Rationalism vs. Empiricism

First published Thu Aug 19, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jul 6, 2017

The dispute between rationalism and empiricism concerns the extent to which we are dependent upon sense experience in our effort to gain knowledge. Rationalists claim that there are significant ways in which our concepts and knowledge are gained independently of sense experience. Empiricists claim that sense experience is the ultimate source of all our concepts and knowledge.

Rationalists generally develop their view in two ways. First, they argue that there are cases where the content of our concepts or knowledge outstrips the information that sense experience can provide. Second, they construct accounts of how reason in some form or other provides that additional information about the world. Empiricists present complementary lines of thought. First, they develop accounts of how experience provides the information that rationalists cite, insofar as we have it in the first place. (Empiricists will at times opt for skepticism as an alternative to rationalism: if experience cannot provide the concepts or knowledge the rationalists cite, then we don’t have them.) Second, empiricists attack the rationalists’ accounts of how reason is a source of concepts or knowledge.

1. Introduction

The dispute between rationalism and empiricism takes place within epistemology, the branch of philosophy devoted to studying the nature, sources and limits of knowledge. The defining questions of epistemology include the following.

  1. What is the nature of propositional knowledge, knowledge that a particular proposition about the world is true?

    To know a proposition, we must believe it and it must be true, but something more is required, something that distinguishes knowledge from a lucky guess. Let’s call this additional element ‘warrant’. A good deal of philosophical work has been invested in trying to determine the nature of warrant.

  2. How can we gain knowledge?

    We can form true beliefs just by making lucky guesses. How to gain warranted beliefs is less clear. Moreover, to know the world, we must think about it, and it is unclear how we gain the concepts we use in thought or what assurance, if any, we have that the ways in which we divide up the world using our concepts correspond to divisions that actually exist.

  3. What are the limits of our knowledge?

    Some aspects of the world may be within the limits of our thought but beyond the limits of our knowledge; faced with competing descriptions of them, we cannot know which description is true. Some aspects of the world may even be beyond the limits of our thought, so that we cannot form intelligible descriptions of them, let alone know that a particular description is true.

The disagreement between rationalists and empiricists primarily concerns the second question, regarding the sources of our concepts and knowledge. In some instances, their disagreement on this topic leads them to give conflicting responses to the other questions as well. They may disagree over the nature of warrant or about the limits of our thought and knowledge. Our focus here will be on the competing rationalist and empiricist responses to the second question.

1.1 Rationalism

To be a rationalist is to adopt at least one of three claims. The Intuition/Deduction thesis concerns how we become warranted in believing propositions in a particular subject area.

The Intuition/Deduction Thesis: Some propositions in a particular subject area, S, are knowable by us by intuition alone; still others are knowable by being deduced from intuited propositions.

Intuition is a form of rational insight. Intellectually grasping a proposition, we just “see” it to be true in such a way as to form a true, warranted belief in it. (As discussed in Section 2 below, the nature of this intellectual “seeing” needs explanation.) Deduction is a process in which we derive conclusions from intuited premises through valid arguments, ones in which the conclusion must be true if the premises are true. We intuit, for example, that the number three is prime and that it is greater than two. We then deduce from this knowledge that there is a prime number greater than two. Intuition and deduction thus provide us with knowledge a priori, which is to say knowledge gained independently of sense experience.

We can generate different versions of the Intuition/Deduction thesis by substituting different subject areas for the variable ‘S’. Some rationalists take mathematics to be knowable by intuition and deduction. Some place ethical truths in this category. Some include metaphysical claims, such as that God exists, we have free will, and our mind and body are distinct substances. The more propositions rationalists include within the range of intuition and deduction, and the more controversial the truth of those propositions or the claims to know them, the more radical their rationalism.

Rationalists also vary the strength of their view by adjusting their understanding of warrant. Some take warranted beliefs to be beyond even the slightest doubt and claim that intuition and deduction provide beliefs of this high epistemic status. Others interpret warrant more conservatively, say as belief beyond a reasonable doubt, and claim that intuition and deduction provide beliefs of that caliber. Still another dimension of rationalism depends on how its proponents understand the connection between intuition, on the one hand, and truth, on the other. Some take intuition to be infallible, claiming that whatever we intuit must be true. Others allow for the possibility of false intuited propositions.

The second thesis associated with rationalism is the Innate Knowledge thesis.

The Innate Knowledge Thesis: We have knowledge of some truths in a particular subject area, S, as part of our rational nature.

Like the Intuition/Deduction thesis, the Innate Knowledge thesis asserts the existence of knowledge gained a priori, independently of experience. The difference between them rests in the accompanying understanding of how this a priori knowledge is gained. The Intuition/Deduction thesis cites intuition and subsequent deductive reasoning. The Innate Knowledge thesis offers our rational nature. Our innate knowledge is not learned through either sense experience or intuition and deduction. It is just part of our nature. Experiences may trigger a process by which we bring this knowledge to consciousness, but the experiences do not provide us with the knowledge itself. It has in some way been with us all along. According to some rationalists, we gained the knowledge in an earlier existence. According to others, God provided us with it at creation. Still others say it is part of our nature through natural selection.

We get different versions of the Innate Knowledge thesis by substituting different subject areas for the variable ‘S’. Once again, the more subjects included within the range of the thesis or the more controversial the claim to have knowledge in them, the more radical the form of rationalism. Stronger and weaker understandings of warrant yield stronger and weaker versions of the thesis as well.

The third important thesis of rationalism is the Innate Concept thesis.

The Innate Concept Thesis: We have some of the concepts we employ in a particular subject area, S, as part of our rational nature.

According to the Innate Concept thesis, some of our concepts are not gained from experience. They are part of our rational nature in such a way that, while sense experiences may trigger a process by which they are brought to consciousness, experience does not provide the concepts or determine the information they contain. Some claim that the Innate Concept thesis is entailed by the Innate Knowledge Thesis; a particular instance of knowledge can only be innate if the concepts that are contained in the known proposition are also innate. This is Locke’s position (1690, Book I, Chapter IV, Section 1, p. 91). Others, such as Carruthers, argue against this connection (1992, pp. 53–54). The content and strength of the Innate Concept thesis varies with the concepts claimed to be innate. The more a concept seems removed from experience and the mental operations we can perform on experience the more plausibly it may be claimed to be innate. Since we do not experience perfect triangles but do experience pains, our concept of the former is a more promising candidate for being innate than our concept of the latter.

The Intuition/Deduction thesis, the Innate Knowledge thesis, and the Innate Concept thesis are essential to rationalism: to be a rationalist is to adopt at least one of them. Two other closely related theses are generally adopted by rationalists, although one can certainly be a rationalist without adopting either of them. The first is that experience cannot provide what we gain from reason.

The Indispensability of Reason Thesis: The knowledge we gain in subject area, S, by intuition and deduction, as well as the ideas and instances of knowledge in S that are innate to us, could not have been gained by us through sense experience.

The second is that reason is superior to experience as a source of knowledge.

The Superiority of Reason Thesis: The knowledge we gain in subject area S by intuition and deduction or have innately is superior to any knowledge gained by sense experience.

How reason is superior needs explanation, and rationalists have offered different accounts. One view, generally associated with Descartes (1628, Rules II and III, pp. 1–4), is that what we know a priori is certain, beyond even the slightest doubt, while what we believe, or even know, on the basis of sense experience is at least somewhat uncertain. Another view, generally associated with Plato (Republic 479e-484c), locates the superiority of a priori knowledge in the objects known. What we know by reason alone, a Platonic form, say, is superior in an important metaphysical way, e.g. unchanging, eternal, perfect, a higher degree of being, to what we are aware of through sense experience.

Most forms of rationalism involve notable commitments to other philosophical positions. One is a commitment to the denial of scepticism for at least some area of knowledge. If we claim to know some truths by intuition or deduction or to have some innate knowledge, we obviously reject scepticism with regard to those truths. Rationalism in the form of the Intuition/Deduction thesis is also committed to epistemic foundationalism, the view that we know some truths without basing our belief in them on any others and that we then use this foundational knowledge to know more truths.

1.2 Empiricism

Empiricists endorse the following claim for some subject area.

The Empiricism Thesis: We have no source of knowledge in S or for the concepts we use in S other than sense experience.

Empiricism about a particular subject rejects the corresponding version of the Intuition/Deduction thesis and Innate Knowledge thesis. Insofar as we have knowledge in the subject, our knowledge is a posteriori, dependent upon sense experience. Empiricists also deny the implication of the corresponding Innate Concept thesis that we have innate ideas in the subject area. Sense experience is our only source of ideas. They reject the corresponding version of the Superiority of Reason thesis. Since reason alone does not give us any knowledge, it certainly does not give us superior knowledge. Empiricists generally reject the Indispensability of Reason thesis, though they need not. The Empiricism thesis does not entail that we have empirical knowledge. It entails that knowledge can only be gained, if at all, by experience. Empiricists may assert, as some do for some subjects, that the rationalists are correct to claim that experience cannot give us knowledge. The conclusion they draw from this rationalist lesson is that we do not know at all.

I have stated the basic claims of rationalism and empiricism so that each is relative to a particular subject area. Rationalism and empiricism, so relativized, need not conflict. We can be rationalists in mathematics or a particular area of mathematics and empiricists in all or some of the physical sciences. Rationalism and empiricism only conflict when formulated to cover the same subject. Then the debate, Rationalism vs. Empiricism, is joined. The fact that philosophers can be both rationalists and empiricists has implications for the classification schemes often employed in the history of philosophy, especially the one traditionally used to describe the Early Modern Period of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries leading up to Kant. It is standard practice to group the major philosophers of this period as either rationalists or empiricists and to suggest that those under one heading share a common agenda in opposition to those under the other. Thus, Descartes, Spinoza and Leibniz are the Continental Rationalists in opposition to Locke, Berkeley and Hume, the British Empiricists. We should adopt such general classification schemes with caution. The views of the individual philosophers are more subtle and complex than the simple-minded classification suggests. (See Loeb (1981) and Kenny (1986) for important discussions of this point.) Locke rejects rationalism in the form of any version of the Innate Knowledge or Innate Concept theses, but he nonetheless adopts the Intuition/Deduction thesis with regard to our knowledge of God’s existence. Descartes and Locke have remarkably similar views on the nature of our ideas, even though Descartes takes many to be innate, while Locke ties them all to experience. The rationalist/empiricist classification also encourages us to expect the philosophers on each side of the divide to have common research programs in areas beyond epistemology. Thus, Descartes, Spinoza and Leibniz are mistakenly seen as applying a reason-centered epistemology to a common metaphysical agenda, with each trying to improve on the efforts of the one before, while Locke, Berkeley and Hume are mistakenly seen as gradually rejecting those metaphysical claims, with each consciously trying to improve on the efforts of his predecessors. It is also important to note that the rationalist/empiricist distinction is not exhaustive of the possible sources of knowledge. One might claim, for example, that we can gain knowledge in a particular area by a form of Divine revelation or insight that is a product of neither reason nor sense experience. In short, when used carelessly, the labels ‘rationalist’ and ‘empiricist,’ as well as the slogan that is the title of this essay, ‘Rationalism vs. Empiricism,’ can retard rather than advance our understanding.

Nonetheless, an important debate properly described as ‘Rationalism vs. Empiricism’ is joined whenever the claims for each view are formulated to cover the same subject. What is perhaps the most interesting form of the debate occurs when we take the relevant subject to be truths about the external world, the world beyond our own minds. A full-fledged rationalist with regard to our knowledge of the external world holds that some external world truths can and must be known a priori, that some of the ideas required for that knowledge are and must be innate, and that this knowledge is superior to any that experience could ever provide. The full-fledged empiricist about our knowledge of the external world replies that, when it comes to the nature of the world beyond our own minds, experience is our sole source of information. Reason might inform us of the relations among our ideas, but those ideas themselves can only be gained, and any truths about the external reality they represent can only be known, on the basis of sense experience. This debate concerning our knowledge of the external world will generally be our main focus in what follows.

Historically, the rationalist/empiricist dispute in epistemology has extended into the area of metaphysics, where philosophers are concerned with the basic nature of reality, including the existence of God and such aspects of our nature as freewill and the relation between the mind and body. Major rationalists (e.g., Descartes 1641) have presented metaphysical theories, which they have claimed to know by reason alone. Major empiricists (e.g., Hume 1739–40) have rejected the theories as either speculation, beyond what we can learn from experience, or nonsensical attempts to describe aspects of the world beyond the concepts experience can provide. The debate raises the issue of metaphysics as an area of knowledge. Kant puts the driving assumption clearly:

The very concept of metaphysics ensures that the sources of metaphysics can’t be empirical. If something could be known through the senses, that would automatically show that it doesn’t belong to metaphysics; that’s an upshot of the meaning of the word ‘metaphysics.’ Its basic principles can never be taken from experience, nor can its basic concepts; for it is not to be physical but metaphysical knowledge, so it must be beyond experience. (1783, Preamble, I, p. 7)

The possibility then of metaphysics so understood, as an area of human knowledge, hinges on how we resolve the rationalist/empiricist debate. The debate also extends into ethics. Some moral objectivists (e.g., Ross 1930 and Huemer 2005) take us to know some fundamental objective moral truths by intuition, while some moral skeptics, who reject such knowledge, (e.g., Mackie 1977) find the appeal to a faculty of moral intuition utterly implausible. More recently, the rationalist/empiricist debate has extended to discussions (e.g., Bealer 1999 and Alexander & Weinberg 2007) of the very nature of philosophical inquiry: to what extent are philosophical questions to be answered by appeals to reason or experience?

2. The Intuition/Deduction Thesis

The Intuition/Deduction thesis claims that we can know some propositions by intuition and still more by deduction. Many empiricists (e.g., Hume 1748) have been willing to accept the thesis so long as it is restricted to propositions solely about the relations among our own concepts. We can, they agree, know by intuition that our concept of God includes our concept of omniscience. Just by examining the concepts, we can intellectually grasp that the one includes the other. The debate between rationalists and empiricists is joined when the former assert, and the latter deny, the Intuition/Deduction thesis with regard to propositions that contain substantive information about the external world. Rationalists, such as Descartes, have claimed that we can know by intuition and deduction that God exists and created the world, that our mind and body are distinct substances, and that the angles of a triangle equal two right angles, where all of these claims are truths about an external reality independent of our thought. Such substantive versions of the Intuition/Deduction thesis are our concern in this section.

One defense of the Intuition/Deduction thesis assumes that we know some substantive external world truths, adds an analysis of what knowledge requires, and concludes that our knowledge must result from intuition and deduction. Descartes claims that knowledge requires certainty and that certainty about the external world is beyond what empirical evidence can provide. We can never be sure our sensory impressions are not part of a dream or a massive, demon orchestrated, deception. Only intuition and deduction can provide the certainty needed for knowledge, and, given that we have some substantive knowledge of the external world, the Intuition/Deduction thesis is true. As Descartes tells us, “all knowledge is certain and evident cognition” (1628, Rule II, p. 1) and when we “review all the actions of the intellect by means of which we are able to arrive at a knowledge of things with no fear of being mistaken,” we “recognize only two: intuition and deduction” (1628, Rule III, p. 3).

This line of argument is one of the least compelling in the rationalist arsenal. First, the assumption that knowledge requires certainty comes at a heavy cost, as it rules out so much of what we commonly take ourselves to know. Second, as many contemporary rationalists accept, intuition is not always a source of certain knowledge. The possibility of a deceiver gives us a reason to doubt our intuitions as well as our empirical beliefs. For all we know, a deceiver might cause us to intuit false propositions, just as one might cause us to have perceptions of nonexistent objects. Descartes’s classic way of meeting this challenge in the Meditations is to argue that we can know with certainty that no such deceiver interferes with our intuitions and deductions. They are infallible, as God guarantees their truth. The problem, known as the Cartesian Circle, is that Descartes’s account of how we gain this knowledge begs the question, by attempting to deduce the conclusion that all our intuitions are true from intuited premises. Moreover, his account does not touch a remaining problem that he himself notes (1628, Rule VII, p. 7): Deductions of any appreciable length rely on our fallible memory.

A more plausible argument for the Intuition/Deduction thesis again assumes that we know some particular, external world truths, and then appeals to the nature of what we know, rather than to the nature of knowledge itself, to argue that our knowledge must result from intuition and deduction. Leibniz (1704) tells us the following.

The senses, although they are necessary for all our actual knowledge, are not sufficient to give us the whole of it, since the senses never give anything but instances, that is to say particular or individual truths. Now all the instances which confirm a general truth, however numerous they may be, are not sufficient to establish the universal necessity of this same truth, for it does not follow that what happened before will happen in the same way again. … From which it appears that necessary truths, such as we find in pure mathematics, and particularly in arithmetic and geometry, must have principles whose proof does not depend on instances, nor consequently on the testimony of the senses, although without the senses it would never have occurred to us to think of them… (1704, Preface, pp. 150–151)

Leibniz goes on to describe our mathematical knowledge as “innate,” and his argument may be directed to support the Innate Knowledge thesis rather than the Intuition/Deduction thesis. For our purposes here, we can relate it to the latter, however: We have substantive knowledge about the external world in mathematics, and what we know in that area, we know to be necessarily true. Experience cannot warrant beliefs about what is necessarily the case. Hence, experience cannot be the source of our knowledge. The best explanation of our knowledge is that we gain it by intuition and deduction. Leibniz mentions logic, metaphysics and morals as other areas in which our knowledge similarly outstrips what experience can provide. Judgments in logic and metaphysics involve forms of necessity beyond what experience can support. Judgments in morals involve a form of obligation or value that lies beyond experience, which only informs us about what is the case rather than about what ought to be.

The strength of this argument varies with its examples of purported knowledge. Insofar as we focus on controversial claims in metaphysics, e.g., that God exists, that our mind is a distinct substance from our body, the initial premise that we know the claims is less than compelling. Taken with regard to other areas, however, the argument clearly has legs. We know a great deal of mathematics, and what we know, we know to be necessarily true. None of our experiences warrants a belief in such necessity, and we do not seem to base our knowledge on any experiences. The warrant that provides us with knowledge arises from an intellectual grasp of the propositions which is clearly part of our learning. Similarly, we seem to have such moral knowledge as that, all other things being equal, it is wrong to break a promise and that pleasure is intrinsically good. No empirical lesson about how things are can warrant such knowledge of how they ought to be.

This argument for the Intuition/Deduction thesis raises additional questions which rationalists must answer. Insofar as they maintain that our knowledge of necessary truths in mathematics or elsewhere by intuition and deduction is substantive knowledge of the external world, they owe us an account of this form of necessity. Many empiricists stand ready to argue that “necessity resides in the way we talk about things, not in the things we talk about” (Quine 1966, p. 174). Similarly, if rationalists claim that our knowledge in morals is knowledge of an objective form of obligation, they owe us an account of how objective values are part of a world of apparently valueless facts.

Perhaps most of all, rationalist defenders of the Intuition/Deduction thesis owe us an account of what intuition is and how it provides warranted true beliefs about the external world. What is it to intuit a proposition and how does that act of intuition support a warranted belief? Their argument presents intuition and deduction as an explanation of assumed knowledge that can’t—they say—be explained by experience, but such an explanation by intuition and deduction requires that we have a clear understanding of intuition and how it supports warranted beliefs. Metaphorical characterizations of intuition as intellectual “grasping” or “seeing” are not enough, and if intuition is some form of intellectual “grasping,” it appears that all that is grasped is relations among our concepts, rather than facts about the external world. One current approach to the issue involves an appeal to Phenomenal Conservatism (Huemer 2001), the principle that if it seems to one as if something is the case, then one is prima facie justified in believing that it is so. Intuitions are then taken to be a particular sort of seeming or appearance: “[A]n intuition that p is a state of its seeming to one that p that is not dependent on inference from other beliefs and that results from thinking about p, as opposed to perceiving, remembering, or introspecting” (Hummer 2005, p. 102). Just as it can visually seem or appear to one as if there’s a tree outside the window, it can intellectually seem or appear to one as if nothing can be both entirely red and entirely green. This approach aims to demystify intuitions; they are but one more form of seeming-state along with ones we gain from sense perception, memory and introspection. It does not, however, tell us all we need to know. Any intellectual faculty, whether it be sense perception, memory, introspection or intuition, provides us with warranted beliefs only if it is generally reliable. The reliability of sense perception stems from the causal connection between how external objects are and how we experience them. What accounts for the reliability of our intuitions regarding the external world? Is our intuition of a particular true proposition the outcome of some causal interaction between ourselves and some aspect of the world? What aspect? What is the nature of this causal interaction? That the number three is prime does not appear to cause anything, let alone our intuition that it is prime. As Michael Huemer (2005, p. 123) points out in mounting his own defense of moral intuitionism, “The challenge for the moral realist, then, is to explain how it would be anything more than chance if my moral beliefs were true, given that I do not interact with moral properties.”

These issues are made all the more pressing by the classic empiricist response to the argument. The reply is generally credited to Hume and begins with a division of all true propositions into two categories.

All the objects of human reason or inquiry may naturally be divided into two kinds, to wit, “Relations of Ideas,” and “Matters of Fact.” Of the first are the sciences of Geometry, Algebra, and Arithmetic, and, in short, every affirmation which is either intuitively or demonstratively certain. That the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the square of the two sides is a proposition which expresses a relation between these figures. That three times five is equal to half of thirty expresses a relation between these numbers. Propositions of this kind are discoverable by the mere operation of thought, without dependence on what is anywhere existent in the universe. Though there never were a circle or triangle in nature, the truths demonstrated by Euclid would forever retain their certainty and evidence. Matters of fact, which are the second objects of human reason, are not ascertained in the same manner, nor is our evidence of their truth, however great, of a like nature with the foregoing. The contrary of every matter of fact is still possible, because it can never imply a contradiction and is conceived by the mind with the same facility and distinctness as if ever so conformable to reality. (Hume 1748, Section IV, Part 1, p. 40)

Intuition and deduction can provide us with knowledge of necessary truths such as those found in mathematics and logic, but such knowledge is not substantive knowledge of the external world. It is only knowledge of the relations of our own ideas. If the rationalist shifts the argument so it appeals to knowledge in morals, Hume’s reply is to offer an analysis of our moral concepts by which such knowledge is empirically gained knowledge of matters of fact.

Morals and criticism are not so properly objects of the understanding as of taste and sentiment. Beauty, whether moral or natural, is felt more properly than perceived. Or if we reason concerning it and endeavor to fix the standard, we regard a new fact, to wit, the general taste of mankind, or some other fact which may be the object of reasoning and inquiry. (Hume 1748, Section XII, Part 3, p. 173)

If the rationalist appeals to our knowledge in metaphysics to support the argument, Hume denies that we have such knowledge.

If we take in our hand any volume--of divinity or school metaphysics, for instance--let us ask, Does it contain any abstract reasoning concerning quantity or number? No. Does it contain any experimental reasoning concerning matter of fact and existence? No. Commit it then to the flames, for it can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion. (Hume 1748, Section XII, Part 3, p. 173)

An updated version of this general empiricist reply, with an increased emphasis on language and the nature of meaning, is given in the twentieth-century by A. J. Ayer’s version of logical positivism. Adopting positivism’s verification theory of meaning, Ayer assigns every cognitively meaningful sentence to one of two categories: either it is a tautology, and so true solely by virtue of the meaning of its terms and provides no substantive information about the world, or it is open to empirical verification. There is, then, no room for knowledge about the external world by intuition or deduction.

There can be no a priori knowledge of reality. For … the truths of pure reason, the propositions which we know to be valid independently of all experience, are so only in virtue of their lack of factual content … [By contrast] empirical propositions are one and all hypotheses which may be confirmed or discredited in actual sense experience. [Ayer 1952, pp. 86; 93–94]

The rationalists’ argument for the Intuition/Deduction thesis goes wrong at the start, according to empiricists, by assuming that we can have substantive knowledge of the external world that outstrips what experience can warrant. We cannot.

This empiricist reply faces challenges of its own. Our knowledge of mathematics seems to be about something more than our own concepts. Our knowledge of moral judgments seems to concern not just how we feel or act but how we ought to behave. The general principles that provide a basis for the empiricist view, e.g. Hume’s overall account of our ideas, the Verification Principle of Meaning, are problematic in their own right. In various formulations, the Verification Principle fails its own test for having cognitive meaning. A careful analysis of Hume’s Inquiry, relative to its own principles, may require us to consign large sections of it to the flames.

In all, rationalists have a strong argument for the Intuition/Deduction thesis relative to our substantive knowledge of the external world, but its success rests on how well they can answer questions about the nature and epistemic force of intuition made all the more pressing by the classic empiricist reply.

3. The Innate Knowledge Thesis

The Innate Knowledge thesis joins the Intuition/Deduction thesis in asserting that we have a priori knowledge, but it does not offer intuition and deduction as the source of that knowledge. It takes our a priori knowledge to be part of our rational nature. Experience may trigger our awareness of this knowledge, but it does not provide us with it. The knowledge is already there.

Plato presents an early version of the Innate Knowledge thesis in the Meno as the doctrine of knowledge by recollection. The doctrine is motivated in part by a paradox that arises when we attempt to explain the nature of inquiry. How do we gain knowledge of a theorem in geometry? We inquire into the matter. Yet, knowledge by inquiry seems impossible (Meno, 80d-e). We either already know the theorem at the start of our investigation or we do not. If we already have the knowledge, there is no place for inquiry. If we lack the knowledge, we don’t know what we are seeking and cannot recognize it when we find it. Either way we cannot gain knowledge of the theorem by inquiry. Yet, we do know some theorems.

The doctrine of knowledge by recollection offers a solution. When we inquire into the truth of a theorem, we both do and do not already know it. We have knowledge in the form of a memory gained from our soul’s knowledge of the theorem prior to its union with our body. We lack knowledge in that, in our soul’s unification with the body, it has forgotten the knowledge and now needs to recollect it. In learning the theorem, we are, in effect, recalling what we already know.

Plato famously illustrates the doctrine with an exchange between Socrates and a young slave, in which Socrates guides the slave from ignorance to mathematical knowledge. The slave’s experiences, in the form of Socrates’ questions and illustrations, are the occasion for his recollection of what he learned previously. Plato’s metaphysics provides additional support for the Innate Knowledge Thesis. Since our knowledge is of abstract, eternal Forms which clearly lie beyond our sensory experience, it is a priori.

Contemporary supporters of Plato’s position are scarce. The initial paradox, which Plato describes as a “trick argument” (Meno, 80e), rings sophistical. The metaphysical assumptions in the solution need justification. The solution does not answer the basic question: Just how did the slave’s soul learn the theorem? The Intuition/Deduction thesis offers an equally, if not more, plausible account of how the slave gains knowledge a priori. Nonetheless, Plato’s position illustrates the kind of reasoning that has caused many philosophers to adopt some form of the Innate Knowledge thesis. We are confident that we know certain propositions about the external world, but there seems to be no adequate explanation of how we gained this knowledge short of saying that it is innate. Its content is beyond what we directly gain in experience, as well as what we can gain by performing mental operations on what experience provides. It does not seem to be based on an intuition or deduction. That it is innate in us appears to be the best explanation.

Noam Chomsky argues along similar lines in presenting what he describes as a “rationalist conception of the nature of language” (1975, p. 129). Chomsky argues that the experiences available to language learners are far too sparse to account for their knowledge of their language. To explain language acquisition, we must assume that learners have an innate knowledge of a universal grammar capturing the common deep structure of natural languages. It is important to note that Chomsky’s language learners do not know particular propositions describing a universal grammar. They have a set of innate capacities or dispositions which enable and determine their language development. Chomsky gives us a theory of innate learning capacities or structures rather than a theory of innate knowledge. His view does not support the Innate Knowledge thesis as rationalists have traditionally understood it. As one commentator puts it, “Chomsky’s principles … are innate neither in the sense that we are explicitly aware of them, nor in the sense that we have a disposition to recognize their truth as obvious under appropriate circumstances. And hence it is by no means clear that Chomsky is correct in seeing his theory as following the traditional rationalist account of the acquisition of knowledge” (Cottingham 1984, p. 124).

Peter Carruthers (1992) argues that we have innate knowledge of the principles of folk-psychology. Folk-psychology is a network of common-sense generalizations that hold independently of context or culture and concern the relationships of mental states to one another, to the environment and states of the body and to behavior (1992, p. 115). It includes such beliefs as that pains tend to be caused by injury, that pains tend to prevent us from concentrating on tasks, and that perceptions are generally caused by the appropriate state of the environment. Carruthers notes the complexity of folk-psychology, along with its success in explaining our behavior and the fact that its explanations appeal to such unobservables as beliefs, desires, feelings and thoughts. He argues that the complexity, universality and depth of folk-psychological principles outstrips what experience can provide, especially to young children who by their fifth year already know a great many of them. This knowledge is also not the result of intuition or deduction; folk-psychological generalizations are not seen to be true in an act of intellectual insight. Carruthers concludes, “[The problem] concerning the child’s acquisition of psychological generalizations cannot be solved, unless we suppose that much of folk-psychology is already innate, triggered locally by the child’s experience of itself and others, rather than learned” (1992, p. 121).

Empiricists, and some rationalists, attack the Innate Knowledge thesis in two main ways. First, they offer accounts of how sense experience or intuition and deduction provide the knowledge that is claimed to be innate. Second, they directly criticize the Innate Knowledge thesis itself. The classic statement of this second line of attack is presented in Locke 1690. Locke raises the issue of just what innate knowledge is. Particular instances of knowledge are supposed to be in our minds as part of our rational make-up, but how are they “in our minds”? If the implication is that we all consciously have this knowledge, it is plainly false. Propositions often given as examples of innate knowledge, even such plausible candidates as the principle that the same thing cannot both be and not be, are not consciously accepted by children and those with severe cognitive limitations. If the point of calling such principles “innate” is not to imply that they are or have been consciously accepted by all rational beings, then it is hard to see what the point is. “No proposition can be said to be in the mind, which it never yet knew, which it never yet was conscious of” (1690, Book I, Chapter II, Section 5, p. 61). Proponents of innate knowledge might respond that some knowledge is innate in that we have the capacity to have it. That claim, while true, is of little interest, however. “If the capacity of knowing, be the natural impression contended for, all the truths a man ever comes to know, will, by this account, be every one of them, innate; and this great point will amount to no more, but only an improper way of speaking; which whilst it pretends to assert the contrary, says nothing different from those, who deny innate principles. For nobody, I think, ever denied, that the mind was capable of knowing several truths” (1690, Book I, Chapter II, Section 5, p. 61). Locke thus challenges defenders of the Innate Knowledge thesis to present an account of innate knowledge that allows their position to be both true and interesting. A narrow interpretation of innateness faces counterexamples of rational individuals who do not meet its conditions. A generous interpretation implies that all our knowledge, even that clearly provided by experience, is innate.

Defenders of innate knowledge take up Locke’s challenge. Leibniz responds (1704) by appealing to an account of innateness in terms of natural potential to avoid Locke’s dilemma. Consider Peter Carruthers’ similar reply.

We have noted that while one form of nativism claims (somewhat implausibly) that knowledge is innate in the sense of being present as such (or at least in propositional form) from birth, it might also be maintained that knowledge is innate in the sense of being innately determined to make its appearance at some stage in childhood. This latter thesis is surely the most plausible version of nativism. (1992, p. 51)

Carruthers claims that our innate knowledge is determined through evolutionary selection (p. 111). Evolution has resulted in our being determined to know certain things (e.g. principles of folk-psychology) at particular stages of our life, as part of our natural development. Experiences provide the occasion for our consciously believing the known propositions but not the basis for our knowledge of them (p. 52). Carruthers thus has a ready reply to Locke’s counterexamples of children and cognitively limited persons who do not believe propositions claimed to be instances of innate knowledge. The former have not yet reached the proper stage of development; the latter are persons in whom natural development has broken down (pp. 49–50).

A serious problem for the Innate Knowledge thesis remains, however. We know a proposition only if it is true, we believe it and our belief is warranted. Rationalists who assert the existence of innate knowledge are not just claiming that, as a matter of human evolution, God’s design or some other factor, at a particular point in our development, certain sorts of experiences trigger our belief in particular propositions in a way that does not involve our learning them from the experiences. Their claim is even bolder: In at least some of these cases, our empirically triggered, but not empirically warranted, belief is nonetheless warranted and so known. How can these beliefs be warranted if they do not gain their warrant from the experiences that cause us to have them or from intuition and deduction?

Some rationalists think that a reliabilist account of warrant provides the answer. According to Reliabilism, beliefs are warranted if they are formed by a process that generally produces true beliefs rather than false ones. The true beliefs that constitute our innate knowledge are warranted, then, because they are formed as the result of a reliable belief-forming process. Carruthers maintains that “Innate beliefs will count as known provided that the process through which they come to be innate is a reliable one (provided, that is, that the process tends to generate beliefs that are true)” (1992, p. 77). He argues that natural selection results in the formation of some beliefs and is a truth-reliable process.

An appeal to Reliabilism, or a similar causal theory of warrant, may well be the best way for rationalists to develop the Innate Knowledge thesis. They have a difficult row to hoe, however. First, such accounts of warrant are themselves quite controversial. Second, rationalists must give an account of innate knowledge that maintains and explains the distinction between innate knowledge and a posteriori knowledge, and it is not clear that they will be able to do so within such an account of warrant. Suppose for the sake of argument that we have innate knowledge of some proposition, P. What makes our knowledge that P innate? To sharpen the question, what difference between our knowledge that P and a clear case of a posteriori knowledge, say our knowledge that something is red based on our current visual experience of a red table, makes the former innate and the latter not innate? In each case, we have a true, warranted belief. In each case, presumably, our belief gains its warrant from the fact that it meets a particular causal condition, e.g., it is produced by a reliable process. In each case, the causal process is one in which an experience causes us to believe the proposition at hand (that P; that something is red), for, as defenders of innate knowledge admit, our belief that P is “triggered” by an experience, as is our belief that something is red. The insight behind the Innate Knowledge thesis seems to be that the difference between our innate and a posteriori knowledge lies in the relation between our experience and our belief in each case. The experience that causes our belief that P does not “contain” the information that P, while our visual experience of a red table does “contain” the information that something is red. Yet, exactly what is the nature of this containment relation between our experiences, on the one hand, and what we believe, on the other, that is missing in the one case but present in the other? The nature of the experience-belief relation seems quite similar in each. The causal relation between the experience that triggers our belief that P and our belief that P is contingent, as is the fact that the belief-forming process is reliable. The same is true of our experience of a red table and our belief that something is red. The causal relation between the experience and our belief is again contingent. We might have been so constructed that the experience we describe as “being appeared to redly” caused us to believe, not that something is red, but that something is hot. The process that takes us from the experince to our belief is also only contingently reliable. Moreover, if our experience of a red table “contains” the information that something is red, then that fact, not the existence of a reliable belief-forming process between the two, should be the reason why the experience warrants our belief. By appealing to Reliablism, or some other causal theory of warrant, rationalists may obtain a way to explain how innate knowledge can be warranted. They still need to show how their explanation supports an account of the difference between innate knowledge and a posteriori knowledge.

4. The Innate Concept Thesis

According to the Innate Concept thesis, some of our concepts have not been gained from experience. They are instead part of our rational make-up, and experience simply triggers a process by which we consciously grasp them. The main concern motivating the rationalist should be familiar by now: the content of some concepts seems to outstrip anything we could have gained from experience. An example of this reasoning is presented by Descartes in the Meditations. Although he sometimes seems committed to the view that all our ideas are innate (Adams 1975 and Gotham 2002), he there classifies our ideas as adventitious, invented by us, and innate. Adventitious ideas, such as a sensation of heat, are gained directly through sense experience. Ideas invented by us, such as our idea of a hippogriff, are created by us from other ideas we possess. Innate ideas, such as our ideas of God, of extended matter, of substance and of a perfect triangle, are placed in our minds by God at creation. Consider Descartes’s argument that our concept of God, as an infinitely perfect being, is innate. Our concept of God is not directly gained in experience, as particular tastes, sensations and mental images might be. Its content is beyond what we could ever construct by applying available mental operations to what experience directly provides. From experience, we can gain the concept of a being with finite amounts of various perfections, one, for example, that is finitely knowledgeable, powerful and good. We cannot however move from these empirical concepts to the concept of a being of infinite perfection. (“I must not think that, just as my conceptions of rest and darkness are arrived at by negating movement and light, so my perception of the infinite is arrived at not by means of a true idea but by merely negating the finite,” Third Meditation, p. 94.) Descartes supplements this argument by another. Not only is the content of our concept of God beyond what experience can provide, the concept is a prerequisite for our employment of the concept of finite perfection gained from experience. (“My perception of the infinite, that is God, is in some way prior to my perception of the finite, that is myself. For how could I understand that I doubted or desired—that is lacked something—and that I was not wholly perfect, unless there were in me some idea of a more perfect being which enabled me to recognize my own defects by comparison,” Third Meditation, p. 94).

An empiricist response to this general line of argument is given by Locke (1690, Book I, Chapter IV, Sections 1–25, pp. 91–107). First, there is the problem of explaining what it is for someone to have an innate concept. If having an innate concept entails consciously entertaining it at present or in the past, then Descartes’s position is open to obvious counterexamples. Young children and people from other cultures do not consciously entertain the concept of God and have not done so. Second, there is the objection that we have no need to appeal to innate concepts in the first place. Contrary to Descartes’ argument, we can explain how experience provides all our ideas, including those the rationalists take to be innate, and with just the content that the rationalists attribute to them.

Leibniz (1704) offers a rationalist reply to the first concern. Where Locke puts forth the image of the mind as a blank tablet on which experience writes, Leibniz offers us the image of a block of marble, the veins of which determine what sculpted figures it will accept.

This is why I have taken as an illustration a block of veined marble, rather than a wholly uniform block or blank tablets, that is to say what is called tabula rasa in the language of the philosophers. For if the soul were like those blank tablets, truths would be in us in the same way as the figure of Hercules is in a block of marble, when the marble is completely indifferent whether it receives this or some other figure. But if there were veins in the stone which marked out the figure of Hercules rather than other figures, this stone would be more determined thereto, and Hercules would be as it were in some manner innate in it, although labour would be needed to uncover the veins, and to clear them by polishing, and by cutting away what prevents them from appearing. It is in this way that ideas and truths are innate in us, like natural inclinations and dispositions, natural habits or potentialities, and not like activities, although these potentialities are always accompanied by some activities which correspond to them, though they are often imperceptible. (1704, Preface, p. 153)

Leibniz’s metaphor contains an insight that Locke misses. The mind plays a role in determining the nature of its contents. This point does not, however, require the adoption of the Innate Concept thesis.

Rationalists have responded to the second part of the empiricist attack on the Innate Concept thesis—the empricists’ claim that the thesis is without basis, as all our ideas can be explained as derived from experience—by focusing on difficulties in the empiricists’ attempts to give such an explanation. The difficulties are illustrated by Locke’s account. According to Locke, experience consists in external sensation and inner reflection. All our ideas are either simple or complex, with the former being received by us passively in sensation or reflection and the latter being built by the mind from simple materials through various mental operations. Right at the start, the account of how simple ideas are gained is open to an obvious counterexample acknowledged, but then set aside, by Hume in presenting his own empiricist theory. Consider the mental image of a particular shade of blue. If Locke is right, the idea is a simple one and should be passively received by the mind through experience. Hume points out otherwise.

Suppose therefore a person to have enjoyed his sight for thirty years and to have become perfectly acquainted with colors of all kinds, except one particular shade of blue, for instance, which it never has been his fortune to meet with; let all the different shades of that color, except that single one, be placed before him, descending gradually from the deepest to the lightest, it is plain that he will perceive a blank where that shade is wanting and will be sensible that there is a greater distance in that place between the contiguous colors than in any other. Now I ask whether it be possible for him, from his own imagination, to supply this deficiency and raise up to himself the idea of that particular shade, though it had never been conveyed to him by his senses? I believe there are but few will be of the opinion that he can… (1748, Section II, pp. 29–30)

Even when it comes to such simple ideas as the image of a particular shade of blue, the mind is more than a blank slate on which experience writes.

Consider too our concept of a particular color, say red. Critics of Locke’s account have pointed out the weaknesses in his explanation of how we gain such a concept by the mental operation of abstraction on individual cases. For one thing, it makes the incorrect assumption that various instances of a particular concept share a common feature. Carruthers puts the objection as follows.

In fact problems arise for empiricists even in connection with the very simplest concepts, such as those of colour. For it is false that all instances of a given colour share some common feature. In which case we cannot acquire the concept of that colour by abstracting the common feature of our experience. Thus consider the concept red. Do all shades of red have something in common? If so, what? It is surely false that individual shades of red consist, as it were, of two distinguishable elements a general redness together with a particular shade. Rather, redness consists in a continuous range of shades, each of which is only just distinguishable from its neighbors. Acquiring the concept red is a matter of learning the extent of the range. (1992, p. 59)

For another thing, Locke’s account of concept acquisition from particular experiences seems circular.

As it stands, however, Locke’s account of concept acquisition appears viciously circular. For noticing or attending to a common feature of various things presupposes that you already possess the concept of the feature in question. (Carruthers 1992, p. 55)

Consider in this regard Locke’s account of how we gain our concept of causation.

In the notice that our senses take of the constant vicissitude of things, we cannot but observe, that several particulars, both qualities and substances; begin to exist; and that they receive this their existence from the due application and operation of some other being. From this observation, we get our ideas of cause and effect. (1690, Book II, Chapter 26, Section 1, pp. 292–293)

We get our concept of causation from our observation that some things receive their existence from the application and operation of some other things. Yet, we cannot make this observation unless we already have the concept of causation. Locke’s account of how we gain our idea of power displays a similar circularity.

The mind being every day informed, by the senses, of the alteration of those simple ideas, it observes in things without; and taking notice how one comes to an end, and ceases to be, and another begins to exist which was not before; reflecting also on what passes within itself, and observing a constant change of its ideas, sometimes by the impression of outward objects on the senses, and sometimes by the determination of its own choice; and concluding from what it has so constantly observed to have been, that the like changes will for the future be made in the same things, by like agents, and by the like ways, considers in one thing the possibility of having any of its simple ideas changed, and in another the possibility of making that change; and so comes by that idea which we call power. (1690, Chapter XXI, Section 1, pp. 219–220)

We come by the idea of power though considering the possibility of changes in our ideas made by experiences and our own choices. Yet, to consider this possibility—of some things making a change in others—we must already have a concept of power.

One way to meet at least some of these challenges to an empiricist account of the origin of our concepts is to revise our understanding of the content of our concepts so as to bring them more in line with what experience will clearly provide. Hume famously takes this approach. Beginning in a way reminiscent of Locke, he distinguishes between two forms of mental contents or “perceptions,” as he calls them: impressions and ideas. Impressions are the contents of our current experiences: our sensations, feelings, emotions, desires, and so on. Ideas are mental contents derived from impressions. Simple ideas are copies of impressions; complex ideas are derived from impressions by “compounding, transposing, augmenting or diminishing” them. Given that all our ideas are thus gained from experience, Hume offers us the following method for determining the content of any idea and thereby the meaning of any term taken to express it.

When we entertain, therefore, any suspicion that a philosophical term is employed without any meaning or idea (as is but too frequent), we need but inquire from what impression is that supposed idea derived? And if it be impossible to assign any, this will confirm our suspicion. (1748, Section II, p. 30)

Using this test, Hume draws out one of the most important implications of the empiricists’ denial of the Innate Concept thesis. If experience is indeed the source of all ideas, then our experiences also determine the content of our ideas. Our ideas of causation, of substance, of right and wrong have their content determined by the experiences that provide them. Those experiences, Hume argues, are unable to support the content that many rationalists and some empiricists, such as Locke, attribute to the corresponding ideas. Our inability to explain how some concepts, with the contents the rationalists attribute to them, are gained from experience should not lead us to adopt the Innate Concept thesis. It should lead us to accept a more limited view of the contents for those concepts, and thereby a more limited view of our ability to describe and understand the world.

Consider, for example, our idea of causation. Descartes takes it to be innate. Locke offers an apparently circular account of how it is gained from experience. Hume’s empiricist account severely limits its content. Our idea of causation is derived from a feeling of expectation rooted in our experiences of the constant conjunction of similar causes and effects.

It appears, then, that this idea of a necessary connection among events arises from a number of similar instances which occur, of the constant conjunction of these events; nor can that idea ever be suggested by any one of these instances surveyed in all possible lights and positions. But there is nothing in a number of instances, different from every single instance, which is supposed to be exactly similar, except only that after a repetition of similar instances the mind is carried by habit, upon the appearance of one event, to expect its usual attendant and to believe that it will exist. This connection, therefore, which we feel in the mind, this customary transition of the imagination from one object to its usual attendant, is the sentiment or impression from which we form the idea of power or necessary connection. (1748, Section VII, Part 2, p. 86)

The source of our idea in experience determines its content.

Suitably to this experience, therefore, we may define a cause to be an object followed by another, and where all the objects, similar to the first are followed by objects similar to the second… We may, therefore, suitably to this experience, form another definition of cause and call it an object followed by another, and whose appearance always conveys the thought of the other. (1748, Section VII, Part 2, p. 87)

Our claims, and any knowledge we may have, about causal connections in the world turn out, given the limited content of our empirically based concept of causation, to be claims and knowledge about the constant conjunction of events and our own feelings of expectation. Thus, the initial disagreement between rationalists and empiricists about the source of our ideas leads to one about their content and thereby the content of our descriptions and knowledge of the world.

Like philosophical debates generally, the rationalist/empiricist debate ultimately concerns our position in the world, in this case our position as rational inquirers. To what extent do our faculties of reason and experience support our attempts to know and understand our situation?


Works Cited

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Related Works

  • Aune, B., 1970, Rationalism, Empiricism and Pragmatism: An Introduction, New York: Random House.
  • Bealer, G. and Strawson, P. F., 1992, “The Incoherence of Empiricism,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 66: 99–143.
  • Boyle, D., 2009, Descartes on Innate Ideas, London: Continum.
  • Block, N., 1981, Essays in Philosophy of Psychology II, London: Methuen, Part Four.
  • Bonjour, L., 1998, In Defense of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Casullo, A., 2003, A priori Knowledge and Justification, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Casullo, A. (ed.), 2012, Essays on A priori Knowledge and Justification, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Cottingham, J., 1984, Rationalism, London: Paladin Books.
  • Chomsky, N., 1975, “Recent Contributions to the Theory of Innate Ideas”, reprinted in S. Stitch (ed.), Innate Ideas, Berkeley, CA: California University Press.
  • –––, 1988, Language and Problems of Knowledge, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • De Paul, M. and W. Ramsey (eds.), 1998, Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and Its Role in Philosophical Inquiry, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Fodor, J., 1975, The Language of Thought, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1981, Representations, Brighton: Harvester.
  • Kripke, S., 1980, Naming and Necessity, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Huemer, M., 2005, Ethical Intuitionism, New York, NY: Palgrave MacMillian.
  • Quine, W. V. O., 1966, Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, New York: Random House.
  • –––, 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” in W.V.O. Quine, From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1951.
  • Stitch, S., 1975, Innate Ideas, Berkeley, CA: California University Press.

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