emotional, intellectual and physical lives, and reinstate a proper and healthy relationship between the state and religion. A close analysis of the Bible is particularly important for any argument that the freedom of philosophizing—essentially, freedom of thought and speech—is not prejudicial to piety. If it can be demonstrated that Scripture is not a source of “natural truth”, but the bearer of only a simple moral message (“Love your neighbor”), then people will see that “faith is something separate from philosophy”. Spinoza intends to show that in that moral message alone—and not in Scripture’s words, origin or history—lies the sacredness of what is otherwise merely a human document. The Bible teaches only “obedience [to God]”, not knowledge. Thus, philosophy and religion, reason and faith, inhabit two distinct and exclusive spheres, and neither should tread in the domain of the other. The freedom to philosophize and speculate can therefore be granted without any harm to true religion. In fact, such freedom is essential to public peace and piety, since most civil disturbances arise from sectarian disputes. The real danger to a republic comes from those who would worship not God, but some words on a page: “It will be said that, although God’s law is inscribed in our hearts, Scripture is nevertheless the Word of God, and it is no more permissible to say of Scripture that it is mutilated and contaminated than to say this of God’s Word. In reply, I have to say that such objectors are carrying their piety too far, and are turning religion into superstition; indeed, instead of God’s Word they are beginning to worship likenesses and images, that is, paper and ink” (TTP, chap. 12, G III.159/S 145–6).

From a proper and informed reading of Scripture, a number of things become clear. First, the prophets were not men of exceptional intellectual talents—they were not, that is, naturally gifted philosophers—but simply very pious, even morally superior individuals endowed with vivid imaginations. They were able to perceive God’s revelation through their imaginative faculties via words or real or imaginary figures. This is what allowed them to apprehend that which lies beyond the boundary of the intellect. Moreover, the content of a prophecy varied according to the physical temperament, imaginative powers, and particular opinions or prejudices of the prophet. It follows that prophecy, while it has its origins in the power of God—and in this respect it is, in Spinoza’s metaphysical scheme, no different from any other natural event—does not provide privileged knowledge of natural or spiritual phenomena. The prophets are not necessarily to be trusted when it comes to matters of the intellect, on questions of philosophy, history or science; and their pronouncements set no parameters on what should or should not be believed about the natural world on the basis of our rational faculties.

Spinoza provides an equally deflationary account of God’s election, or the “vocation”, of the Hebrews. It is “childish”, he insists, for anyone to base their happiness on the uniqueness of their gifts; in the case of the Jews, it would be the uniqueness of their being chosen among all people. The ancient Hebrews, in fact, did not surpass other nations in their wisdom or in their proximity to God. They were neither intellectually nor morally superior to other peoples. They were “chosen” only with respect to their social organization and political good fortune. God or Nature gave them a set of laws (through a wise lawgiver, Moses), which they obeyed, and made their surrounding enemies weaker than them. The natural result of this “internal” and “external” aid is that their society was well-ordered and their autonomous government persisted for a long time. Their election was thus a temporal and conditional one, and their kingdom is now long gone. Thus, “at the present time there is nothing whatsoever that the Jews can arrogate to themselves above other nations” (TTP, chap. 3, G III.56/S 45). Spinoza thereby rejects the particularism that many—including Amsterdam’s Sephardic rabbis—insisted was essential to Judaism. True piety and blessedness are universal in their scope and accessible to anyone, regardless of their confessional creed.

Central to Spinoza’s analysis of the Jewish religion—although it is applicable to any religion whatsoever—is the distinction between the divine law and the ceremonial law. The law of God commands only the knowledge and love of God and the actions required for attaining that condition. Such love must arise not from fear of possible penalties or hope for any rewards, but solely from the goodness of its object. The divine law does not demand any particular rites or ceremonies such as sacrifices or dietary restrictions or festival observances. The six hundred and thirteen precepts of the Torah have nothing to do with blessedness or virtue. They were directed only at the Hebrews so that they might govern themselves in an autonomous state. The ceremonial laws helped preserve their kingdom and insure its prosperity, but were valid only as long as that political entity lasted. They are not binding on all Jews under all circumstances. They were, in fact, instituted by Moses for a purely practical reason: so that people might do their duty and not go their own way. This is true not just of the rites and practices of Judaism, but of the outer ceremonies of all religions. None of these activities have anything to do with true happiness or piety. They serve only to control people’s behavior and preserve a particular society.

A similar practical function is served by stories of miracles. Scripture speaks in a language suited to affect the imagination of ordinary people and compel their obedience. Rather than appealing to the natural and real causes of all events, its authors sometimes narrate things in a way calculated to move people—particularly uneducated people—to devotion. “If Scripture were to describe the downfall of an empire in the style adopted by political historians, the common people would not be stirred …” Strictly speaking, however, miracles—understood as divinely caused departures from the ordinary course of nature—are impossible. Every event, no matter how extraordinary, has a natural cause and explanation. “Nothing happens in nature that does not follow from her laws” (TTP, chap. 6, G III.83/S 73). This is simply a consequence of Spinoza’s metaphysical doctrines. Miracles as traditionally conceived require a distinction between God and nature, something that Spinoza’s philosophy rules out in principle. Moreover, nature’s order is inviolable in so far as the sequence of events in nature is a necessary consequence of God’s attributes. There certainly are “miracles” in the sense of events whose natural causes are unknown to us, and which we therefore attribute to the powers of a supernatural God. But this is, once again, to retreat to superstition, “the bitter enemy of all true knowledge and true morality”.

By analyzing prophecy in terms of vividness of imagination, Jewish election as political fortune, the ceremonial law as a kind of social and political expediency, and the belief in miracles as an ignorance of nature’s necessary causal operations, Spinoza naturalizes (and, consequently, demystifies) some of the fundamental elements of Judaism and other religions and undermines the foundations of their external, superstitious rites. At the same time, he thereby reduces the fundamental doctrine of piety to a simple and universal formula, naturalistic in itself, involving love and knowledge. This process of naturalization achieves its stunning climax when Spinoza turns to consider the authorship and interpretation of the Bible itself. Spinoza’s views on Scripture constitute, without question, the most radical theses of the Treatise, and explain why he was attacked with such vitriol by his contemporaries. Others before Spinoza had suggested that Moses was not the author of the entire Pentateuch (for example, Abraham ibn Ezra in the twelfth century and, in the seventeenth century, the English philosopher Thomas Hobbes). But no one had taken that claim to the extreme limit that Spinoza did, arguing for it with such boldness and at such length. Nor had anyone before Spinoza been willing to draw from it the conclusions about the status, meaning and interpretation of Scripture that Spinoza drew.

Spinoza denied that Moses wrote all, or even most of the Torah. The references in the Pentateuch to Moses in the third person; the narration of his death and, particularly, of events following his death; and the fact that some places are called by names that they did not bear in the time of Moses all “make it clear beyond a shadow of doubt” that the writings commonly referred to as “the Five Books of Moses” were, in fact, written by someone who lived many generations after Moses. Moses did, to be sure, compose some books of history and of law; and remnants of those long lost books can be found in the Pentateuch. But the Torah as we have it, as well as as other books of the Hebrew Bible (such as Joshua, Judges, Samuel and Kings) were written neither by the individuals whose names they bear nor by any person appearing in them. Spinoza believes that these were, in fact, all composed by a single historian living many generations after the events narrated, and that this was most likely Ezra the Scribe. It was the post-exilic leader who took the many writings that had come down to him and began weaving them into a single (but not seamless) narrative. Ezra’s work was later completed and supplemented by the editorial labors of others. What we now possess, then, is nothing but a compilation, and a rather mismanaged, haphazard and “mutilated” one at that.

As for the books of the Prophets, they are of even later provenance, compiled (or “heaped together”, in Spinoza’s view) by a chronicler or scribe perhaps as late as the Second Temple period. Canonization into Scripture occurred only in the second century BCE, when the Pharisees selected a number of texts from a multitude of others. Because the process of transmission was a historical one, involving the conveyance of writings of human origin over a long period of time through numerous scribes, and because the decision to include some books but not others was made by fallible human beings, there are good reasons for believing that a significant portion of the text of the “Old Testament” is corrupt.

While in 1670 there was nothing novel in claiming that Moses did not write all of the Torah, Spinoza’s remarkably innovative claim was to argue that this holds great significance for how Scripture is to be read and interpreted. He was dismayed by the way in which Scripture itself was worshipped, by the reverence accorded to the words on the page rather than to the message they conveyed. If the Bible is an historical (i.e., natural) document, then it should be treated like any other work of nature. The study of Scripture, or Biblical hermeneutics, should therefore proceed as the study of nature, or natural science, proceeds: by gathering and evaluating empirical data, that is, by examining the “book” itself—along with the contextual conditions of its composition—for its general principles.

I hold that the method of interpreting Scripture is no different from the method of interpreting Nature, and is in fact in complete accord with it. For the method of interpreting Nature consists essentially in composing a detailed study of Nature from which, as being the source of our assured data, we can deduce the definitions of the things of Nature. Now in exactly the same way the task of Scriptural interpretation requires us to make a straightforward study of Scripture, and from this, as the source of our fixed data and principles, to deduce by logical inference the meaning of the authors of Scripture. In this way—that is, by allowing no other principles or data for the interpretation of Scripture and study of its contents except those that can be gathered only from Scripture itself and from a historical study of Scripture—steady progress can be made without any danger of error, and one can deal with matters that surpass our understanding with no less confidence than those matters that are known to us by the natural light of reason. (TTP, chap. 7, G III.98/S 87).

Just as the knowledge of nature must be sought from nature alone, so must the knowledge of Scripture—an apprehension of its intended meaning—be sought from Scripture alone and through the appropriate exercise of rational and textual inquiry.

When properly interpreted, the universal message conveyed by Scripture is a simple moral one: “To know and love God, and to love one’s neighbor as oneself”. This is the real word of God and the foundation of true piety, and it lies uncorrupted in a faulty, tampered and corrupt text. The lesson involves no metaphysical doctrines about God or nature, and requires no sophisticated training in philosophy. In contrast with Maimonides’ account, Spinoza insists that the object of Scripture is not to impart truth or knowledge, but to compel obedience and regulate our conduct. “Scriptural doctrine contains not abstruse speculation or philosophic reasoning, but very simple matters able to be understood by the most sluggish mind” (TTP, chap. 13, G III.167/S 153). To the extent (and only to the extent) that Scripture is successful in morally edifying its readers and inspiring them to obey the word of God and treat others with justice and charity, it is “divine”. Spinoza claims, in fact, that a familiarity with Scripture is not even necessary for piety and blessedness, since its message can be known by our rational faculties alone, although with great difficulty for most people. “He who, while unacquainted with these writings, nevertheless knows by the natural light that there is a God having the attributes we have recounted, and who also pursues a true way of life, is altogether blessed.”

It follows that the only practical commandments that properly belong to religion are those that are necessary to carry out the moral precept and “confirm in our hearts the love of our neighbor”. “A catholic faith should therefore contain only those dogmas which obedience to God absolutely demands, and without which such obedience is absolutely impossible … these must all be directed to this one end: that there is a Supreme Being who loves justice and charity, whom all must obey in order to be saved, and must worship by practicing justice and charity to their neighbor” (TTP, chap. 14, G III.177/S 161–2). As for other dogmas, “every person should embrace those that he, being the best judge of himself, feels will do most to strengthen in him love of justice”.

This is the heart of Spinoza’s case for toleration, for freedom of philosophizing and freedom of religious expression. By reducing the central message of Scripture—and the essential content of piety—to a simple moral maxim, one that is free of any superfluous speculative doctrines or ceremonial practices; and by freeing Scripture of the burden of having to communicate specific philosophical truths or of prescribing (or proscribing) a multitude of required behaviors, he has demonstrated both that philosophy is independent from religion and that the liberty of each individual to interpret religion as he wishes can be upheld without any detriment to piety.

As to the question of what God, the exemplar of true life, really is, whether he is fire, or spirit, or light, or thought, or something else, this is irrelevant to faith. And so likewise is the question as to why he is the exemplar of true life, whether this is because he has a just and merciful disposition, or because all things exist and act through him and consequently we, too, understand through him, and through him we see what is true, just and good. On these questions it matters not what beliefs a man holds. Nor, again, does it matter for faith whether one believes that God is omnipresent in essence or in potency, whether he directs everything from free will or from the necessity of his nature, whether he lays down laws as a rule or teaches them as being eternal truths, whether man obeys God from free will or from the necessity of the divine decree, whether the rewarding of the good and the punishing of the wicked is natural or supernatural. The view one takes on these and similar questions has no bearing on faith, provided that such a belief does not lead to the assumption of greater license to sin, or hinders submission to God. Indeed … every person is in duty bound to adapt these religious dogmas to his own understanding and to interpret them for himself in whatever way makes him feel that he can the more readily accept them with full confidence and conviction. (TTP, chap. 14, G III.164/S 162–3)

Faith and piety belong not to the person who has the most rational argument for the existence of God or the most thorough philosophical understanding of his attributes, but to the person “who best displays works of justice and charity”.

3.2 The State

Spinoza’s account of religion has clear political ramifications. There had always been a quasi-political agenda behind his decision to write the TTP, since his attack was directed at political meddling by religious authorities. But he also took the opportunity to give a more detailed and thorough presentation of a general theory of the state that is only sketchily present in the Ethics. Such an examination of the true nature of political society is particularly important to his argument for intellectual and religious freedom, since he must show that such freedom is not only compatible with political well-being, but essential to it.

The individual egoism of the Ethics plays itself out in a pre-political context—the so-called “state of nature”, a universal condition where there is no law or religion or justice and injustice—as the right of every individual to do whatever he can to preserve himself. “Whatever every person, whenever he is considered as solely under the dominion of Nature, believes to be to his advantage, whether under the guidance of sound reason or under passion’s sway, he may by sovereign natural right seek and get for himself by any means, by force, deceit, entreaty, or in any other way he best can, and he may consequently regard as his enemy anyone who tries to hinder him from getting what he wants” (TTP, chap. 16, G III.190/S 174). Naturally, this is a rather insecure and dangerous condition under which to live. In Hobbes’ celebrated phrase—and Spinoza was clearly influenced by his reading of that British thinker—life in the state of nature is “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short”. As rational creatures, we soon realize that we would be better off, still from a thoroughly egoistic perspective, coming to an agreement among ourselves to restrain our opposing desires and the unbounded pursuit of self-interest—in sum, that it would be in our greater self-interest to live under the law of reason rather than the law of nature. We thus agree to hand over to a sovereign our natural right and power to do whatever we can to satisfy our interests. That sovereign—whether it be an individual (in which case the resulting state is a monarchy), a small group of individuals (an oligarchy) or the body-politic as a whole (a democracy)—will be absolute and unrestrained in the scope of its powers. It will be charged with keeping all the members of society to the agreement, mostly by playing on their fear of the consequences of breaking the “social contract”.

Obedience to the sovereign does not infringe upon our autonomy, since in following the commands of the sovereign we are following an authority whom we have freely authorized and whose commands have no other object than our own rational self- interest. The type of government most likely to respect and preserve that autonomy, issue laws based on sound reason and to serve the ends for which government is instituted is democracy. It is the “most natural” form of governing arising out of a social contract—since in a democracy the people obey only laws that issue from the general will of the body politic—and the least subject to various abuses of power. In a democracy, the rationality of the sovereign’s commands is practically secured, since it is unlikely that a majority of a large number of people will agree to an irrational design. Monarchy, on the other hand, is the least stable form of government and the one most likely to degenerate into tyranny.

Since the outward practices of religion impinge upon the comportment and relations of citizens, they fall under “state business” and, thus, within the sphere of the sovereign’s power. The sovereign should have complete dominion in all public matters secular and spiritual. There should be no church separate from the religion instituted and regulated by the state. This will prevent sectarianism and the multiplication of religious disputes. All questions concerning external religious rites and ceremonies are in the hands of the sovereign. This is in the best interest of everyone, since the sovereign will, ideally and in conformity with its “contractual” duty, insure that such practices are in accord with public peace and safety and social well-being. The sovereign should rule in such a way that his commands enforce God’s law. Justice and charity thereby acquire the force of civil law, backed by the power of the sovereign. (For this reason, it is misleading to proclaim Spinoza as a proponent of the separation of church and state.)

On the other hand, dominion over the “inward worship of God” and the beliefs accompanying it—in other words, inner piety—belongs exclusively to the individual. This is a matter of inalienable, private right, and it cannot be legislated, not even by the sovereign. No one can limit or control another person’s thoughts anyway, and it would be foolhardy and destructive to the polity for a sovereign to attempt to do so. Nor can speech ever truly and effectively be controlled, since people will always say want they want, at least in private. “Everyone is by absolute natural right the master of his own thoughts, and thus utter failure will attend any attempt in a commonwealth to force men to speak only as prescribed by the sovereign despite their different and opposing opinions” (TTP, chap. 20, G III.240/S 223). There must, Spinoza grants, be some limits to speech and teaching. Seditious discourse that encourages individuals to nullify the social contract should not be tolerated. But the best government will err on the side of leniency and allow the freedom of philosophical speculation and the freedom of religious belief. Certain “inconveniences” will, no doubt, sometimes result from such an extensive liberty. But the attempt to regulate everything by law is “more likely to arouse vices than to reform them”. In a passage that foreshadows John Stuart Mill’s utilitarian defense of liberty nearly two centuries later, Spinoza adds that “this freedom is of the first importance in fostering the sciences and the arts, for only those whose judgment is free and unbiased can attain success in these fields” (TTP, chap. 20, G III.243/S 226).

It is hard to imagine a more passionate and reasoned defense of freedom and toleration than that offered by Spinoza.


Spinoza’s Works

  • Spinoza Opera, edited by Carl Gebhardt, 5 volumes (Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925, 1972 [volume 5, 1987]). Abbreviated in SEP entry as G.
  • Spinoza Oeuvres, under the general direction of Pierre-François Moreau. This edition, by the Groupe de recherches spinoziste, is superseding the Gebhardt edition. As of October 2023, four volumes have appeared: I. Premiers écrits (2009); III. Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (1999); IV. Ethica (2020); and V. Tractatus Politicus (2005), all published in Paris by the Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Spinoza, Benedictus, The Collected Writings of Spinoza, 2 vols., Edwin Curley, translator (Princeton: Princeton University Press, vol. 1: 1985; vol. 2: 2016). The Ethics is in vol. 1; the Theological Political Treatise is in vol. 2.
  • Spinoza, Baruch, The Complete Works, Samuel Shirley, translator (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2002).

Recommended Secondary Literature in English

Note: There is an enormous body of literature on Spinoza in many languages, especially French, Italian, Dutch and German. This is a highly selective list of books in English that are especially helpful for the study of Spinoza’s philosophy in general, as well as for learning more about particular dimensions of his thought. There is also the irregularly published series Studia Spinozana, each volume of which contains essays by scholars devoted to a particular theme.

  • Allison, Henry, 1987. Benedict de Spinoza: An Introduction, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Balibar, Etienne, 1998. Spinoza and Politics, London: Verso.
  • Bennett, Jonathan, 1984. A Study of Spinoza’s Ethics, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Carlisle, Clare. 2021. Spinoza’s Religion. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Curley, Edwin, 1969. Spinoza’s Metaphysics: An Essay in Interpretation, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1988. Behind the Geometric Method, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Della Rocca, Michael, 2008. Spinoza, London and New York: Routledge.
  • –––, (ed.), 2018. The Oxford Handbook of Spinoza. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Donagan, Alan, 1988. Spinoza, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Gatens, Moira and Genevieve Lloyd, 1999. Collective Imaginings: Spinoza, Past and Present. New York: Routledge.
  • Garrett, Don (ed.), 1996. The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2018. Nature and Necessity in Spinoza’s Philosophy. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Goff, Philip (ed.), 2012. Spinoza on Monism, Hampshire and New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Huenemann, Charlie (ed.), 2008. Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Israel, Jonathan I., 2023. Spinoza: Life and Legacy. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Jaquet, Chantal, 2018. Affections, Actions and Passions in Spinoza: The Unity of Body and Mind. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • James, Susan, 2012. Spinoza on Philosophy, Religion, and Politics: The Theological-Political Treatise, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kisner, Matthew J., 2011. Spinoza on Human Freedom: Reason, Autonomy and the Good Life, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kisner, Matthew J. and Andrew Youpa (eds.), 2014. Essays on Spinoza’s Ethical Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Koistinen, Olli (ed.), 2009. The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza’s Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Koistinen, Olli and John Biro (eds.), 2002. Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Laerke, Mogens, 2021. Spinoza and the Freedom of Philosophizing. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • LeBuffe, Michael, 2010. From Bondage to Freedom: Spinoza on Human Excellence, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2017. Spinoza on Reason, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lin, Martin, 2019. Being and Reason: An Essay on Spinoza’s Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lord, Beth, 2010. Spinoza’s Ethics: An Edinburgh Philosophical Guide, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Marshall, Eugene, 2013. The Spiritual Automaton: Spinoza’s Science of the Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Melamed, Yitzhak, 2013. Spinoza’s Metaphysics: Substance and Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, (ed.), 2021. A Companion to Spinoza, Hoboken, NJ: Wiley Blackwell.
  • Melamed, Yitzhak and Michael A. Rosenthal (eds.), 2010. Spinoza’s Theological-Political Treatise: A Critical Guide, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nadler, Steven, 1999 [2018]. Spinoza: A Life, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press; 2nd edition, 2018.
  • –––, 2002. Spinoza’s Heresy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2006. Spinoza’s Ethics: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2011. A Book Forged in Hell: Spinoza’s Scandalous Treatise and the Birth of the Secular Age, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2020. Think Least of Death: Spinoza on How to Live and How to Die, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Newlands, Sam, 2018. Reconceiving Spinoza, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Popkin, Richard, 2004. Spinoza, Oxford: One World.
  • Preus, J. Samuel, 2001. Spinoza and the Irrelevance of Biblical Authority, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ravven, Heidi and Leonard E. Goodman (eds.), 2002. Jewish Themes in Spinoza’s Philosophy, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Renz, Ursula, 2018, The Explainability of Experience: Realism and Subjectivity in Spinoza’s Theory of the Human Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sangiacomo, Andrea, 2020. Spinoza on Reason, Passions and the Supreme Good, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Smith, Steven B., 1997. Spinoza, Liberalism and the Question of Jewish Identity, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 2003. Spinoza’s Book of Life, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Steenbakkers, Piet, 1994. Spinoza’s Ethica: From Manuscript to Print. Studies on text, form and related topics, Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Steinberg, Justin, 2018. Spinoza’s Political Psychology: The Taming of Fortune and Fear. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Van Bunge, Wiep, Henri Krop, Piet Steenbakkers and Jeroen van de Ven (eds.), 2011. The Bloomsbury Companion to Spinoza, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Viljanen, Valtteri, 2011. Spinoza’s Geometry of Power, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Verbeek, Theo, 2003. Spinoza’s Theologico-Political Treatise: Exploring ‘the Will of God’, London: Ashgate.
  • Wolfson, Harry, 1934. The Philosophy of Spinoza, 2 vols., Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Youpa, Andrew, 2020. The Ethics of Joy: Spinoza on the Empowered Life, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Yovel, Yirmiyahu, 1989. Spinoza and Other Heretics, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1991. God and Nature: Spinoza’s Metaphysics, Leiden: Brill.
  • ––– (ed.), 1994. Spinoza on Knowledge and the Human Mind, Leiden: Brill.
  • ––– (ed.), 1999. Desire and Affect: Spinoza as Psychologist, New York: Little Room Press.
  • Yovel, Yirmiyahu and Gideon Segal (eds.), 2004. Spinoza on Reason and the “Free Man”, New York: Little Room Press.

Other Internet Resources

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