Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy

First published Fri May 28, 2004; substantive revision Mon Dec 18, 2023

The notions of mental representation and intentionality are intrinsically related in contemporary philosophy of mind, since it is usually thought that a mental state has content or is about something other than itself due to its representational nature. These notions have a parallel history in medieval philosophy as well and are now well studied, at least up to Buridan (see, for example, in Knudsen 1982, Tweedale 1990, Pasnau 1997, Perler 2001, Perler 2002, King 2007, Lagerlund 2007a, Black 2010, Amerini 2011, and Klima 2015).

One reason for the interest in intentionality and representation in medieval philosophy is that it has been widely recognized that Franz Brentano was reviving a scholastic notion when he introduced intentionality as “the mark of the mental” (Brentano 1874). But Brentano never used the terminology of representation to explicate intentionality. This was done much later, in post-Wittgensteinian philosophy of mind. In later medieval philosophy, it was, however, standard to explain the content of a thought by referring to its representational nature.

There are a variety of theories of mental representation in medieval philosophy, which were intensely discussed from the twelfth century up to the time of Descartes. This article will briefly trace the history of the terminology and also give a brief outline of the main theories developed during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries.

1. The Ancient Background and the Formation of the Concept

The English words ‘representation’ and ‘to represent’ derive via Old French from the Latin words ‘repraesentatio’ and ‘repraesentare,’ but these are by no means commonly used words in classical Latin. In late ancient thought it is foremost Quintilian and Tertullian that uses the terms in a philosophically interesting way. It was not until the twelfth century Latin translation of Avicenna’s De anima that these terms became frequently used in connection with cognition and the mind or the intellective soul (see Lagerlund 2007b).

The Latin translators of Avicenna rendered several related terms in Arabic all related to cognition and the internal senses with the Latin ‘repraesentatio’. In doing so they, intentionally or not, formed the concept of representations in the soul. Representation in the Latin translation of Avicenna is associated with all five faculties. Forms received through the common sense and stored in the phantasia are called representations. The imaginative or cogitative faculty combines and divides representations collected in the phantasia to make new representations, which might not have any real object corresponding to them. The senses apprehend the sensible forms of the objects perceived and the estimative faculty apprehends the ‘intentio’ or ‘ma’na’ of the perceived object. Representations in the imagination are also the basis for intellectual activity, according to this view of cognition:

In the intellect, the form of animal is of the sort that agrees with one and the same definition of many particular [things]. Thus, one form in the intellect will be related to many things, and it is in this respect that it is universal, because it is one intention in the intellect … which is evident since, of those [things] represented by the form in the imagination, the intellect has plundered the intention of its accidents [and] acquired the form in the intellect. (Liber de philosophia prima sive scientia divina V, cap. 1, p. 237)

Avicenna here describes the process of abstraction, or how the representation in the imagination of particular things becomes universal in the intellect. The universal forms are abstracted from representations in the imagination and flow from the active intellect into the passive. Note, however, that the terminology of representation is never used in relation to the intellect. It is always the internal senses that represent in Avicenna and not the intellect or the external senses (see Lagerlund 2007b, for a table of the whole range of terms translated by ‘representation’ in Avicenna’s works.)

One of the reasons ‘representation’ is only used for the internal senses is that representations are thought of as images. The notion of linguistic representations or representations as signs is not present in Avicenna’s work or any other work of the time. It seems instead to derive from logic. Early logic works like Garlandus Compotista’s Dialectica (17) and Abelard’s Dialectica (II, 188) discussed a distinction between a word’s signification by imposition and representation. A denominative term such as ‘white’ signifies by imposition a substance that is white, but it signifies by representation the whiteness inhering in the substance. The white thing stands in for or is an instantiation of whiteness; white is re-presented in the object. Garlandus mentions the example of a traveler (‘viator’) who can be said to represent a road (‘via’). The term ‘traveler’ signifies by imposition the human being who is a traveler, but also represents the road the traveler travels on. It is exactly this usage of representation applied to mental signs that becomes important with Ockham and Buridan.

2. Thomas Aquinas and Formal Sameness

The most influential theory of thought in the thirteenth century goes back to Aristotle and has its foremost medieval defender in Thomas Aquinas. It rests on viewing mental representations or intelligible species, as Aquinas calls them, as sameness of form. The explanation for why thoughts are about something, exhibit intentionality, or represent is that the form of the object thought about is in the mind of the thinker. According to a popular metaphor, thinking something, on this view, is being the object thought about in the sense that the intellect becomes the object or takes on its form.

Following Aristotle in De anima III.4, Aquinas argues, that the mind or the intellective part of the soul has no nature or rather it is nothing before it thinks of something. The active intellect abstracts the intelligible species from the sensitive species in the internal senses and places it in the potential intellect. Aquinas is here very close to the view we saw Avicenna defend above. The species actualizes the potential intellect as a form actualizes a potency. The intelligible species in the potential intellect constitutes the thought. The intellect is immaterial, according to Aquinas, and since he also famously thinks that matter is the principle of individuation, the intelligible species in the potential intellect is not individual, but universal. This is why Aquinas holds that a thought is always universal.

There are many problems associated with this view of mental representation. A famous problem is: why are the daffodils outside my soul not about my thought of the daffodils? The forms inside and outside my mind are the same, suggesting that mental representation is symmetrical. Aquinas has a famous answer to this problem, which is that the daffodils in the garden are not about my thought because of the mode of the form’s presence in them. The forms in the daffodils are really or naturally present whereas in my mind the universal form is spiritually or intentionally present.

The distinction between forms being really/naturally or spiritually/intentionally present is central to Aquinas’s theory of cognition. A form may be present somewhere without literally making whatever substance it informs into something else. Colors in the air, for example, do not make the air really colored: we see colors in the objects around us but not in the intervening air, although they must be there spiritually if sensation is to be a causal process. This means, of course, that the air must somehow contain the color, which entails that intentionality is not a mark of the mental for Aquinas. The air is not in itself a mind (for discussion, see Pasnau 1997, Chap. 2, and for a completely different take see Brower and Brower-Toland 2008).

3. Peter Olivi and the Rejection of Formal Sameness

One of the first to criticize the species theory of cognition, in the late thirteenth century, was Peter Olivi. He argued, contrary to Aristotle and Aquinas, that the mind is active in its cognition of the world; it attends to the object, and it is this move on his part that puts the species theory of cognition in a completely different light. In fact, there seems little point in postulating a species through which the object is cognized. He argues:

Third, because the attention will tend toward the species either in such a way that it would not pass beyond so as to attend to the object, or in such a way that it would pass beyond. If in the first way, then the thing will not be seen in itself but only its image will be seen as if it were the thing itself. That is the role of a memory species, not a visual one. If in the second way, then after the inspection of the species it will inspect the object in itself. In this way it will cognize the object in two ways, first through the species and second in itself. It will indeed be like when someone sees an intervening space and then beyond that sees the fixed object. (Peter John Olivi, Quaestiones in secundum librum Sententiarum, III, q. 74, 123.)

In this passage, it seems clear that for Olivi the species is a thing in itself and that there really are three things involved in the cognition of an object: the object, the species, and the cognizer. The species is on his view a representation, namely a thing that stands in for the object in the mind. The main problem he sees with the theory is hence epistemological. How can we be sure we are cognizing the object and not the species (see Toivanen 2009, Chap. 4 and Adriaenssen 2011). Olivi hence argues that this third representing thing is not needed and that the mind can attend to the object directly. Ockham is later on in the early fourteenth century to repeat a similar argument against the species theory.

Both Olivi and Ockham seem to take it for granted that species are representations and hence a thing added to the object and the cognizer. There were, however, two versions of the species theory of cognition in the thirteenth century. The most influential one was foremost associated with Roger Bacon. According to him, species are representations, that is, real extended images like objects representing the thing cognized to the cognizer. The other version of the theory was defended by Aquinas. According to him, species were not representations but the forms themselves of the objects cognized under a different mode of being. The species were not real but spiritual and as such there are no physical change of for example the eye in a visual perception; only a spiritual one.

Olivi’s objection mentioned above does not apply to Aquinas’ theory since species are not real representations on that view. Olivi himself seems aware of this, however, and says that if the species has spiritual being, then they cannot: “truly and naturally flow from a natural, corporeal form, [and] not really and truly inform a natural body, e.g. the air or the eye.” (Sententiarum II, q. 73, 87.) On Aquinas’ theory the species cannot affect the sense organ and cause a cognition, he seems to think. The species cannot hence fulfill the role they are supposed to play in a theory of cognition or a theory of vision.

Olivi does not straight our reject all species, however, since he thinks memory utilizes species. These species are representations and they are constructed by us. He explains it in the following passage:

Cognitive acts are effected by the [cognitive] power — not, however, through its nude essence. Rather, in all [cognitive acts] an actual attention, actually terminated upon the object, is required…. And therefore, when the exterior thing in-and-of-itself (per se) is not placed before the attention, there must be a memorative species placed before it in lieu of the object, which [the species] is not the origin of the cognitive act, except insofar as it serves as a term for or representative of the object. (Sententiarum II, q. 74, 113.)

This is the most common usage of species after Olivi, that is, that species are representative (see Adriaenssen 2017).

4. Henry of Ghent and John Duns Scotus on Mental Content

For various reasons, the late thirteenth century saw an increased interest in epistemology. One reason for this was the development of new theories of mental representations and intentionality. Some of these developments were due to problematic features of, on the one hand, Aquinas’s view of mental representation and on the other, of Henry of Ghent’s interpretation of Augustine’s view of divine cognition. Aquinas seems to have held that the intelligible species is supposed to play a dual role both as a universal common to all of us thinking it and as my individual thought. It is hard to see how such a view can be maintained without the introduction of some kind of distinction. Henry on the other hand reinterprets Augustine’s doctrine of divine ideas and introduces a distinction between the ideas and the divine nature. The ideas are possibilia or the natures of possible things to be created (de Rijk 2005: 81–84).

Both of these views contribute to the introduction of a distinction between the vehicle and the content of a representation. The distinction developed by Henry in relation to the divine nature was almost immediately taken up into the debates about human cognition. It was applied to Aquinas’s theory of mental representation, taking it a step further by introducing a distinction between the thing representing and the thing represented.

John Duns Scotus was instrumental in adapting this view to human cognition. Scotus’s implemented Henry’s distinction and treated the thing that does the representing as a mental act or concept, which ontologically speaking is an accident of the mind, and the thing represented as the form of the object thought about. Scotus claimed that the accident or mental act is subjectively in the soul, whereas the object being represented is present objectively, or has objective being in the mind. He also said that the object exists as represented to express the content side of the mental representation (Ord. I, d. 3, pars 3, q. 1, n. 382) Scouts can through this distinction also maintain that all spiritual change supervenes on a real change (see Cross 2014).

Scotus thus had a clear way of expressing what Brentano later called intentionality, that is, the way the object of thought exists in the mind. It has objective existence in the mind on his view, which later came to be regarded as the mark of the mental (see Normore 1986; Pasnau 2003; King 2007; Cross 2014). Although the advantages of this approach over Aquinas’s are clear, problems remains concerning the ontological status of these mental contents. The medieval debate here is famous and features a wide variety of opinions (for a survey, see Tachau 1988). Scotus himself says that thought objects have a diminished kind of being, which is supposed to be a state between real being and no being at all. Although first accepting a similar view, Ockham would later subject this view to much criticism.

6. William Ockham and Mental Language

The theory of mental language in the fourteenth century was foremost developed by William Ockham. It rests on a theory of mental representation that combined the notions of cause and signification. A concept or a mental term on this view represents because it is caused efficiently by a thing in the world. It signifies that thing also because of the causal relation between them. On Ockham’s view, a mental representation or concept is caused by an intuitive cognition. He explains:

Intuitive cognition is the proper cognition of a singular not because of its greater likeness to one thing more than another but because it is naturally caused by one thing and not by another; nor can it be caused by another. If you object that it can be caused by God alone, I reply that this is true: such a visual apprehension is always apt to be caused by one created object and not by another; and if it is caused naturally, it is caused by one thing and not by another, and it is not able to be caused by another. (Quodlibeta Septem 1.13)

According to Ockham’s metaphysics there are only individuals in the world so that when an individual causes a concept to exist in the mind, it causes an individual concept and hence a singular conception of itself. Nothing else can cause that concept (except perhaps God). The singular concept functions as the word of the object that caused it in our language of thought. It is an atomic constituent that can then be combined to form more complex concepts or sentences in the language.

Ockham’s notion of concept acquisition and mental representation is developed as part of a very sophisticated theory of thought involving not only a theory of signification, but also a whole range of logico-semantic properties such as connotation and supposition. It explains how concepts, which in turn are the direct objects of belief and knowledge, are assembled into mental sentences describing the world (for the details, see Panaccio 2004).

5. John Buridan and Vague Concepts

Ockham and John Buridan’s accounts of thought are on the one hand very similar, but on the other hand there are fundamental differences between them. This is particularly true about their view of mental representation. A case in point is their views of singular thought. They both start out from the same idea, that is, that thinking something singular is having a singular concept in mind, but they disagree fundamentally on what a singular concept looks like and, foremost, on how it manages to latch onto the world. On Ockham’s account a concept is singular because its cause is proper, as he calls it, and proper causes are necessarily tied to one object. But on Buridan’s account, a singular concept is singular because of its semantic complexity (see Klima 2001: xxxviii–xlii and 2009: 40–56). It has a descriptive content that enables it to narrow down its signification. However, Buridan retains Ockham’s view for some terms (for the significance of this difference from Ockham, see Klima 2009: 69–89).

Buridan thinks that we always in the first instance cognize or conceive of something as singular. There are, however, two kinds of singular concepts, namely, vague and determinate singular concepts. There are also two ways a singular concept or mental term can be acquired. The vague terms are acquired through perception and involves a direct acquaintance with the perceived object. Buridan describes how we see something approaching from a distance and cognize it as ‘this thing’, then as ‘this body’, then as ‘this animal’, then as ‘this donkey’, and finally as ‘Brunellus.’ (For more on this and its significance see Normore 2007, Black 2011, Lagerlund 2006, and Lagerlund 2014.) These demonstratives describe circumstances in which we cognize something singularly, and they come together under a description of a singular thing, which we impose on it ourselves or have learned the name of, in this case, ‘Brunellus.’ The vague singular term is a name for a circumstance in which we cognize a non-determinate singular thing as something, for example, an individual thing, body, donkey, etc. There is, however, another way a singular can be formed and that is by imposing or associating it with a name of some descriptions or properties that we never have had a corresponding vague singular cognition of, since we have no actual acquaintance with the thing through sense perception. These are singular terms like ‘Socrates’ or ‘Plato.’ They have never directly existed before our senses and intellect. We only know them through descriptions. Buridan explains the difference in Summulae de Dialectica 8.2.1 (Buridan SD, 633):

Another reason is that things cannot be cognized as singular unless they are cognized as something in the prospect of the cognizer. Therefore, if I did not perceive Socrates, you cannot tell me what I should understand by ‘Socrates,’ except by using common terms, the aggregate of which can just as well apply to something else as to Socrates. So, should another thing be created similar to Socrates in all of its external features [circumstantiis], this [aggregate] would no longer be the definition of ‘Socrates’, for it would not be proper to it, nor convertible with it.

As explained above, only terms that derive from actual sense cognitions (what he here calls cognition in ‘the prospect’) are properly singular. They have an element that fixes them to the thing cognized.

He seems to think that all proper singular terms are collections of descriptions of a thing under a name. This goes for singulars that I am acquainted with as well as singulars I have no sense acquaintance with. Assume that I have the concept ‘Brunellus’ in my mental language, which I have formed through vague singulars, that is, through circumstances in which I have perceived him as this or that. These vague singulars express the demonstrative aspect of my experience of Brunellus. They come together under the singular term ‘Brunellus’ with all the things I ‘know’ about him. I have no such demonstrative element in my singular terms of ‘Socrates’ and ‘Plato,’ since they have never and cannot exist in a direct sense cognition. In that respect, there is nothing part of such singular terms that discriminate them from other term than the sum of descriptions I have sorted under these terms. They will, to use Saul Kripke’s terminology, never rigidly pick out what they signify. ‘Brunellus’ on the other hand will, because of the demonstrative element derived from my actual interactions with him. (For a slightly different take on this preserving the rigid designation of terms like 'Socrates' or 'Plato' see Klima 2009, Chapter 4, Section 4.2.)

Buridan is defending an internalist semantics for singular terms. It is not internalist because of the two different kinds of singular terms or that they both are collections of descriptions and circumstances in which we have interacted with something, but instead because the imposition of these terms describes a process that is completely internal to the agent. It is up to us to sort names with descriptions and circumstances and, hence, impose certain names on these descriptions and circumstances. Give this, two speakers of the same language could have the same name for an individual and even be using it for the same individual despite the fact that the names they use have different content or meaning because they have different descriptions in mind during the conversation. Meaning is, hence, in the head for Buridan. A position quite different from Ockham (for more on this see Panaccio 2017 and Lagerlund 2024).


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