Supplement to The Metaphysics of Mass Expressions

Challenges to Mereological Essentialism for Masses

Laycock (2006) argues that a mass of matter, such as some ice, can change its parts and remain the very same ice, as well as arguing that not any old collection of H2O molecules have a fusion.

Laycock argues that ‘the ice’ in ‘the ice in my gin and tonic’ cannot refer to a sum (2006, pp. 22–28). Laycock argues that the supposition that the reference of mass expressions is to mereological sums, and that sums are particulars, leads to a contradiction. Suppose at \(t_1\) Henry puts ice in his drink, and that some of it melts by \(t_2\). On a sum view, ‘the ice’ at \(t_1\) refers to a sum of matter composing all and only the ice in Henry’s drink at \(t_1\). The ice in his drink at \(t_2\) is not identical, since some of the ice is no more—it has melted.

So, the following seems true:

at \(t_2, {\sim}x (x\) is the ice added at \(t_1)\)

Yet, says Laycock, it is not until \(t_3\), when all of the ice is melted, that the ice in his drink ceases to be. If so, then the following would also be true (2006, p. 23):

at \(t_2, x (x\) is the ice added at \(t_1)\)

(d) and (e) seem contradictory. Laycock attempts to dissolve the problem by attacking what led to it, viz., that all reference is singular reference, and mass reference is reference to singular sums (which have all of their parts essentially). As well as singular reference, there is plural reference (e.g., ‘The gerbils in the pet store’) and mass reference (e.g., ‘the water in Lake Michigan’). Mass reference is not reference to things, but to concrete non-particular stuff. There is no thing which is the referent of ‘the ice’ (and, since sums are particular things, then ‘the ice’ cannot refer to a sum).

While there are other reasons for considering mass-reference to refer to entities which are concrete but not particular (and Laycock gives such reasons), the ice argument does not seem to be a knock-down argument for the proposal. For starters, as many have shown, it proves too much. The argument is supposed to prove that ‘the ice’, while it does refer, does not refer to a thing, especially not a sum, since, in that case, MEM would be true of it. This is because ‘the ice’ continues to refer to the same entity through loss of parts.

But arguments of the same form could be made about things as well. Think of a red patch that is being erased (Sennet 2007), a cake that is gradually being eaten at a party (Koslicki 2007) or a cat in a bag which is losing weight over time (McKay 2008). If none of these examples support the idea that patches, cakes, or cats are not things, then it is hard to see why the ice example shows this.

This is an interesting puzzle, but in this form I don’t think that it should detain the partisan of bits (parcels, quantities) of matter…For example, one could argue that the phrase ‘the ice at \(t_1\)’ denotes a bit of matter by an accidental property, that it is ice at \(t_1\). That bit of matter persists as the ice melts, but not all of it is ice at \(t_2\). Thus ‘the ice at \(t_2\)’ denotes a distinct bit of matter (a sub-bit of the \(t_1\)bit), and so (b) is true. The bit of matter (that is ice at \(t_1)\) never ceases to be in our imagined case, but at \(t_3\), the last cold morsel of it ceases to be ice. At that point, the bit of matter that was ice at \(t_1\) has all become non-ice. (McKay 2008, p. 307)

So the friend of sums has reason to believe that (d) is false. But teasing out the ramifications of the falsity of (d) reveals some notable constraints upon the sum theorist.

There are other powerful reasons why one cannot remain a strict mereological essentialist while also adhering to folk intuitions about the individuation of stuffs, if one is also against the possibility of coincidence (see the supplement on sums and ordinary objects for details). The sum theorist seemingly has to accept the view that all composite atomic and all fuzzy atomless stuffs, such as blood, taco sauce and crude oil, are accidental phases of masses. Object-reducing sum theorists will also have to reduce complex stuffs, so that kinds such as water do not essentially apply to what falls under them. Let us see why.

Suppose you have a two-chambered container of water. Suppose electrolysis is performed on it, separating the hydrogen into one chamber and the oxygen in the other, and then the two chambers are sealed. Suppose further that no hydrogen or oxygen molecules are lost in the process. Do you have the same stuff left over or not? You do, in the sense that there is no fundamental matter unaccounted for after the procedure that was there before. But you do not, in that you do not have any water left. So, this shows that ‘same stuff’ is ambiguous between at least two readings: 1) same fusion of fundamental particles, 2) same fusion of fundamental particles whose parts remain in the right kind of relations to continue making up a portion of stuff of kind \(K\) (cf. Kleinschmidt 2007, section 3.1). This also points out the problem of ‘Stuff-Stuff Coincidence’, which has not been extensively discussed (see Barnett 2004; Donnely and Bittner 2008; and Kleinschmidt 2007 for stuff-stuff coincidence discussions).

In fact, There could be a third, ‘loose’ reading of ‘same stuff’, where some portion of stuff can be the same portion even if some particles are lost. The folk will regularly say things like “Gottfried used the bath water to wash the dishes!” implying that it is the same water, even though some of the bath water would have evaporated. Most likely there are stricter and looser senses of ‘same stuff’ (Zimmerman 1995, section 8).

David Barnett argues convincingly that some portion of oil can remain the same portion of oil while not remaining the same sum of oil, since some of its constituent molecules can unbind and then rebind with others, so that

that very [sum] of oil…no longer exists…[but the oil] survives; for each of its molecules retains an oil-forming relation with some of the others throughout the entire procedure. (Barnett 2004, p. 91)

The sum theorist must contend that there are no portions of heterogeneous stuff-kinds which are identical with mere sums, if they wish to avoid stuff-stuff coincidence (see section 1.4 of the main entry for the terminological definitions). Hence they will treat complex stuffs as they do ordinary objects. Some gold, for instance, can be treated as a fiction or logical construction out of a mass of matter, or as some stuff which is not a sum of gold which has the property of being golden, or as some stuff which is ‘golding.’ (cf. Kleinschmidt 2007, p. 416).

So, since the friend of sums has the same reasons to reduce or eliminate complex stuffs as she does to reduce or eliminate ordinary objects, then she should do so. The only genuine portions of stuff kinds which the sum theorist should believe in would be kinds of fundamental entities, e.g., ‘electron-stuff’, ‘green-down-quark-stuff’, and so on.

The foregoing shows how the sum theorist can resist arguments such as Barnett’s and Laycock’s. The price that the mereologist has to pay for keeping form out of the equation for individuating sums is denying that complex stuffs are similar to fundamental stuffs, and are in fact more similar to the things which they sought to reduce (cf. Kleinschmidt 2007, and see Tanksley 2010 for related discussion).

Lastly, van Inwagen (2009) argues that all objects are mereological sums, and since objects change parts, then so do sums. This argument can be quite powerful if one is independently motivated to deny arbitrary sums, and goes along with denying Unrestricted Mereology. See section 3.1 of the main entry for more discussion on the denial of arbitrary sums (see van Inwagen 1981 as well for a rejection of the “Doctrine of Arbitrary Undetached Parts”). This kind of view also goes against the denial of many mereologists that structure or arrangement is part of the identity and individuation of mereological sums, which seems to be their raison d’etre, and how they earn their theoretical keep.

Copyright © 2022 by
Mark Steen <>

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