Medieval Theories of the Syllogism

First published Mon Feb 2, 2004; substantive revision Sat Apr 2, 2022

Aristotle’s theory of the syllogism played an important role in the Western and Near Eastern intellectual traditions for more than two thousand years, but it was during the Middle Ages that it became the dominant model of correct argumentation.

Historically, medieval logic is divided into the old logic (logica vetus), the tradition stretching from Boethius (c. 480–525) until Abelard (1079–1142), and the new logic (logica nova), from the late twelfth century until the Renaissance. The division reflects the availability of ancient logical texts. Before Abelard, medieval logicians were only familiar with Aristotle’s Categories and On Interpretation and Porphyry’s Isagoge or Introduction to the Categories and not the Prior Analytics, where Aristotle develops the theory of the syllogism — though they did know something of his theory through secondary sources. Once the Prior Analytics reappeared in the West in the middle of the twelfth century, commentaries on it began appearing in the late twelfth and early thirteenth centuries.

Aristotle’s theory of the syllogism for assertoric (non-modal) sentences was a remarkable achievement and virtually complete in the Prior Analytics. To quote Kant, it was “a closed and completed body of doctrine.” Medieval logicians could not add much to it, though small changes were sometimes made and it was systematized in different ways. It was not until the mid-fourteenth century, when John Buridan reworked logic in general and placed the theory of the syllogism in the context of the more comprehensive logic of consequence, that people’s understanding of syllogistic logic began to change.

The theory of the modal syllogism, however, was incomplete in the Prior Analytics, and in the hands of medieval logicians it saw a remarkable development. The first commentators tried to save Aristotle’s original theory and in the course of doing so produced some interesting logical theories, though in the end they were unable to make the system work. The next generation of logicians simply abandoned the idea of saving Aristotle and instead introduced new distinctions and developed a completely new theory that subsumed the logic of syllogisms.

The theory of the syllogisms developed independently in the Arabic tradition. Although there was some influence on the Latin tradition through Averroes, the dominant influence was Avicenna, who made several changes to Aristotle’s theory and eventually became the sole authority.

1. Aristotle’s Theory

In the Prior Analytics, Aristotle presents the first system of logic, the theory of the syllogism (see the entry on Aristotle’s logic and ch. 1 of Lagerlund 2000 for further details). A syllogism is a deduction consisting of three sentences: two premises and a conclusion. Syllogistic sentences are categorical sentences involving a subject and a predicate connected by a copula (verb). These are in turn divided into four different classes: universal affirmative (a), particular affirmative (i), universal negative (e) and particular negative (o), written by Aristotle as follows:

a A belongs to all B (AaB)
i A belongs to some B (AiB)
e A does not belong to any B (AeB)
o A does not belong to some B (AoB)

The subject and predicate in the categorical sentences used in a syllogism are called terms (horoi) by Aristotle. There are three terms in a syllogism: a major, a minor, and a middle term. The major and the minor are called the extremes (akra), i.e., the major extreme (meizon akron) and the minor extreme (elatton akron), and they form the predicate and the subject of the conclusion. The middle (meson) term is what joins the two premises. These three terms can be combined in different ways to form three figures (skhemata), which Aristotle presents in the Prior Analytics (A is the major, B the middle, and C the minor term):

A – B
B – C
A – C
B – A
B – C
A – C
A – B
C – B
A – C

When the four categorical sentences are placed into these three figures, Aristotle ends up with the following 14 valid moods (in parentheses are the medieval mnemonic names for the valid moods; see Spade 2002, pp. 29–33, and Lagerlund 2008, for the significance of these names):

First figure: AaB, BaC, therefore, AaC (Barbara); AeB, BaC, therefore, AeC (Celarent); AaB, BiC, therefore, AiC (Darii); AeB, BiC, therefore, AoC (Ferio).

Second figure: BaA, BeC, therefore, AeC (Camestres); BeA, BaC, therefore, AeC (Cesare); BeA, BiC, therefore, AoC (Festino); BaA, BoC, therefore, AoC (Baroco).

Third figure: AaB, CaB, therefore, AiC (Darapti); AeB, CaB, therefore, AoC (Felapton); AiB, CaB, therefore, AiC (Disamis); AaB, CiB, therefore, AiC (Datisi); AoB, CaB, therefore, AoC (Bocardo); AeB, CiB, therefore, AoC (Ferison).

A fourth figure was discussed in ancient times as well as during the Middle Ages. In Aristotelian syllogistic, it has the following form:

B – A
C – B
A – C

By taking this figure into account we can derive additional valid moods, all of which are mentioned by Aristotle in the Prior Analytics (see, e.g., An. Pr. I.7, 29a19–29). The fourth figure moods are the following:

Fourth figure: BaA, CaB, therefore, AiC (Bramantip); BaA, CeB, therefore, AeC (Camenes); BiA, CaB, therefore, AiC (Dimaris); BeA, CaB, therefore, AoC (Fesapo); BeA, CiB, therefore, AoC (Fresison).

If we perform a simple calculation based on the four categorical sentences and the four figures, we find that there are 256 possible combinations of sentences. Of these, 24 have traditionally been thought to yield valid deductions. To the 19 already mentioned we must add two subalternate moods in the first figure (Barbari and Celaront), two subalternate moods in the second figure (Camestrop and Cesaro), and one subalternate mood in the fourth figure (Camenop).

The difference between the first figure and the other three figures is that the syllogisms in the first figure are complete, meaning that they are immediately evident and do not require proof. This distinction is important in Aristotle’s theory, since it gives the first figure an axiomatic character, so that the proofs of the incomplete syllogisms in the other three figures are arrived at primarily through reduction to the complete syllogisms.

The reductions of the incomplete syllogisms were made by Aristotle through conversion rules. He states the following conversion rules in the Prior Analytics (I.2, 25a1–26):

AaB \(\supset\) BiA,
AiB \(\equiv\) BiA,
AeB \(\equiv\) BeA.

During the Middle Ages, (1:1) was called an accidental (per accidens) conversion and (1:2) and (1:3) simple (simpliciter) conversions. Particular negative sentences do not convert, according to Aristotle.

Not all incomplete syllogisms were reduced to complete syllogisms; Aristotle also gave other arguments for them. He used two methods to prove the incomplete syllogisms: reductio ad impossibile and ekthesis. Thus, he proves Baroco by impossibility, from the assumption that the premises are true and the conclusion false (An. Pr. I.5, 27a36-b1):

  1. BaA Premise
  2. BoC Premise
  3. AaC Assumed as the negation of the conclusion
  4. BaC From (i) and (iii) by Barbara
  5. \(\bot\) From (ii) and (iv)
  6. AoC From (iii) and (v)

Medieval logicians used this method as well, following Aristotle.

The ekthesis proof is more complicated and was not commonly used by medieval logicians, who preferred proofs through expository syllogisms, a simplification and refinement of the ekthesis. Aristotle’s method can be expressed in terms of the following rules (Patzig 1968 and Smith 1982):

AiB, therefore, AaC, BaC (where C does not occur previously),
AoB, therefore, AeC, BaC (where C does not occur previously),
AaC, BaC, therefore, AiB,
AeC, BaC, therefore, AoB.

Based on these rules, the ekthesis method permits straightforward proofs of the third figure syllogisms. Aristotle proves Darapti (An. Pr. I.6, 28a22–26) and mentions that Bocardo is provable by ekthesis (An. Pr. I.6, 28b20–21). The proof of Bocardo is as follows:

  1. AoB Premise
  2. CaB Premise
  3. AeD From (i) and (1:5)
  4. BaD From (i) and (1:5)
  5. CaD From (ii), (iv) and Barbara
  6. AoC From (iii), (v) and (1:7)

Yet this account of the ekthesis proof is not without its problems. Even in antiquity, Aristotle was accused of arguing in a circle, since (1:6) and (1:7) seem to correspond to the third figure incomplete syllogisms Darapti and Felapton. (1:4)–(1:7) also seem superfluous, and in fact Alexander of Aphrodisias (fl. c. 200 AD) was able to show that ekthesis is really all Aristotle needed, since all the valid moods can be proved with it. Aristotle also used counterexamples to show that a mood is invalid.

In Chapters 3 and 8–22 of Book I of the Prior Analytics, Aristotle extends his theory to include syllogisms with modally qualified categorical sentences. An Aristotelian modal syllogism is a syllogism that has at least one premise modalized, i.e., that in addition to the standard terms also contains the modal words ‘necessarily’, ‘possibly’ or ‘contingently’. Aristotle’s terminology is not entirely clear, however. He speaks only of necessity and possibility, though he works with two notions of possibility. In what seems to be his preferred sense, used primarily in the Prior Analytics, possibility is defined as that which is not necessary and not impossible. This sense of possibility was called contingency in the Middle Ages. But there is another sense of possibility in Aristotle’s On Interpretation according to which possibility is equivalent to what is not impossible. The first concept of possibility, which I will henceforth call ‘contingency’, is used in the modal syllogistic. The second concept is not treated systematically in the Prior Analytics.

If we follow this terminology we get eight modal categorical sentences, which we can raise to twelve if the notion of possibility is added. If we then perform the same calculation as before, taking into account the four figures and also the non-modal propositions, we get either 6,912 or 16,384 possible moods. It would be a gargantuan task, of course, to go through them all and see which ones are valid. Accordingly, Aristotle limits his discussion to those modal syllogisms whose assertoric counterparts are valid, as did most medieval logicians.

Aristotle treats modal syllogisms with (i) uniform necessity, (ii) uniform contingency, (iii) mixed necessity and assertoric, (iv) mixed contingency and assertoric, and (v) mixed necessity and contingency premises. Possibility sentences are not treated as premises of modal syllogisms. Sometimes, however, mixed syllogisms are only valid in reaching a possibility conclusion.

Aristotle uses the same methods to prove the incomplete modal syllogisms as he uses for the assertoric syllogisms, i.e., conversions, reductio ad impossibile, and ekthesis. In An. Pr. I.3, 25a27–25b26, he accepts the following conversion rules for necessity, contingency, and possibility sentences:

Necessarily AaB \(\supset\) Necessarily BiA,
Necessarily AiB \(\equiv\) Necessarily BiA,
Necessarily AeB \(\equiv\) Necessarily BeA,
Contingently AaB \(\supset\) Contingently BiA,
Contingently AiB \(\equiv\) Contingently BiA,
Contingently AeB \(\supset\) Contingently BoA,
Contingently AoB \(\equiv\) Contingently BoA,
Possibly AaB \(\supset\) Possibly BiA,
Possibly AiB \(\equiv\) Possibly BiA,
Possibly AeB \(\equiv\) Possibly BeA.

Aristotle accepts no conversion rules for either necessity or possibility particular negative sentences, though he does accept two conversions to the opposite quality for contingency sentences (see An. Pr. I.13, 32a30–32b2):

Contingently AaB \(\equiv\) Contingently AeB,
Contingently AiB \(\equiv\) Contingently AoB.

In the Prior Analytics Aristotle gives only vague hints about how modal sentences are supposed to be interpreted. The problem is best illustrated by what is often used as a test for all interpretations of Aristotle, i.e., the problem of the two Barbara syllogisms. They are discussed at An. Pr. I.9:

It is necessary that AaB
It is necessary that AaC
It is necessary that BaC
It is necessary that AaC

The problem is that Aristotle accepts the former but not the latter. The question then is: Under which interpretation does the former come out valid but not the latter?

To solve this problem, it has been common in contemporary discussions to introduce the distinction between de dicto and de re modal sentences. I have presented the two syllogisms above with a de dicto reading of the modal sentences, i.e., so that the modality concerns the way the sentence is or is not true. On this reading, both Barbara syllogisms seem invalid. But what about the de re reading? The modality in this reading of the sentences applies to the manner in which the predicate belongs to the subject. The two syllogisms will then have the following form:

(A necessarily)aB
(A necessarily)aC
(B necessarily)aC
(A necessarily)aC

It is equally obvious in these cases that the first syllogism is valid whereas the latter is not, since the latter involves five different terms. This suggests that Aristotle’s modal syllogistic should be given a de re interpretation (Becker 1933).

However, if this interpretation is accepted, another problem emerges, namely that the conversion rules are not valid under a de re interpretation, for if the de re interpretation means that the predicate is modified by the mode, the conversion rules will never be valid. Consider the following example:

(A necessarily)aB,

which should convert to:

(B necessarily)iA.

‘Necessarily A’ has here been transformed to ‘A’, which is a valid move since necessity implies actuality, but ‘B’ has been transformed to ‘necessarily B’, which is an invalid move. The same can be said for all the modal conversion rules under a de re interpretation. If, on the other hand, the de dicto reading is maintained, it is easily seen that they are valid in view of the validity of the non-modal conversion rules.

However, Aristotle probably did have something like a de re reading of the categorical sentences in mind, as many scholars have come to realize and as most medievals who read him thought. But if the conversion rules must be given a de dicto interpretation and the different syllogisms a de re interpretation, the whole system seems to collapse. This problem makes a consistent reconstruction of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic using modern modal logic very difficult. (See Becker 1933, Lukasiewicz 1957, Rescher 1974, van Rijen 1989, Patterson 1995, Thom 1996, Nortmann 1996 and Malink 2013 for such attempts, and see Hintikka 1973 and Lagerlund 2000 for critical reflections on these attempts.)

2. Boethius

The medieval tradition of logic is generally thought to have begun with Boethius (c. 475–526), who ambitiously tried to preserve philosophical learning from the declining culture of late antiquity. In fact, however, he was only able to save parts of ancient logic, primarily Aristotelian logic (see Lee 1984 for a discussion of Aristotle’s syllogistic in late ancient thought). He wrote extensively on the theory of the syllogism, producing a Latin translation of the Prior Analytics, though it was not used very much before the twelfth century (see Aristotle, Analytica Priora, and the introduction by Minio-Paluello). He also wrote two textbooks on the categorical syllogism: On the Categorical Syllogism (De syllogismo categorico) and Introduction to Categorical Syllogisms (Introductio ad syllogismos categoricos) (for the texts, see Migne 1847 and Thomsen Thörnqvist 2008). In addition, he produced an interesting book called On Hypothetical Syllogisms (De hypotheticis syllogismis), which will be touched on in the discussion below (see Boethius [Obertello 1969] for the text).

Boethius made no substantial contribution to the theory of the syllogism, though he was an important transmitter of the theory to later logicians and his works offer a clear presentation of the Aristotelian account. But that presentation differs from Aristotle’s in one important respect. In Boethius, the categorical sentences are constructed using ‘is’ (’est’) and not ‘belongs’, as in Aristotle. The four sentences thus become:

a Every B is A
i Some B is A
e No B is A
o Some B is not A

Put in this way, it is more obvious that they are subject predicate sentences, and moreover, that the syllogisms are deductions rather than conditional sentences. As a result, the four figures look different:

B – A
C – B
C – A
A – B
C – B
C – A
B – A
B – C
C – A
A – B
B – C
C – A

In systematic terms, Boethius’ change makes no difference and all medieval logicians writing after him adopted it, even though it makes the first figure syllogisms less evident. According to Aristotle, the first syllogism of the first figure (Barbara) should read: ‘A belongs to all B, B belongs to all C; therefore A belongs to all C’. This is obviously valid by the transitivity of inclusion. But if we line up the same syllogism using Boethian formulation we get: ‘Every B is A, Every C is B; therefore Every C is A’. This is not at all as obvious and we have to switch the places of the premises to get the same transitivity characteristic: ‘Every C is B, Every B is A; therefore Every C is A’. Beyond this small but significant change, Boethius does not contribute much to the theory, though he is a little more interested than Aristotle in the different kinds of conversion. His hypothetical syllogistic is, on the other hand, rather novel.

Like most things in the history of logic, hypothetical syllogistic also begins with Aristotle. In the Prior Analytics, he says that every syllogism is either direct or from a hypothesis. Traditional syllogistic is direct and hence all syllogisms that do not fall into the patterns of inference defined by the three Aristotelian figures, but which are nevertheless valid syllogisms, must be hypothetical. Aristotle’s principal example is a syllogism through impossibility. If we reason from a hypothesis P via a syllogism to a conclusion Q that is impossible, then we can conclude that not-P is true and P false (An. Pr. 41a23–30).

In the second century C.E., Alexander of Aphrodisias tried to develop this into a theory of the hypothetical syllogism. What emerged from his attempt is something quite strange and even confused, though it has been studied at great length (see esp. Speca 2001 and the list of further references there). Boethius’ On the Hypothetical Syllogisms is the only remaining early work on this topic.

A hypothetical syllogism is a syllogism in which one or more premises are hypothetical sentences. Boethius draws the distinction between categorical sentences and hypothetical sentences formally by saying that a categorical sentence involves a predication whereas a hypothetical sentence involves a condition, i.e., it says that something is, if something else is. Typically such sentences are conditional sentences such as ‘if P then Q’, though Boethius also treats ‘P or Q’ as hypothetical, apparently because he thinks that disjunction can be translated in terms of a conditional sentence. Another characteristic of hypothetical sentences is that they are made up of categorical sentences.

The basic hypothetical sentences he gives are:

If it is A, then it is B
If it is not-A, then it is not-B
If it is A, then it is not-B
If it is not-A, then it is B

He also considers sentences involving three terms:

If, if it is A, then it is B, then it is C
If it is A, then if it is B, then it is C

though a hypothetical sentence can be even more complicated:

If, if it is A, then it is B, then if it is C, then it is D.

Boethius also thinks that hypothetical sentences can be qualified by modalities such as necessity or possibility, but he never develops this idea.

In trying to establish what combination of premises form valid inferences he proceeds like Aristotle and develops lists or tables in which he can group the valid patterns. The basic sentences (2:1)–(2:4) combined with a simple categorical sentence as the second premise boil down to what we today know as modus ponens and modus tollens. This led some modern interpreters to think that Boethius was developing a sentential logic as the Stoics had done (Dürr 1951), but this idea has been rejected by more recent scholars (Obertello 1969, Martin 1991 and Speca 2001). Whatever Boethius thought he was doing, he was not trying to develop a sentential logic. This becomes obvious if one considers a more complex hypothetical syllogism, such as the following, which he accepts as valid:

If it is A, then if it is B, then it is C
If it is B, then it is not-C
It is not-A

If Boethius’ logic is a sentential logic his syllogism would be translatable into the following:

A \(\supset\) (B \(\supset\) C)
B \(\supset\) \(\sim\)C

But this is not a valid deduction, since if A is assumed to be true and B false, the conclusion that follows, not-A, remains false despite both premises being true. If, on the other hand, Boethius means his reader not to take them for sentences but rather, following Aristotle’s syllogistic, terms, which carry no truth-value by themselves, then the inference schema can be given a valid interpretation, as long as one allows for the way that Boethius understood negation and compound conditionals (see Martin 2009, 76–78). If a thing is A then it must be that if it is B then it is C. So, if we also have that if it is B then it is not-C, then it could not be A, so it must be not-A. This example alone thus already suggests that, despite some formal similarities to sentential logic, Boethius is actually operating with something more akin to the term logic that preceded him rather than in some newer, original, pre-modern formulation of sentential logic.

Boethius is conscious of a Stoic logical tradition in which the logical forms of sentences were distinguished according to their linguistic form, such that ‘if … then’ structures indicate conditionals and ‘or’ structures indicate disjunctions, making these terms rather like operators on sentences. He seems to be using these ideas to demarcate his hypothetical sentences, though he is still writing in an Aristotelian fashion and developing an Aristotelian term logic (see Speca 2001 and Marenbon 2003: 50–56). This mix makes his logic quite confused, and the confusion was not sorted out until Abelard was able to develop a proper sentential logic out of Boethius’ suggestions. (See Martin 2009 as well.)

3. Arabic Logic and Syllogisms

Arabic logic begins in the middle of the eighth century. As with logic in the Latin tradition, it has its foundation in Ancient Greek logic, primarily in Aristotelian logic and syllogistics. The Syriac Christians adopted a teaching tradition in logic that included Porphyry’s Isagoge in addition to Aristotle’s Categories, De interpretatione and the first seven chapters of the Prior Analytics. This teaching tradition was adopted and spread through the Arab conquest. During the Abbasid Caliphate (750–1258), there was a continuous and growing interest in philosophy and logic. It is this time period that is often referred to as the ‘Golden Age’ of Arabic philosophy and logic.

Gradually, the whole Organon was made available in Arabic translation (the Arabic tradition was unique in treating Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics as part of logic, unlike later traditions in medieval logic. The first more important Arabic logician was Ishâq al-Kindî (d. 870), who wrote a short overview of the whole of the Organon. After him, more and more substantial works were produced. Abû Nasr Alfarabi (d. 950) made the first original contributions, writing a series of commentaries on Aristotle, although only his commentary on De interpretatione has survived. Avicenna seems to have held his work in very high esteem. By far the most important logician in the Arabic tradition, however, was Ibn Sînâ (d. 1037) or Avicenna, as he was known in the Latin West.

Avicenna had a different attitude to Aristotle’s logic than logicians before him. He did not think that Aristotle was necessarily right. Aristotle had a lot of intuitions about logic that do not all fit together into a coherent whole. They had to be worked out and Avicenna believed that when that happened, it would become clear that Aristotle’s logic was only a fragment of a much larger system. After Avicenna, the general character of Arabic logic was no longer Aristotelian but Avicennan, which is to say that the texts drawn upon by most logicians were no longer Aristotle’s but Avicenna’s (with the notable exception of Averroes, known to the Latin tradition as ‘the Commentator’, i.e., on Aristotle). One work of Avicenna in particular became important for subsequent logicians: what is known as Al-Ishârât wa’l Tanbîhat in Arabic and Pointers and Reminders in English — or Remarks and Admonitions in S. Inati’s translation (Avicenna 1984).

Tony Street (2002, 2004) has identified three things that make logic Avicennan as opposed to Aristotelian: (1) truth-conditions of absolute (or assertoric, i.e., non-modal) sentences are expressed in modal terms; (2) logical properties of so-called descriptional (wasfi) sentences, such as ‘Every B is A while B’, are studied; and (3) syllogisms are divided into connective and repetitive. If a logician adopts (1)–(3), he is following Avicenna, according to Street.

In Pointer Two of Path Four, Avicenna introduces distinctions between different kinds of sentences. The first distinction is between absolute and modal sentences, although absolute sentences turn out to be modal as well. The basic division is one between absolute sentences that are taken to be definite or indefinite with respect to time.

Avicenna talks about three kinds of absolute sentences, all of which are explicated with reference to time. First are absolute sentences that refer to a definite time, but these play no role in his discussion. The other two are the general and the special absolute sentences. General absolute sentences are sentences taken without limitation with respect to time, which means that they have to take in all individuals - past, present and future. Furthermore, the copula is taken to mean that the Bs are As at least sometime, as in ‘Every human is sometimes moving’. A special absolute sentence is a sentence with limitations with respect to time, its subject term referring to individuals at a specific moment in time - although it is not explicated what moment in time that is. The copula is also understood as a conjunction meaning ‘sometimes B and sometimes not B’, as in ‘Everything running is sometimes walking and sometimes not walking’.

Avicenna is quick to point out that neither general nor special absolute sentences behave as expected. For example, they do not fit the traditional square of opposition. ‘Every B is A’ on the general reading does not contradict ‘Some B is not A’. Thus, he introduces one other kind of absolute sentence, namely a perpetual absolute sentence. In a perpetual sentence the copula is simply read as ‘is always’. The contradictory of a general absolute is the perpetual absolute, and similarly with the special absolute, although it will contradict a disjunction of two perpetual sentences (see Street 2002 and Lagerlund 2009).

The second distinctive Avicennan thesis is the introduction of descriptional (wasfi) sentences. This is again done in the context of modal syllogistics, although, such sentences do not need to be modal at all and Avicenna can be seen to have introduced a logic for descriptional sentences (Street 2002). The example he gives in Pointers and Reminders is:

Everything walking is necessarily moving while walking

The addition of ‘while walking’ restricts all moving things to those actually walking, which makes the sentence true. Avicenna distinguishes descriptional sentences from substantial sentences. The example he gives of a substantial sentence is:

Every human is necessarily an animal

The logic for substantial sentences is different from the logic for descriptional sentences. A sentences like (3:2) converts according to the standard Aristotelian conversion rules, so:

Every human being is necessarily an animal

converts into:

Some animal is necessarily a human.

Such sentences are characterized by as kath’ hauto (per se) by Aristotle in Posterior Analytics I.4 (see Lagerlund 2000, 30–1). Part of what Aristotle said about modal syllogistic is valid for such sentences.

But another group of sentences, such as:

Every literate being is necessarily a human being

are not substantial and hence do not convert, since this converted sentence is false:

Some human being is necessarily literate.

However, if these are read as descriptional sentences, then they do convert:

Every literate being is necessarily a human being while literate

converts into

Some human being is necessarily literate while literate.

Descriptional sentences have a syllogistic logic like substantial sentences and Avicenna thinks part of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic can be worked out using descriptional sentences (for a comparison with similar logics found in the thirteenth-century Latin tradition, see Lagerlund 2009). But even though Avicenna sketches a syllogistic for descriptional sentences in Pointers and Reminders, he is mostly concerned with substantial sentences and their logic.

The third distinctive mark of Avicenna’s logic is the distinction between so-called connective and repetitive syllogisms, which corresponds roughly to Aristotle’s distinction between categorical and hypothetical syllogisms.

In his history of Arabic logic, Khaled El-Rouayheb divides Arabic logic after 1200 into several distinctive periods (El-Rouyaheb 2010). According to him the next period begins with Fakhr al-Din al-Razi. After Razi, the later Arabic logical tradition became disassociated from Aristotle and more narrowly focused on the predicables, definitions, propositions, and syllogisms.

Most thirteenth-century logic can also be described as post-Avicennan in the sense that logicians in this period all took their departure from Avicenna rather than from Aristotle. In the fourteenth century another transformation took place and the lengthy summaries found in the earlier traditions became very rare. Instead of writing commentaries on the works of Aristotle, Arabic logicians were content with writing glosses. Their interest also shifted from formal logic (syllogisms) to semantic concerns.

Arabic logic began to fragment in the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries and several centers developed. El-Rouyaheb identifies distinct Ottoman Turkish, Iranian, Indo-Muslim, North African, and Christian Arabic traditions. These developed independently of one other, and, according to El-Rouyaheb, it is the Ottoman Turkish tradition that is the most important up to the twentieth century. The basic themes outlined by Avicenna remained dominant in this tradition, however.

4. Peter Abelard

Peter Abelard (1079–1142) was one of the first original medieval logicians in the Latin West. His most thorough treatment of the theory of the syllogism can be found in the Dialectica, though he occasionally discusses it in other works as well, such as the Logica ingredientibus (Minio-Paluello 1958). It is only in the Dialectica, however, that the theory is outlined in full.

Since the logic of the Dialectica is based on Boethius’ commentaries and monographs, we find in it a treatise on categorical sentences and categorical syllogisms (Tractatus II), and another on hypothetical sentences and hypothetical syllogisms (Tractatus IV). But neither of these discussions is very extensive. Taken together, they are shorter than the discussion of topical inferences, which indicates that Abelard was most interested in developing a logic for sentences (Green-Pedersen 1984 and Martin 1987). His presentation of syllogistic is condensed but highly original. It reveals that he was not able to study the text of Aristotle’s Prior Analytics in any detail. He must have seen it, but he cannot have had access to a copy himself.

Abelard gives the four standard figures and shows how the second, third, and fourth (he treats the fourth figure as part of the first figure with the terms in the conclusion converted) can be reduced to the first in the standard ways using conversion rules and proofs through impossibility, but to clarify and simply the theory he also presents rules showing the validity of the different moods. In the first figure he gives these rules (I have included the terms A, B, C to clarify the rules, though they are not in Abelard’s text):

If something A is predicated of something else B universally and a third thing C places the subject B under it universally, then the same thing C also places the predicate A under it with the same mode, namely universally.
If something A is removed from something else B universally and a third thing C places the subject B under it universally, then the first predicate A is removed from the second subject C universally.
If something A is predicated of something else B universally and some third thing C places the subject B under it particularly, then that thing C also places the predicate A under it particularly.
If something A is removed from something else B and a third thing C places the subject B under it particularly, then the first predicate A is removed from the second subject C particularly.

To these he adds two more rules for the second figure:

If something B is removed from some other thing A and a third thing C places that predicate B under it, then the first subject A is removed from the second subject C universally.
If something B is predicated of some other thing A universally and that predicate is removed from a third thing C universally, then the [first] subject is removed from the same [subject] C universally.

There are three more rules for the third figure:

If two different things A and C are predicated of the same B universally, then the first A predicated of the second comes together particularly.
If something B is removed from something A universally and something third C is predicated of the same subject B universally, then the first predicate A is removed from the second C particularly.
If something A is predicated of something B particularly and the same B with another predicate C supposits universally, then the first A is predicated of the second C particularly.

If we allow that the conjuncts in the antecedent of these conditional statements can switch places, and that a universal implies a particular, these rules exhaust the 24 valid syllogisms.

Abelard’s rules 1 and 2 are equivalent to the rules of class inclusion that later became the subject of much discussion, i.e., the so-called dici de omni et nullo rules. These rules are based on the transitivity of class inclusion and were the standard way in which later medieval logicians explained how the first figure moods are perfect or evident.

It was elegant of Abelard to lay out these rules that entail the valid moods, but then again, the theory of the syllogism is an elegant and simple system. The simplicity of his nine rules reflects the simplicity of Aristotelian syllogistic, since on Aristotle’s view only the first two syllogisms and the rules of conversion plus the method of proof by impossibility and a couple of other consequences are needed to demonstrate all 24 valid moods.

Abelard’s hypothetical syllogistic does not repeat Boethius’ mistake of mixing a term logic like the theory of the syllogism with a sentential logic. Rather, Abelard’s work should be seen as a very sophisticated development of a sentential logic. I will therefore not treat it in this overview, since it belongs to the history of sentential logic rather than syllogistic. It seems that the medievals also rather quickly stopped associating the word ‘syllogism’ with this theory.

Abelard is also associated with the history of modal logic. He is famous as the philosopher who introduced the distinction between de dicto and de re modal sentences. The basic notions of Abelard’s modal theory are to be found in the introduction to Chapters XII and XIII of his longer commentary on Aristotle’s De interpretatione (ed. Minio-Paluello 1958). Abelard concentrates his analysis on the logical structure of modal sentences, introducing some new distinctions and concepts that were later commonly used by medieval logicians.

According to Abelard, modal terms are strictly speaking adverbs expressing how something said of the subject is actualized, e.g., ‘well’ or ‘quickly’ or ‘necessarily’. Adverbs that do not modify an actual inherence, e.g., ‘possibly’, are called secondary modal terms due to their position in a sentence. Abelard also noticed that in De interpretatione 12–13, Aristotle operates with nominal rather than adverbial modes, e.g. ‘it is necessary that’ or ‘it is possible that’. He seems to have assumed that Aristotle did this because the nominal modes lead to many more problems than simple adverbial modes. This is more clearly seen from the fact that sentences including nominal modes, such as ‘Necesse est Socratem currere’, can be understood either adverbially, ‘Socrates runs necessarily’, or, as suggested by the grammar, ‘That Socrates runs is necessary’. He calls these two alternatives de re necessity sentences and de sensu (or de dicto) necessity sentences, respectively. Abelard seems to be the first to employ this terminology. A de re modal sentence expresses the mode through which the predicate belongs to the subject. The mode is, therefore, associated with a thing, whereas the mode in the de dicto case (as he also calls it) is said of what is expressed by a non-modal sentence.

Abelard also referred to this distinction as the distinction between personal and impersonal readings of a modal sentence, the de re sense corresponding to the personal reading and the de dicto sense to the impersonal reading because when the expression ‘necesse est’ or ‘possibile est’ is used at the beginning of a sentence, it lacks a personal subject. Abelard states that this distinction is related to Aristotle’s distinction between per divisionem and per compositionem in the Sophistici Elenchi (4, 166a23–31). What is new is Abelard’s contention that modal discussions should proceed by distinguishing the different possible readings of modal sentences, moving on to consider their quantity, quality, and conversion as well as their equipollence and any other relations holding between them on these different readings. Abelard’s program thus became the standard operating procedure in medieval treatises on logic.

After Abelard, equipollence and other relations between modal sentences were commonly presented with the help of the square of opposition, which Abelard mentions though it does not appear as such in his works. The square can be taken to refer to de dicto modal sentences or to singular de re modal sentences. Although the distinction between de dicto and de re modal sentences was common in logical treatises on the properties of the terms, syncategorematic terms, and the solution of sophisms, twelfth- and thirteenth-century logicians were mainly interested in the logical properties of singular de re modal sentences. There is no detailed theory of quantified de re modal sentences from this period, and the first movements in this direction by Abelard and his followers were rather confused. A satisfactory theory of de re modal sentences did not appear until the fourteenth century, when the various relations between such sentences was presented by John Buridan in his octagon of opposition.

Medieval logicians generally assumed that Aristotle dealt with de dicto modal sentences in the De Interpretatione and de re modal sentences in the Prior Analytics. In early commentaries on the Prior Analytics, there is usually no mention of Abelard’s distinction between them. One reason may be that the only theory available concentrated on singular de re modal sentences, which are not part of modal syllogistic as developed by Aristotle.

While the de dicto/de re terminology was used, it was not all that common. Medieval logicians preferred to use what they took to be Aristotle’s terminology, talking about modal sentences in the composite sense (in sensu composito) and divided sense (in sensu diviso). The structure of a composite modal sentence can be represented as follows:

(quantity/subject/copula, [quality]/predicate)mode

A composite modal sentence corresponds to a de dicto modal sentence. The word ‘composite’ is used because the mode is said to qualify the composition of the subject and the predicate. The structure of a divided modal sentence can be represented as follows:

quantity/subject/copula, mode, [quality]/predicate

Here, the mode is thought to qualify the copula and thus to divide the sentence into two parts (hence the name, ‘divided modal sentence’). This type of modal sentence was characterized as de re because what is modified is how things (res) are related to each other, rather than the truth of what is said by the sentence (dictum) (see Lagerlund 2000: 35–39, and the entry on medieval theories of modality for further details).

Like virtually all medievals, Abelard thought that Aristotle’s modal syllogistic was a theory for de re modal sentences. He says very little about it in his logical works, however. In less than five pages in the Dialectica (245–249) he treats modal, oblique, and temporal syllogistic logic. Earlier in the same work, he says a little about conversion rules. He argues in both the Dialectica (195–196) and the Logica (15–16) that the conversion rules can be defended even on a de re reading, but the conversions he discusses are not modal conversions since the mode must be attached to the predicate and follow the term in the conversion, making the conversion into the conversion of an assertoric sentence. The conversions of de re modal sentences, as Abelard has defined them, do not hold, as Paul Thom has convincingly shown. (Thom 2003: 57–58.)

There is no modal syllogistic explicitly outlined in any of Abelard’s logical works, though in the Dialectica, he exemplifies some of the valid mixed moods: M–M in the first figure, MM– in the second, and M–M in the third (M represents a possibility sentence and ‘–’ an assertoric). He also shows that uniform modal syllogisms are not generally valid, so that MMM is not valid unless the middle term in the major premise is read with the mode attached to it, as in:

Everything which is possibly B is possibly A
Every C is possibly B
Every C is possibly A

A consequence of this, of course, is that the middle term in the minor premise is ‘possibly B’ and hence no longer a modal sentence. MMM is consequently reduced to M–M.

Anything more systematic than this has to be drawn out from Abelard’s definition of modal sentences and their semantic interpretation. Thom has done this in his book (Thom 2003), where he claims that there is a very specific system developed that is not at all similar to Aristotle’s modal system. Abelard was therefore not attempting an interpretation of Aristotle, but must be seen as developing a new system based on his reading of de re sentences. But this project must overcome several problems, particularly since Abelard cannot use the conversion rule.

5. The Early Commentators on the Prior Analytics

The first known commentary on the Prior Analytics in the Latin West is an anonymous work that has recently been edited (Thomsen Thörnqvist 2015) but is not yet fully studied (see Thomsen Thörnqvist 2010 and 2013 for more details). The author has been called Anonymous Aurelianensis III by Sten Ebbesen, who studied parts of the work (Ebbesen 1981). He dates it to c. 1160–80. The theory of the assertoric syllogism was repeated and summarized in almost all logic works from this time, but there are no other major Latin commentaries that we know of until the 1240’s when Robert Kilwardby (d. 1279) wrote his Literal Commentary on the Books of the Prior Analytics (In libros Priorum Analyticorum expositio).

By the time Kilwardby wrote his commentary, however, a Latin translation of a commentary by Averroes on the Prior Analytics was becoming known in the West. Averroes wrote three kinds of commentaries on Aristotle’s works, called ‘minor’, ‘middle’, and ‘major’ or ‘great’ based on their length and detail. In the 1220s and 1230s, William of Luna translated Averroes’ middle commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge as well as his middle commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories, On Interpretation, and Prior Analytics. In addition to these, a major commentary on the Posterior Analytics also became available. In the middle commentaries, Averroes does not go much beyond Aristotle, adhering closely to the letter of Aristotle’s text and deviating only on occasion. Nevertheless, his commentaries played an indispensable role throughout the later Middle Ages in the teaching and study of these difficult texts.

One thing Averroes does do in these commentaries, however, is to build a strong connection between logic and a realist metaphysics, which had a clear influence on thirteenth-century logicians in the Latin West (Lagerlund 2000, 2008). In particular, Averroes’s treatment of modal syllogistics is profoundly metaphysical. In his commentary on the Prior Analytics, he pursues a line of interpretation which is more developed in the Quaesitum, a short treatise on mixed syllogisms (see Uckelman and Lagerlund 2016). In the Quaesitum, Averroes focuses on modal syllogistics and develops an interpretation based on the metaphysical nature of the terms involved in different syllogisms. It has been claimed that this short work is the final result of his inquiries into modal syllogistics (Elamrani-Jamal 1995, p.74). The Quaesitum has been studied by scholars in detail insofar as it clearly influenced Robert Kilwardby (c. 1215–79) (Lagerlund 2000, 32–35; Thom 2003, 81–91; Lagerlund 2008, 300–302). Although Kilwardby added nothing of substance to the theory of the assertoric syllogism, his interpretation of modal syllogistic is quite remarkable. It was also very influential in the thirteenth and early fourteenth centuries. Albert the Great, Simon of Faversham, and Radulphus Brito — in other words, all of the major thirteenth-century commentators on the Prior Analytics — followed Kilwardby in their interpretations.

Throughout the commentary, Kilwardby assumes that Aristotle’s theory is correct and makes it his project to find the interpretation that shows this. He begins by considering a counterexample to the accidental conversion of necessity sentences:

Every literate being is necessarily a human being.

According to the conversion rules accepted by Kilwardby, (5:1) should convert to:

Some human being is necessarily literate.

But (5:1) is obviously true whereas (5:2) is false.

As we have seen, this is a common issue for de re readings of the modal sentences. Kilwardby assumes that Aristotle’s modal syllogistic is a logic for divided (de re) sentences. He proceeds to give two separate solutions to this puzzle. The first is based on a distinction between different readings of (5:1). Kilwardby explains that the subject term of a sentence can stand for the subject of the inherence (the suppositum), or for the qualification through which the subject is specified (qualitas/forma). If the term ‘white’ stands for its suppositum, it refers to a thing that is white or to ‘that which is white’, but if it stands for the quality or form, it refers to the whiteness inhering in that which is white, rather than to the thing in which it inheres. Kilwardby says that in (5:1), ‘literate being’ stands for its suppositum, which explains why (5:1) is true, whereas in (5:2) the term is taken differently as standing for the quality or form. According to Kilwardby, the meaning of the original subject term is changed when it no longer stands for the suppositum (literate being), but for the abstract quality of being literate, and it is this change that blocks the conversion. (5:2) is true if it is read as:

Something that is a human being is necessarily that which is literate.

Kilwardby, however, preferred another solution to these difficulties for the conversion rules of necessity sentences. The second solution is based on a distinction between sentences that are necessary per se and those that are necessary per accidens. He writes (I, fol. 7rb):

When it is said: ‘Every literate being is necessarily a human being’, the subject is not something that can be said per se of the predicate, but since ‘literate being’ is not separated from what belongs to a human being in itself, the sentence is conceded as necessary, though when a sentence is necessary in this way it is necessary per accidens. Therefore, when Aristotle says that necessity sentences are convertible, he means only sentences necessary per se are convertible.

The idea is here that since ‘human being’ is not predicated per se of its subject ‘literate being’, the sentence (5:1) is not a per se necessity sentence and therefore not convertible. (5:1) is a necessity sentence, though of the per accidens type, since it is necessarily true only in the sense that being human and being literate are not separable. Kilwardby implies that the relation between the subject and predicate terms must be of a special kind if a sentence is to be called necessary per se. In (5:1), ‘literate being’ and ‘human being’ do not have the close per se relation Kilwardby demands of a convertible sentence.

Kilwardby thinks that sentences per se should be understood following An. Post. I.4–6, where Aristotle discusses four different notions of per se (kath’ hauto) predication, though Kilwardby seems only to have the first two in mind when discussing per se necessity. Aristotle says that the first type of per se predication (per se primo modo) occurs when the definition of the subject includes the predicate. The second type of per se predication (per se secundo modo) occurs when the definition of the predicate includes the subject. The best characterization of the first type is the genus/species relation, where the definition of a species includes its genus. The second type is often characterized by a proprium (property), since a proprium is included in the definition of a subject, as in ‘a human being is able to laugh’, where the term ‘human being’ is included in the definition of the predicate ‘able to laugh’. A sentence is per se necessary if it involves either of these two predications, according to Kilwardby. Necessity per accidens belongs to all other necessity sentences, which lack this intrinsic relation between subject and predicate.

Kilwardby also stresses that in a per se necessity sentence, the subject must be ‘something belonging in itself to that predicate’ (‘per se aliquod ipsius predicati’), by which he seems to mean that the subject has the predicate as an essential property, i.e., such that it has the predicate as a necessary property through itself and not through something else. A syllogistic necessity sentence is then understood as a proposition expressing the essential properties of a thing in a genus/species relationship. He seems to assume that in a per se necessity sentence, the subject term is not an accidental term but an essential or necessary term, and that the subject is essentially (per se) linked to the predicate rather than merely through the weaker relation of inseparability. Consequently, if the subject term is necessary and the link is necessary, it follows that the predicate term cannot be merely a contingent (accidental) term. It must be necessary as well. The Aristotelian theory of necessity syllogistic is thus limited to a special class of terms, all of which stand for substances. The same terminology is also used to explain syllogistic for contingency sentences, which suggests that Kilwardby was trying to develop a uniform and highly original interpretation of the theory. A number of recent scholars have offered similar interpretations of Aristotle (see van Rijen 1989, Patterson 1995, Thom 1996, and Nortmann 1996).

When they interpreted Aristotle’s modal syllogistic, most medievals saw the need to introduce a distinction between different kinds of assertoric sentences. In the mixed syllogism L–L (L represents a necessity sentence), the assertoric minor premise cannot be any kind of assertoric sentence because then the terms could merely be accidentally connected. Kilwardby therefore introduced a distinction between absolutely (simpliciter) and as-of-now (ut nunc) assertoric sentences. The origins of this distinction can be found in Aristotle (An. Pr. I.15, 34b7–18), but Kilwardby of course uses his own per se/per accidens terminology to spell out the difference. An absolutely assertoric sentence involves a per se predication whereas an as-of-now assertoric sentence involves a per accidens predication. In this way, he can guarantee that an essential connection between the terms in a valid L–L syllogisms is preserved through to the conclusion. This is not unproblematic (see Lagerlund 2000, 39–42), though the distinction between different assertoric sentences needed somehow to be made and remained a problem throughout the later Middle Ages.

In the end, Kilwardby did not arrive at just the moods accepted by Aristotle. For example, he accepts –LL for the first figure, which is not accepted by Aristotle, and does not manage to get –CC and LCC for Disamis in the third figure. There are also some other moods he does not succeed in validating and others still he grants but which are not accepted by Aristotle. But perhaps Kilwardby gets as close as one can possibly get to making Aristotle’s system consistent. (See Knuuttila 1996, Lagerlund 2000, and Thom 2003 and 2007.)

6. Richard of Campsall

An important figure in the history of syllogistic logic is Richard of Campsall (c. 1280/90–1350/60). Sometime before 1308 he wrote his Questions on the Books of the Prior Analytics (Questiones super librum Priorum Analeticorum), a commentary on the first book of the Prior Analytics that devotes 14 of its 20 questions to modal syllogistic. He seems to think that there is nothing to add to the theory of assertoric syllogistic and his presentation of it is fairly standard, but he has lots of interesting things to say about modal syllogistic.

The main development of modal syllogistic in Campsall’s work is his systematic application of the distinction between composite (de dicto) and divided (de re) modal sentences. Campsall seems to have held that the system of modal syllogisms presented in the Prior Analytics was intended for divided modal sentences, and so he tries to prove that what Aristotle said is basically correct when modal sentences are understood in this way. But this turns out to be a very cumbersome task. It is no surprise that he does not quite succeed, as he occasionally admits.

In his reply to one of the questions in his commentary, he makes a brief remark about the difference between composite and divided modal sentences. With regard to universal negative necessity sentences he writes: “[Such a sentence] in the composite sense is singular and signifies that the inherence which it modifies is necessary; in the divided sense it is universal and does not signify that the inherence that is modified is necessary, but solely that whatever is contained under the predicate necessarily is removed from whatever is contained under the subject” (5.38: 110). The universal negative modal sentence is singular when it is taken in the composite sense, that is, when it is read so that the modality is predicated of what a non-modal proposition expresses (dictum) or, as Campsall says, when it is predicated of the inherence. He goes on to explain that a necessity sentence in the composite sense signifies that the corresponding non-modal sentence is necessarily true. ‘That every B is not A is necessary’ is thus not universal but singular. When the universal negative necessity proposition is taken in the divided sense, it is universal. The modality does not qualify the dictum as a whole, but only the mode of removal of whatever is under the predicate term from whatever is under the subject term.

Both the conversion rules and the syllogisms for modal sentences in the composite sense are validated by a small number of consequences, such as:

If the antecedent is necessary, then the consequent is necessary.

The corresponding non-modal sentence is here assumed to be valid. Similar consequences can be formed for possibility and contingency sentences. These exhaust the theory of syllogism for composite modal sentences and Campsall accordingly spends little time elaborating it.

It is natural to assume, as Campsall does, that Aristotle meant his theory of modal syllogisms to cover divided modal sentences, since the reading of composite sentences Campsall proposes entails that they are all singular and that Aristotle’s theory is not a theory for singular sentences. Therefore, he must show how the conversion rules can be made to hold on such a reading of modal sentences.

In his attempt to give Aristotelian modal syllogistic a consistent interpretation, Campsall is forced to adopt a very artificial reading of divided modal sentences. He is clearly influenced by the suppositum approach suggested by Kilwardby, but he thinks that both subject and predicate terms should be taken in this way. Furthermore, he states that the terms in divided modal sentences should be taken as standing for that which is now under them. He believes that with these conditions, the conversion rules and almost all of the moods accepted by Aristotle can be shown to be valid.

Campsall also thinks that on such a reading, the following holds:

C can be one of those that are now under B; therefore, it is one of those that are now under B.

Campsall takes the terms to signify how things actually are now. If the terms in the sentence ‘A can be B’ are taken to stand for the things that are at this very moment under them, then ‘A can be B’ means the same as ‘A is B’. According to Campsall, ‘Socrates can be white’ should read in the divided sense ‘That which is Socrates can now be one of those that are now white’. If that which is Socrates can be one of those that are white now, it is one of them; otherwise, Socrates could not have been that particular white being in the first place. Campsall thinks that Socrates can be this white being (B1) or that white being (B2) or …, that is, (B1, B2, …, Bn), and if Socrates is not actually B1 now, he is B2 now, etc., but Socrates will be one of B1 to Bn now. This is Campsall’s reason for stating (6:2).

This is not as crazy as it might first seem. Consider the following schema in quantified modal logic:

\(\forall x (Bx \amp \Diamond(c = x) \supset Bc)\).

If (6:3) is an accurate interpretation of (6:2), then it seems true since \((\Diamond(t = t') \supset(t = t'))\) is true for identity statements in Kripke’s S5 if \(t\) and \(t'\) are rigid designators.

Given his interpretation of divided modal sentences and consequences like (6:2), Campsall manages to prove the conversion rules. Like Kilwardby, he approximates Aristotle’s original system but in the end does not preserve all of its features. The most interesting features of Campsall’s work, however, are not the result of his efforts to prove Aristotle right, but of his apparently successful solutions. His concept of contingency allows for simultaneous alternatives, such that if something exists, it is possible for it not to exist at that very same moment. Campsall thus abandons the fundamental Aristotelian principle of the necessity of the present (see Knuuttila 1993 and the entry on medieval theories of modality for discussion of criticisms of this principle in the late thirteenth century). But Campsall’s analysis is complicated by the fact that, as we have seen, he also accepts the principle that what can exist now does exist now, and that what does not exist now is necessarily non-existent now. In other words, he denies the necessity of the present for affirmative sentences and accepts it for negative ones. There is thus an asymmetry between affirmative and negative modal sentences in Campsall’s system.

Accepting simultaneous alternatives and denying the necessity of the present are typical of modal semantics and modal logic after Campsall, especially in the work of figures such as William of Ockham and John Buridan. It is historically interesting that Campsall employs these principles in his work, even though they are embedded in a theory whose elements point in another direction, towards Kilwardby. Campsall’s problematization of the necessity of the present also indicates that he wants to separate logic from ontology. In many respects, he paves the way for the next generation of logicians. His complicated interpretation also shows that no matter how hard one might try, there is no way to give a consistent interpretation of what Aristotle says in the Prior Analytics (for discussion, see Lagerlund 2000, Thom 2003 and Knuuttila 2008).

7. William of Ockham

Around the time William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347) wrote his Compendium of Logic (Summa logicae), medieval logic began to change. More emphasis was placed on the theory of consequences than the theory of syllogisms. A theory of consequences was developed by Abelard in the course of his discussion of topical inferences and hypothetical syllogisms, and during the thirteenth century the basic idea was further developed in treatments of the topics, but in the fourteenth century works devoted solely to consequences began to appear (Green-Pedersen 1984). The most famous is John Buridan’s Treatise on Consequences (Tractatus de consequentiis), though earlier authors such as Walter Burley had also stressed consequences over syllogisms. Burley probably wrote his On the Purity of the Art of Logic (De puritate arte logicae) as a reply to Ockham’s famous Summa. For Ockham, however, syllogisms are still the most important formal inferences, and he devotes most of Book III of the Summa to them (see Normore 1999 for a recent study of Ockham’s logic).

Like Campsall, Ockham has nothing to add to the theory of assertoric syllogisms, which was by then well understood. Let us, however, have a look at the proof method using the expository syllogism that medieval logicians such as Ockham seem to have preferred over Aristotle’s cumbersome method of ekthesis. Ockham uses this method frequently, though not as frequently as Buridan later did.

The method is used to prove the third figure moods. Expository syllogisms are perfect for this because the middle term is the subject of both premises in that figure. Darapti, for example, runs as follows:

Every B is A
Every B is C
Some C is A

Proofs by expository syllogism are practically self-evident. To prove Darapti, one has only to take a particular instantiation of the two premises to get:

b is A
b is C
One C is A

The resulting syllogism is an expository syllogism since it has singular terms as subject terms, and so Darapti is proved. This method is reminiscent of ekthesis since it involves particular instantiation, though it is not the same method.

As we have seen, the theory of modal syllogisms was explored in order to try to save Aristotle’s theory, and this was still the motive of most logicians in the first half of the fourteenth century. But Ockham himself seems no longer to be interested in this project. His aim instead seems purely systematic, and in his desire to extend his basic methods he manages to bring the theory into a whole new light.

The most fundamental distinction in modal syllogistic is of course that between composite and divided modal sentences, but divided modal sentences are also equivocal according to Ockham. Using ideas developed in the theory of supposition, he distinguishes between divided modal sentences with an ampliated subject term and those with a non-ampliated subject term. Let us look at how Ockham draws the more fundamental distinction.

Ockham proceeds by dividing modal sentences into sentences with a dictum (cum dicto) and those without a dictum (sine dicto), dividing modal sentences with a dictum into composite and divided senses. He adds that a modal sentence cum dicto taken in the divided sense is always equivalent to a modal sentence sine dicto. Ockham expresses the dictum in Latin by an accusative and infinitive construction. Thus, in the sentence ‘That every human being is an animal is necessary’ (in Latin ‘Omnem hominem esse animal est necessarium’), ‘That every human being is an animal’ (’Omnem hominem esse animal’) is the dictum of the sentence, which has the mode ‘necessity’ predicated of it. He treats the dictum as the subject term of the modal sentence, and the mode as the predicate term. It is important to distinguish between the dictum and an assertoric sentence. The dictum is what is asserted in an assertoric sentence. Thus, when the dictum is said to be necessary or possible and there is a sentence asserting it, such a sentence is necessarily or possibly true (Summa logicae II, 9).

As noted by Campsall, the fact that both the dictum and the mode are treated as terms has an important consequence for composite modal sentences. ‘That every B is A is necessary’ is, according to the reading suggested, not a universal affirmative but a singular affirmative sentence. Ockham adds that one can also call such sentences universal or particular, depending on whether the original sentence — that is, the sentence referred to by the dictum — is universal or particular.

The syllogistic for composite modal sentences is equally straightforward and reduces to a few valid consequences. He explicitly mentions the following six (Summa logicae III-1):

If the premises of a valid argument are necessary, so is the conclusion
If the premises of a valid argument are possible and compossible, then the conclusion is possible
If the premises of a valid argument are contingent and compossible, then the conclusion is contingent
A necessity sentence, whether in the composite or divided sense, always entails the corresponding assertoric sentence
An assertoric sentence entails the corresponding possibility sentence

(7:4) and (7:5) are used by Ockham to get:

A necessity sentence entails the corresponding possibility sentence

It is consequences such as these that give Ockham a syllogistic for composite modal sentences. He simply takes the standard assertoric syllogistic and applies these rules to them. Ockham’s syllogistic for divided modal sentences, however, is much less straightforward.

In Book III-1, Ockham expresses the equivocal nature of divided modal sentences as follows:

But if the possibility proposition is taken in the divided sense or if one takes a proposition equivalent to it — such as the propositions, ‘Every human being can be white’, ‘A white being can be black’ and the like — then this proposition must be distinguished by virtue of the third mode of equivocation, in the way that a subject can supposit for those that are or for those that can be, that is, in the way that a subject can supposit for that about which a thing is verified with a word about the present or for that about which a thing is verified with a word about the possible; or else it denotes what it can supposit for, which I say to exclude quibbling. If this is said about ‘Every white being can be a human being’, then one sense is, ‘Everything that is white can be a human being’, and in this sense it is true as long as nothing is white except a human being. Another sense is, ‘Everything that can be white can be a human being’, and this is false, provided either only a human being is white or something other than a human being [is white].

Here he clearly states that a possibility sentence has two readings, namely:

(Quantity) what is B can be (quality) A
(Quantity) what can be B can be (quality) A

(7:8) has generated some scholarly debate as to what Ockham really meant by this reading of divided possibility sentences. Does he mean by (7:8) that the subject term is ampliated to stand for possible beings as well as for actual beings? Can a strict nominalist such as Ockham really accept quantification over possible beings? (For the details, see Karger 1980, Freddoso 1980, McGrade 1985, Knuuttila 1993: 139–49, and Lagerlund 2000: 107–112.)

Ockham also thinks that contingency sentences are equivocal in the same sense as possibility sentences, but not necessity sentences. The only reading he accepts for these sentences is:

(Quantity) what is B is necessarily (quality) A.

(7:10) implies that only actually existing things have necessary properties. It is unclear why he thinks this (see Lagerlund 2000: 112–114), but it gives his syllogistic an unattractive feature that has awkward consequences. For example, no conversion rules for divided necessity sentences are valid and there are also no valid moods in the second figure.

Ockham also discusses syllogisms with mixed composite and divided modal premises. He mentions some very interesting consequences in the course of this discussion.

That every B is A is possible \(\supset\) Some B is possibly A
That some B is A is possible \(\supset\) Some B is possibly A
That this is A is possible \(\equiv\) This is possibly A
That this is A is contingent \(\equiv\) This is contingently A
That this is A is necessary \(\equiv\) This is necessarily A

In (7:11) and (7:12), the subject terms of divided modal sentences must be ampliated for the consequences to hold. It is interesting to note that for categorical sentences with singular subject terms, the distinction between composite and divided senses collapses. His example is ‘That Socrates is white is possible’ implies ‘Socrates is possibly white’. With the help of these consequences he can prove some additional moods to be valid in the different figures. (See Lagerlund 2000: 124–29, and for a systematic reconstruction see Klima 2008.)

8. John Buridan

John Buridan (c. 1300–1361) was the foremost logician of the later Middle Ages and in his hands the theory of the syllogism was reworked and developed well beyond anything seen before in the history of logic. His two most important logical works are the Treatise on Consequence and the Summulae de Dialectica. The presentation here is primarily based on the Treatise (for further discussion, see Lagerlund 2000, Chapter 5, and Zupko 2003, Chapters 5–6).

In the Treatise, Buridan bases his discussion of the syllogism on a philosophical semantics that views syllogistic inference as a special case of the much more comprehensive theory of consequences. Like his immediate predecessors, he was for the most part uninterested in assertoric syllogisms and moves on quickly to temporal, oblique, variation, and modal syllogisms, though this does not prevent him from making some original contributions to the theory of the assertoric syllogism.

According to Buridan, a syllogism is a formal consequence, and so syllogistic becomes a branch of the theory of formal consequence. As consequences, syllogisms are distinguished by their conjunctive antecedent and single-sentence consequent, and furthermore by their three terms — though this last condition is not necessary since Buridan also treats of syllogisms with more than three terms.

Buridan treats of the three famous figures and notes that a conclusion can be either direct or indirect. In an indirect conclusion, the minor term is predicated of the major instead of the other way around. Since the premises are part of a conjunction and together form the antecedent of a consequent, they can easily switch places, which means that Buridan can define the fourth figure as a first figure with transposed premises and an indirect conclusion. Hence, he does not need to discuss it independently of the first figure.

For Buridan, a formal consequence holds by the principle of uniform substitution. It is valid for any uniform substitution of its categorematic terms. A syllogism is a special kind of formal consequence since it requires for its validity that terms be conjoined across sentences. How the principle of uniform substitution is supposed to work here is a bit tricky and forces him to bring into play his general semantics as well as the notion of distribution. To spell out the relation of their terms and hence the validity of the first figure syllogisms, he reformulates the traditional dici de omni et nullo rules (see King 1985: 71):

Any two terms, which are called the same as a third by reason of the same thing for which that third term supposits, not collectively, are correctly called the same as each other.
Any two terms, of which one is called the same as some third term of which the other is called not the same by reason of the same thing for which that third term supposits, are correctly called not the same as each other.

One could say a great deal about these rules, but the term that does most of the heavy lifting is ‘supposits’. Supposition is a theory of reference and it is the coreferentiality of terms in the different sentences in a syllogism that is the decisive factor in determining whether the principle of uniform substitution is satisfied or not. It is at this point that he introduces the theory of distribution.

The rules governing the distribution of terms in a sentence are given as part of his account of common personal supposition. A term is distributed in a sentence if it is taken to refer to everything it signifies, such as if the term is in the scope of a universal quantifier. To indicate when a term is distributed he gives five rules, according to which universals distribute subjects, negatives distribute predicates, and no other terms are distributed. If we stay within the square of opposition (Buridan’s theory of distribution, and hence his syllogistic, has wide application, extending far beyond the traditional A, E, I, and O sentences), this implies that universal affirmative sentences have their subject terms distributed, universal negatives have both terms distributed, particular affirmatives have neither term distributed, and particular negatives have only their predicate terms distributed. (For an influential criticism of this theory of distribution see Geach 1962, and King 1985 for a reply.)

With his theory of distribution in place, Buridan turns to the syllogisms, and we see now that in order for a combination of premises to be acceptable, the middle terms must be distributed — otherwise we will not have a formally acceptable consequence. Buridan approaches the problem in combinatorial fashion. Given the four sentences and two possible positions for each we get 16 possible combinations. Some of these can be ruled out immediately based on the rules for distribution. A combination with only negative premises will not work at all; hence EE, EO, OE, and OO must be rejected. II has both middle terms undistributed and can thus be rejected. In the first figure, IA, OA, and OI have an undistributed middle. The other eight are accepted. In the second figure, we see that AA, AI, and IA must be rejected because of an undistributed middle. The other eight are accepted. In the third figure, IO and OI have an undistributed middle but the remaining nine combinations are accepted.

At first glance, there are some surprises in Buridan’s presentation of assertoric syllogistic. In the second figure he accepts indirect conclusions for IEO (Tifesno) and OAO (Robaco), and in the third figure indirect conclusions for AOO (Carbodo), AEO (Lapfeton), and IEO (Rifeson). He also accepts syllogisms concluding to what he calls an “uncommon idiom for negatives,” that is, when the predicate term precedes the negation, as in ‘Some B A is not’ (Quaedam B A est non). Such sentences make no sense in English, but Buridan treats them as equivalent to sentences where the predicate term quantified, as in ‘Some B is not some A’. He writes the sentences in this way because otherwise they would violate his rules for distribution and scope. Syllogisms concluding to an “uncommon idiom for negatives” add another three valid forms in the first figure and two in the second. If we tally this up and include all of the indirect conclusions, we get 33 valid moods, as opposed to 19 in Aristotelian syllogistic. If we then add the supplementary subalternate conclusions, we get 24 valid moods in traditional syllogistic but 38 in Buridan’s systematization.

Buridan is quite right to accept these additional 14 moods. They are valid. But his result is not as dramatic as it seems since the middle terms are either in the subject or predicate position. In the second and third figure an indirect conclusion becomes equivalent to transposing the premises. Hence Buridan’s Tifesno, Robaco, Carbodo, Lapfeton, and Rifeson reduce to Festino, Baroco, Bocardo, Felapton, and Ferison, respectively. This is also obvious if we look at the names of these syllogisms, which suggest that Buridan has only reshuffled the letters of the names of the standard Aristotelian syllogisms. After having done all this over just a few pages — as mentioned above, Buridan is rather uninterested in assertoric syllogistic — he turns to the temporal, oblique, and modal syllogistic. Of these, it is modal syllogistic to which he devotes the most time.

A temporal syllogism consists of sentences whose copulas involve temporal ampliation. In such sentences, the supposition of the subject term is extended to include past and future things as well as present things. The syllogistic for sentences involving oblique terms is important for Buridan’s general theory of consequence, since this is where we find rules governing the behavior of oblique terms in distributive contexts. His investigation is extraordinarily detailed and extremely rigorous, qualities all the more impressive when we consider that he did not have the representational tools of modern symbolic logic.

The syllogistic for composite modal sentences is straightforward and Buridan uses only a couple of pages in the Treatise to sketch its basic structure. The theory of the syllogism for divided modal sentences is given a much more thorough treatment. For Buridan, a modal copula always ampliates its subject term to stand not only for present, past, and future things but also possible things, unless the supposition of the subject term is explicitly restricted to what is actual. On this basis, he can give an exhaustive account of the logical relations between quantified divided modal sentences, which he presents in the octagon of opposition. Slightly simplified, and assuming that the complete octagon can be formed by some trivial equivalences holding between the modalities, it can be depicted as in Figure 1:

Figure 1

Figure 1

Together with the octagon he also uses some consequences to prove the valid syllogisms. He first states the valid conversion rules:

Every B is possibly A \(\supset\) Some A is possibly B
Some B is possibly A \(\equiv\) Some A is possibly B
Every B is necessarily not A \(\equiv\) Every A is necessarily not B
(Quantity) B is contingently A \(\equiv\) (Quantity) B is contingently not A

All these are valid assuming their subject terms are ampliated. He also employs the following consequences:

Every B is necessarily not A \(\supset\) Every B is not A
(Quantity) which is B is necessarily A \(\supset\) (Quantity) B is A
(Quantity) B is A \(\supset\) Some B is possibly A
(Quantity) B is necessarily (quality) A \(\supset\) (Quantity) B is possibly (quality) A
(Quantity) B is contingently (quality) A \(\supset\) (Quantity) B is possibly (quality) A

By stating these consequences and the octagon of opposition, Buridan has presented a virtually exhaustive syntactical account of modal logic, and, together with his semantics of supposition and distribution, constructed a powerful logic unmatched by anything presented in the history of logic before him.

Buridan uses four methods to prove the valid syllogistic moods. All first figure moods are proved by the rules of class inclusion, that is, the dici de omni and dici de nullo rules. The second and third figure moods are proved using three different methods: either by conversion — that is, by (8:3), (8:4), (8:5) or (8:6) — by reductio ad impossibile, or by expository syllogism. Proof by impossibility is used on a few occasions, but Buridan’s approach here differs in no way from Aristotle’s. This fourth way is frequently used to prove the valid third figure moods. Since the number of possible combinations of premises and conclusions in modal syllogistic is quite extensive, he limits himself to discussing those moods whose assertoric counterparts are valid, but even so he manages to discuss a large number of valid and invalid syllogisms (see Hughes 1989, Lagerlund 2000, Thom 2003, Klima 2008, and Dutilh Novaes 2008).

There has been considerable scholarly discussion of Buridan’s modal syllogistic. It has been asked in particular whether it corresponds to any modern system of modal logic. The most popular answer is S5 (King 1985). Some have argued that Buridan must have been thinking in terms of some kind of possible worlds model (Hughes 1989 and Knuuttila 1993). Such comparisons of course reflect the extent to which these scholars have been impressed by Buridan’s modal logic, which was without equal until the late twentieth century.(For an example of just how powerful his general logic was see Parsons 2014.)

9. Later Medieval Developments of the Theory

Syllogistic logic reached the height of its development in Buridan and for the next two hundred years, little was said about it. Buridan’s younger associates at Paris, Albert of Saxony and Marsilius of Inghen, were both competent logicians, but neither made any substantive additions to the theory developed by their master. Paul of Venice was a well-known early fifteenth-century logician, but he had little to say about the theory of the syllogism. In the late fifteenth and sixteenth centuries, several very good logicians wrote books on logic, perhaps the most skillful being Jodocus Trutfetter, a follower of Ockham who is better known as a teacher of Martin Luther. But Trutfetter’s logic is wholly based on Buridan. In his massive work, the modestly titled, Little Compendium of the Whole of Logic (Summulae totius logicae), he extends modal logic beyond Buridan to include discussions of epistemic and doxastic modalities. His treatment of syllogistic is perhaps the most extensive in the medieval tradition.

As noted above, the syllogistic logic of Ockham and Buridan was not primarily aimed at saving Aristotle. But historical interest in Aristotle returned in the latter part of the fifteenth century, and some scholars, mainly from the Thomistic and Albertist traditions, wanted to know what Aristotle had said about syllogistic. There was also the nominalist commentator George of Brussels, who tried to offer a historically accurate interpretation of Aristotle together with a systematic account along the lines of Buridan. It is interesting to note that the modal syllogistic these philosophers ascribe to Aristotle is identical to that provided under Kilwardby’s interpretation. (For further discussion of modal logic in the later Middle Ages, see Coombs 1990, Roncaglia 1996, and Lagerlund 2000, Chapter 8.)

10. Summary

The theory of the syllogism was the most important logical theory during the Middle Ages and for a long time it was practically synonymous with logic as a discipline. Buridan altered this picture by making syllogistic part of a much larger and more complex logic of consequence.

At first, medieval commentators on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics sought to save what they took to be Aristotle’s original system. Kilwardby thought this could be done by interpreting modal sentences in light of Aristotle’s metaphysics of essence together with his account of essential prediction in the Posterior Analytics. This was a very influential interpretation, but it was ultimately abandoned because it did not succeed in saving Aristotle.

In the early fourteenth century, Campsall tried to save Aristotle by developing a more radical interpretation restricting the supposition of subject and predicate terms in modal sentences. This enabled him to prove the conversion rules and many of the syllogistic moods accepted by Aristotle, but not even this interpretation could make sense of the Prior Analytics.

By the second quarter of the fourteenth century, modal logic had begun to change and new distinctions were used to develop the theory of the modal syllogism, such as the distinction between de dicto and de re modal sentences. Ockham was the first simply to abandon Aristotle’s theory in favor of a newer and more systematic account. He was not quite successful, however, and it was left to Buridan to subsume modal syllogistic as part of his larger project of systematizing the whole of logic.

The history of syllogistic does not end with the Middle Ages, of course, but it is fair to say that the theory did not really change in the six centuries since Buridan. What did change, and for the worse, was people’s knowledge of the original sources and hence also of the richness and sophistication of medieval logic, a state of ignorance that made the doctrine easy for logicians of the early twentieth century to ridicule.


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