Michel Henry (1922–2002) developed a radically revised approach to phenomenology through a critical reading of the phenomenological tradition (especially of Husserl and Heidegger). Henry named his approach “phenomenology of life” and, before that, “material phenomenology” or “radical phenomenology”. He was, in part, influenced by the work of Maine de Biran. Perhaps the most characteristic, as well as most controversial, feature of Henry’s phenomenology of life is that it grounds intentionality in a pre-intentional form of appearing, namely immanent affectivity or “life”. In the last period of his work (1992–2002), Henry developed a philosophy of religion and Christianity based on his phenomenology. He is widely recognized as one of the major figures of 20th-century French phenomenology.
- 1. Life and Work
- 2. Phenomenology of Life and the Concept of Transcendental Affectivity
- 3. Aesthetics
- 4. Ethics and Political Philosophy
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1. Life and Work
Michel Henry was born on January 10, 1922 in Haiphong, Vietnam (then, French Indochina). After the accidental death of his father, the family returned to Paris in 1929. In Paris, Henry became a student at the prestigious Lycée Henri IV, then graduated with a Master thesis on Spinoza in 1943 with Jean Grenier as director. Soon after having turned in his thesis, partially published in the Revue d’histoire de la philosophie et d’histoire générale de la civilisation in 1944 and 1946, Henry joined the French Resistance and was assigned to the “Pericles” division in the region of Haut Jura. He returned to Paris at the end of 1944, obtaining the Agrégation in philosophy in 1945. As a researcher at the French National Research Center CNRS and the Fondation Thiers, he began working under the supervision of both Jean Wahl and Jean Hyppolite on his Ph.D. thesis, which would be published in 1963 and become one of his major works: The Essence of Manifestation. His second book, Philosophy and Phenomenology of the Body, although published two years later, was already finished around 1950, having first been planned as a part of the main thesis but, due to its length, was presented as Henry’s secondary thesis (a requirement in the French academic system at that time). In 1963, the dissertation committee, composed of Jean Wahl, Jean Hyppolite, Ferdinand Alquié, Paul Ricoeur, and Henri Gouhier, was impressed by Henry’s main Ph.D. thesis, a work that translates almost a decade of research into more than 900 pages of complex philosophical argument. Preferring a position in southern France to one at the Sorbonne, Henry had already been appointed to the University of Montpellier in 1960 where he remained a professor until his retirement in 1982. He devoted his entire philosophical career to the development of his phenomenology of life with, among other publications, Marx (1976), Genealogy of Psychoanalysis (1985), Seeing the Invisible (1988), Material Phenomenology (1990), I Am the Truth (1996), Incarnation (2000). In addition, he authored four novels, one of which—L’amour les yeux fermés—was awarded the Prix Renaudot in 1976. He died on July 3, 2002 in Albi, France.
2. Phenomenology of Life and the Concept of Transcendental Affectivity
Since the publication of the Essence of Manifestation in 1963, Henry’s entire oeuvre was devoted to the systematic development of a phenomenology that, while constituting itself within the phenomenological tradition, criticizes substantially not only classical Husserlian phenomenology but also the works of some of Husserl’s most famous successors: Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty. The originality of Henry’s phenomenology lies in the fact that it considers intentionality to be only one of two modes of appearing. In other words, Henry argues that the way in which phenomena appear to us cannot be restricted to the “consciousness of something” as classical phenomenology would suggest. On the contrary, for Henry, intentional consciousness must be founded in a more fundamental mode of appearing that is precisely non- and even pre-intentional and that therefore essentially differs from intentionality. It is this fundamental mode of appearing that Henry designates as “affectivity”, “pathos” or “life”.
2.1 The Critique of Intentionality and of Ontological Monism
If Henry’s critique of intentionality is construed through a critique of Husserlian phenomenology, it nevertheless comports a much wider perspective that includes a “deconstruction” of the history of philosophy in general, insofar as the latter relies on a limited concept of appearing or phenomenality. Every philosophy, Henry argues, relies on phenomenological presuppositions and, therefore, “a critique of phenomenality necessarily concerns philosophy in general” (PNI 105). Phenomenality as such, however, is the object of phenomenology. As Husserl notes in, for instance, his Göttingen Lectures of 1905, phenomenology is concerned with how objects are given (Gegenstände im Wie, Husserl [GW]: 117). The mode of givenness, i.e., appearing itself, is therefore what phenomenology must investigate. For Henry, however, this line of thought must be taken one step further to include the fact that appearing itself must appear. Since things are devoid of the ability to become phenomena by themselves, Henry argues, that which makes them appear has itself to appear. Otherwise, nothing would appear at all (PNI 107–8). As a result, phenomenology cannot be reduced to a method that would make us see how things appear to us. Instead it finds its proper object with the question “How does appearing appear?” According to Henry’s reading of the phenomenological tradition, however, we are faced with a very peculiar situation where intentionality is considered the sole mode of appearing.
Since intentionality is, as Sartre emphasized, always consciousness of something other than consciousness itself, appearing becomes “ek-static” by its very essence, i.e., it points to something exterior to itself. This leads in turn to replace the question of appearing with that of the appearing of entities or beings and, finally, centers the focus of phenomenology on beings (étants) insofar as they appear. This tendency, an “ontological monism” that according to Henry has pervaded most of the history of philosophy, leads to a reduction of human subjectivity to the sole function of being directed outward, and thus to equate it with the exteriority or “transcendence of the world” (EM 89). Henry does not deny that decisive results were achieved through the perspective of intentionality, notably in Husserl’s investigations into noetic-noematic correlation (I 91). His question however is that of intentionality itself, i.e., the transcendental question regarding the conditions that make intentionality possible. If intentionality gives access to objects, how do we access intentionality itself and is such an access also intentional? In other words, is the way through which intentionality is given homogenous to the way objects are given? The problem with a philosophical horizon constituted by ontological monism is that it presupposes “the understanding of the essence of manifestation as representation” and, thus, makes “inaccessible to philosophical thought the very idea of a reception which would not be essentially the reception of an exterior content” (EM 237).
For Henry, the answer to the question of homogeneity is clearly negative. If intentionality enables us “to see”, in the sense of sight pertaining to consciousness in general, then we must bear in mind that the act of seeing is not itself seen—on the contrary, it escapes sight. As a result, an intentional act is not primarily given in an intentional way. Or, in the language of the Essence of Manifestation, we must admit “the impossibility for transcendence to lay its own foundation and thus to constitute the essence of the foundation” (EM 210).
Moreover, if we take seriously the claim that appearing itself must appear, then in order to avoid an infinite regress such appearing would have to be self-appearing (auto-apparaître). Intentionality, however, since it points toward and reveals something other than itself, cannot fulfill this task of self-revelation. Thus, Henry concludes that the fundamental mode of appearing, namely the self-appearing of appearing, cannot have an intentional structure. It must be non-intentional and, since intentionality is tied to visibility in the general sense of perception (or representation), invisible. In other words, the origin and the essence of manifestation—the “archi-revelation” (Archi-Révélation) as Henry will put it later in Genealogy of Psychoanalysis for instance—is a self-revelation or, in the terminology forged as early as the Essence of Manifestation, an auto-affection that refers to nothing but itself.
In Henry, “life” (vie) has therefore no biological meaning, but an exclusively phenomenological one, which means that it refers to this fundamental mode of appearing that is, as self-appearing, radically distinct from the ek-static nature of intentionality. It is not the opening to an other, but enclosed in itself, undergoing itself in self-experience (épreuve de soi that Henry distinguishes from conscience de soi, self-awareness), which is precisely for Henry the condition of possibility of any experience of an other or hetero-affection. As Henry intends to illustrate in Barbarism through the somewhat ironic example of a biology student, none of the forms of intentional directedness—including the most elaborate forms of scientific knowledge—would be possible if they weren’t revealed as such to a living subject that is characterized by auto-affection or, better yet, that is auto-affection. Henry also uses the term “transcendental affectivity” to characterize this self-appearing proper to his phenomenological concept of life: it is transcendental in the sense that it is the condition of possibility of every possible phenomenon, and it is affectivity because the self-experience that characterizes the living (vivant) is a form of primal suffering (souffrir originaire) or pathos.
“Pathos” refers to the fact that, because of its self-enclosed nature, such an experience cannot cease to adhere to itself. But, like the flip side of a coin, this self-adherence is also the condition for the greatest joy, namely the joy of living. Joy and suffering are thus fundamental tonalities that both express the fact that life cannot escape from itself, that it is irremediably tied to itself. This explains for instance why the concrete experience of suffering can become unbearable. Henry’s analysis of appearing is, as one can see, connected to the question of the subject of appearing: phenomena only exist for a subject, and subjectivity is precisely conceived of as life, i.e., as the essence and origin of every possible phenomenon. At the same time, and because of its auto-affective nature, subjectivity is marked by the fundamental tonalities of joy and suffering.
Henry’s approach to phenomenology could be characterized further as “hyletic”, in reference to Husserl’s concept of hylè (primal impressions, raw sensuous-data as matter for consciousness), with one important difference however. Whereas for Husserl hylè is raw matter destined to be shaped into an intentional form (morphè) and only becomes a phenomenon through this shaping, Henry’s “material phenomenology” reverses the relation between hylè and morphè by 1) giving to hylè its own form of (self-)appearing as affectivity, independently from intentionality; and 2) grounding intentionality in affectivity, the latter becoming the transcendental condition of the former. As Henry writes in Material Phenomenology (1990):
This self-givenness […] is structurally different from “relating-to”. It is not in itself a “relating-to” but insurmountably excludes it from itself. It is not outside of itself but in itself, not transcendence but radical immanence. And it is only on the basis of this radical immanence that something like transcendence is possible. Seeing is actualized only as a nonseeing […]. This nonseeing, this unseen, this invisible, is not the unconscious. It is not the negation of phenomenality but its first phenomenalization. It is not a presupposition but rather our life in its non-ek-static but yet undeniable pathos. (MP 81)
Consequently, Henry understands his phenomenology as being a radical departure from monism insofar as it advocates the “duplicity of appearing”. If a non-intentional self-appearing is necessary in order for intentionality to be possible, than there are indeed two modes of appearing: an intentional appearing that operates by means of difference and that constitutes the intentional object as transcendent; and a non-intentional or “affective” appearing (apparaître pathétique, which would—in opposition to “ek-static appearing”—literally translate as “pathetic appearing”, an expression that remains controversial among Henry translators) that is given in pure immanence prior to any subject-object division.
2.2 Sources of Henry’s Phenomenology
From the perspective of the history of philosophy, a critique of monism amounts to a critique of most philosophies, and Henry recognizes only a few precursors as having a presentiment of the immanence pertaining to life as self-appearing. One clear case is French philosopher Maine de Biran (1766–1824), whose work inspired Henry’s second book Philosophy and Phenomenology of the Body (1965), explicitly subtitled: Essay in Biranian Ontology. Through Biran’s “sense of effort”, Henry connects the theme of the original essence of manifestation to that of the subjective body as locus of immanent affectivity (see Kühn 1992). Although it appeared after the Essence of Manifestation, it is interesting to note that the Biran-book was outlined before the Essence and originally planned as a part of this more comprehensive work. Considering Biran’s influence on Henry, especially in the light of Henry’s handwritten notes (now available at the Henry-Archive at the University of Louvain-la-Neuve), the phenomenology of life has been conceived of as “phenomenological vitalism” (see Jean 2015). This thesis, however, has not been widely echoed by Henry scholars (for a critique: see Kühn 2019), in part because it relies on notes that Henry himself chose not to publish.
As for the Essence of Manifestation itself, it finds a precursor concerning the structure of immanence in the works of Meister Eckhart and, though to a lesser extent, in the concept of love in Fichte’s Die Anweisung zum seligen Leben oder auch die Religionslehre (The Way Towards the Blessed Life or The Doctrine of Religion) of 1806. Other authors will be interpreted in a similar way by Henry: Marx (1976), but also Schopenhauer, Nietzsche and Freud in the 1985 Genealogy of Psychoanalysis. In the same book, Henry develops an interpretation of Descartes’ Cogito that cannot be overestimated in its importance for Henry’s project insofar as it is repeatedly used to introduce Henry’s own concept of the phenomenological reduction as “counter-reduction”, most notably in Section 18 of Incarnation. As for Spinoza, J.-M. Longneaux (2004) has defended the thesis of a Spinozism in Henry, who devoted his Master thesis to the concept of happiness in Spinoza. However, because Henry almost never again refers to Spinoza after this early work (the subject of which was imposed by his thesis-advisor) and will even explicitly distance himself from Spinoza’s rationalism, it seems unlikely that Spinoza constitutes an important source for Henry’s phenomenology, despite Longneaux’ arguments. The writings of Husserl and Heidegger have played a decisive role in the elaboration of what Henry termed the “phenomenology of life”. but as can be seen from the critique of intentionality and the emphasis on immanence against the Heideggerian theme of being-in-the-world, their influence operates “by contrast”, which means that Henry will develop his phenomenology through a series of oppositions to the thought of Husserl and Heidegger rather than in accordance with them.
In the last phase of Henry’s work, however, another source of Western thought came to the foreground, namely Christianity. Paradoxically, it was before he developed his philosophy of Christianity that Henry was targeted (along with Levinas, J.-L. Marion and J.-L. Chrétien) by D. Janicaud’s critique of what he polemically termed the “theological turn” in French phenomenology (Janicaud 1991). Janicaud’s critique is, in fact, not so much directed against an explicit reference to “theology” in phenomenology (which is why the term “theological turn” is polemical and, in a way, misleading), but against an attempt to radicalize phenomenology beyond the scope of object manifestation and intentionality. One can therefore read Janicaud’s essay as advocating in favor of a “minimalistic phenomenology” or “surface phenomenology” that remains inside such a scope. However, as Zahavi has pointed out, practically all of the major phenomenological thinkers cross such boundaries, especially as they seek to approach the core of subjectivity as well as “the phenomenological question concerning the condition of possibility for manifestation” (Zahavi 1999: 236). One can therefore interpret Henry’s explicit “turn” toward a philosophy of Christianity as his reaffirmation of the possibility of a radicalized phenomenology in which such a philosophy is grounded (see also Capelle 2004).
2.3 Life and the Living: Philosophy of Christianity
With the publication of I Am the Truth. Toward a Philosophy of Christianity in 1996, phenomenology of life was extended to a philosophical reading of Christianity. This “extension” was already announced in 1992 with a talk given at the Ecole Normale Supérieure under the title “Parole et religion: La parole de Dieu” (“Speech and Religion: The Word of God”) which contains—sometimes word for word—some of the main theses that will be developed in I Am the Truth. Incarnation (2000) and Words of Christ (2002) continue to pursue the project of a philosophy of Christianity by focusing on the concepts of flesh and revelation, respectively. But what does a philosophical or even a phenomenological “reading” of Christianity mean here? To be sure, Henry’s philosophical approach does not rely on religious faith in the sense that his phenomenology of life would presuppose Christian faith. It is rather the other way around: as Henry himself admitted, it is the development of his phenomenology that led him to discover in the Scriptures an intuition of life that, although written in a non-philosophical language, corresponds to his own phenomenological concept of immanent affectivity.
From a philosophical perspective, the turning point that leads Henry to his interpretation of Christianity is the need to account for individual subjectivity as rooted in life, a life that is common to all the living and therefore transcends the living while remaining at the same time immanent. This aspect is present in Henry’s thought long before he turns toward a philosophy of Christianity, when, following Kierkegaard, he repeatedly emphasizes that the “me” is not its own foundation. This is why auto-affection is, for Henry, essentially tied to a form of passivity: subjectivity is characterized by a dimension of suffering, i.e., of pathos, without which it would simply not be living subjectivity. Subjective powers of the “I can” therefore always refer to a deep-seated and original powerlessness of a life that cannot escape from itself. It is this relation between the living and life that Henry seeks to describe through the concept of “transcendental birth”.
Transcendental birth, which is identical to the birth of subjectivity, cannot be understood with reference to the world, for instance as “being-in-the-world”. Henry argues:
in the world and in the externality of its “outside”, no “Living” is possible—and consequently no livings either (IAT 71)
In other words, the status of auto-affection as immanent self-appearing—i.e., Henry’s definition of transcendental subjectivity or ipseity (from ipse, self)—cannot be engendered by something of an entirely different nature (the exteriority or “externality” of the world), but must be engendered “within” auto-affection itself, i.e., within and through life.
Life as capable of engendering the form of ipseity is, for Henry, absolute life, which transcends each individual living being. Subjective powers described by the “I can” thus take place when the “I” is given to itself in auto-affection. By engendering individual life, absolute life engenders in fact itself. This is, however, only possible in the form of ipseity, since life, for Henry, equates with auto-affection, which in turn equates with ipseity. In the language of Christianity, absolute life is God and the original form of ipseity (or “archi-ipseity”) is Christ as the “First living” (Premier vivant).
In Henry’s phenomenological terminology, the process of self-engendering reflects a transcendence in immanence: within the immanence of auto-affection, it is in fact absolute life that affects itself through each living individual (see Lavigne 2009). Or, as Henry also puts it, absolute life gives itself to itself through the individuality of the living and it is only through such “participation” that the latter can be said to be alive. This also leads Henry to distinguish an auto-affection in the strong sense (i.e. pertaining to absolute life) from an auto-affection in the weak sense (i.e. pertaining to the individual living being). The relation of the living to absolute life is thus described by Henry as a relation of “sonship” (filiation), whereby transcendental birth does not denote a singular event but a stable condition, namely the human condition as “son of absolute Life”. Life’s self-engendering is here understood as a continuous process, a movement of life’s “eternal coming forth in itself” (IAT 55) which thereby supports the life of each individual living. The living is thus understood as being continuously “traversed by Life”, a condition, however, that, being strictly immanent, can be “forgotten” by the individual living being—an aspect that will play a fundamental role in Henry’s ethical perspective (see Section 4.2).
Besides Henry’s book on Kandinsky (Seeing the Invisible 1988), a 1996 interview with M. Huhl and J.-M. Brohm, published under the title “Art et phénoménologie de la vie” (“Art and Phenomenology of Life”) is the best overview of Henry’s position with regard to aesthetics and the philosophy of art. This interview not only shows how Henry applies the principles of his phenomenology of life to art and aesthetics, but also illustrates such an application in the fields of painting—including the importance given to Kandinsky’s artistic work and theory—music, architecture, and literature.
3.1 Applied Phenomenology: Art and Aesthetics
According to a phenomenological theme that Henry traces back to Husserl and Heidegger, the world is not limited to any existing world, but includes in itself the possibility of creating new fields of experience for the human. Art would thus be such a possibility, insofar as the artist surpasses “habitual facticity” and establishes through the work of art a dimension of being that is “absolutely specific” and “original”. Above all art reveals, through its ability to create a new ontological dimension, a more fundamental reality than the world itself, namely “the possibility of world” as such. In this sense, art reveals that which is ordinarily concealed: “a pure appearing that brings things into visibility” (AP 284). In other words, if things are given to us in an immediate way—when we perceive bodies and, to a certain extent, our own body—such thematic givenness is only possible because space is given in a non-thematic way, as Kant’s Transcendental Aesthetic already emphasizes. Space is, therefore, not what we perceive but that which allows perception. As Henry argues, this is the kind of role that Heidegger attributes to the world insofar as it is not the sum of beings anymore, but the condition of their appearing. Thus, by creating “a world”, art reveals precisely this form of original appearing. Beyond the things perceived, art “make[s] us see the appearing that conceals itself and in which the thing unveils itself” (AP 284).
Henry follows Heidegger here so far as to say that art reveals an original appearing. But he opposes Heidegger in at least two essential points: 1) The idea that the world of art is a world apart from ordinary experience; and 2) The idea that the original appearing is the appearing of a world. With regard to the first point, Henry observes that the rise of art as a separate domain is historically situated in modernity. Such a separation did not exist when some of humanity’s greatest art works were created, the temples of ancient Greece or the cathedrals of the Middle Ages, for instance. The function of these edifices was to serve as a place where the divine could be worshipped, and the divine was the chief concern of those who conceived them, not beauty. As Henry concludes, it is only through our retrospective glance and through the projection of our own 20th-century concept of art that we find these works beautiful; and beauty has even become the only thing we are capable of finding in them “since we have lost their original meaning”, i.e., “since we do not anymore see a temple as an access to the sacred essence of things, but as a work of art” (AP 285–6).
But Henry’s highlighting of the religious origin of art is also connected to the question of the original appearing that is unveiled by art. In his critique of Heidegger, Henry distinguishes between Being and Time, on the one hand, and Heidegger’s later texts that were influenced by Hölderlin and Nietzsche on the other. With regard to Being and Time, Henry’s opposition is clearly marked: “the original appearing is not the one that Heidegger thought of, it is not the world”, which means that
it is not an ek-static appearing […], it is therefore not an horizon, but what I call Life, i.e., a revelation that is not the revelation of an other, that does not open to an exteriority, but that opens to itself. (AP 286)
The original appearing to which art refers is the immanent self-appearing of life given through auto-affection or pathos. In a fundamental sense for Henry, such affective appearing is given in suffering and joy as basic tonalities. With regard to Hölderlin’s and Nietzsche’s reference to the Greek gods, this means that Dionysus has to be seen as the “first god”, since he is the god of desire, of life tied to itself in both suffering and joy (AP 287). Moreover, Dionysus “has no world” but suffers the burden of his own pathos from which he seeks to escape by generating Apollo, i.e., the god of light and, thus, the hope of distancing oneself from pathos. Here art becomes a source of light, a figure through which Dionysus strives to escape from suffering. This is not, however, Henry’s concept of art: it is through the influence of Kandinsky’s writings that he conceives of art as an “intensification of life” (AP 296), where life is understood as auto-affection and original appearing.
3.2 Henry’s Phenomenological Reading of Kandinsky
According to Henry, Kandinsky is the first artist to theorize a new conception of art and to root art in transcendental life. But how could art, and painting in particular, “intensify” invisible and affective life since it is made of visible elements such as form and color? For Kandinsky, color is first and foremost a “radically subjective impression”, “an inner resonance” (AP 290). In the terminology of Henry’s phenomenology, such an apparent paradox is accounted for by the duplicity of appearing: on the one hand, there is a noematic color, the color red as a moment of a particular object, which is only made possible by a primal impression of red that is, on the other hand, purely immanent and subjective. Or, as Henry writes:
There is no red in the world. Red is a sensation, and such sensation is absolutely subjective, originally invisible. Original colors are invisible; they are, however, laid over things through a process of projection. (AP 290)
For the painter, then, the choice of a color is determined by its emotional power. It is not the world that is painted, but, in a sense, emotion itself. This applies to abstract painting, which obviously does not represent any worldly object, but it also applies to any other form of painting. A painting that would be a simple copy of what has been seen in the world would be utterly “insignificant”. As Henry’s example of a painting from the Quattrocento illustrates, even figurative painting—in this case a representation of the Adoration of the Magi—chooses its colors according to their emotional power, not according to a “realistic” representation. Thus, while providing a theoretical basis for abstract painting, it is in fact a theory of painting as such that Kandinsky provides. For such a theory, forms are, very much like colors, not entities exterior to life but the expression of a force (K 123). Kandinsky’s theory of forms—referring to point, plane and line as their basic elements—therefore amounts to a theory of forces that inhabit not the world but our body as it is subjectively lived through (K 82). Such is the essence of Kandinsky’s theory of painting: to be a visible composition that both expresses and touches living interiority. Through this project, and as Kandinsky himself admits, painting has been ascribed the same purpose as music: to express “not the world […] but the Ground of Being and of Life” (“Dessiner la musique”, PHV III, 272).
3.3 Particular Art Forms: From Music to Literature
Following a Schopenhauerian line of thought, Henry states that music “does not express the horizon of the world or any of its objects” (AP 292), but affectivity itself, i.e., a force—the Will in Schopenhauer—that lies outside of representation. More precisely, music is the immediate reproduction of a force that lies “outside the world” (PHV III, 264) and which is in this sense abstract. For Schopenhauer every great work of art is the expression of a force. In architecture for instance, both a Greek temple and a baroque façade express and represent forces. The specificity of music, however, lies in the fact that it expresses the Will in an immediate way. Moreover, this Schopenhauerian standpoint is taken further with regard to another idea to which Henry will agree, namely that of the living body as being the immediate manifestation of the Will. As the important chapter devoted to Schopenhauer in Genealogy of Psychoanalysis shows, Henry interprets the Will within the framework of his own concept of life as immanent auto-affection or affectivity, while at the same time acknowledging that Schopenhauer was “one of the greatest thinkers of all times, albeit a poor philosopher” (AP 292).
The fact that most of Henry’s writings on art focus either on painting or on music does not allow one to conclude that his thesis of art as an “intensification of life” would not apply, or would apply any less, to other art forms. Architecture is repeatedly used by Henry, for instance in Barbarism where the baroque façade is taken as an example of both expression and reproduction (for the spectator) of an immanent play of forces (B 103).
The same principle applies to dance. According to Henry, dance is not figurative; its purpose is not “to tell us a story”, but to express movement abilities pertaining to the body thereby enabling the spectator to feel these abilities in his or her own body, very much “like the forms in a painting makes me feel the forces that are within me and with which I coincide” (AP 306).
Literature, too, occupies a special place in Henry’s oeuvre. It is the one art that he himself practiced as a novelist—his novel L’amour les yeux fermés was awarded the French Prix Renaudot in 1976—though literature as an art form is never clearly theorized in his philosophy. In a 1991 interview published under the title “Narrer le pathos” (“To Narrate Pathos”) Henry admits that an aesthetic theory of literature still remains a task for his phenomenology. Nonetheless, the interview contains several indications concerning the direction such a theory would have to take. As the title indicates, novels and other forms of fictional writing such as poetry for instance, are conceived both as an expression of pathos (from the standpoint of the artist) and as its reproduction or intensification (from the standpoint of the reader). As in the case of painting, it is Henry’s approach to music that provides the foundation for the aesthetics of writing. In order to accomplish this task, the words of the poet or those of the novelist must be able to unveil affectivity rather than be limited to ek-static appearing as their ultimate phenomenological possibility. In the latter case, they are bound to give the thing as absent, as Henry argues while commenting on Heidegger’s analysis of Trakl’s poem “Ein Winterabend”: the snow, the ringing of the bells when the night falls, etc., are brought into presence by the poet’s words, but, at the same time, this presence is retrieved from them since they are given as not really being there. But this is only true in so far as the presence to which words refer is the one that characterizes what can be seen or perceived within the ek-static appearing of the world. In such a context, poetry can only give things through an ambiguous presence-absence (“Phénoménologie matérielle et langage”, PHV III, 333). For Henry, it is only when words are envisaged as the expression of pathos that they speak to a living present beneath the words and their representations. Such a language of affectivity would thus have to be largely disconnected from any form of realism and objectivity, while making room for the imaginary as in hallucination, since “in hallucination pathos governs directly its own images” (PHV III, 313).
As can be seen from Henry’s approach regarding different art forms such as painting, music, and literature, art aims, or should aim, at being an intensification of life as immanent pathos. Life in this sense, however, can be forgotten and its force can be diminished. If therefore, like Henry states, art is an “arising of the most essential life that breaks through in each of us”, then art also accomplishes an “ethical oeuvre” (AP 296).
4. Ethics and Political Philosophy
Even if one does not find a systematic development of ethics in the few articles that Henry explicitly devotes to this subject, it is nonetheless possible to use these writings as a foundation for an ethics from the standpoint of his phenomenology of life. Given the emphasis that Henry puts on the fundamental nature of life as affectivity as well as the tendency toward a forgetting of life’s essence, it seems consistent to ascribe to ethics the task of unmasking and, if possible, overcoming such forgetting. In this sense, Henry’s ethics could be termed an “ethics of affectivity” (Seyler 2010). Among the possible angles that allow for further development with regard to ethics in Henry’s writings, the three following stand out: 1) the idea that art is intrinsically ethical; 2) the critique of contemporary culture through the concept of “barbarism”; and 3) the concept of religion as developed by Henry’s philosophy of Christianity.
4.1 Art as Intrinsically Ethical
As we have seen above, Henry explicitly ascribes an ethical function to art. This involves two essential concepts: that of life’s “self-growth” (auto-accroissement) and that of the bond between the living and absolute life (the latter concept being especially important in his philosophy of religion). Self-growth describes the movement inherent to life, namely “the living ‘me’” itself (AP 295). Such a movement, however, is not simply the continuation of an unchanging state. Self-experience is primarily an experience (épreuve) of passivity, of pathos in Henry’s terminology: We have neither brought ourselves into existence nor do we continue to make ourselves exist. On the contrary, it is absolute life that engenders itself “in” us. But for the same reason, the experience of passivity is one of the “weight” of subjectivity, leading to the urge to deploy subjective powers. Perhaps in analogy with intentional acts that seek fulfillment in intuition, Henry’s concept of self-growth refers, on the level of immanent affectivity, to subjectivity seeking the development of its powers in the “I can”:
Each eye […] wants to see more. Culture exists when this prescription—which is the energy of vision—is followed in this display of what is seen and in the creation of this display. What is now entirely clear to us is that this energy resides in vision as such. That is to say that it resides […] in its self-growth, in what has been called its will to power. (B 100–1)
In this context, the work of art appears as a possible mediation toward such a subjective self-growth, both for the artist and the spectator. Art, however, is not limited to this intensification of subjectivity. It functions at the same time as a “reminder” of the bond between the living and absolute life, and this, according to Henry, is precisely the function of ethics, namely “to make us relive this forgotten bond” (AP 296). By taking religio in its etymological sense as “bond”, Henry’s aesthetics are therefore not only intrinsically ethical but also intrinsically religious. “Art is by its very nature ethical”, just as it is “a form of religious life” (AP 297), a conclusion that for Henry is compatible with a Christian as well as Nietzschean approach to art. However, since aesthetics is not only concerned with art but encompasses all sensible experience, it is not only art that is ethically relevant but everything that affects sensibility, and this includes the world as a whole given its organization in cultural forms and traditions (B 102–3). For this reason, Henry’s critique of contemporary culture has to be seen as an important part of his approach to ethics.
4.2 The Critique of Contemporary Culture as “Barbarism”
If, for Henry, culture has always to be understood as “a culture of life”, i.e., as the cultivation of subjective powers, then it includes art without being limited to it. Cultural praxis comports what Henry designates as its “elaborate forms” (e.g., art, religion, discursive knowledge) as well as everyday forms related to the satisfaction of basic needs. Both types of forms, however, fall under the ethical category of subjective self-growth and illustrate the bond between the living and absolute life. The inversion of culture in “barbarism” means that within a particular socio-historical context the need for subjective self-growth is no longer adequately met, and the tendency toward an occultation of the bond between the living and absolute life is reinforced. According to Henry, who echoes Husserl’s analysis in Crisis, such an inversion takes place in contemporary culture, the dominating feature of which is the triumph of Galilean science and its technological developments (B xiv).
Insofar as it relies on objectification, the “Galilean principle” is directly opposed to Henry’s philosophy of immanent affectivity. For Henry, science, including modern Galilean science, nonetheless remains a highly elaborated form of culture (B 62). Although “the joy of knowing is not always as innocent as it seems”, (B 72) the line separating culture from “barbarism” is crossed when science is transformed into scientist ideology, i.e., when the Galilean principle is made into an ontological claim according to which ultimate reality is given only through the objectively measurable and quantifiable. Here, Henry’s critique of scientism functions in parallel with his critique of ontological monism: in both cases, it is ek-static appearing that is considered as the only access to reality, which amounts to the (ideological or philosophical) negation of subjectivity as immanent auto-affection. As the Essence of Manifestation already notes in opposition to Hegel but also to Heidegger:
Objectification is not possible unless the essence which objectifies itself originally arrives in itself […]. That this original arriving of the essence in itself be not constituted by objectification, that it cannot, as Hegel and Heidegger would wish, be the consequence hereof, results precisely from its being the condition of this objectification. (EM 278)
But the concept of “barbarism” is not limited to a critique of scientist ideology and its paradigm of objectification. More importantly, it targets the implications of such an ideology on the level of everyday praxis in what Henry terms “practices of barbarism”. This rather polemical use of the term “barbarism” refers to practices that impoverish rather than develop subjective powers. If it includes the ordinary sense of barbarism as brutality and extreme violence, it is by no means limited to it and extends to every form of practice that reverses the movement of self-growth inherent to subjectivity. On a societal level, the concept of “barbarism” becomes a reinterpretation of the Freudian “malaise in civilization”. “There is a malaise in civilization every time that the energy of Life remains unemployed”, explains Henry (B 103). “Reverse” forms of practice thus illustrate the alienation of subjective praxis through the domination of the Galilean principle and its technological outcomes. With regard to the practice of television, for instance, Henry’s critique targets the constant succession from one image to the other that makes an aesthetic contemplation impossible. As a corollary to their inconstancy, televised images are also considered insignificant. If they had any significance, they would not only capture attention but would also call for reflection and contemplation. However, this is precisely what an uninterrupted flow of images makes impossible:
Emergence and disappearance are thus only the continually resumed act of life getting rid of itself. It is only in light of such an act that disappearance can become fully intelligible. It presupposes that the content of the image is of no interest in itself and that it is destined to be replaced by another one. If it were to arouse true attention and have a worth of its own, instead, this would imply that it would remain and that the perception of it would arouse a growth of sensibility and intelligence in the spectator. This would imply that the mind, occupied with this inner work, would latch onto the image […], in the omni-temporality of the cultural object that delivers it to contemplation. But, in such a case, life would no longer seek to flee itself in such an image; instead it would find its accomplishment in it, that is to say, in itself. (B 111, translation edited)
As this passage indicates, the underlying principle of “barbarism” is that of a flight from subjectivity into anonymous processes mastered by techno-science, which are then used gradually to replace living praxis. Henry’s concept of “barbarism” can thereby be related to Kierkegaardian despair as “sickness unto death” (EM 680–1, B 64–66). More precisely, “barbarism” is seen as the ultimate form of despair in which the desire to escape oneself as living subjectivity takes the form of a negation of life pure and simple. It is important to note that for Henry such a desire is itself rooted in life, i.e., in immanent affectivity, as a desire to escape the tonalities of suffering that life necessarily undergoes. Consequently, “barbarism” is a project impossible to accomplish, because life remains itself even through forms of flight and negation that Henry does not hesitate to characterize as “madness” (B 52). And it is this movement of fleeing that Henry recognizes as constituting the characteristic trait of modernity.
4.3 Christian Ethics as Recognition of Absolute Life
Henry’s reading of Christian ethics in I Am the Truth confirms that what is at stake for the ethics of affectivity is the recognition of the bond between individual and absolute life. For Henry, cultural renaissance is therefore inherently religious and is connected to the theme of “second birth”. In I am the Truth, as in Incarnation, the opposition of “barbarism” and culture remains operative. As an example, Henry considers the negation of God in the world of techno-science to be implied by the negation of the human as living ipseity (IAT 263), since “practices of barbarism” impair the subjective need for action, in which the human is able to experience life as an absolute. Paradoxically, the search for oneself in the world, which according to Henry characterizes modernity, can only be overcome by abandoning oneself to absolute life, i.e., by renouncing the care for oneself in the world (souci de soi dans le monde) (IAT 143–144). Not to care anymore about oneself as worldly ego means “to be only a living that is traversed by Life” (DD 169), i.e., to rediscover what was previously forgotten, namely absolute life, and to live from the infinite love that the absolute has for itself. In order to account for this “second birth”, Henry explicitly refers to a teleology oriented toward the recognition of absolute life. Eventually, such recognition expresses itself through a double negation in which what negates the absolute is negated in return. But, being immanent and affective, this recognition also resists its description and escapes representation. “Second birth” is only possible within subjective praxis and, more precisely, through the work of mercy, since
only the work of mercy practices the forgetting of self in which, all interest for the Self (right down to the idea of what we call a self or a me) now removed, no obstacle is now posed to the unfurling of life in this Self extended to its original essence. (IAT 170)
However, it is through the action of immanent life itself that “the life of the ego is changed into Life of the absolute” (IAT 165). Consequently, such a mutation of praxis can only be an interior one, which means that it can never be commanded from a point of view exterior to immanent affectivity or even be the result of the ego’s conscious caring for salvation. This point is not unproblematic for an ethics of affectivity, since what has been identified as its fundamental issue depends not primarily on decisions consciously put into action, but on the immanent dynamic of affectivity itself.
4.4 Political Philosophy
Henry’s critique of contemporary culture also raises the question of social conditions and their impact on the exercise of subjective potentialities (see also Gély 2007). The issue of social organization refers here to two important fields of investigation: economics, investigated in Marx (1976), and politics, investigated mainly in From Communism to Capitalism. Theory of a Catastrophe (1990) as well as in two important articles: “La vie et la république” (“Life and the Republic”, 1989) and “Difficile démocratie” (“Difficult Democracy”, 2000). For both economics and politics, Henry’s normative critique targets the forgetting and the occultation of life as a transcendental genesis in which political organization and economy are rooted. Politics and economics are both superstructures that are necessarily tied to representation and measurement, but their legitimacy comes from what is ante-political and ante-economic, namely transcendental life. In Henry’s view, modernity turns this actual genesis upside down: superstructures seem to have become autonomous and, in reverse, tend to impose their laws on immanent life. This reversal is only possible insofar as the foundational character of life as immanent appearing remains forgotten. As Henry argues in From Communism to Capitalism, in techno-scientific capitalism, and even more in totalitarianism, the tendency toward an (albeit illusory) autonomization of superstructures becomes extreme. Despite the violence of totalitarianism, and as can be seen from the analysis of Henry’s concept of “barbarism”, alienation can never be total. It is nonetheless very real, precisely because it is able to affect individual praxis by substituting the “laws of ideality” for those of “vital teleology” (B 134). And again, it is the lack of recognition of immanent life as fundamental phenomenality that makes the reversal that characterizes “barbarism” possible. While Henry distinguishes between an original ethics—ethos itself as first ethics in which life accomplishes its essence—and ethics as normative and discursive (B 96–7), it is to the latter that the philosophical task of reminding us of the transcendental genesis and, hence, of life as fundamental appearing is assigned. Thereby, the ethics of affectivity becomes political insofar as it identifies and unmasks “hypostases” in economics and politics (VR 158). Henry’s phenomenology can then conceptualize cultural renaissance as a “reversal of the reversal” operating in figures of “barbarism”. As far as the political realm is concerned, however, such a renaissance faces the tension—the aporia even—that must exist between invisible life as ipseity and public affairs as general. This tension, which constitutes the political, underlies the democratic project as the self-foundation of communal life (DD 171). From Henry’s point of view, democracy does not necessarily promote culture: if democracy is a chance to reestablish “the true order of things, the foundation of the political in life, for which it can be nothing but a mediation”, (VR 162) it also entails the risk that the visibility necessary to public life be posited as the only possible mode of appearing. Democracy may thereby favor the occultation of its own foundation and become the objective ally of the Galilean principle (DD 175). Moreover, the prospect of political self-foundation is, in its essence, at risk of reproducing the transcendental illusion of the ego (IAT 140) on the communal level: just like the ego is victim of an illusion when it presumes to be the ultimate source of the “I can”, so is a political community misdirected if it presumes to be the ultimate constitutive power of communal life. On this political level the religious bond with absolute life can also fall into oblivion. In such a case, it is the conquest of human rights that is eventually threatened by the reduction of the human to that which scientific exteriority is able to measure and enunciate. As Henry’s phenomenology of intersubjectivity in Part III of Material Phenomenology explains, absolute life is shared by all living and provides the ground for an invisible and immanent community. The core of Henry’s political philosophy lies therefore in the principle according to which the political is only legitimate as a mediation for what is ante-political—namely life, both individual and communal.
The originality of Henry’s contribution to phenomenology is without a doubt his thesis of the duality of appearing, where “immanent affectivity” or “life” designates the “first” and more fundamental form of appearing. Henry’s approach can therefore be described as a systematic phenomenology and philosophy of life. It is also a philosophy of immanence, but enriched with the heritage of transcendental phenomenology, since, for Henry, immanent affectivity is nothing less than the condition of possibility of both the world and consciousness. Furthermore, this transcendental framework leads him to develop a critique of the history of philosophy as well as an approach to practical philosophy and the philosophy of religion. As a philosophy of immanence, however, the formidable challenge Henry’s phenomenology faces lies in its application to what it regards as transcendent, namely that which is given to us through the distance of intentional consciousness: the world and even ourselves as intentional beings.
Page indications refer to the English translations when available
Works by Michel Henry
- Le bonheur de Spinoza, mémoire de fin d’étude (1943) reprinted in Le bonheur de Spinoza suivi de: J.-M. Longneaux, “Étude sur le spinozisme de Michel Henry”, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004.
- [EM] L’essence de la manifestation, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1963; second edition, 1990. English Translation by G. Etzkorn: The Essence of Manifestation, The Hague: Nijhoff, 1973; second edition, 2004.
- Philosophie et phénoménologie du corps. Essai d’ontologie biranienne, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1965. English translation by G. Etzkorn: Philosophy and Phenomenology of the Body, The Hague: Nijhoff, 1975.
- Marx, 2 volumes, vol. 1: Une philosophie de la réalité, vol. 2: Une philosophie de l’économie. Paris: Gallimard, 1976. Partial English translation by K. McLaughlin: Marx. A Philosophy of Human Reality, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1983.
- Généalogie de la psychanalyse. Le commencement perdu, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1985. English translation by D. Brick : The Genealogy of Psychoanalysis, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1993.
- [B] La barbarie, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 19871, 20042. English translation by S. Davidson: Barbarism, London/ New York: Continuum, 2012.
- [K] Voir l’invisible. Sur Kandinsky, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 19881, 20052. English translation by S. Davidson: Seeing the Invisible. On Kandinsky, London/New York: Continuum, 2009.
- [MP] Phénoménologie matérielle, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1990. English translation by S. Davidson: Material Phenomenology, New York: Fordham University Press, 2008.
- Du communisme au capitalisme. Théorie d’une catastrophe, Paris: Odile Jacob, 1990. English translation by S. Davidson: From Communism to Capitalism. Theory of a Catastrophe, London: Bloomsbury Academic, 2014.
- [IAT] C’est moi la vérité. Pour une philosophie du christianisme, Paris: Seuil, 1996. English translation by S. Emanuel: I Am the Truth. Toward a Philosophy of Christianity, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003.
- [I] Incarnation. Une philosophie de la chair, Paris: Seuil, 2000. English translation by K. Hefty: Incarnation. A Philosophy of Flesh, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2015.
- Paroles du Christ, Paris: Seuil, 2002. English translation by C. Gschwandtner: Words of Christ, Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2012.
- [PHV] Phénoménologie de la vie, 4 volumes (collected articles): Volume I: De la phénoménologie. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2003; Volume II: De la subjectivité. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2003. Volume III: De l’art et du politique. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004. Volume IV: Sur l’éthique et la religion. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004.
- Auto-donation. Entretiens et conférences, Paris: Beauchesne, 20021, 20042.
- [PNI] “Phénoménologie non-intentionnelle: une tâche de la phénoménologie à venir”, in Janicaud, D. (ed.), L’intentionnalité en question. Entre phénoménologie et sciences cognitives. Paris: Vrin, 1995, 383–397; reprinted in Phénoménologie de la vie, vol. I, Paris, Presses Universitaires de France, 2003, 105–121 (translations by the author).
- [AP] “Art et phénoménologie de la vie”, in Prétentaine, 6, 1996, 27–43; reprinted in Phénoménologie de la vie, vol. III, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004, 283–308 (translations by the author).
- [VR] “La vie et la république”, in Enseignement philosophique, 3, 1989, 148–160; reprinted in Phénoménologie de la vie, vol. III, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 147–165. (translations mine)
- [DD] “Difficile démocratie”, in David, A. and Greisch, J.(ed.), Michel Henry, l’épreuve de la vie, Paris: Cerf 2000, 39–54; reprinted in Phénoménologie de la vie, vol. III. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004, 167–182. (translations mine)
- Le jeune officier, Paris: Gallimard, 1954.
- L’amour les yeux fermés, Paris: Gallimard, 19771, 19822.
- Le fils du roi. Paris: Gallimard, 1981.
- Le cadavre indiscret, Paris: Albin-Michel, 1996
- Audi, P., 2006, Michel Henry. Une trajectoire philosophique, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
- Barbaras, R., 1991, “Le sens de l’auto-affection chez M. Henry et chez M. Merleau-Ponty”, Epochè, 2: 91–111.
- Barbaras, R., 2012, “The Essence of Life: Desire or Drive?”, in Hanson, J. and Kelly, M. (eds.), 2012, Michel Henry and the Affect of Thought, London/New York: Continuum: 40–61.
- Brohm, J.-M. and J. Leclercq. (eds.), 2009, Michel Henry, Lausanne: L’Âge d’Homme.
- Capelle, Ph. (ed.), 2004, Phénoménologie et christianisme chez Michel Henry. Les derniers écrits de Michel Henry en débat, Paris: Cerf.
- David, A. and J. Greisch. (eds.), 2001, Michel Henry, l’épreuve de la vie, Paris: Cerf.
- Davidson,S. and F. Seyler. (eds.), 2019, The Michel Henry Reader, Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
- Enders, M. (ed.), 2015, Immanenz und Einheit. Festschrift zum 70. Geburtstag von Rolf Kühn, Boston/Leiden: Brill Academic Publishers.
- Fichte, J. G., 1806, Die Anweisung zum seligen Leben oder auch die Religionslehre, in Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Vol. I, 9, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1995. English translation by W. Smith, The Way Towards the Blessed Life or The Doctrine of Religion, London: Chapman, 1849.
- Garcia-Baro, M., 1997, “Introduccion a la teoria de la verdad de Michel Henry”, Dialogo Filosofico, 38: 189–202.
- Gély, R., 2007, Rôles, action sociale et vie subjective. Recherches à partir de la phénoménologie de Michel, Bruxelles: Lang.
- Green, G., 2012, “Kant and Henry: An Inheritance of Idealism and a ‘Turn’ for Phenomenology”, Analecta Hermeneutica, 4: 1–19.
- Grätzel, S. and F. Seyler (eds.), 2013, Sein, Existenz, Leben: Michel Henry und Martin Heidegger, Freiburg i. Br.: Alber.
- Gschwandtner, C., 2010, “Can We Hear the Voice of God? Michel Henry and Words of Christ”, in Benson, B.E. and Wirzba, W. (eds.), 2010, Words of Life. New Theological Turns in French Phenomenology. New York: Fordham University Press: 147–157.
- Haar, M., 1987, “Michel Henry entre phénoménologie et métaphysique”, Philosophie, 15: 30–59.
- Hanson, J. and M. Kelly (eds.), 2012, Michel Henry and the Affect of Thought, London/New York: Continuum.
- Hart, J., 1999, “A Phenomenological Theory and Critique of Culture: A Reading of Michel Henry’s La barbarie”, Continental Philosophy Review, 32(3): 255–270.
- Hatem, J.(ed.), 2003, Michel Henry. La parole de la vie, Paris: L’Harmattan.
- Husserl, E., [GW], Gesammelte Werke, Vol. X, The Hague: Nijhoff, 1966.
- Janicaud, D., 1991, Le tournant théologique de la phénoménologie française. Combas: Éclat. English translation by B. C. Prusak: The French Debate. Part I: The Theological Turn of French Phenomenology, New York: Fordham University Press 2004.
- Jean, G., 2015, Force et temps. Essai sur le vitalisme phénoménologique de Michel Henry, Paris: Hermann.
- Jean, G. and J. Leclercq (eds.), 2014, Lectures de Michel Henry: Enjeux et perspectives, Louvain: Presses Universitaires de Louvain.
- Jdey, A. and R. Kühn (eds.), 2011, Michel Henry et l’affect de l’art. Recherches sur l’esthétique de la phénoménologie matérielle, Boston/Leiden: Brill Academic Publishers.
- Kawase, M., 2012, “Genjitsukan no genshogaku: Michel Henry to Kimura Bin” [The Sentiment of Reality: Michel Henry and Kimura Bin], Ritsumeikan bungaku, 625: 1077–1089.
- Kühn, R., 1992, Leiblichkeit als Lebendigkeit. Michel Henrys Phänomenologie absoluter Subjektivität als Affektivität, Freiburg i. Br.: Alber.
- –––, 2003, Radicalité et passibilité. Pour une phénoménologie pratique, Paris: L’Harmattan.
- –––, 2016, Wie das Leben spricht: Narrativität als radikale Lebensphänomenologie. Neuere Studien zu Michel Henry, Dordrecht: Spinger.
- –––, 2019, “‘Vitalismus’ und reine Potenzialität bei Michel Henry”, Phänomenologische Forschungen, 1: 53–70.
- Kühn, R. and S. Nowotny (eds.), 2002, Michel Henry: Selbsterprobung des Lebens und der Kultur, Freiburg/München: Alber.
- Laoureux, S., 2005, L’immanence à la limite, Paris: Cerf.
- Lavigne, J.-F. (ed.), 2006, Michel Henry. Pensée de la vie et culture contemporaine, Actes du colloque international de Montpellier 3–5 décembre 2003. Paris: Beauchesne.
- –––, 2009, “The Paradox and Limits of Michel Henry’s Concept of Transcendence”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 17(3): 377–388.
- –––, 2011, “Souffrance et ipséité selon Michel Henry”, Cahiers Philosophiques, 3: 66–81.
- Longneaux, J.-M., 2004,“Étude sur le spinozisme de Michel Henry”, in M. Henry, Le bonheur de Spinoza, suivi de: J.-M. Longneaux, “Étude sur le spinozisme de Michel Henry”, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004, 153–429.
- Martins, F., 2004, “Michel Henry: beatitude e fenomenologia”, Revista Portuguesa de Filosofia, 60(4): 1031–1040.
- O’Sullivan, M., 2006, Incarnation, Barbarism and Belief. An Introduction to the Work of Michel Henry, Bern: Lang.
- Ricoeur, P., 2014, “Le Marx de Michel Henry”, in Jean, G. and Leclercq, J. (eds.), 2014, Lectures de Michel Henry: Enjeux et perspectives, Louvain: Presses Universitaires de Louvain: 161–183.
- Rivera, J., 2015, The Contemplative Self after Michel Henry, Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press.
- Sebbah, J.-D., 2001, L’épreuve de la limite, Derrida, Henry, Levinas et la phénoménologie, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. English translation by S. Barker: Testing the Limit: Derrida, Henry, Levinas, and the Phenomenological Tradition, Stanford: Stanford University Press 2012.
- Seyler, F., 2009, “Michel Henry et la critique du politique”, Studia Phaenomenologica, IX: 351–377.
- –––, 2010, Barbarie ou culture: L’éthique de l’affectivité dans la phénoménologie de Michel Henry, Paris: Kimé.
- –––, 2014, “Fichte in 1804: A Radical Phenomenology of Life? On a Possible Comparison Between the 1804 Wissenschaftslehre and Michel Henry’s Phenomenology”, Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 28(3): 295–304.
- Staudigl, M., 2009, “From the ‘Metaphysics of the Individual’ to the Critique of Society: On the Practical Significance of Michel Henry’s Phenomenology of Life”, Continental Philosophy Review, 45(3), 339–361.
- Steinbock, A., 1999, “The Problem of Forgetfulness in Michel Henry”, Continental Philosophy Review, 32(3): 271–302.
- Vidalin, A., 2012, Acte du Christ et actes de l’homme. La théologie morale à l’épreuve de la phénoménologie de la vie, Paris: Parole et Silence.
- Yamagata, Y., 2006, “Le langage du sentiment”, in Lavigne 2006: 261–274.
- Zahavi, D., 1999, “Michel Henry and the Phenomenology of the Invisible”, Continental Philosophy Review, 32(3): 223–240.
Special Edition Periodicals
- Philosophie, XV, 1987.
- Les Etudes philosophiques, I, 1988.
- Annales de philosophie de Beyrouth, 16, 1995 & 18, 1997.
- Communio, XXI, 1996.
- Continental Philosophy Review, 32(3), 1999.
- Revue philosophique de la France et de l’étranger, 3, 2001.
- Etudes phénoménologiques, 39–40, 2004.
- Phainomenon, 13, 2006.
- Studia Phaenomenologica, IX, 2009.
- International Journal for Philosophical Studies, 17(3), 2009.
- Cahiers philosophiques de Strasbourg, 30, 2011.
- Cahiers philosophiques, 126(3), 2011.
- Alea. International Journal for Phenomenology and Hermeneutics, 10, 2012
- Journal of French and Francophone Philosophy—Revue de philosophie française et de langue française, XX(2), 2012.
- Revue Internationale Michel Henry (Journal, since 2010).
- Michel Henry kenkyu (Journal in Japanese, since 2011).
- Analecta Hermeneutica, vol. 8, 2016.
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