Divine Illumination

First published Tue Nov 2, 1999; substantive revision Wed May 22, 2024

Divine illumination is the oldest and most influential alternative to naturalism in the areas of mind and knowledge. The doctrine holds that human beings require a special divine assistance in their ordinary cognitive activities. Although most closely associated with Augustine and his scholastic followers, the doctrine has its origins in the ancient period and would reappear, transformed, in the early modern era.

1. Orientation

The theory of divine illumination is generally conceived of as distinctively Christian, distinctively medieval, and distinctively Augustinian. There is some justification for this, of course, inasmuch as Christian medieval philosophers gave the theory serious and sustained discussion, and inasmuch as Augustine gave illumination a very prominent role in his theory of knowledge. Still, it is better to think of the theory in a wider context. Divine illumination played a prominent part in ancient Greek philosophy, in the later Greek commentary tradition, in neo-Platonism, and in medieval Islamic philosophy. Moreover, it was Christian medieval philosophers, near the end of the thirteenth century, who were ultimately responsible for decisively refuting the theory. I will suggest that we view this last development as the first great turning point in the history of cognitive theory.

I understand a theory of divine illumination to be a theory on which the human mind regularly relies on some kind of special supernatural assistance in order to complete (some part of) its ordinary cognitive activity. The assistance must be supernatural, of course, or it will not count as divine illumination. It must be special, in the sense that it must be something more than the divine creation and ongoing conservation of the human mind. (If this by itself were to count as illumination, then all theists would be committed to the theory of divine illumination.) The mind must regularly rely on this assistance, in order to complete its ordinary cognitive activity: otherwise, an occasional mystical experience might suffice to confirm a theory of divine illumination. But a defender of the theory need hold only that we require this assistance for some part of our ordinary cognitive activities: hardly anyone has supposed that every form of human cognition requires divine illumination.

It is useful to think of divine illumination as analogous to grace. Just as a proponent of grace postulates a special divine role on the volitional side, so a proponent of divine illumination postulates a special divine role on the cognitive side. Grace is intended as an explanation not of all human desires and motivations, nor even of all virtuous desires and motivations. Rather, the proponent of grace holds that there is a certain class of volitional states, crucial to human well-being, that we can achieve only with special divine assistance. Likewise, the theory of divine illumination is intended as an explanation not of all belief, nor even of all knowledge. Rather, the theory holds that there are certain kinds of knowledge, crucial to cognitive development, that we can achieve only with special divine assistance. It is an odd fact that, despite the close analogy, grace is regarded not as a philosophical question, but as a theological one. It is an equally odd fact that, whereas divine illumination hasn’t generally been regarded as plausible since the thirteenth century, grace continues to be taken seriously by many theologians. Perhaps both of these facts can be accounted for by motivational psychology’s relative obscurity in comparison to cognitive psychology.

For most people today it is hard to take divine illumination seriously, hard to view it as anything other than a quaint relic. A first step toward developing a proper perspective on the theory is to see it in its broader context, not as peculiarly Christian or medieval, but as an assumption shared by most premodern philosophers. A second step in the same direction is to identify and to take seriously the philosophical problem that drives illumination theory. In large part, the theory has been invoked to explain rational insight — that is, a priori knowledge. For much of the modern era, philosophers have been preoccupied with empirical knowledge and have not had much interest in this topic. (Recently, this situation has changed notably; for foundational recent treatments, see Bealer 2000 and Bonjour 1998.) To see how something like divine illumination could have ever seemed at all plausible, one has to see how deeply puzzling the phenomenon of rational insight actually is. One way of seeing this, and of seeing how little we understand rational insight, is to look at cases where something goes wrong. A recent biography of the Nobel-prize winning mathematician John Nash describes his long period of mental illness, during which time he held various odd beliefs such as that extraterrestrials were recruiting him to save the world. How could he believe this, a friend asked during a hospital visit, given his devotion to reason and logic?

“Because,” Nash said slowly in his soft, reasonable southern drawl, as if talking to himself, “the ideas I had about supernatural beings came to me the same way that my mathematical ideas did. So I took them seriously” (Nasar 1998, p.11).

In a case such as this we don’t know what to do, because we are accustomed to give unhesitating trust to the deliverances of pure reason. But why should we trust reason in this way? Why should we have confidence that others can come to share our insights? Where does it come from? The theory of divine illumination attempts to answer such questions.

2. The Ancient Background

What follows is by no means a comprehensive survey. Still, it seems useful to begin near the beginning, with this remark by Socrates from the Apology:

I have a divine or spiritual sign which Meletus has ridiculed in his deposition. This began when I was a child. It is a voice, and whenever it speaks it turns me away from something I am about to do, but it never encourages me to do anything (31d, tr. Grube).

This appears to be an entirely straightforward expression of a theory of divine illumination. It is not clear who is providing the illumination. Apuleius (fl. 150 CE) would later identify the source as a certain kind of friendly demon, and argue that it was only fitting for Socrates, the most perfect of all human beings, to receive such illumination (De deo Socratis, XVII–XIX). (This idea that illumination comes to those who deserve it would be proposed by Augustine as well [e.g., De magistro 11.38], but abandoned in his later writings as untenable.) As one might expect from Socrates, his illumination seems restricted to the moral sphere. Its form is unclear: is it propositional? (see Phaedrus 242bc) Is it merely the pang of conscience? (For discussion of these and other questions, see e.g. the papers collected in Destrée and Smith 2005.) Whatever the details, Socrates is explicitly describing a kind of cognitive guidance that has a “divine or spiritual” source. The passage may be an embarrassment to classicists, but it surely belongs in the same tradition as later medieval endorsements of illumination.

Not all appeals to the divine involve this sort of direct communication. (Indeed, Socrates’s reference to a “voice” is quite extraordinary.) But the leading figures in ancient Greek philosophy were equally committed to some kind of divine role in cognition. Plato’s theory of recollection presupposes that the human mind somehow has built into it a grasp of the Forms, suggesting that at some point the soul must have received some kind of illumination. Indeed, Plato’s arguments for recollection anticipate the two lines along which medieval views would later develop. The Meno focuses on a priori, rational insight, as illustrated by the slave’s ability to see for himself the validity of a geometrical proof. The Phaedo in contrast focuses on universal properties — Equality, for instance, as compared with two equal sticks (74a) — contrasting the changeable imperfection of the physical world with the exemplary perfection of the Forms. Medieval philosophers from Augustine on, although largely lacking in firsthand knowledge of Plato, would argue for illumination along both of these lines.

Aristotle too seems to invoke the divine. He describes the active intellect in this way:

This intellect is separate, unaffected, and unmixed, being in essence activity…. It is not the case that it sometimes thinks and at other times not. In separation it is just what it is, and this alone is immortal and eternal (De anima III 5, 430a17–23).

There is of course unending controversy over the meaning of this text. One very common reading, in ancient times and our own, is that this active intellect is something divine, not a human faculty at all. If one then makes the further, natural assumption that the active intellect participates in ordinary human cognition, then Aristotle would clearly be committed to a version of divine illumination. (One should, however, be cautious in supposing that Aristotle’s nous poietikos plays anything like the role played by the scholastic intellectus agens. See Haldane 1992.) Not everyone has been persuaded that this active intellect is something literally separate and divine. But even if one supposes that the active intellect is a part of the human soul, it is nevertheless difficult to avoid the suspicion that some sort of special divine influence is at work. Everything in the passage cries out for some sort of supernatural element in human cognition.

Alexander of Aphrodisias (fl. 200 CE) was influential in pushing the separate-and-divine reading of De anima III.5, and Islamic philosophers (most notably Ibn Sīnā [980–1037] and Ibn Rushd [c.1126–c.1198]) would later follow suit. Themistius (4th century CE), in contrast, championed the part-of-soul reading, and Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) would second this interpretation. A full treatment of this topic would cover the later Aristotelian and Platonic traditions, Greek and Islamic. But here I will focus exclusively on the Latin West, where it was Augustine who played the decisive role in formulating the doctrine of illumination. (For a useful survey of ancient and medieval Aristotelian accounts of agent intellect, see Brentano 1992. On the later Platonic tradition, see Gersh 1978. The Islamic tradition deserves a full essay in its own right, covering not just names well known in the Latin West, but also figures like Suhrawardi and Mulla Sadra, central figures in the Islamic illuminationist tradition [see Walbridge 2005].)

3. Augustine

Throughout his long literary career, Augustine (354–430) stresses the role of divine illumination in human thought. One could choose almost any work to illustrate this point; here I will focus on the most familiar of all, the Confessions, where Augustine invokes divine illumination constantly, and makes bold claims for its global necessity:

The mind needs to be enlightened by light from outside itself, so that it can participate in truth, because it is not itself the nature of truth. You will light my lamp, Lord (IV.xv.25).

None other than you is teacher of the truth, wherever and from whatever source it is manifest (V.vi.10).

You hear nothing true from me which you have not first told me (X.ii.2).

Truth, when did you ever fail to walk with me, teaching me what to avoid and what to seek…. Without you I could discern none of these things (X.xl.65).

Even during the Middle Ages, Augustine’s readers disagreed on the precise nature of his theory. One thing that seems clear from these passages alone is that divine illumination is an influence that we receive in an ongoing way throughout our lives. Thomas Aquinas would later understand illumination as an infusion all at once at the start (see below), but this seems untenable as an interpretation of Augustine. The mind needs to be enlightened “from outside itself”; “it is not itself the nature of truth”; “you will light my lamp, Lord” (he has not done so already); truth “walk[s] with me,” rather than merely setting me in motion at the start.

To speak of this influence as an illumination is of course to use a metaphor, one not likely to be unpacked fully. Our own minds present enough of a puzzle to us: when we try to understand how the divine mind might influence our own, we must inevitably fall back on metaphor. Still, there are a variety of ways in which we might seek some clarification. In particular, it is helpful to distinguish two ways in which God might provide illumination. First, he might simply give us information of certain kinds, telling us how things are. This is how illumination is most often understood, at least implicitly. But a second possibility is that God would provide not the information itself, but the insight into the truth of the information. On this second model, we would frame beliefs on our own, and God would illuminate our minds so that we could see the truth. In other words, God would supply the justification. It is clear that sometimes illumination takes the first form: much of Biblical revelation just is illumination in this sense. But Augustine’s theory of illumination seems largely to be of the second kind. Consider this famous passage from the Confessions:

If we both see that what you say is true, and we both see that what I say is true, then where do we see that? Not I in you, nor you in me, but both of us in that unalterable truth that is above our minds (XII.xxv.35).

At issue here is biblical interpretation. When a reading is advanced that seems clearly correct, how is it that everyone listening grasps the truth of that reading? It is not that God gives us the interpretation itself, but that he allows us to see that the interpretation is true.

This understanding of illumination is particularly apparent in the De magistro, where Augustine argues that only God can teach us. Of course, other people can tell us things, and can thereby communicate ideas to us. And we can believe what others tell us: indeed, our lives would be impoverished if we didn’t regularly accept what others tell us. But all of this stays at the level of mere belief. It is not knowledge unless we grasp with our minds the truth of what we are hearing:

When I speak the truth, I do not teach someone who sees these truths. For he is taught not by my words but by the things themselves made manifest within when God discloses them (12.40).

The speaker’s role is not irrelevant in this process. My words give listeners an idea that they can then verify for themselves in light of God’s illumination. Illumination is what allows us to go from mere true belief to knowledge. Illumination provides justification.

This account is most attractive in cases of a priori knowledge or pure reasoning, where we grasp through the mind alone that an argument is valid or that a conclusion is necessary. But there is another strain of thought running through Augustine, one that focuses on the mind’s ability to transcend the untrustworthy senses and grasp the truth that lies beyond mere appearances. The following passage is very often cited in this connection:

Everything that the bodily senses attain, that which is also called sensible, is incessantly changing…. But what is not constant cannot be perceived; for that is perceived that is comprehended in knowledge. But something that is incessantly changing cannot be comprehended. Therefore we should not expect pure truth from the bodily senses (Eighty-three Different Questions, q.9).

In one stroke, this argument rules out the physical world as an object of pure truth, and rules out the senses as a source for that truth. It must be the mind, then, with which we attain truth, and that truth must be something beyond the sensible world. Plainly, the mind cannot rely on the senses. But what else is there? The conclusion we are invited to reach is that the mind must rely on God.

One might try assimilating this line of thought to those passages where Augustine has in mind necessary a priori truths. But it is more natural to take this in a different way, as an account of how the mind goes beyond the sensible data to a grasp of the real essences of things. Accordingly, the theory of divine illumination would be put to two very different sorts of work in the later Middle Ages: as an account of a priori knowledge, and as an account of concept formation. Each account raises its own set of issues. Taken in the first way, divine illumination has to compete against the claim that the mind is naturally capable of grasping such truth. Taken in the second way, questions immediately arise about the nature of conceptual knowledge. Do essences (or properties in general) exist in the physical world? Do they exist only in the divine mind? Do the senses play any role in the process of concept formation? Later medieval philosophers would handle these issues in interestingly different ways.

4. Thirteenth-century Franciscans

Augustine’s position would remain ascendant among Christian philosophers for most of the Middle Ages. Thirteenth-century Franciscans, led by figures such as Bonaventure (c.1217–1274) and Matthew of Aquasparta (c.1237–1302), gave the theory a detailed and systematic defense, focusing on the changeability and hence uncertainty of the human mind and the sensory world (see Marrone 2001). Bonaventure characteristically argues,

Things have existence in the mind, in their own nature (proprio genere), and in the eternal art. So the truth of things as they are in the mind or in their own nature — given that both are changeable — is sufficient for the soul to have certain knowledge only if the soul somehow reaches things as they are in the eternal art (De scientia Christi, q.4 resp.).

Certain knowledge requires steadfast unchangeability. Since that can be found only in the divine mind, and since we have access to the divine mind only through illumination, certain knowledge requires illumination. (On the early thirteenth century see Faucher 2019; on Bonaventure see Solignac 2022.)

This line of argument came to seem increasingly old-fashioned as the thirteenth century progressed. The growing influence of Aristotle’s theory of cognition, as developed in particular by the Dominican friars Albert the Great (c.1200–1280) and his student, Thomas Aquinas (c.1225–1274), offered an impressive picture of how human beings might be able to achieve certain knowledge despite the changeability of mind and matter. These developments struck many Franciscans as a betrayal of Christianity. John Pecham (c.1225–1292), in a letter dating from 1285, writes

I do not in any way disapprove of philosophical studies, insofar as they serve theological mysteries, but I do disapprove of irreverent innovations in language, introduced within the last twenty years into the depths of theology against philosophical truth and to the detriment of the Fathers, whose positions are disdained and openly held in contempt.

Continuing, Pecham criticizes the doctrine

which fills the entire world with wordy quarrels, weakening and destroying with all its strength what Augustine teaches concerning the eternal rules and the unchangeable light…. (quoted in Gilson 1955, p.359).

At roughly the same time, Roger Marston (c.1235–1303) writes of those who, “drunk on the nectar of philosophy … twisted toward their own sense all of Augustine’s authoritative texts on the unchanging light and the eternal rules” (Quaestiones disputatae de anima 3 ad 30).

Marston’s view is particularly interesting because he proposes a synthesis of Augustine and Aristotle. On his view,

It is necessary to posit in our mind, beyond the phantasms or abstracted species, something by which we to some degree attain the unchanging truths. I believe this to be no different than the influence of the eternal light…. For the eternal light, irradiating the human mind, makes a certain active impression on it, from which a certain passive impression is left in it, which is the formal principle of cognizing the unchanging truths (De anima 3, p.263).

Rather than dismiss the agent intellect as superfluous, Marston follows Alexander of Aphrodisias et al. in treating the agent intellect as separate and divine — indeed, as God himself. Earlier in the thirteenth century, William of Auvergne (c.1180–1249) had in effect identified the agent intellect with God (The Soul 7.6; cf. Gilson 1926–27, pp.67–72). Such cases illustrate how the various medieval disputes over whether human beings might share a single intellect — so absurd on their face — are in fact simply alternative formulations of the dispute over divine illumination. But there were subtle differences among the various approaches. So whereas Auvergne largely turns his back on Aristotle, Marston is more accommodating. In addition to the divine agent intellect, he allows that each human being possesses its own agent intellect.

On Marston’s account, Aristotle and Augustine turn out to be entirely in harmony: each uses his own terminology to defend the same theory of divine illumination (De anima 3, p. 258). Étienne Gilson (1933) has characterized Marston’s position as an Avicennized Augustinianism (Augustinisme avicennisant). But this label prejudices the case in favor of Aquinas’s perspective: it assumes that Marston has been seduced by an Islamic misreading of Aristotle, and it closes off the possibility that Augustine and Aristotle might have more in common than is typically allowed.

The case of Peter John Olivi (1247/8–1298) demonstrates how precarious a position the illumination theory held by the 1280s. Olivi, a Franciscan whose work would eventually be condemned by his own order, presents a compelling critique of the Augustinian illumination theory (I Sent., q. 2), presenting his comments in the form of “cautions” (cavenda). The theory, he notes, is often very vague with respect to the actual process of illumination. And in running through the various possible accounts of the process available to a defender of the theory, Olivi appears to rule out every one. The eternal reasons cannot represent things distinctly and specifically, because then we would have no need of any sensory input. But if the eternal reasons give us information only of a general and indistinct sort, then at what level of generality? Does it supply us with information about species, or genera? If divine illumination is efficacious at any level, why do we seem to need the senses for all of our concepts? Olivi’s questions and cautions go on and on. But after laying an entire minefield of this sort for anyone who would defend divine illumination — at ad 6 he rejects the Augustinian argument set out above by Bonaventure — he nevertheless comes to the surprising conclusion that he accepts the theory:

These things, since I don’t know how to analyze them fully, I set out only as cautions. For although the stated position is in itself venerable (sollemnis) and sensible, it could nevertheless be quite dangerous to those who are not carefully supervised. And so I hold the stated position as it is, because it belongs to men who are highly venerable. Nevertheless I leave an exposition of the above to their wisdom (q. 2, pp. 512–13).

This was a favorite strategy of Olivi’s: to criticize a theory fiercely, exposing seemingly devastating difficulties, and then to embrace the theory anyway, as a pious gesture of respect. It’s hard to resist reading between the lines, and concluding that dusk was fast approaching for the theory of divine illumination.

5. Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas is often thought of as the figure most responsible for putting an end to the theory of divine illumination. Although there is some truth to this view, as we will see, it seems more accurate to regard Aquinas as one of the last defenders of the theory, as a proponent of innate Aristotelian illumination.

A vivid example of the way Aquinas moves from an Augustinian to an Aristotelian framework occurs in his Treatise on Human Nature (Summa theologiae 1a 75–89), where he considers the Augustinian claim that “pure truth should not be looked for from the senses of the body” (84.6 obj. 1). In reply, Aquinas invokes the Aristotelian agent intellect:

From those words of Augustine we are given to understand that truth is not entirely to be looked for from the senses. For we require the light of agent intellect, through which we unchangeably cognize the truth in changeable things, and we distinguish the things themselves from the likenesses of things (ad 1).

It is not at all clear, here or elsewhere, how the agent intellect carries out the two tasks he describes. (If Aquinas had given us a satisfactory account of this, he would have thereby solved two of the leading problems of epistemology.) But for present purposes it is enough to notice how Aquinas seems to replace Augustinian illumination with the Aristotelian agent intellect. Thus the traditional verdict has been that Aquinas replaced Augustine with Aristotle, and exchanged illumination for abstraction.

There is more to the story. In the immediately preceding article, Aquinas explicitly discusses Augustinian divine illumination, and reaches the affirmative conclusion that “the intellective soul does cognize all true things in the eternal reasons” (84.5sc). Often this affirmative conclusion gets treated as little more than lip service to the authority of Augustine, and the article as a whole gets taken as a backhanded repudiation of illumination theory: affirming the theory in form but denying it in substance. This is a misreading. Aquinas sees something important in Augustine’s theory, something worth preserving.

Aquinas does reject certain conceptions of divine illumination. He denies that human beings in this life have the divine ideas as an object of cognition. And he denies that divine illumination is sufficient on its own, without the senses. Neither of these claims was controversial. What Aquinas further denies, and what was controversial, was the claim that there is a special ongoing divine influence, constantly required for the intellect’s operation. Aquinas instead argues that human beings possess a sufficient capacity for thought on their own, without the need for any “new illumination added onto their natural illumination” (Summa theol. 1a2ae 109.1c). From one perspective this makes for an important difference between Aquinas and his Franciscan contemporaries. But from another perspective the difference seems slight, because Aquinas is by no means removing God from the picture. Here is how he expresses his endorsement of illumination theory:

It is necessary to say that the human soul cognizes all things in the eternal reasons, through participating in which we cognize all things. For the intellectual light that is in us is nothing other than a certain likeness of the uncreated light, obtained through participation, in which the eternal reasons are contained. Thus it is said in Psalm 4, Many say, Who shows us good things? To this question the Psalmist replies, saying The light of your face, Lord, is imprinted upon us. This is as if to say, through that seal of the divine light on us, all things are shown to us (Summa theol. 1a 84.5c).

There is some temptation to take all of this simply as an expression of Aquinas’s more general view that God is the first cause of all things. He writes, for instance,

All active created powers operate in virtue of being directed and moved by the Creator. So it is, then, that in all cognition of the truth, the human mind needs the divine operation. But in the case of things cognized naturally it does not need any new light, but only divine movement and direction (In de trinitate pro. 1.1c).

Here there seems to be nothing special about the intellect’s need for illumination. The intellect, like all of nature, needs God as its first mover. If you like, think of this as divine illumination. But viewed under this aspect, it is no wonder the theory was controversial. While his Franciscan contemporaries were insisting on a special role for God in human cognition, Aquinas seems to move as far in the opposite direction as his theism would permit.

But passages of this last kind are misleading, because Aquinas does see something especially mysterious about human cognition, and he appeals to God as a way of solving this mystery. The agent intellect, on Aquinas’s view, accounts for our capacity to grasp self-evident truths. We have an immediate and direct grasp of the truth of first principles, such as the principle of noncontradiction (see, e.g., Summa contra Gentiles II.83.1678). We do not infer the truth of this principle, we do not discover that it is true through any kind of induction. Instead we simply see its truth, as soon as we are confronted with an instance where it applies. This is not innate knowledge; we are not born knowing these principles. What we are born with is the capacity to recognize their truth as soon as we are confronted with instances of them. These first natural conceptions are “the seeds of all the things that are subsequently cognized” (De veritate 11.1 ad 5). In this sense, Aquinas is even willing to speak of the soul’s having a prior knowledge of everything that it knows:

The soul forms in itself likenesses of things inasmuch as, through the light of agent intellect, forms abstracted from sensible objects are made actually intelligible, so as to be received in the possible intellect. And so, in a way, all knowledge is imparted to us at the start, in the light of agent intellect, mediated by the universal concepts that are cognized at once by the light of agent intellect. Through these concepts, as through universal principles, we make judgments about other things, and in these universal concepts we have a prior cognition of those others. In this connection there is truth in the view that the things we learn, we already had knowledge of (De veritate 10.6c).

Because all of what we know can be traced back to these fundamental principles, there is a sense in which everything we learn, we already knew. An innate grasp of certain basic truths, recognized by the light of agent intellect, plays a crucial, foundational role.

The light of agent intellect is of course given to us from God — “a certain likeness of the uncreated light, obtained through participation” (1a 84.5c). Without appealing to God, Aquinas sees no way of explaining how we recognize the truth of first principles. Neither deductive nor inductive reasoning can account for the way in which we immediately see that such principles are true. This insight, then, is simply something we are given:

The light of this kind of reason, by which principles of this kind are known to us, is imparted to us from God. It is like a likeness of the uncreated truth reflecting in us. So, since no human teaching can be effective except in virtue of that light, it is clear that it is God alone who internally and principally teaches us (De veritate 11.1c).

The light of agent intellect, a likeness of the divine ideas, is the essential starting point for all knowledge.

Aquinas agrees with his Franciscan contemporaries that intellective cognition is incomplete without some sort of supernaturally infused insight. The only difference is that Aquinas wants that insight to be given all at once, from the start — bottled up within agent intellect, as we might think of it. His opponents, in contrast, think of illumination as an ongoing process, as necessary as the air we breathe. It is easy to see how, at the time, this difference might have seemed important. But from our present perspective the differences seem rather slight: they seem to be arguing simply over the means of transmission. Aquinas conceives of illumination as a deep well within us, whereas the Franciscans conceived of it as raining down in drops. (This is a summary of the account in Pasnau 2002, Chapter 10.)

6. Henry of Ghent

Although in a sense Thomas Aquinas defends a version of divine illumination, he in another sense clearly weakens the theory by giving it the status of an innate gift rather than ongoing patronage. In making for the agent intellect a central place in his theory of cognition, Aquinas has less room for illumination. As the thirteenth century progressed, philosophers and theologians were increasingly willing to make this tradeoff. While the Aristotelian theory of cognition waxed, the Augustinian theory of divine illumination waned. To combine the two seemed, in the words of Étienne Gilson (1930), “unproductive and even, in a sense, contradictory.”

It is this seemingly contradictory task that Henry of Ghent (c.1217–1293) took upon himself in the years immediately after Aquinas’s death. When Peter John Olivi remarked that he would accept the theory of illumination because it “belongs to men who are highly venerable” (sec. 4 above), he would have had in mind among others Henry of Ghent, who would indeed become known as the “Venerable Doctor” (Doctor solemnis). Ghent was neither Dominican nor Franciscan, but a so-called “secular” master at the University of Paris. His project was to defend an Aristotelian theory of cognition while at the same time reviving divine illumination in its traditional Augustinian form. To those, like Aquinas, who were arguing for the self-sufficiency of the human cognitive powers, Ghent replies,

this is true for natural things, as regards knowing what is true of the thing…. Pure truth, however, or any truth that must be cognized supernaturally, or perhaps any truth at all, cannot be known without God himself doing the teaching (Summa 1.7 ad 1).

On Ghent’s terminology, to know what is true of a thing is simply to have a veridical impression of it: to represent a thing as it is. To grasp the truth of a thing, in contrast, is to grasp its nature. Only this latter sort of cognition counts as knowledge in the strict sense, because only here are we getting at the unchanging reality of the material world.

For there is no knowledge of things insofar as they are external in effect, but insofar as their nature and quiddity is grasped by the mind (Summa 2.2 ad 1).

For knowledge of this kind, divine illumination is necessary.

Ghent’s argument is interestingly different from that of Augustine and his Franciscan followers. Whereas they had dismissed the physical world as too changeable to be a fit subject for human knowledge, Ghent believes that pure truth and certain knowledge can be had of the physical world, provided we manage to grasp the real essences of things. Since we cannot do so on our own, we need divine illumination to go beyond sensory appearances, to have genuine insight into the nature of reality. At its most basic level, Ghent is offering a critique of the agent intellect. Although he accepts the doctrine of agent intellect, he refuses to give that faculty the kind of efficacy that it has for Aquinas and other medieval Aristotelians. Not surprisingly, Ghent proposes reviving the earlier thirteenth-century tradition of referring to God himself as a kind of agent intellect (Quodlibet 9.15). The way Ghent would synthesize Augustine and Aristotle, in this area, is by identifying those aspects of Aristotle that are incomplete and supplementing them with the necessary Augustinian illumination. (This is a summary of the account in Pasnau 1995. All of Henry’s important initial article from his Summa on the possibility of knowledge is now available in a translation from Roland Teske.)

7. John Duns Scotus

It was the Franciscan John Duns Scotus, more than anyone else, who put an end to the theory of divine illumination. As Steven Marrone (2001) has shown in detail, there were various authors at the end of the thirteenth century who were ready to reject illumination. Indeed, Ghent himself gave illumination less and less attention in his later years. Still, it was Scotus who provided the most impressive and extensive philosophical alternative to illumination theory. (As John Boler remarked in correspondence, “as with Nixon’s trip to China, it probably could only be done by a Franciscan.” On the story from Bonaventure through Scotus see Adams 2022.) Scotus criticizes Ghent’s argument in detail (Ordinatio I.3.1.4), arguing against Ghent’s own arguments, against the skeptical consequences that would allegedly come from giving up divine illumination, and against the viability of such illumination in its own right. With respect to the last point, Scotus argues that if human cognition were fallible in the way Ghent argues, then outside illumination could not, even in principle, ensure “certain and pure knowledge.” On Ghent’s account, the human mind cooperates with the divine light in achieving such knowledge. Scotus replies:

When one of those that come together is incompatible with certainty, then certainty cannot be achieved. For just as from one premise that is necessary and one that is contingent nothing follows but a contingent conclusion, so from something certain and something uncertain, coming together in some cognition, no cognition that is certain follows (Ordinatio I.3.1.4 n. 221).

If one part of a system is fallible, then that fallibility infects the process of a whole. Scotus’s startling claim is that if the human mind were intrinsically incapable of achieving certain knowledge, then not even divine illumination could save it.

Scotus’s own view is that the human mind is capable of such knowledge on its own. If by “certain and pure truth” Ghent means “infallible truth, without doubt and deception,” then Scotus thinks he has established that human beings “can achieve this, by purely natural means” (Ord. I.3.1.4 n. 258). How can such a thing be established? How can the skeptic be refuted, without appealing to divine illumination? Scotus distinguishes four kinds of knowledge:

  • self-evident (principia per se nota)
  • inductive (cognita per experientiam)
  • introspective (cognoscibilia de actibus nostris)
  • sensory (ea quae subsunt actibus sensus)

The general strategy is to show that sensory knowledge rests on inductive knowledge, that inductive knowledge rests on self-evident knowledge, and that introspective knowledge can be defended as analogous to self-evident knowledge. Scotus’s implicit aim is to shift as much weight as possible onto the broad shoulders of self-evident knowledge.

For Scotus, the self-evident is the bedrock on which other sorts of knowledge rest, and so he does not attempt to locate some further set of even more basic truths. Instead, he argues that our self-evident knowledge is foolproof because of certain psychological facts. When one considers a proposition like Every whole is greater than its part, one immediately grasps that the terms are related in such a way that the proposition must be true:

There can be in the intellect no apprehension of the terms or composition of those terms without the conformity of that composition to the terms emerging (quin stet conformitas), just as two white things cannot arise without their likeness emerging (Ord. I.3.1.4 n. 230).

When we see two white objects we immediately grasp, “without doubt and deception,” their similarity to one another. Likewise, when we grasp a self-evident truth in our mind, we immediately grasp its truth. Of course, we won’t grasp the truth of the proposition if we don’t understand the meaning of the terms, but in that case we won’t have truly formed the proposition in our mind. And in contrast to the analogous case of recognizing similarity, there is no room for sensory error here. The senses help us acquire certain concepts, but once we have those concepts, the senses drop out of the picture — sensory reliability becomes irrelevant. Scotus offers the example of a blind man miraculously shown in his dreams an image of black and white. Once he acquires these concepts, he can recognize as truly and infallibly as anyone — his blindness notwithstanding — that white is not black (Ord. I.3.1.4 n. 234).

Scotus is unwilling to discard Augustinian illumination entirely, and so he articulates four senses in which the human intellect sees infallible truths in the divine light. In each sense, the divine light acts not on us but on the objects of our understanding. By giving objects their intelligibility (esse intelligibile), the divine intellect “is that in virtue of which secondarily the objects produced move the intellect in actuality” (Ord. I.3.1.4 n. 267). When the human mind grasps a self-evident truth, it does so immediately and infallibly not because the mind has received any special illumination, but because the terms of the proposition are themselves intelligible: our grasp of a proposition “seems to follow necessarily from the character of the terms, which character they derive from the divine intellect’s causing those terms to have intelligible being naturally” (Ord. I.3.1.4 n. 268). It is not that we are illuminated by the divine light, but that the truth we grasp is illuminated.

This marks a turning point in the history of philosophy, the first great victory for naturalism as a research strategy in cognitive theory. On Scotus’s account, when we grasp some conceptual truth, nothing miraculous or divine happens within us: “the terms, once apprehended and put together, are naturally suited (sunt nati naturaliter) to cause an awareness of the composition’s conformity with its terms” (Ord. I.3.1.4 n. 269). It is of course God that gives the world its intelligibility, just as it is God that creates our cognitive powers. But what is new in Scotus is the idea that the mind is not a special case. From this point forward, divine illumination would rarely be regarded as a serious philosophical possibility.

8. Epilogue

It is easy to miss the significance of what Scotus brought about: in part because it now seems so inevitable, in part because Scotus comes at the end of a gradual trend toward naturalism, and in part because until only recently it was generally supposed that nothing of much philosophical importance happened between Aristotle and Descartes. Yet if one looks at the big picture of our evolving philosophical/scientific understanding of the mind, then it is clear that something important happened at the end of the thirteenth century.

Still, Scotus’s impact should not be overstated. Although divine illumination, so called, would no longer have many prominent supporters, the tendency toward supernatural explanations of cognitive phenomena would survive well beyond the Renaissance. Descartes, to take one prominent example, can speak of “certain seeds of truth which are naturally in our souls” (Discourse on Method 6, AT VI:64), and of “ideas implanted in the intellect by nature” (Principles of Philosophy 2.3). In its details, the view is strikingly similar to Aquinas’s: Descartes identifies these ideas as the basis of our knowledge of first principles; he holds that the ideas themselves are formed only in virtue of sensory impressions; he identifies God as the ultimate source of these ideas. Moreover, if Descartes is playing Aquinas, in modern dress, then as Henry of Ghent we can cast Malebranche, who argues that “All our ideas must be located in the efficacious substance of the Divinity, which alone is intelligible or capable of enlightening us, because it alone can affect intelligences” (Search after Truth, p. 232). Malebranche’s remarkable view — in support of which he quotes Augustine — is that all our ideas are seen in God. This is illumination theory, all over again. But by the seventeenth century the philosophical context has changed so dramatically that these modern developments must be regarded as a different topic.


Primary Literature

  • Apuleius, De deo Socratis, in J. Beaujeu (ed.) Opuscules Philosophiques et Fragments, Paris: Société d’Édition “Les Belles Lettres”, 1973.
  • Aristotle, De anima, tr. C. Shields, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2016.
  • Augustine, Eighty-three different questions, tr. D.L. Mosher, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1982.
  • –––, Confessions, tr. T. Williams, Indianapolis: Hackett, 2019.
  • –––, Against the Academicians and The Teacher [=De magistro], tr. P. King, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1995.
  • Bonaventure, Disputed Questions on the Knowledge of Christ [=De scientia Christi], tr. Z. Hayes, St. Bonaventure: Franciscan Institute Press, 1992.
  • –––, Christ Our One Teacher, in Pasnau 2002, 79–92.
  • Descartes, René, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, tr. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Henry of Ghent, Quodlibeta, in Henrici de Gandavo Opera Omnia, Leiden: Brill, 1979–.
  • –––, Summa of Ordinary Questions: Article One. On the Possibility of Knowing, tr. R. J. Teske, South Bend, IN: St. Augustine’s Press, 2008.
  • –––, Summa quaestionum ordinariarum, in Henrici de Gandavo Opera Omnia, Leiden: Brill, 1979–. (Relevant portions are translated in Pasnau 2002, 93–135.)
  • John Duns Scotus Ordinatio I.3.1.4, in Allan Wolter (tr.), Philosophical Writings, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, The Search after Truth, tr. T. Lennon and P. Olscamp, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Matthew of Aquasparta, Quaestiones de fide et de cognitione q.2, in R. McKeon (tr.), Selections from Medieval Philosophers Vol.II: From Roger Bacon to William of Ockham, New York: Scribners, 1930.
  • Pasnau, Robert, Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts (Volume 3: Mind and Knowledge), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Peter John Olivi, Quaestiones in primum librum Sententiarum, in Quaestiones in secundum librum Sententiarum (Volume 3, Appendix), Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1926.
  • Plato, Complete Works, ed. J. M. Cooper, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
  • Roger Marston, Quaestiones disputatae, Florence: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1932.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Summa contra gentiles, tr. A. C. Pegis et al., Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1975.
  • –––, Summa theologiae tr. L. Shapcote, New York: Benzinger, 1947–48.
  • –––, Truth [=De veritate], tr. R. W. Mulligan, et al., Chicago: Henry Regnery, 1954.
  • –––, Faith, reason and theology [= In de trinitate 1–4], tr. A. Maurer, Toronto: Pontifical Institute, 1987.
  • William of Auvergne, The Soul, tr. R. J. Teske, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 2000.

Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, 2022. Housing the Powers: Medieval Debates about Dependence on God, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bealer, George, 2000. “A Theory of the A Priori,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 81: 1–30.
  • Bonjour, Laurence, 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brentano, Franz, 1992. “Nous Poiêtikos: Survey of Earlier Interpretations,” in M. Nussbaum and A. Rorty (eds.) Essays on Aristotle’s De Anima, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 313–41.
  • Connolly, Patrick J., 2015. “Henry of Ghent’s Argument for Divine Illumination Reconsidered,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 89: 47–68.
  • Destrée, Pierre and Nicholas D. Smith (eds.), 2005. Socrates’ Divine Sign: Religion, Practice and Value in Socratic Philosophy, Kelowna, BC: Academic Printing and Publishing.
  • Faucher, Nicholas, 2019. La volonté de croire au Moyen Âge: les théories de la foi dans la pensée scolastique du XIIIème siècle, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Gilson, Étienne, 1926–27. “Pourquoi Saint Thomas a critiqué Saint Augustin,” Archives D’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Age, 1: 5–127.
  • –––, 1930. “Réflexions sur la controverse: S. Thomas – S. Augustin” in Mélanges Mandonnet, Volume 1, Paris: Vrin.
  • –––, 1933. “Roger Marston: Un cas d’Augustinisme Avicennisant,” Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Age, 8: 37–42.
  • –––, 1955. History of Christian Philosophy in the Middle Ages, New York: Random House.
  • Gersh, Stephen, 1978. From Iamblichus to Eriugena: An Investigation of the Prehistory and Evolution of the Pseudo-Dionysian Tradition, Leiden: Brill.
  • Haldane, John, 1992. “Aquinas and the Active Intellect,” Philosophy, 67: 199–210.
  • Marrone, Steven, 2001. The Light of Thy Countenance: Science and Knowledge of God in the Thirteenth Century, Leiden: Brill.
  • Nasar, Sylvia, 1998. A Beautiful Mind, New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • Pasnau, Robert, 1995. “Henry of Ghent and the Twilight of Divine Illumination,” Review of Metaphysics, 49: 49–75.
  • –––, 2002. Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa theologiae 1a 75–89, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Perler, Dominik, 2006. Zweifel und Gewissheit: Skeptische Debatten im Mittelalter, Frankfurt: Klostermann.
  • Schumacher, Lydia, 2011. Divine Illumination: The History and Future of Augustine’s Theory of Knowledge, Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Solignac, Charlotte, 2022. Rayonnante humilité: l’amplitude de la lumière selon Bonaventure de Bagnoregio, Louvain-la-Neuve, Peeters.
  • Van Dyke, Christina, 2009. “An Aristotelian Theory of Divine Illumination: Robert Grosseteste’s Commentary on the Posterior Analytics,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17: 685–704.
  • Walbridge, John, 2005. “Suhrawardi and Illuminationism,” in P. Adamson and R. C. Taylor (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 201–23.

Other Internet Resources

  • Corpus Thomisticum. The best place to go for scholarly information about Thomas Aquinas.
  • Provisionalia. An attempt at an exhaustive survey of medieval scholastic authors and their works, including information on editions and translations.
  • Medieval Philosophy Digital Resources. A collection of much useful information on Internet resources for medieval philosophy.


This entry has benefited greatly from suggestions by Marilyn Adams, Jenny Ashworth, John Boler, Peter King, Gyula Klima, Neil Lewis, Tim Noone, Sarah Pessin, Christopher Shields, and John Wippel.

Copyright © 2024 by
Robert Pasnau <pasnau@colorado.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free