Supplement to Neutral Monism

Reducing Mind and Matter to Neutral Entities

One of the ways in which the reduction of mind to matter is pursued proceeds in two steps. First, an analysis of mental state concepts in terms of functional roles. Second, the identification of mental states with those physical states that are empirically discovered to occupy the functional roles described in the first step.[S1]

Traditional neutral monism can be viewed as engaged in a similar, but more ambitious, reductive project. The goal is to reduce mind and matter to something that is neither mental nor physical. The three traditional neutral monists conceive of mind and matter in functional terms.[S2] Not the substance of which it is composed, but the role it plays, determines the nature of a given type of thing. James’s notorious denial of consciousness (James 1904b) applies only to consciousness understood as some sort of “aboriginal stuff or quality of being”. But he “insist[s] most emphatically that it [the word ‘consciousness’] does stand for a function” (James 1904b, 3). And Russell’s remarks about electrons are marked by the same functionalist spirit, this time applied to matter:

We know it [the electron] only as a hypothetical entity fulfilling certain theoretical purposes. So far as theoretical physics is concerned, anything that fulfills these purposes can be taken to be the electron. It may be simple or complex; and, if complex, it may be built out of any components that allow the resultant structure to have the requisite properties. (Russell 1959: 22–23)[S3]

But thinking about the mental and the physical in terms of function does raise a further question about “stuff”: something, some stuff, must function in the relevant ways. What are the occupants of the functional roles in terms of which mental and physical concepts are defined? The neutral monists answer that groups of neutral entities, appropriately interrelated, play these functional roles. And that is to say that these groups of neutral entities are the things to which mental and physical concepts apply. In this way the neutral monists aim to perform a functionalist role-occupant reduction of the mental and the physical to the neutral.

The proposal to read the traditional neutral monists are role-occupant reductionists is debatable. None of the traditional neutral monists frame their project in these terms. But the ideas that underlie this form of reduction are present in the thought of all of them. The model fits the ideas of Mach and James particularly well. And while the model captures much of the spirit of Russell’s thought, it will be seen (see section 4.3.1) that certain aspects of Russell’s method of logical construction cannot be accommodated in this framework. The most striking difference between Russell’s constructionism and the model of role occupant reduction presented here is this: though Russell does pick out—via the method of logical construction—complex structures of neutral entities that play the relevant mental and physical roles, he refrains from identifying these structures with the mental and physical entities that were supposed to play these functional roles. Those entities may or may not exist. He takes no stand on this question. All that matters to Russell is that there is a set of entities—the logically constructed entities—that play the relevant mental and physical roles. Whether there are, in addition, mental and physical entities, as traditionally conceived, we cannot tell.

Copyright © 2016 by
Leopold Stubenberg

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