Peter John Olivi

First published Tue Nov 2, 1999; substantive revision Mon Apr 24, 2017

Peter John Olivi was one of the most original and interesting philosophers and theologians of the thirteenth century. Although not as clear and systematic as Thomas Aquinas, and not as brilliantly analytical as John Duns Scotus, Olivi’s ideas are equally original and provocative, and their philosophical value is nowadays recognized among the specialists in medieval philosophy. He is probably best known for his psychological theories, especially his voluntarist conception of the freedom of the will, but his influence extends also to other areas of philosophy, from metaphysics to practical philosophy.

1. Life and Work

Olivi (ca. 1248–1298) was born in Sérignan, in the Languedoc region of southern France. He entered the Franciscan order at the age of twelve, studied in Paris from 1267 to about 1272 (during the final years of Bonaventure’s generalate) without becoming a master of theology, and spent the remainder of his life teaching at various Franciscan houses of study in southern France, with a stay in Florence from 1287–89. (For biographical details, see Burr 1976 and 1989, and especially Piron 1998, 1999, 2006a.) Olivi’s outspoken originality led him into conflict with religious authorities: his writings were condemned by the Franciscan authorities in 1283, and although he was later rehabilitated by the new minister general Matthew of Aquasparta, he remained a controversial figure. He spent the rest of his life as a lector at Montpellier and Narbonne. Soon after his death the Franciscan order renewed the prohibition on reading or retaining his works. Although his philosophical views were controversial, what proved to be fatal was his reputation within the so-called “Spiritual” reform movement of the Franciscan order. Olivi’s understanding of the Franciscan vow and poverty became influential among the spiritualists, and after his death he was venerated by fervent laymen in Languedoc. When Church officials took action against the spiritual movement, Olivi’s reputation suffered a blow, which obviously limited the influence he would have on posterity. (See Burr 1989, 1993, 2001.)

Olivi produced a large and wide-ranging body of work, much of which has survived. By far the most important philosophical text is his Summa of questions on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, a massive work he began writing soon after leaving Paris and redacted to its final form in the mid-1290s. This masterpiece of medieval philosophy remains still largely untranslated, and edited only in part. Olivi’s views on metaphysics and human nature are mostly found in his questions on Bk. II (ed. Jansen, 1922–26). Material on the virtues is found in Bk. III (ed. Emmen and Stadter, 1981). Other philosophically relevant works include his Quodlibeta from 1289–95 (ed. Defraia, 2002), a set of questions on logic (ed. Brown, 1986), and the Questions on Evangelical Perfection. Many of his biblical commentaries, the historically significant Commentary on the Apocalypse, and various texts pertaining to his condemnation have survived and are available in modern editions. (For a recent list of editions, see König-Pralong et al. 2010.) In this article we will focus on just a few of Olivi’s interesting philosophical views, concentrating especially on his philosophical psychology.

2. Human Freedom

Olivi devotes several extended questions of his Summa to the topic of human freedom, beginning with the question of whether human beings even have free will (liberum arbitrium). Olivi’s own argument for the affirmative begins by listing seven pairs of attitudes (affectus), each of which testifies to the existence of free will (Q57, p. 317):

  1. Zeal and mercy
  2. Friendship and hostility
  3. Shame and glory
  4. Gratitude and ingratitude
  5. Subjugation and domination
  6. Hope and distrust
  7. Carefulness and heedlessness

Each of these attitudes, Olivi claims, is intelligible only given the existence of free will. More specifically, they are “its distinctive products, or its distinctive acts and habits” (ibid.). As he runs through the list, explaining how each attitude entails free will, it becomes clear that many of these claims are familiar ones. Zeal, for instance, is an angry reaction to bad deeds, motivated “only against the bad that one judges to have been done voluntarily, and thus which could have been freely avoided” (p. 318). Without free will, this attitude is based on an assumption that is “thoroughly false and grounded on a thoroughly false object” (p. 317). As zeal goes, so do the related phenomena of accusations, excuses, blame, and guilt. Generally, “a human being could no more be accused of some vice than he could be accused of death, for he could avoid the one as little as the other” (p. 336). Carefulness and heedlessness, the last pair on the list, likewise become meaningless : “For it is foolish to be careful about things that will occur necessarily” (p. 323). It becomes pointless to be careful about deliberation, for instance, “because the deliberation itself will or will not happen necessarily, and even one’s carefulness will or will not occur necessarily” (p. 323).

For Olivi, these and other data stand as unshakeable evidence for the existence and nature of free will. He makes this clear from the beginning of his reply, when he introduces two premisses that “no one of sane mind ought to doubt” (p. 317). First, it is impossible for all of the attitudes of one’s rational nature to be “thoroughly false and perverse and grounded on a thoroughly false and perverse object.” Since Olivi thinks that the attitudes that distinguish us as rational creatures are founded on free will, giving up on free will would be to abandon most of what makes us human. We would cease to be what we properly are, persons, and we would become only “intellectual beasts” (p. 338). Second, it is impossible for attitudes to be entirely illusory when human beings improve and perfect themselves by assuming those attitudes (p. 317). If the practices of zeal, deliberation, friendship, love, political power, etc. were all founded on a false assumption, then surely these practices would not be so crucial to human well-being. Thus “no one of sane mind will believe that something could be the truth which so sharply puts an end to all good things and brings on so many bad things” (p. 338). In the face of these implications, we should reject whatever stands in the way of free will, whether that be the authority of Aristotle or some abstruse principle of metaphysics. “Even if there were no other argument establishing that [the denial of free will] is false, this alone ought to be sufficiently persuasive” (p. 338). Moreover, as he explicitly notes, we should be persuaded not just of our own free will, but of the free will of all human beings, since these arguments are based not on private experience, but on our relationships with others.

Having proved that human beings have free will, Olivi sets out to explain what he means by freedom. His conception obviously belongs within the libertarian camp in the free will debate, and the central aspect of it is that in order to be free, the will must be active and capable of reflexively moving itself to action. True, the will’s choices are not necessitated by reason or anything other than by the will itself, but Olivi does not merely conclude that the will is not necessitated; the further conclusion he reaches is that the will, until it makes a choice, is entirely undetermined one way or another, and that it determines itself in the direction it chooses. This is something “every human being senses with complete certainty within himself” (p. 327). In arguing that the will determines itself, he means that it is a first mover, in need of no efficient cause other than itself. “Its free power is the cause of its motion, when it is moved, and the cause of its rest, when it rests” (ad 5, pp. 341–42). If the will did not have this capacity for self-movement, then it would have to be determined by something else, and it would not be making its own choices. But this violates the unshakeable assumptions from which Olivi begins, because it would then turn out that the will is not autonomous, not making its own choices, hence not a suitable object of one’s zeal or friendship, among other things.

Olivi is well aware that the lack of autonomy does not entirely preclude a sort of pseudo-zeal or pseudo-friendship. One might be angry with someone, for instance, not out of the conviction that the bad action was that person’s fault, but simply in an effort to change that person’s ways. But this line of thought does violence to our conceptions of ourselves and our fellow human beings. We want people to do the right thing not because they have been effectively manipulated, but “solely and purely because of the love of justice” (ad 22, p. 368). Further, when we urge a person to do the right thing, “we do not intend simply to move someone toward what is good, but rather to make it that he voluntarily moves himself toward the good” (p. 369).

Moreover, Olivi argues fervently against the view that the will is a power for opposites only with respect to a future instant. In order to be truly free, the will must, in the same instant as it wills ‘A’, be capable of willing ‘not-A’. Olivi’s conception seems to have been the source of John Duns Scotus’ revolutionary theory of synchronic contingency (Dumont 1995), and although Scotus is better known as an early proponent of libertarian freedom, his view is heavily indebted to Olivi. Indeed, it is arguable that Olivi deserves credit as the founder of this conception of freedom of the will.

3. Soul and Body

With the rediscovery of Aristotle’s metaphysical and ethical works, thirteenth-century theologians devoted an increasing portion of their time to interpreting and developing Aristotelian accounts of human nature. Olivi was very far from a slavish admirer of Aristotle’s, and his theory of the nature of the soul and its relation to the body differs radically from those medieval interpretations which endeavor to be faithful to the Philosopher. Nonetheless, he employs the Aristotelian theoretical framework, and although he often seems to be rather hostile to Aristotle’s pervasive influence, once remarking that “without reason he is believed, as the god of this age” (Q58 ad 14, p. 482; see Burr 1971), the main thrust of his criticism is directed at contemporary Averroist interpretations of Aristotle rather than at Aristotle himself (Piron 2006b). The critical, even harsh passages must be understood in this light.

Nonetheless, he rejects many principles that are crucial for Aristotle’s account of the soul-body relationship. He argues that it is “not only contrary to reason but also dangerous to the faith” to hold that “the [soul’s] intellective and free part is the form of the body per se and considered as such” (Q51, p. 104). Others had questioned the extent to which soul and body could be analyzed in terms of form and matter, but Olivi goes further because he explicitly denies that one part of the soul, the rational part, can be understood as the form of the body. This denial is ultimately based on his view that the intellectual part of the soul must be spiritual and incorporeal because otherwise it cannot be immortal, intellectual, and free. Yet he does not want to jeopardize the substantial unity of the soul and the body, and he works towards a theory which incorporates both of these doctrines.

Olivi’s denial that the soul’s intellectual part is the form of the body matches fairly closely with a doctrine that was condemned by the Council of Vienne in 1312, when Pope Clement V declared in the bull Fidei catholicae fundamento that it is a heresy to hold that “the rational or intellective soul is not per se and essentially the form of the human body” (Denzinger 1965, n. 902). However, it is easy to misunderstand what Olivi is saying, and a closer analysis shows that his position is far more nuanced than the wording of the condemnation suggests. First, he is not denying that the rational part of the soul is a form, or even that it is the form of a human being. To begin with, he follows Bonaventure and makes a distinction between two kinds of matter. The human body and all material objects are made of corporeal matter, but spiritual entities (angels and human souls) also have a material substratum, the so-called spiritual matter. Olivi argues that the rational part of the soul, intellect and will, is a form of this spiritual matter. It is acceptable to speak of intellect as the form of a human being since the spiritual matter belongs to the human being. But because the spiritual matter of the soul is distinct from the corporeal matter of the body, Olivi can maintain that the rational part is not the form of the body. (See e.g. Q51 appendix, p. 138.)

Second, Olivi is not denying that the soul is the form of the body. What he denies is that the rational part of the soul (“the intellective and free part”) is the form of the body. He resorts to a doctrine of the plurality of substantial forms, according to which complex substances, such as human beings, have several more or less distinct forms that together make the complete human being. The intellectual part of the soul is distinct from another part, the sensory part, and only the latter is the form of the body. Because the two parts of the soul are united in the spiritual matter, it is acceptable to say that the whole soul is the form of the body:

It is said that the whole rational soul, rather than the sensory part, is the form of the body, even though it is informed by the whole only insofar as it is informed by the soul’s sensory and nutritive part. (Q51 app., p. 146)

We should say that the whole soul is the form of the body, in much the same way that we say that a person talks, not a tongue (p. 144). But if we direct our attention to the various parts of the soul, then it is wrong to say that the rational part, “per se and considered as such,” is the form of the body. The soul is the form of the body only with respect to its sensory and nutritive part.

Despite his theoretical commitments that are not compatible with Aristotle’s view, there is a sense in which Olivi might plausibly be said to be agreeing with Aristotle, who explicitly leaves room for parts of the soul that “are the actuality of no body” (De an. II.1, 413a7). Presumably, Aristotle is thinking of the intellect. But it’s not at all obvious how that remark should be interpreted. Aquinas, for instance, holds without qualification that “the intellect ... is the form of the human body,” only its acts are not realized in the bodily organs (Summa theologiae 1.76.1). So what is it that compels Olivi to drop intellect from the hylomorphic scheme?

Olivi writes that to identify the rational part as the form of the body is “not only contrary to reason but also dangerous to the faith” (as above). More specifically, as he writes in a letter defending his views, he believes that that claim holds “the danger of destroying the soul’s immortality, its liberty, and its intellectual nature” (Epistola n. 7). Each of these three consequences is based on one overarching assumption: that to make the soul’s rational part the form of the body is either to attribute to the body the distinctive capacities of the rational soul, or to deny these capacities to the intellectual soul. Here is how Olivi puts that claim:

If the intellective part is the form of the body, then, since all matter is actualized by its form, it follows that just as a human body is truly sensory and living through the sensory soul, so that body will be truly intellective and free through the intellective part. (Q51, pp. 104–5)

If the intellect is the form of the body, then the body must have the capacities for intellectual thought and free decision. Olivi is of course going to reject that as absurd. Notice the form of this argument. First, Olivi asserts that to be the form of something is to impart actuality to that thing. This seems uncontroversial. Second, Olivi argues by analogy. Just as the sensory soul actualizes a body by giving it life and the capacity for sensation, so the intellective part—if it is the form of the body—should actualize the body by making it intellective and free. This claim seems plausible as well. If one accepts the first step of the argument, that to be the form of something is to impart actuality to that thing, then the rational part must be giving something to the body. Olivi says, “every form imparts to its matter some operation, and some power for operating” (Q51, p. 109). So, if the rational part does not render the body immortal and give it the capacity for intellective thought and freedom, we have to provide some sort of account of what the rational part does give the body. But what else could the rational part of the soul do for the body, if not endow it with its essential properties and powers?

We might view this argument as posing a dilemma. If the rational part is the form of the body, then one must either understand this formal relationship in the ordinary way, in terms of actualizing the body, or one must concede that the rational part is not the form of the body in any ordinary sense. The first horn of the dilemma leads in the direction of materialism, because it forces one to claim that the powers of the rational soul are instantiated in the body. The second horn of the dilemma leads one toward retracting the original assertion: that the rational part, the intellect, is the form of the body. For it is not at all clear what that means, if the intellect is not in any way actualizing the body.

Given Olivi’s argumentation against the formal union between the intellectual part of the soul and the body, it may seem that the unity of the human being is compromised. Olivi argues, however, that the relation between these two parts is substantial even though it is mediated by the sensory part and the spiritual matter of the soul. He writes:

If the human body is united and inclined to the sensory form, which is inclined and united to the intellectual form; and the intellectual form is essentially united to the sensory form, which is inclined to the body; then by the same token the intellectual form and the body are necessarily substantially united to each other. Still, this does not mean that they would be united as form and matter. (Q51, p. 134)

The substantial union between the intellectual and sensory parts is due to their being the forms of the same spiritual matter of the soul. In this way, all the metaphysical components constitute a single substance. A human being is an essentially unified entity even though the intellectual part of the soul is not the actuality of the body or any of its parts.

4. Cognitive Activity and Attention

One of the most interesting and original aspects of Olivi’s philosophy is his critique of the standard Aristotelian model of cognition. The starting point of this critique is the Augustinian conception of the ontological superiority of the soul with respect to the body, which leads Olivi to insist that perception and intellectual understanding cannot be passive reception of external stimuli but must be understood as active processes. On the conventional medieval view, a cognitive power simply receives impressions from the world, in the form of sensible or intelligible species. Olivi argues that such an account leaves out a crucial element, the focusing of the cognitive power’s attention on the object to be cognized.

However much the cognitive power is informed through a disposition and a species differing from the cognitive action, it cannot advance to a cognitive action unless before this it actually tends toward the object, so that the attention of its intention should be actually turned and directed to the object. (Q72, p. 9)

Olivi gives the kinds of examples that one would expect. The ears of someone sleeping, for instance, receive the same impressions as the ears of someone awake, but the sleeper does not sense these impressions. Even when we are awake, we sometimes do not perceive objects right in front of us when we are intently focused on something else (Q73, pp. 89–90).

Olivi argues that this kind of cognitive attention requires a “virtual extension” toward the object. Though he accepts the traditional theory of species in medio, sensible qualities that fill the air between the senses and their objects, he denies that these species are the efficient cause of cognition. One striking consequence of this claim is that the object itself need not exert any causal influence, not on the cognitive powers nor even on the physical sense organs. The external object need only be close enough to be apprehended by the cognizer’s spiritual attention. In the cases of both perception and understanding, the efficient agent is the cognitive power. The external object is merely a kind of final cause or, more precisely, a “terminative cause” (Q72, p. 36; Epistola, n. 12). It is merely by being the object of the cognitive power’s attention that the external object plays a role in cognition.

Olivi treats virtual attention—or directedness—not as a sui generis activity of the mind, but as a general kind of causal relationship that can be applied to physical agents just as much as to mental ones. For him, every natural physical agent has a virtual attention of this sort that extends as far as its causal force does (Q23, pp. 424–25). One authority comments that Olivi’s virtual attention is “in fact equivalent to action at a distance” (Jansen 1921, p. 118), a characterization that seems just in the case of physical effects such as the light of the sun that illuminates distant objects.

However, the case of cognitive acts is different. Olivi carefully avoids committing to real extramission of vision, and he argues that perceptual acts take place in the powers of the soul, not in the perceived object (Q58, p. 482; Silva & Toivanen 2010). The virtual extension of the soul’s attention is not real, not even in some special nonphysical sense. When Olivi explains that the extension is ‘virtual’, he means to contrast it with ‘real’. He explicitly denies, for instance, that this virtual extension involves “any real emission of its essence” (Q73, p. 61). Elsewhere, considering the claim that “our mind is where it fixes its intention,” he says that “these words are metaphorical. For we are not there really or substantially, but only virtually or intentionally.” (Q37 ad 13, p. 672.) On this basis it is fair to say that the soul does not actually perform any action at a distance, although its attention can be directed to distant objects. Olivi’s view is best described as an intentional theory of cognition (Perler 2003; Toivanen 2013a).

Olivi allows that the object itself, through species in medio, can indirectly act on our spiritual faculties, through what he calls the via colligantiae (way of connection). A flash of lightning will make a physical impression on our eyes, and this physical impression can, through the via colligantiae, affect the spiritual sensory powers. But, crucially, this connection is not what brings about sensation. We see this flash, as opposed to receiving merely a physical impression from it, when we direct our spiritual attention toward it (Quodlibet I.4). This via colligantiae plays an important role across Olivi’s philosophical psychology, being his general method of explaining the vexed connection between mind and body (see Q59, pp. 546–54; Q72, pp. 30–35; Jansen 1921, pp. 76–90).

5. Direct Realism

Olivi’s direct realism is central to his thinking about cognition. If he were willing to say that the object of our spiritual attention is not the external object but an internal species of the object, then he could reformulate his theory of cognitive attention in a more plausible way, as a matter of grasping an internal impression from the object. But Olivi works very hard to avoid falling into any kind of position that might be called representationalist—that is, a view on which the immediate objects of cognition are internal. This epistemological commitment to direct realism is one of the most important philosophical reasons for Olivi to reject the standard scholastic account of sensible and intelligible species. On that standard account, species serve as forms that provide the intentional content of sensation and thought. Although these forms were standardly described as merely the means by which we grasp external things, Olivi argued that in fact the proponent of species was committed to representationalism.

Olivi argues against the species theory by advancing through a series of ever-more-serious charges. First, the theory is committed to taking species as the objects of cognition:

A species will never actually represent an object to the cognitive power unless the power attends to the species in such a way that it turns and fixes its attention on the species. But that to which the power’s attention is turned has the character of an object, and that to which it is first turned has the character of a first object. Therefore these species will have the character of an object more than the character of an intermediate or representative source. (Q58 ad 14, p. 469; cf. Q74, p. 123)

His argument for this conclusion turns on the first sentence of the passage, in which he claims that a species cannot represent an object to a cognizer unless the cognizer attends to the species. For Olivi, such attention to some thing is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for that thing’s being cognized. So if we do have to focus our attention in this way on species, he infers that those species will be the object of cognition, not merely causal intermediaries.

Next, Olivi argues that species would have to be the first object of cognition. To turn toward a species in the way that we must if that species is to represent the external world “is the same as to attend to it as a first object” (Q74, p. 123). Elsewhere, “we would always cognize the species before the thing itself that is the object” (Q58 ad 14, p. 469). The point Olivi wants to make is one more often made by denying that the world is seen directly or immediately. If we see the external world at all, we see it only at second hand, indirectly.

The argument goes one final step. Someone who wants to claim that our internal sensations are themselves perceived has to choose whether or not to claim that the external world is also perceived. Olivi takes it that it is not; on the species account, we would not perceive the external world at all, only images of it:

The attention will tend toward the species either in such a way that it would not pass beyond so as to attend to the object, or in such a way that it would pass beyond. If in the first way, then the thing will not be seen in itself, but only its image will be seen as if it were the thing itself. (Q74, p. 123; cf. Q58 ad 14, pp. 469–70, 487–88)

The argument is based on a dilemma. Granting that cognizers must attend to species, there either will or will not be a separate and further attention to the object itself. It would of course be quite odd to say that there is such a further attention. This would entail, as Olivi goes on to say, that one “considers the object in two ways—first through a species, second in itself” (Q74, p. 123). This seems too much at odds with the phenomenal feel of perception to be a serious possibility. The obvious way out of the dilemma, then, is to say that there will not be any further attention: one apprehends the external world, if one does at all, in virtue of attending to the species themselves. This is what the representationalist will likely say. But if this is the case, Olivi argues, then we won’t be seeing the things in themselves but only their images. Memorably, he remarks that a species “would veil the thing and impede its being attended to in itself as if present, rather than aid in its being attended to” (Q58 ad 14, p. 469; Pasnau 1997).

In place of the species theory, Olivi offers an interesting alternative. Rather than treat mental representations as something separate from an act of cognition, Olivi proposes identifying the two. On his view, an act of cognition in itself represents the object that is perceived. There is no need to postulate any further representation beyond the act itself: that inevitably results in the mediation that Olivi wants to avoid. This act theory would prove influential on later scholastics, most notably William Ockham. And in our own era it has been reinvented and renamed, as the adverbial theory of thought and perception.

6. Word and Concept

Olivi extends his critique of species to the mental word (verbum), which was standardly postulated as the product of intellectual thought. His treatment of the verbum raises different issues from those associated with species. Here the issue is not direct realism, precisely, but rather the nature of concept formation. Near the start of his commentary on the Gospel of John, Olivi describes the standard view as follows: “Our mental word is something following an act of thought ... and formed by that thought. ... After it has been formed ... the [extra-mental] object is clearly understood or viewed in that word as if in a mirror” (Tractatus de verbo 6.1). This word, moreover, “is that which is first cognized by intellect and is its first object;” the extra-mental object is cognized secondarily. This description closely matches a characterization Olivi gives in his later Sentences commentary:

Some maintain that a kind of concept, or word, is formed through an abstractive, investigative, or inventive consideration, in which real objects are intellectively cognized as in a mirror. For they call this the first thing understood, and the immediate object; it is a kind of intention, concept, and defining notion of things. (Q74, pp. 120–21)

This view has two characteristic features. First, it postulates a mental representation—a concept or word—that is the product of intellectual activity. Second, it supposes that we understand the world through these representations, in such a way that we get at the world indirectly, or secondarily, “as if in a mirror.” Call this an object theory of the verbum.

Olivi’s own view is that the verbum should be identified with a particular act of thought: “our mental word is our actual thought” (Tractatus 6.2.1). When we engage in abstract intellectual cognition, Olivi says, “nothing serving as an object is really abstracted or formed that differs from the act of consideration already mentioned” (6.2.3). The Sentences commentary offers a concise characterization:

This [sort of intervening concept] ought not to be called a verbum, nor can [such a concept] be anything other than the act of consideration itself or a memory species formed through that act. (Q74, p. 121)

There are, then, acts of intellect, but there are no separate inner concepts that are the objects of those acts. Call this an act theory of the verbum.

Why is this act theory superior to an object theory? One line of argument holds that the object theory “contains in itself obvious absurdities and thus contradicts sound reason” (Tractatus 6.2.2). This claim is argued in different ways, with the following dilemma often playing a crucial role: On one hand the verbum is said to be the product of intellectual cognition. But on the other hand the verbum is said to be required for cognition as the “first thing understood.” How can it be both? Olivi thinks his opponents will have to maintain that in some way the verbum is the product of one act of intellect and the object of a second. This leads him to argue that his opponents are treating the verbum as merely a memory. But Olivi is happy to countenance representations of this sort. Thus the object theory collapses into the act theory.

The second line of attack holds that the theory lacks support because “there is no necessity or utility in postulating such a verbum” (6.2.3). Here Olivi considers two parallel lines of argument that a proponent of the mental word might make against this charge of superfluity.

First,... we experience in ourselves that we form in our mind new concepts of many propositions and conclusions. These concepts remain in us later and we return to them when we want to remember such propositions. ... Second,... from individuals seen or imagined by us we abstract and form defining characterizations of their universal features,... and we come back to these when we wish to view such universal features. (6.2.3)

Each argument appeals to our experience of forming within ourselves abstract ideas: in the first case propositional ideas, in the second universals. Intellect in each case is said to form a verbum. Olivi replies that no such inner word is necessary. In each case we have an act of conceptual thought, but no object is formed in intellect over and above the act of thinking itself. Indeed, if anything, such an object “would be an impediment” (6.2.3)—alluding to the epistemological difficulties discussed in the previous section.

By eliminating the representations that might intervene between intellect and external reality, Olivi gives us what we might be tempted to think of as a direct realist theory of intellectual cognition. Yet direct realism faces a serious problem at the intellectual level, a problem that Olivi’s discussion fails to acknowledge. Direct realism is attractive as a theory of sensation because it seems clear what the objects of sensation are. But what are we directly in touch with when our intellect thinks abstractly or propositionally? One answer to this question is Platonism: universals and/or propositions have some kind of abstract mode of existence, independently of the human mind. Like almost all the scholastics, Olivi firmly rejects this kind of account (Q13). Another kind of answer, sometimes called conceptualism, treats universals and/or propositions as mental constructs. Defenders of the object theory can take this approach. They can hold that although there are no universals or propositions in external things (in re), there are universals and propositions in the mind (in mente). The verbum, serving as universal or as proposition, will (in some cautiously described sense) be the object of thought.

Olivi’s act theory would seem to rule out this kind of conceptualism. But what then will Olivi put in its place? He speaks of intellect’s “attending to and considering the real character of a common or specific nature” (376–379), as if he has an unproblematic account of intellect’s relationship to the external world. Yet he says nothing to clarify the status of this relationship. He simply does not seem to have recognized the problem of abstract knowledge as a fundamental metaphysical motivation for the object theory. In this respect his overall account, although conceptually innovative, remains fundamentally incomplete.

7. Self-Awareness and Reflexivity

Olivi discusses various types of self-reflexivity fairly extensively in his writings. He adopts the traditional idea that the intellect is capable of turning reflexively toward itself, but he also attributes certain types of reflexivity to the sensory powers of the soul and argues that the will is a reflexive power.

The most rudimentary type of self-reflexivity takes place in the sense of touch. Aristotle argues in De anima II.11 that the organ of the sense of touch is the heart and that the flesh of the body is nothing but the medium that transmits the sensations from an external object to the heart. Olivi rejects the Aristotelian theory. He thinks that the whole body functions as the organ of the sense of touch. Moreover, he argues that the body is the primary object of the sense of touch, while external objects are perceived secondarily by perceiving the harmful and beneficial changes that they cause in the body. This position leads to the obvious problem that the sense of touch seems to be a reflexive power, as it is capable of sensing the state of its own organ. Olivi recognises this problem and gives two possible solutions: either the sense of touch which is in one place of the body senses the state of the adjacent part of the body, or the sense of touch really is capable of a certain type of reflexivity. In the latter case, Olivi argues, the sense of touch would be capable of sensing the state of its own organ but not its own act or itself as a psychological power. He does not make up his mind between these two explanations, but he clearly thinks that the sense of touch enables a certain kind of bodily self-perception. Even the simplest animals are capable of perceiving their bodies, because every animal has the sense of touch. (Q61, pp. 575–85; Yrjönsuuri 2008a; Toivanen 2013a.)

The sense of touch is not the only sensory power that is capable of reflexivity. The so-called common sense—the highest cognitive power of the animal soul and the only internal sense Olivi acknowledges—is another. Although he does not provide a systematic discussion of the reflexivity of the common sense, he suggests in several places that it is capable of apprehending its own activity by turning toward itself incompletely (semiplene) (Q62, p. 595). This ability is obviously related to the Aristotelian conception of perception of perception, but Olivi suggests something more than the traditional Aristotelian picture. Following Augustine, he argues that animals are aware of their own bodies and the purpose and value of their organs and body parts, since otherwise they would not be able to use their bodies effectively and preserve their lives:

When a dog or a snake sacrifices one of its members in order to save its head or sacrifices some part in order to save the whole, then it prefers the whole over the part and the head over the other member. Therefore, these animals must have some common power which shows both extremes simultaneously, their mutual comparison, and the preference of one over the other—although it does not do this with the same fullness and degree of reflexive judgement as does the intellect. (Q62, p. 588)

The common sense enables animals to perceive their own bodies, the parts and their functions, and the relative value of the parts for the well-being of the animal as a whole, thus making animals capable of self-preservation that goes beyond the ability to avoid pain. (See Toivanen 2013b.)

The difference between intellectual self-reflexivity and the reflexivity of the common sense is based on the spiritual nature of the intellectual soul. Unlike the common sense, the intellectual mind is spiritual and immaterial and therefore capable of being directly and immediately aware of itself. Certain authors (most notably Aquinas) had argued that this kind of direct awareness is not possible because considered in itself the intellect is fully potential. It must be actualized by thinking something else before it can be cognized. By contrast, Olivi argues that the soul is directly aware of itself:

The soul knows or is able to know itself in two ways. The first of them is an experiential and as if tactile sensation by which the soul undoubtedly senses that it is, lives, cognizes, wills, sees, hears, moves the body, and likewise for its other acts, whose principle and subject it knows and senses itself to be. And this [happens] to such an extent that it cannot actually know or consider any object or any act without always knowing and sensing itself to be the subject (suppositum) of the act by which it knows and considers that [object or act] ... The other way of knowing itself is by reasoning. In this way the soul investigates the genera and differences that it does not know in the first way. (Q76, pp. 146–47)

By separating these two types of knowledge that the soul or mind has of itself, Olivi is in a position to explain why we do not have certain knowledge of the nature of the soul. The direct awareness tells us only that the soul lives and acts, but in order to know the essence of the soul, we must compare this immediate awareness to our knowledge of the species and genera of the things in the world, and this process is not infallible. (Putallaz 1991; Brower-Toland 2013.)

The highest level of reflexivity, however, is found in the will, because only the will is capable of moving itself to action. In order to be free, the will has to be able to move itself in such a way that it can also refrain from moving itself. It has this ability because it is related to itself as a mover to a moved thing: “Insofar as the will is free, it has another kind of reflexivity upon itself which the intellect lacks: for, the will is turned toward itself not only as to an object, but also as a mover to a moved thing” (Q51, p. 115). In fact, the reflexivity of the intellect is based on the will’s ability to direct other powers of the soul. (Q57, pp. 364–66; Q58, pp. 421–23.) Usually human beings are able to control themselves by their will, and this ability is what makes them persons. Reflexivity of the will plays a crucial role in the process, as we can see from a passage in which Olivi explains how sleep affects the psychological processes of the soul:

Sometimes the attention of the superior part of the soul is in such a state that it is able to invent and form various things with respect to the cognitive powers and, similarly, to refuse and approve with respect to appetitive powers; then it is said to deliberate and combine, to consent and choose. And nevertheless it does not move to these acts freely, as it does when awake, because it moves itself to these acts in such a way that it does not have a power to move itself otherwise. (Q59, p. 564)

Experience shows that the will can act also when a person is asleep, as we often make choices in our dreams. But because the reflexivity of the will is hindered, it does not make these choices freely. In this way, the ability to move the will to its acts is the crucial factor that makes us free, and our personhood is dependent on the highest type of reflexivity, which ensures that our choices and actions originate in us.


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