Empirical Approaches to Moral Character

First published Wed Aug 3, 2016; substantive revision Fri Jun 16, 2023

The turn of the century saw a significant increase in the amount of attention being paid by philosophers to empirical issues about moral character. Dating back at least to Plato and Aristotle in the West, and Confucius in the East, philosophers have traditionally drawn on empirical data to some extent in their theorizing about character. One of the main differences in recent years has been the source of this empirical data, namely the work of social and personality psychologists on morally relevant thought and action.

This entry briefly examines four recent empirical approaches to moral character. It will draw on the psychology literature where appropriate, but the main focus will be on the significance of that work for philosophers interested in better understanding moral character. The four areas are situationism, the CAPS model, the Big Five model, and the VIA. The remainder of this entry devotes a section to each of them.

1. Situationism in Philosophy

In the late 1960s and 70s, what became the situationist movement in psychology took center stage. An intense ‘person-situation debate’ ensued which called into question the existence of traditional personality traits and even the need for the discipline of personality psychology. Writers describing this era called it “traumatic” and “intense”, involving “warfare” and “heated but futile battles” (Mischel 2009: 283, 1999b: 39). By the 1980s, though, many psychologists parted ways with the situationist movement, and today very few would subscribe to the claims that were advanced at that time.

1.1 An Argument Against Aristotelian Virtue Ethics

This entry will not delve into the debate in psychology (see Miller 2014: chapter 4 for extensive discussion). It is mentioned in order to set the stage for the much later situationist movement in philosophy. The main philosophers responsible for jumpstarting this discussion were Gilbert Harman in a series of papers dating back to 1999, and John Doris in several papers and most importantly in his 2002 book, Lack of Character: Personality and Moral Behavior (Harman 1999, 2000, 2001, 2003, 2009; Doris 1998, 2002, 2010; and Merritt et al. 2010. For others supporting their views, see Blackburn 1998: 36–37; Campbell 1999; Hurka 2001: 44; Goldie 2004: chapter 3; Vranas 2005; Appiah 2008: chapter 2; Upton 2009; Badhwar 2009; Sarkissian 2010; and Alfano 2013). Broadly speaking, Harman and Doris used studies and claims that were influential during the situationist movement in psychology, and applied them to debates in contemporary ethical theory. In particular, their focus was on how the empirical data, as they interpreted it, could cause trouble for Aristotelian virtue ethics.

Their broad argumentative strategy proceeded in two stages:

  • Stage One. Draw on studies in psychology to show that people typically do not have what they call global character traits.

  • Stage Two. Show that this is a serious problem for Aristotelian virtue ethics, as well as any other view in normative ethics which is committed in some central way to global character traits.

First we need to clarify what global character traits are before diving into the details of the two stages. According to Doris, global character traits have two main features:

  • Consistency. Character traits are reliably manifested in trait-relevant behavior across a diversity of trait-relevant eliciting conditions that may vary widely in their conduciveness to the manifestation of the trait in question.

  • Stability. Character traits are reliably manifested in trait-relevant behavior over iterated trials of similar trait-relevant eliciting conditions (Doris 2002: 22. A third feature he mentions, evaluative integration, does not factor much into his discussion.).

An example would help. Consider temperance. A person with this trait is expected to exhibit it over time in the same kind of situation, say when eating at restaurants. But she is also expected to exhibit it across situations which are relevant to the trait, such as drinking, sexual activity, and so forth, as well as eating at home, eating at airports, eating with friends, eating alone, and the like. The same is true for other examples of what we might call “traditional” virtues, such as courage, honesty, and kindness. Vices like cruelty and dishonesty count as global character traits as well.

With this background in place, let us turn to the two stages.

1.1.1 Stage One: Against Widespread Possession of Global Character Traits

On the basis of certain studies in psychology, Harman and Doris reasoned roughly as follows (this reconstruction is from Miller 2014: 192):

  • If there is widespread possession of the traditional virtues and vices understood as global character traits, then systematic empirical observation using appropriate psychology experiments will reveal most people behaving in a certain kind of way.
  • However, systematic empirical observation using appropriate psychology experiments fails to reveal that most people act in this kind of way.
  • Therefore, there is not widespread possession of the traditional virtues and vices understood as global character traits (for more, see Doris 1998: 505–507; Merritt et al. 2010: 357–358).

The “behaving in a certain kind of way” is behaving virtuously. This could pertain to behaving virtuously over time in the same situations (stability) or behaving virtuously across situations (cross-situational consistency).

Harman and Doris did not take the experimental evidence to challenge the stability of character traits. As we will see below, they were happy to accept the widespread possession of what they called “local” character traits which are restricted to narrow situations like eating at home. Instead, their focus was on the cross-situational consistency of global traits. There they thought there is good empirical reason to believe most people do not have virtues and vices which exhibit consistent behavior across trait-relevant situations.

One way they could have argued for this was by examining the psychological literature with respect to a variety of different kinds of moral behavior, such as stealing, helping, eating, hurting, and so forth, and seeing whether the data was compatible with the corresponding virtue (or vice). Instead, though, Harman and Doris chose the strategy of focusing in great detail on just one virtue—compassion—and using the literature in psychology on pro-social behavior.

The choice of compassion made a great deal of sense given the state of the empirical literature. There are numerous studies that have been done over the past sixty years on helping behavior, in contrast to other kinds of morally relevant behavior which might pertain to other virtues. Nevertheless, Harman and Doris did not take the conclusion of their argument to apply just to one virtue, and so expected that future studies in other areas of morality, when combined with whatever studies we currently have, would tell a similar story about absent virtue.

Focusing on helping and compassion, here are three of the studies which occupied a central place in their discussion:

  • Dime in the Phone Booth. The psychologists Isen and Levin had an experimental group find a dime in the coin return slot of a phone booth, whereas the control group did not. Individuals in both groups subsequently had a chance to help pick up dropped papers. 88% in the experimental group helped; only 4% in the control group did (Isen and Levin 1972). There were replication problems with this study, but there are many other studies on the effect of mood on helping which found a similar pattern (see Miller 2013: chapter 3).

  • Lady in Distress. In the 1969 “Lady in Distress” experiment, participants heard a loud crash in the next room together with a woman’s scream. It sounded like a bookshelf had topped down on her, and cries of pain quickly followed. The question was whether participants would do anything to help. Those who were by themselves helped 70% of the time. But shockingly, if a participant was in the same room with a stranger who didn’t do anything to respond, helping happened only 7% of the time (Latané and Rodin 1969: 193–195; Latané and Darley 1970: 60–63).

  • Obedience to Authority. Stanley Milgram’s shock experiments are arguably the most famous in the history of psychology. Especially relevant is experiment five, where a participant had to give a test to an innocent person in another room, and turn up a dial with increasingly greater shocks for each wrong answer. At 270 volts, the test taker demanded to be released from the test and was making agonizing screams. At higher levels the pleas became desperate and hysterical. Nevertheless, under pressure from an authority figure, 80% of participants went at least to 270 volts, and 65% went all the way to the 450 volt XXX level, which was a lethal level of shock (so they thought) (Milgram 1974: 60).

Other studies include the Princeton Theological Seminary hurry study (Darley and Batson 1973) and the Zimbardo prison experiment (Haney et al. 1973).

How are these studies supposed to tell against the widespread possession of the virtue of compassion? It isn’t just that they show people behaving less than virtuously in all three experimental situations. After all, when participants found a dime, or when participants were alone in the next room, they did tend to help. In another version of the Milgram setup, when participants at the 150 volt level heard commands from two authority figures which contradicted either other, they immediately stopped at that level or one more level above it (Milgram 1974: 95, 105–107).

Rather, the alleged conflict with the virtue of compassion stems from the apparent failure on behalf of most participants to be appropriately sensitive to the morally relevant considerations. A compassionate person would not exhibit helping which is sensitive in this way to finding a dime, or which is sensitive (in an emergency) to the presence of an unresponsive bystander. Nor would they be so insensitive to the screams and eventual death of a test taker. As Harman and Doris wrote,

both disappointing omissions and appalling actions are readily induced through seemingly minor situations. What makes these findings so striking is just how insubstantial the situational influences that produce troubling moral failures seem to be (Merritt et al. 2010: 357, emphasis theirs; see also Doris 1998: 507, 2002: 2, 28, 35–36; Harman 2003: 90).

It is important to be clear on exactly what Harman and Doris took themselves to be arguing (here drawing on Miller 2014: 193–194). They should not be read as advancing the following:

On metaphysical grounds the property of being compassionate does not exist.

This is a matter of debate for metaphysics, and is not something that these psychology experiments could establish. Furthermore, they should not be read as arguing for the strong empirical claim that:

No human being has ever had any of the traditional virtues or vices such as compassion, either as a matter of psychological necessity or as a matter of contingent fact.

Doris admitted that, as far as the studies themselves showed, there could be a few virtuous and a few vicious people (Doris 2002: 60, 65, 112, 122; see also Vranas 2005: 16).

At the same time, it would be a mistake to think that they were only arguing for an absence of evidence claim like:

Given the psychological evidence, we are not justified in believing on the basis of that evidence that most people possess the traditional virtues or vices such as compassion.

They did indeed accept this, but they also made stronger claims as well. Harman said that, “it may even be the case that there is no such thing as character” (Harman 1999: 328; for recent qualifications, see Harman 2009: 238, 241). Doris argued that, “people typically lack character” (Doris 1998: 506, 2002: 2). In a co-authored article with Maria Merritt they together said that, “Behavior is not typically ordered by robust traits” (Merritt et al. 2010: 358, emphasis theirs).

Here, then, is how to understand their conclusion:

Given the psychological evidence, we are justified in believing on the basis of that evidence that most people do not possess the traditional virtues or vices such as compassion.

With this in mind, let us turn to the second stage of their argument.

1.1.2 Stage Two: The Problem for Aristotelian Virtue Ethics

Harman and Doris took the conclusion that most people do not possess traditional virtues or vices and tried to show that it had problematic consequences for certain positions in ethical theory. Specifically, their main target was a broadly Aristotelian form of virtue ethics, as well as any other theories which made use of empirical claims about global character traits.

Here is Harman first, writing about Aristotelian views:

this sort of virtue ethics presupposes that there are character traits of the relevant sort, that people differ in what character traits they have, and these traits help to explain differences in the way people behave (Harman 1999: 319).

Next here is Doris in his 1998 paper:

Aristotelian virtue ethics, when construed as invoking a generally applicable descriptive psychology…[is] subject to damaging empirical criticism (Doris 1998: 520).

Their shared assumption seems to be that Aristotelians make not only normative but also empirical claims, in particular that the moral virtues and/or vices are widely held by most people (see also Merritt 2000: 366; Sreenivasan 2002: 48, 57, 63; Sabini and Silver 2005: 538). Given that in the first stage they argued this is empirically disconfirmed, it follows that Aristotelian virtue ethics is highly problematic.

In his 2002 book, Doris’s focus seemed to shift. Instead of trying to show that the lack of virtue and vice provided evidence for the falsity of Aristotelian virtue ethics, he instead appeared to take the main upshot to be one about practicality, namely that virtue ethics would no longer be practically relevant for most people who did not have these traits (2002: chapter 6).

Here in this second stage it is hard to pin down exactly how the argument was supposed to go. But Harman and Doris did succeed in generating a lot of interest in these issues, mostly among philosophers who ended up being critical of their work.

The remainder of this section briefly distinguishes seven leading responses to Harman and Doris’s situationist argument, and then concludes with some comments about what our characters might look like if indeed we do not have the traditional virtues.

1.2 Responses to the Argument

The responses are organized based on whether they address the first or the second stage of the Harman and Doris argument.

1.2.1 Responses that Address Stage One

The following responses address the argument against global character traits.

  • Deficiencies of Particular Experiments for Evaluating Character. A natural question to ask is whether the experiments cited by Harman and Doris really do show that most people lack the virtue of compassion. Several philosophers have argued that they do not.

    For instance, Miller (2003) raised questions about Dime in the Phone Booth. Serious concerns have arisen about the Zimbardo prison experiment, with calls to remove it from psychology textbooks (Blum 2018). Others have not been convinced that the Milgram experiments and the Darley and Batson Princeton Seminary experiment shed much light on the possession of compassion (see Sreenivasan 2002: 60–61; Annas 2003: 14 (see Other Internet Resources); Adams 2006: 147; Snow 2010: 103–107, 111–116. For general discussion of this line of response, see Montmarquet 2003: 365–368; Russell 2009: 279–287). Concerning bystander intervention studies like “Lady in Distress,” it could be objected that they are carried out artificially in a lab. In one of the only naturalistic studies of bystander interventions ever conducted, Philpot and colleagues (2019) analyzed 219 CCTV video recordings of aggressive behavior in public urban areas in the Netherlands, South Africa, and the United Kingdom. They found that, “at least one bystander intervened in 90.9% of the situations, with an average of 3.76 interveners per video,” although on the flip side the mean number of bystanders at any given incident was 16.29 (Philpot et al. 2019).

    If a sufficient number of studies are called into question this way, then stage one of the argument would not go through, and hence it would not matter how exactly the second stage of the argument was meant to go (for criticism of this response, see Russell 2009: 279–287).

  • Competing Virtues. This next response can be seen as a different version of the previous one. It calls into question the first stage of the Harman/Doris argument by suggesting that the results of the relevant studies are best interpreted, not as demonstrating a lack of virtue, but rather as suggesting the contribution of competing virtues. Or a weaker version of this response would say that, at the very least, Harman and Doris have not done enough to rule out this hypothesis.

    For instance, instead of saying that the standard Milgram experiment is evidence that most participants did not have the virtue of compassion, perhaps a better interpretation is to say that their compassion was being outweighed by the work of another virtue which seemed at the time to have greater priority (perhaps mistakenly). One candidate for this virtue could be obedience. Or take the Lady in Distress study. Here again participants might have had their compassion outweighed by another virtue, such as trust, as they followed the example of the other person in the room who did not respond. Additional candidates for competing virtues could likewise be found for the other studies that get mentioned in this debate (for discussion see Solomon 2003: 53, 55–56; Kamtekar 2004: 473; Kristjánsson 2008: 64–65; Snow 2010: 106. For criticism see Harman 2003: 91; Prinz 2009: 123; Russell 2009: 282–283, 286).

  • Mental States are Important Too. One claim commonly made in the situationist literature in psychology, was that so-called “situational forces”, as opposed to global character traits or even more familiar folk mental states such as beliefs and desires, are part of the best explanation for our behavior (see for instance Ross and Nisbett 1991: 59; Sabini and Silver 2005: 546–554). In a paper published in the journal Ethics in 2005, the leading psychologists John Sabini and Maury Silver engaged with the work of Harman and Doris by primarily criticizing this claim. Their approach was to reassess the leading studies such as Lady in Distress, in order to show that mental states and perhaps even character traits are indeed central to explaining the results. Summarizing their view, they wrote that,

    People who must act in such circumstances are confused and inhibited by the anticipation of embarrassment, and that we argue is the lesson to be drawn from social psychological research. People are also, we suggest, unaware of how potent fear of embarrassment is as a motivation for behavior (Sabini and Silver 2005: 559).

    Thus in contrast to the claim about situational forces, Sabini and Silver held that psychological causes such as fear of embarrassment are ineliminable from the best explanation and prediction of morally relevant behavior. But they did accept that these studies provide support for the influence of, “features of the immediate situation which are not in themselves of moral significance” (2005: 561). So putting the pieces together, they seemed to hold that psychological dispositions do exist and constitute various character traits, but those character traits end up not being virtuous (for a similar line of response, see Kupperman 2001: 245–247; Solomon 2003: 48, 56; Wielenberg 2006: 471–490; for criticism see Russell 2009: 288; Merritt et al. 2010: 367–369).

  • CAPS. Philosophers such as Nancy Snow and Daniel Russell have made use of the “cognitive-affective personality system” or “CAPS” model in psychology, in developing an Aristotelian response to situationism (Miller 2003; Adams 2006: 131–138; Russell 2009: chapters 8–10; Snow 2010: chapter 1). Because the CAPS model will be covered in the next section, discussion of this response is postponed until then.

1.2.2 Responses that Address Stage Two

The remaining responses address the link from the evidence against global character traits, to the conclusion that Aristotelian virtue ethics is problematic.

  • Rarity. Perhaps the most widely used response by defenders of Aristotelian virtue ethics, the rarity response just denies that any reasonable form of the view is committed to the empirical claim that most people have the virtues. Instead, virtue ethics could be true as a normative theory while as a matter of contingent fact people in a given society are doing a poor job of acquiring the virtues (for a few references among many, see DePaul 1999: 150–153; Miller 2003; Kamtekar 2004: 466; Wielenberg 2006: 490; Russell 2009: 170; for criticism of the response, see Annas 2003 (see Other Internet Resources), 2011: 173; Russell 2009: 284).

    This is not an ad hoc revision to the view designed to defend it against situationist challenges. Plato and Aristotle long ago thought that virtue is rare, as have most philosophers working on character throughout the intervening years (see DePaul 1999 on Plato and Nicomachean Ethics 1099b29–32, 1103b16–31, 1152a30–34, 1179b25–29, 1180a1–5, 15–19). As Aristotle wrote,

    the many naturally obey fear, not shame; they avoid what is base because of the penalties, not because it is disgraceful. For since they live by their feelings, they pursue their proper pleasures and the sources of them, and avoid the opposed pains, and have not even a notion of what is fine and truly pleasant, since they have had no taste of it (Nicomachean Ethics 1179b11–16).

  • Wrong Conception of Aristotelian Character. Some Aristotelians acknowledged that Harman and Doris succeeded in raising problems for the empirical adequacy of a certain picture of character traits, but they complained that this picture is not a sufficiently nuanced and sophisticated Aristotelian one. Hence Rachana Kamtekar wrote,

    the character traits conceived of as debunked by situationist social psychological studies have very little to do with character as it is conceived of in traditional virtue ethics. Traditional virtue ethics offers a conception of character far superior to the one under attack by situationism (Kamtekar 2004: 460; for similar claims, see DePaul 1999: 149–150; Kupperman 2001: 241–243; Annas 2003: 13 (see Other Internet Resources), 2011: 172–176).

    Kamtekar noted several differences. One is that, on the Aristotelian picture, virtues are supposed to be, “dispositions to respond appropriately—in judgment, feeling, and action—to one’s situation” (2004: 477). Furthermore, Aristotle was clear that they require practical wisdom, which is a “disposition to deliberate well about what conduces to the good life in general” (2004: 480). And while the virtues do require cross-situational consistency, this needs to be handled carefully, since it is consistency relative to the individual’s own outlook on life, as shaped by her values, goals, plans, and the like. So to outside observers, someone might be acting very inconsistently, but from her own perspective the pattern of behavior makes perfect sense (2004: 485, for criticism of this response, see Adams 2006: 121; Sosa 2009: 280–283; Merritt et al. 2010: 358–360).

  • Aristotelian Conception of Character is the Wrong Conception. Other participants in this discussion have shown less interest in defending Aristotelian conceptions of character. Instead they wanted to see what non-Aristotelian accounts have to offer, and whether they can better accommodate studies like those cited above. Three examples of philosophers who have gone in this direction are Maria Merritt, who supported a Humean account, Eric Wielenberg, who supported a Kantian account, and Edward Slingerland, who supported a Confucian account (Merritt 2000; Wielenberg 2006: 466, 469; Slingerland 2011).

1.2.3 Conclusion

This is not the place to evaluate these different responses and see which if any of them is the strongest. It is important to note, however, that they should not be treated in isolation. For instance, someone might combine a first stage response such as Mental States are Important Too with a second stage response such as Rarity.

Let me conclude this discussion with two points. First, we should briefly consider what the empirical story about character might look like if we grant that most people do not have the traditional virtues. After all, philosophers can accept that conclusion without having to accept the arguments Harman and Doris offered drawing on the experimental literature. As noted already, Plato and Aristotle both accepted it, as have many others.

Here, then, are a few of the leading options for what a positive story about most people’s actual character might look like:

  • Most people have the vices, such as dishonesty and cowardice, which are global character traits as well. Harman and Doris claim that this position is empirically inadequate too, but not everyone agrees (Bates and Kleingeld 2018).
  • Most people have local character traits, which are virtues and vices restricted to narrow types of situations such as the courtroom or the bar. Harman seems to be amenable to this position, and Doris explicitly accepts it (Doris 1998: 507–508, 2002: 23, 25, 64).
  • Most people have mixed character traits, which are global traits that are neither good enough to qualify as virtues nor bad enough to qualify as vices. They are constituted by some morally positive and some morally negative dispositions. Miller (2013, 2014) develops this position at length.

Clearly much additional work is needed to better understand how our characters are actually put together.

The second point is that discussions in philosophy of situationism are showing no signs of slowing down, even twenty years after Harman and Doris’s original work appeared. A significant development, for instance, has been to extend the debate to the epistemic virtues and vices, with potentially troubling implications arising for certain forms of virtue epistemology (Alfano 2012; Doris and Olin 2014; Alfano and Fairweather 2017). A number of other topics related to situationism remain underexplored (for examples, see Miller 2017).

2. The CAPS Model

One thread left over from the previous section had to do with the so-called “cognitive-affective personality system” or “CAPS” model. It will take a bit of work to introduce the model. But it is worth doing, since CAPS is currently receiving a lot of attention in the situationist literature in philosophy (Miller 2003; Adams 2006: 131–138; Russell 2009: chapters 8–10; Snow 2010: chapter 1). Plus, regardless of its relevance to that literature, the CAPS model might have some important resources of its own to offer as an empirical approach to thinking about character. This section first provides the needed background before turning to some of the philosophical implications.

2.1 Background

Walter Mischel is often hailed as the leader of the situationist movement in psychology, especially in his 1968 book Personality and Assessment. But as he notes in a 1973 paper, that book

has been widely misunderstood to imply that people show no consistencies, that individual differences are unimportant, and that “situations” are the main determinants of behavior (Mischel 1973: 254).

Indeed, he writes, it

would be wasteful to create pseudo-controversies that pit person against situation in order to see which is more important (Mischel 1973: 255–256).

During the subsequent decades, he proceeded to develop what came to be known as the CAPS model, along with the help of Yuichi Shoda and Jack Wright among others (for a leading statement of the model, see Mischel and Shoda 1995). Here we focus on just a few features of the model, in particular cognitive-affective units, if…then…situation-behavior contingencies, psychologically salient features of situations, and intraindividual behavioral signatures.

2.1.1 Cognitive-Affective Units

Cognitive-affective units are the basic building blocks of the CAPS model. They are not global character traits, but rather specific mental states and processes. Here is Mischel’s list from the 1973 paper (Mischel 1973: 265, 275; for an updated version, see Mischel and Shoda 1995: 252):

  • Behavior-outcome and stimulus-outcome expectancies in particular situations
  • Subjective stimulus values
  • Self-regulatory systems and plans
  • Construction competencies
  • Encoding strategies and personal constructs

Despite this sophisticated terminology, what Mischel is referring to is perfectly familiar. The first item has to do with instrumental beliefs (beliefs about the best means to an end), the second with desires, the third with goals and plans, and the final two with general capacities to process incoming information and perform mental and physical behaviors (for further discussion, see Mischel 1973, 1984: 353, 2004: 4–5, 11, 2009: 284; Shoda 1999: 165–171).

2.1.2 If-Then Situation-Behavior Contingencies

If-then situation-behavior contingencies are another central feature of the CAPS model. These contingencies are conditional statements representing some facet of an individual’s personality, where the “if” is a situation and the “then” is a behavior. For example, Mischel and his colleagues studied children’s behavior at a summer treatment camp. They found in one case that if a child was teased by a peer, then he would be unlikely to exhibit verbal aggression. The same was not true, though, for another child (for relevant data from this camp, see Mischel 1984: 361–362; Wright and Mischel 1987; and Shoda et al. 1993, 1994). This difference can be explained by appealing to their different cognitive-affective units. Some children might want to hurt someone who is teasing them, whereas others may want to run away (for more on individual differences in the CAPS model, see Mischel and Shoda 1995: 253, 1998: 237–240, 2008: 211–212). More generally, Mischel and Shoda write that,

Features of situations activate a set of internal reactions—not just cognitive but also affective—based on the individual’s prior experience with those features (Mischel and Shoda 1995: 251).

And those reactions can lead to subsequent behavior.

2.1.3 Nominal versus Psychologically Salient Features of Situations

This distinction is always taken to be central to CAPS, and figures prominently in the recent philosophical literature on character (for two examples, see Russell 2009: chapters 8 to 10; Snow 2010: chapter 1). Psychologically salient features are defined as:

the features of the situation that have significant meaning for a given individual or type, and that are related to the experienced psychological situation—the thoughts and affects and goals that become activated within the personality system (Mischel 2004: 15).

Nominal characteristics are defined as more generic features that third party observers would use in describing a situation, such as the physical location, time, or event. Examples include being at the bowling alley, eating lunch, doing taxes, talking on the computer with Smith, and watching a movie (this distinction is related to the technical terminology in psychology of idiographic versus nomothetic approaches. Very roughly, idiographic approaches use criteria supplied by the participant in question, whereas nomothetic approaches use criteria supply by individuals besides the participant. For careful discussion, see Lamiell 1997).

The idea is that situations might seem very different to observers on the basis of their nominal features, but to the person in question there could be important similarities (or vice versa). For instance, a person could perceive criticism of himself at the bowling alley and the office, and use the same defensive strategies in both cases even though they might seem to be so different in other respects. The more general lesson is that psychologists need to pay attention to both nominal and psychologically salient features of situations when studying personality.

2.1.4 Intraindividual Behavioral Signatures

Putting all these pieces together, we can introduce the next component of the CAPS model, the intraindividual behavioral signature. Rather than focusing on the individual’s behavior in just one situation, the behavioral signature depicts her pattern of behavior across multiple situations. And what individuates the situations is their psychologically relevant features. For instance, Mischel and colleagues came up with behavioral signatures for the children at the summer camp, by examining their aggressive behavior across situations such as peer teasing, “when approached by a peer”, and “when warned by an adult counselor” (Shoda 1999: 160). Not surprisingly, the children tended to behave differently from one situation to the next. Thus the CAPS model,

predicts that the person’s behavior in a domain will change from one situation to another—when the if changes, so will the then—even if the personality system were to remain entirely unchanged (Mischel and Shoda 1995: 257, emphasis theirs).

(For more on behavioral signatures, see Shoda et al. 1994: 675–678, Mischel and Shoda 1995: 249, 251, 255, 258, 1998: 242, 245, 2008: 208, 224, 228, 233.)

Let me stop the presentation of CAPS at this point, although there is much more to the view. Mischel offers a helpful summary of what we have covered thus far:

As the person experiences situations that contain different psychological features, different [cognitive-affective units] and their characteristic interrelationships become activated in relation to these features. Consequently, the activation of [cognitive-affective units] changes from one time to another and from one situation to another…Although cognitions and affects that are activated at a given time change, how they change, that is, the sequence and pattern of their activation, remains stable, reflecting the stable structure of the organization within the system. The result is a distinctive pattern of if…then…relations, or behavioral signatures, manifested as the individual moves across different situations (2004: 11, emphasis his).

With this in mind, let us now turn to some of the philosophical implications.

2.2 Philosophical Relevance of CAPS

Leaving aside the situationism debate for a moment, is there anything in the CAPS model, at least as presented above, which could be relevant to philosophers working on character? To address this question, we first need to connect CAPS to character traits, as nothing thus far in this section has explicitly mentioned traits.

Mischel and company are not very helpful when it comes to making this connection. They say different things about traits in different places, sometimes wanting to distance themselves from traits and other times seeming to embrace them. When they do embrace them, they understand them in different ways, for instance as causal dispositions (in some passages) or as mere summaries of past behavior (in other places).

Rather than get bogged down in textual interpretation of Mischel’s work, we can simply note that there appears to be a straightforward path from the CAPS model to the acceptance of character traits understood as causal dispositions to think, feel, and act in various ways (see Mumford 1998: 182; Kamtekar 2004: 472, 477; Adams 2006: 131–138; Badhwar 2009: 279; Russell 2009: xii, 172, 292–293, 330; Sosa 2009: 279; Lukes 2009: 292). We have seen that the CAPS model already accepts dispositions to form, say, instrumental beliefs, desires, values, and goals. These were among the “cognitive-affective units”. These units tend to be relatively enduring psychological structures in a person’s mind, they are sensitive to their own activating conditions, and, upon being activated, they serve to cause the formation of occurrent mental states like beliefs and (other things being equal) behavior. They are also the basis for true “if…then…” conditionals, as we saw earlier.

To take an example, I am disposed to be afraid of rats. So if one lands on my bed, I am likely to run away (to say the least). Upon seeing a rat, my fear of rats would be triggered, leading to an occurrent feeling of fear of this rat at this particular moment, which connects with other mental goings-on that together lead me to run.

This last bit about other mental goings-on is important. My disposition to fear rats is connected to all kinds of other psychological dispositions, such as a disposition to believe that rats carry diseases and that I should run away from them, a desire to not catch any diseases from rats, and so forth. In other words, the CAPS model accepts that there are clusters of interrelated mental state dispositions, and that upon being activated they cause multiple occurrent thoughts and feelings to be formed. As Mischel and Shoda write,

cognitive-affective representations and affective states interact dynamically and influence each other reciprocally. It is the organization of the relationships among them that forms the core of the personality structure and that guides and constrains their effects (2008: 211, see also 212, 219, 233).

These clusters are typically not fleeting, they can explain the true “if…then…” conditionals, and they are manifest in the person’s behavioral signature over time. So if I see a rat on my bed, I will tend to behave a certain way. Similarly if a few months later I see a rat in the kitchen, and so forth.

But now that we have clusters of psychological dispositions, we have everything we need for a person to have moral character traits too. For we can just equate a moral character trait with a cluster of cognitive-affective units which pertain to a given moral domain (as Mischel seems willing to do in some places; see Mischel and Shoda 1995: 257; Mischel 1999a: 456). Furthermore, they will be traits with causal powers, since the psychological dispositions which are their components have causal powers. Plus they can be global character traits too—they can be activated in a variety of different situations. In my simple example, the cluster of psychological dispositions associated with my seeing rats can be activated in situations ranging from the office to the pool to the bedroom. The same could be true for clusters which are more centrally morally relevant. But it is also important to note that the CAPS model by itself does not entail that there are global traits—one could accept only highly narrow or local traits instead. This is an empirical matter.

Hence it appears that philosophers may have found a rich psychological model to use in helping them to develop a more empirically informed account of character traits. This model would allow for character traits to exist, and for them to be widespread, have causal powers, and be grounded in enduring psychological structures which are already familiar from the philosophy of mind.

Two points of caution are worth making, though. The first concerns the relevance of CAPS in responding to situationism. As we just noted, the CAPS model does not by itself support the widespread possession of global as opposed to local character traits. Furthermore, even if we just focus on global character traits, the model does not—by itself—provide any reason to think that the character traits most people have are the traditional moral virtues like honesty. They could be moral vices, or mixed traits, or something else altogether. So it turns out that Harman and Doris could accept much of the CAPS model, and still advance the first stage of their situationist argument for the conclusion that most people do not have the traditional moral virtues.

Secondly, while it would take more space than is available here to properly explore, another reason for caution about the relevance of CAPS has to do with whether it provides much of a theoretical advance over commonsense folk psychology about the mind. The language of cognitive-affective units, if…then…situation-behavior contingencies, psychologically salient features of situations, and intraindividual behavioral signatures might sound impressive, but stripped away of this jargon, the model might not have much new to offer to philosophers. Even some psychologists have expressed this worry. For instance John Johnson, in a 1999 commentary in European Journal of Personality, wrote:

One limitation of the CAPS model is its failure to advance our scientific understanding of personality dynamics beyond how we already understand human action from common sense. As far as I can tell, the labeling and re-labeling of desires, beliefs, and abilities has simply reflected the psychological jargon popular at that point in history…I am surprised and somewhat depressed about the enthusiasm for the CAPS model, but not because the model is wrong. The problem is that settling for this model indicates that we are content to merely re-label common sense concepts with jargon, as opposed to developing a truly scientific model of personality dynamics (Johnson 1999: 449–450).

Johnson focused here on the cognitive-affective units, but his claims apply more generally to the rest of the CAPS model.

None of this calls into question the truth of the CAPS model. It just raises a concern about how much of an advance the model will prove to be to philosophers working on character, if it turns out to not offer any additional theoretical insights, explanatory resources, or novel predictions beyond what philosophers can infer based on their own careful reflection on folk psychology (for much more on these issues, see Miller 2016).

3. The Big Five

Back to psychology for a moment. As time went on, the situationist movement ended up not ushering in the downfall of the study of personality. In fact, global character traits have come to dominate the field of personality psychology. The primary reason for this has been the emergence of the Big Five or Five-Factor model. Today the Big Five personality traits are all the rage, with thousands of papers appearing in journals in recent years. Now one sees the study of global personality traits described in terms of a “renaissance” with “real progress toward consensus” after “decades of floundering” (McCrae and Costa 2003: 21, 20, 2008: 159).

Surprisingly, though, philosophers have said almost nothing about the Big Five (for exceptions see Doris 2002: 67–71; Snow 2010: 11–12; Slingerland 2011: 397; Miller 2014: chapter 6). This section first provides some background from the psychology literature, before raising some relevant philosophical issues.

3.1 Background

The Big Five model is a taxonomy of personality traits. But before jumping into the details, something should be said, even if too briefly, about the relationship between personality traits and character traits. Strikingly, for many decades in the twentieth century, psychologists rarely invoked the language of “character traits,” although in recent years this has been changing. The historical story is complex and beyond the scope of this article, but one factor responsible for this aversion was the rise of positivism and its dismal of value-laden concepts from scientific investigation, with “character” begin regarded as one such concept. Another factor was the rise of situationism in social psychology and its related skepticism about the empirical adequacy of traditional character traits (for more see Peterson and Seligman 2004: 55–9).

Such factors do not play as much of a role in the recent history of psychology, but questions remain about how to classify traits, especially personality and character traits. On one approach, for instance, they are the very same thing. A trait like extraversion would be both a personality trait and a character trait. An alternative approach, and one likely favored by philosophers working on character, is to claim that character traits are only one kind of personality trait. How then would we distinguish between character versus non-character personality traits?

There are several answers that can be given, but no consensus about what is the right one. One answer is to say that the key issue is responsibility; a character trait is a personality trait for which a person who possesses it is (at least to some degree) responsible for doing so. Another answer is to say that the key issue has to do with normative standards; a character trait is a personality trait for which a person who has it is, in that respect, an appropriate object of normative assessment by the relevant norms (for details about these approaches, see Miller 2014: chapter one).

But instead of unpacking these issues more, let’s turn to the Big Five directly. Starting mainly in the 1980s, psychologists arrived at the Big Five taxonomy using two different paths (McCrae and John 1992: 181–187; Goldberg 1993: 30; for a review of earlier work, see John et al. 2008a). Lewis Goldberg is most famously associated with the first. He held that we can learn about personality traits from ordinary language, as over long periods of time the way we speak is shaped by the different ways people tend to be. Here is one statement of his so-called “lexical hypothesis”:

The most promising of the empirical approaches to systematizing personality differences have been based on one critical assumption: Those individual differences that are of the most significance in the daily transactions of persons with each other will eventually become encoded in their language…[this] has a highly significant corollary: The more important is an individual difference in human transactions, the more languages will have an item for it (Goldberg 1981: 141–142, see also Saucier and Goldberg 1996b).

Using this idea, Goldberg compiled long lists of trait words found in ordinary language. These are three adjectives from his 1992 list of 100 Unipolar Markers (Goldberg 1992: 41):

  • Fearful
  • Fretful
  • Generous

To pare down his list, Goldberg asked study participants to rate from 1 (extremely inaccurate) to 9 (extremely accurate) how well a particular trait described themselves or others. Then using factor analysis, Goldberg could see which trait adjectives are closely related to each other, thereby making it reasonable to posit a “factor” or “latent variable” which could serve as a more fundamental underlying trait (Goldberg 1990, 1992, 1993 and Saucier and Goldberg 1996a; for an introduction to factor analysis in psychology, see Leary 2004: 187–192). Fearful and fretful, not surprisingly, were highly correlated, and were categorized under the heading of “neuroticism” in the Big Five.

A separate line of research also arrived at the Big Five taxonomy. Here the idea was not to use trait adjectives, but rather to give participants entire sentences to use as part of a personality questionnaire. That way, some confusion could be avoided if, for example, they did not know what a word like “fretful” meant.

While there are many personality questionnaire used in Big Five research (such as the NEO-FFI, HEXACO, TDA, BFAS, and BFI), it appears that the NEO-PI-R, developed by the prominent personality psychologists Robert McCrae and Paul Costa, continues to be the most popular choice. Here are three examples of items participants might have to respond to in taking it (NEO-PI-R Item Booklet-Form S: 3):

  • I am easily frightened.
  • I don’t get much pleasure from chatting with people.
  • I don’t take civic duties like voting very seriously.

They would be asked to respond on a 1 to 5 scale anchored on strongly disagree to strongly agree. Factor analysis would then be run on this questionnaire data as well.

Many more analyses have been performed with both adjective and questionnaire data, and using self, friend, spouse, employer, and expert reports (McCrae 1982; McCrae and Costa 1987; Piedmont 1998: 52–56, chapter 5). Extensive cross-cultural work has also been done with the items being translated into dozens of languages (McCrae and Costa 1997; Piedmont 1998: 43–46, 73–74; Caprara and Cervone 2000: 73–75). What often seems to emerge are five basic or core personality traits (for a very helpful review, see John et al. 2008a):

  • Extraversion (also labeled Surgency, Energy, Enthusiasm)
  • Agreeableness (also labeled Altruism, Affection)
  • Conscientiousness (also labeled Constraint, Control of Impulse)
  • Neuroticism (also labeled Emotional Instability, Negative Emotionality, Nervousness)
  • Openness (also labeled Intellect, Culture, Originality, Open-Mindedness)

If it turns out that these five core personality traits are cross-culturally universal, then for any given person, you can capture much (some Big Five researchers would even say all) of her personality by determining her standing on these five dimensions. In a large group of people, you would naturally expect to see differences in their comparative standings, with some individuals being high on agreeableness and others not, for instance.

It is important to note that in recent years some empirical challenges have emerged about the cross-cultural universality of the Big Five. This includes divergent findings in some locations in Africa (Thalmayer et al. 2020, 2021), South America (Gurven et al. 2013), and South Asia (Kunnel et al. 2019). Doubts have been expressed more generally about the applicability of the framework to non-WEIRD (western, educated, industrialized, rich, and democratic) populations (Laajaj 2019), and a computational model has been developed to explain cross-cultural differences in personality (Smaldino et al. 2019).

In cases where you can arrive at Big Five personality ratings for a given person, studies have found that you can also use those ratings to predict other important information about the person as well, including what kinds of thoughts, behavior, and consequences of her behavior you might expect to see (for helpful reviews, Ozer and Benet-Martínez 2006; Roberts et al. 2007; Funder 2007: chapter 7; John et al. 2008a: 141–143). For example, those who are high in conscientiousness have been found to avoid risky behaviors (Bogg and Roberts 2004) and to have greater success on various job performance criteria (Mount and Barrick 1998). In contrast, high neuroticism predicts job dissatisfaction and criminal behavior (perhaps not surprisingly) (Ozer and Benet-Martínez 2006).

The five personality traits in the Big Five taxonomy do not, however, constitute the only personality traits. With respect to each of these traits, researchers have identified various sub-traits or “facets” that are less broad and are said to have the advantage of being more accurate. Unfortunately, when it comes to the facet level of traits, there is a lot more controversy in the literature, including how many facets there are for each of the Big Five traits as well as what to call them (Costa and McCrae 1995: 24–27; McCrae and Costa 2003: 47; Ozer and Benet-Martínez 2006: 403; Crowe et al. 2018). Here, though, is one widely used version from McCrae and Costa’s work, which appeals to 30 facets (Costa and McCrae 1995: 28):

Neuroticism Anxiety, Angry Hostility, Depression, Self-Consciousness, Impulsiveness, Vulnerability
Extraversion Warmth, Gregariousness, Assertiveness, Activity, Excitement Seeking, Positive Emotions
Openness to Experience Fantasy, Aesthetics, Feelings, Actions, Ideas, Values
Agreeableness Trust, Straightforwardness, Altruism, Compliance, Modesty, Tender-Mindedness
Conscientiousness Competence, Order, Dutifulness, Achievement Striving, Self-Discipline, Deliberation

Recall that McCrae and Costa were the ones who developed the NEO-PI-R personality survey, which has 240 items. Not by accident, 8 items are specifically tailored to measure each of these facets. As examples, “I keep my belongings neat and clean” and “I like to keep everything in its place so I know just where it is” fall under the heading of the consciousness facet of order (Costa and McCrae 1992: 73).

There is much more to the Big Five approach than can be covered here, but let’s move on to its relevance to philosophical issues about character (for helpful reviews of the Big Five model, see McCrae and John 1992; Goldberg 1993; Piedmont 1998; McCrae and Costa 2003: chapters 2 and 3; John et al. 2008a).

3.2 Philosophical Relevance of the Big Five

On the surface, the Big Five taxonomy might seem to be a very promising resource for philosophers working on the virtues, whether from within a virtue ethical framework or not. However, there are at least four reasons to be cautious about the relevance of this taxonomy to philosophical discussions of moral character.

First, moral character traits are strikingly absent from the Big Five, even at the facet level. Modesty and altruism are there, to be sure, but what about justice or honesty or courage? Any taxonomy which leaves them out will not be of much use to moral philosophers.

To be fair, the psychologists Ashton and Lee have long argued that the Big Five list of traits is incomplete. They have added a sixth personality dimension called “honesty/humility”, which has four facets for sincerity, fairness, greed-avoidance, and modesty (Ashton and Lee 2001, 2005, 2020; Lee and Ashton 2004). And their HEXACO personality assessment instrument has become widely used among personality psychologists. Relevant to the point at hand, this six trait taxonomy does a much better job of capturing moral traits, although it too is incomplete (what about gratitude or courage?).

Suppose further additions were made to get to a complete taxonomy. The second worry that arises is methodological. Measures of Big Five traits are questionnaire measures. Unfortunately, the items used tend to have questionable relevance to the traditional moral virtues. Consider, for instance, the agreeableness facet of “altruism”, which researchers tend to characterize in a way that makes it sound quite close to the virtue of compassion (Costa and McCrae 1992: 18). Here are the questionnaire items for altruism from McCrae and Costa’s NEO-PI-R (where “R” is for a reversed item) (Costa and McCrae 1992: 72):

  • Some people think I’m selfish and egotistical. (R)
  • I try to be courteous to everyone I meet.
  • Some people think of me as cold and calculating. (R)
  • I generally try to be thoughtful and considerate.
  • I’m not known for my generosity. (R)
  • Most people I know like me.
  • I think of myself as a charitable person.
  • I go out of my way to help others if I can.

Four of the items are concerned with the impressions we make on others and how they think of us, rather than how we ourselves are. Arguably two of them are better connected to manners and politeness, and one to social liking, with not one item assessing altruistic motivation. Indeed, only the final item asks directly about helping behavior at all.

Not to mention that questionnaires, even with better items for assessing the virtues, are considered by many philosophers to have limited value. Among several weaknesses, they omit the role of subconscious processes in influencing behavior, and could instead reflect a person’s significantly misinformed understanding of her own character.

The third reason for philosophers to be cautious about adapting work on the Big Five to the study of moral character is also methodological. On at least one way of understanding the Big Five taxonomy, it classifies people, not on the basis of whether they have traits like extraversion or not, but rather on the basis of the degree to which they have these traits. In other words, it assumes that everyone has the trait of extraversion, and the main question is only to what extent a given individual comes out on the extraversion scale. What goes for extraversion also applies to introversion. Everyone has that trait too.

In fact, it is going to follow, at least on this particular way of unpacking the Big Five approach, that everyone has all the traits there are, at least to some degree or other. If we extend the Big Five taxonomy to include all the moral character traits as well, then everyone will be virtuous to some degree. But that is not all. Everyone will also be vicious to some degree as well. This will be true, even with respect to opposing virtues and vices such as courage and cowardice.

Many moral philosophers are likely going to be concerned about how helpful such an approach will be to their own work on character. For they typically accept the following assumption:

  • (A1) A person cannot have the virtue of honesty and the opposing vice of dishonesty as part of her character at the same time.

But that assumption is rejected in this research. Furthermore, many philosophers would also accept that:

  • (A2)Virtues and vices are threshold concepts.

What this means is that not everyone’s character automatically qualifies as having a given virtue or vice. There are normative standards that a character trait has to meet to be “good enough” to count as a virtue or “bad enough” to count as a vice. But again this assumption is violated by the Big Five taxonomy, at least as understood above.

Amongst philosophers, Aristotle for instance clearly endorses both of these assumptions. Virtue is rare on his view, and most people fail to meet the relevant requirements. Plus vice is diametrically opposed to virtue. Virtue ethicists in the Aristotelian tradition would follow him in accepting (A1) and (A2) (for further discussion of these assumptions, see Miller 2019a).

Now this is not at all to criticize this particular version of the Big Five approach. Given what it aims to do in personality psychology, it has clearly been a very rich and important approach. The only point here is that it may be ill-suited for incorporation into philosophical discussions of character.

There is a fourth and final reason why this might be true. Many philosophers, especially those working in the Aristotelian tradition, understand character traits to be metaphysically real dispositions with causal powers of their own that give rise to relevant thoughts and, in turn, to trait relevant actions. The trait of honesty, for example, is a real feature of an honest person’s psychology which, when triggered, can lead to the formation of honest occurrent thoughts and feelings. It can figure into causal explanations for action, and can be a reliable basis for predicting future behavior.

Up to this point, the metaphysical status of traits on the Big Five approach has not been specified. It turns out that there is some disagreement about this amongst personality psychologists, but the clear majority position seems to be that they do not have any metaphysical existence. The leading Big Five psychologists Oliver John, Richard Robins, Lewis Goldberg, Gerard Saucier, Robert Hogan, Jerry Wiggins, Paul Trapnell, Laura Naumann, and Christopher Soto all seem to hold this view (John and Robins 1994: 138–139; Goldberg and Saucier 1995: 221; Saucier and Goldberg 1996b: 24–25, 34, 43; Hogan 1991, 1996; Wiggins and Trapnell 1996; John et al. 2008: 140). McCrae and Costa seems to be two of the rare exceptions in holding a causal view of Big Five traits (McCrae and Costa 2003, 2008).

If Big Five traits are not real entities with causal powers, then what are they? The standard view is that they are just descriptive labels for how people tend to be. Put differently, they are useful devices—terms of classification—which are far more economical to use than is appealing to the thousands of trait terms in the English language. Grouping people into only five categories is thus highly efficient (Hogan 1996: 170–173; McCrae and Costa 2003: 36), but it is a further step to say that there actually is a trait of extraversion which causally explains individual differences between people. As Daniel Ozer and Steven Reise note, the Big Five taxonomy,

provides a useful taxonomy, a hierarchical coordinate system, for mapping personality variables. The model is not a theory; it organizes phenomena to be explained by theory (1994: 360–361).

In particular, it does not specify what the actual psychological processes are which lead people to act the way that they do.

But again, all of this is much less interesting to the moral philosopher than it is to the personality psychologist. The moral philosopher working on character typically wants to know about the psychological processes involved in virtue and vice, as well as whether most people do or do not have such traits understood as causal dispositions. The Big Five approach won’t be of much help in furthering that kind of work.

4. Positive Psychology and the VIA

Of the four approaches to the empirical study of character that we are examining here, the one coming out of the positive psychology movement is the most recent. That movement itself only really got going at the turn of the century, and character traits were one part of a much larger focus that will not concern us here (for overviews of positive psychology, see Snyder and Lopez 2009; Moneta 2014; Lopez et al. 2015). As before, we need some background first before we get to the philosophical implications.

4.1 Background

The canonical approach to character traits in positive psychology is found in Character Strengths and Virtues: A Handbook and Classification, edited by Christopher Peterson and Martin Seligman and published in 2004. Peterson and Seligman, with the help of over 50 leading scholars working on character, put together a classification of character traits which they saw as a “manual of the sanities” (2004: 4) by focusing on psychological health rather than illness, as so much of the field had done prior to the positive psychology movement.

To develop their classification, they scoured writings from traditions such as Confucianism, Buddhism, ancient Greek philosophy, and medieval Islam. They examined lists of traits from Charlemagne, Benjamin Franklin, the Boy and Girl Scouts, Hallmark greeting cards, and Pokémon characters (2004: 15, 33–52). Naturally they came up with a huge list of traits, and needed some criteria to use to pare them down. Here are the 10 criteria they came up with (2004: 17–27):

  1. A strength contributes to various fulfillments that constitute the good life, for oneself and for others.
  2. Each strength is morally valued in its own right, even in the absence of obvious beneficial outcomes.
  3. The display of a strength by one person does not diminish other people in the vicinity.
  4. Being able to phrase the “opposite” of a putative strength in a felicitous way counts against regarding it as a character strength.
  5. It should be traitlike in the sense of having a degree of generality across situations and stability across time.
  6. The strength is distinct from other positive traits in the classification and cannot be decomposed into them.
  7. The character strength is embodied in consensual paragons.
  8. An additional criterion where sensible is the existence of prodigies with respect to the strength.
  9. The existence of people who show—selectively—the total absence of a given strength.
  10. The larger society provides institutions and associated rituals for cultivating strengths and virtues and then for sustaining their practice.

Using these criteria, Peterson and Seligman arrived at a classification with 6 “virtues” and 24 “character strengths”, which today goes by the name of the Values in Action or VIA classification. Virtues are defined as “core characteristics valued by moral philosophers and religious thinkers” (2004: 13). Character strengths are:

the psychological ingredients—processes or mechanisms—that define the virtues. Said another way, they are distinguishable routes to displaying one or another of the virtues (2004: 13).

Together the virtues and character strengths make up the official VIA classification (2004: 29–30):

Wisdom Creativity
Love of Learning
Courage Bravery
Humanity Love
Social Intelligence
Justice Citizenship
Temperance Forgiveness and Mercy
Transcendence Appreciation of Beauty and Excellence

Naturally Peterson and Seligman have a great deal to say in clarifying what each of these means. But here it is important to keep a few more general points in mind.

First, Peterson and Seligman are explicit that they do not think this classification is exhaustive, and are open to additions or deletions (2004: 13; see also Peterson and Park 2009: 27). Second, they acknowledge that “In some cases, the classification of a given strength under a core virtue can be debated” (Peterson and Seligman 2004: 28, 31). And finally, they “regard these strengths as ubiquitously recognized and valued, although a given individual will rarely, if ever, display all of them” (2004: 13).

Research making use of the VIA has been extensive, with many studies in particular looking at correlations between particular character strengths and other variables like health and educational success (for a review, see Niemiec 2013). Peterson and Seligman have also developed several assessment tools for character strengths, the main one of which is the VIA-IS. This 240 item measure uses a 5-point Likert scale anchored on “very much like me” and “very much unlike me” (2004: 629). Some example of its items include (2004: 629):

  • I am never too busy to help a friend. [kindness]
  • I always keep my promises. [integrity]
  • I have great difficulty accepting love from anyone. [love]

Anyone can take the survey for free at the VIA Institute for Character website (see the Other Internet Resources) and learn what their “signature strengths” are.

As always, there is much more to be said, but let us turn to the philosophical relevance.

4.2 Philosophical Relevance of Positive Psychology and the VIA

Philosophers might initially have some questions about the VIA classification. Where, for instance, is the virtue of patience? Or self-respect? Why does humor fall under the virtue of transcendence (for more questions like these, see Kristjánsson 2013: 151–152)?

These are good questions, but not serious problems. For as we saw Peterson and Seligman were the first to admit that their classification could need revision. If anything, these questions might help to make the VIA even better.

A larger revision will be demanded by many Aristotelians, namely that the list of virtues include practical wisdom (Kristjánsson 2013: chapter 7). On traditional Aristotelian approaches, practical wisdom is necessary for the possession of any virtue. Leaving it off the list would be a serious omission, but again there is nothing about Peterson and Seligman’s framework that would preclude it from being added (for more on practical wisdom, see Russell 2009; Miller forthcoming).

In fact, on the face of it philosophers should be quite amenable to this framework, and be interested in incorporating it into their thinking about character. For unlike the Big Five, the VIA is focused specifically on character traits, rather than personality traits in general (Peterson and Park 2009: 26–27). And while there might be a few omissions, it is remarkably comprehensive. Plus, unlike most advocates of the Big Five, Peterson, Seligman, and their colleagues seem to be more comfortable describing character traits on metaphysical grounds as dispositions with causal powers.

But caution is needed here (for a number of concerns, see Miller 2019b). For the VIA, unlike the other three approaches examined in this entry, was not arrived at empirically. As Peterson noted in a later article, “Our classification of character strengths under core virtues is a conceptual scheme and not an empirical claim” (Peterson and Park 2009: 31). We saw already that it is a theoretical classification derived from the writings of philosophers, religious thinkers, and famous exemplars of good character, as well as more popular level expressions of character in greeting cards and games (Peterson and Seligman 2004: 9–10). Furthermore, Peterson and Seligman are explicit that they aligned their approach with virtue ethics (2004: 10).

Unfortunately, subsequent empirical tests of the VIA have raised problems. MacDonald and colleagues (2008) found that four factors, rather than the six in the VIA, best fit the questionnaire data. McGrath (2014) found support for five factors. Noftle and his colleagues (2011) used confirmatory factor analysis to test existing six factor, five factor, four factor, and one factor models, and could not find support for any of them (2011: 212). They concluded that,

Although it is possible that an alternative model that was not tested could capture the structure of the VIA scales, it seems more likely that the VIA simply does not have a clear hierarchical structure (2011: 212).

See also the recent three virtue classification by McGrath 2015.

So it is not clear that the VIA is an empirically adequate framework for thinking about character. It might have contributions to make in other ways, but if the goal is for philosophers to be able to draw on psychological research about character that is empirically informed, then clearly more work is needed here.

Two other concerns arise as well. The first is methodological, in that like the assessment measures for the Big Five, the VIA-IS is a questionnaire measure which gathers self and other reports. When it comes to character, philosophers are often worried about how much questionnaires can tell us about what our characters are really like.

The other concern is more conceptual. The VIA classification as developed by Peterson and Seligman only appeals to positive character traits. Strikingly absent are the vices (Kristjánsson 2013: 7, 153). It may be an admirable goal to try to get psychologists to pay more attention to psychological health rather than illness, but that can be done without dropping the vices entirely from one’s classification. Adding them, though, by canvassing once again all the same philosophical, religious, and cultural resources, will require another herculean undertaking on a par with what Peterson and Seligman did in their 2004 handbook.

5. Conclusion

This entry has briefly reviewed and critically evaluated four different approaches which draw on empirical psychology to aid us in thinking about issues of character. The amount of attention given here to each of them is in line with discussions in the philosophy literature. Philosophers in their writings have paid by far the most attention to situationism followed by the CAPS model, with the Big Five and the VIA classifications hardly getting mentioned at all. This is in direct contrast to the current landscape in psychology, especially personality psychology. Perhaps it is time for philosophers to shift their attention accordingly.


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Work on this entry was supported by a grant from the Templeton Religion Trust. The statements made here are those of the author and are not necessarily endorsed by the Templeton Religion Trust. Sections 1, 2, and 3 are drawn from Miller 2014, with permission of Oxford University Press, and have been revised for this entry. Thanks to Mark Timmons for catching several typos, and to two readers, one for suggesting that there be some clarification of the personality versus character trait distinction, and the other for providing very helpful citations on cross-cultural variation in findings pertaining to the Big Five

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Christian B. Miller <millerc@wfu.edu>

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