Personal Relationship Goods

First published Tue Sep 4, 2018; substantive revision Tue Oct 4, 2022

Over the past decades, political philosophers and applied ethicists have been increasingly interested in the value of personal relationships. The goods they generate—or, perhaps, of which they consist—are obviously important, both instrumentally and non-instrumentally, for how well individuals’ lives go on various accounts of what makes a life good: They are highly desired by most people, can bring a lot of pleasure and joy and, at least some of them—such as friendship or love—have objective value. More recently, these goods have also been said to be relevant to determining individuals’ duties and even rights. In particular, there are several reasons to be concerned with their distribution: Personal relationship goods represent a significant and non-substitutable component of individuals’ well-being, are a significant kind of personal resource as well as a major determinant of individuals’ opportunities.

It seems important to ensure that all individuals enjoy these goods to a sufficient, or perhaps equal, degree. Theories of justice—which have for a long time been mostly preoccupied with the distribution of material goods—started to show interest in the distribution of personal relationship goods. And yet, the claims that there are duties of justice to distribute them and that states are (amongst) the bearers of such duties raise several problems.

1. Preliminary Distinctions

Here, “relationship goods” refers to those goods of constitutive (as well as, often, instrumental) value that accrue to individuals in virtue of them being in relationships with other people, and that could not be enjoyed outside relationships. Examples include companionship, affection, intimacy, attachment, love, friendship, empathy, social respect, solidarity, trust. The distinction between relationships and some of the relationship goods identified here may be purely analytical: Relationships partly consist of these goods, as they would not exists—or would not be the kind of relationships they are—in the absence of these “goods”. To some extent, our language bears witness to this: we use “love” or “friendship” both in order to refer to types of relationships and to refer to the things that individuals “get” out of relationships. Therefore, talking about relationship goods—as well as about distributing them—is artificial, yet helpful for the purpose of the present normative analysis.

One sub-category of relationship goods that has received philosophical attention recently are familial relationship goods: these are relationship goods that accrue to individuals in virtue of them being in an adequate parent-child relationship (Macleod 2002; Brighouse & Swift 2014). They include things such as providing authoritative care for a child, the special spontaneous love and intimacy that (it has been argued) is only possible between a child and a parental figure, and a sense of continuity with the past and the future that is created by being part of a family. Another example of relationship goods are political relationship goods: These are relationship goods that accrue to individuals in virtue of them being in political relationships with each other (personal or not)—for instance with co-citizens or co-nationals, fellow members of the same political organization such as a party or a trade union. Examples include voting rights, social respect, social trust, social solidarity, as well as those goods that are the focus of relational egalitarianism—a strand of egalitarianism interested in how we relate to each others as equals—such as respect, recognition, inclusion, and community (Honneth 1992; Wolff 1998; Anderson 1999; Young 1990; Gheaus 2018).

The subject of this entry is a large sub-class of relationship goods, “personal relationship goods”; they accrue to individuals in virtue of them being in relationships that involve some kind of direct, personalized interaction—for instance with friends, family members, neighbors, colleagues, people who are active in the same political or social movement, or even strangers with whom one gets into direct contact that is substantial enough to be personal. Relationships that don’t qualify for this description are often anonymous interactions, like one-off interactions with a clerk or a mall employee often are. People involved in some personal relationships may also stand in a political relationship, and then the goods realized in the relationships are also political. Examples are the personalized trust, solidarity or loyalty that can bind individuals who relate directly to each other as part of a political movement. Other such goods are personal relationship goods realized in non-political relationships. Examples are companionship, affection, attention, sympathy, encouragement, acceptance or loyalty and trust that one gives and receives qua part of a personal relationship.

Examples of relationship goods that are not personal relationship goods are social solidarity—expressed through the existence of a social security net—social inclusion—expressed, for instance, in anti-discrimination laws—or voting rights. One can enjoy these goods even in the absence of direct, personal encounters with other individuals.

Because the scope of this entry includes goods that are realized in relationships that are personal but not close, or intimate, this definition of relationship goods is wider than that implicit in Chiara Cordelli’s notion of relational resources. These are resources made available through

intimate relationships such as relationships of familial love, friendship, and kinship, as well as non-intimate relationships between colleagues, neighbors, members of voluntary associations, and participants in a common social network

but not through

the more abstract relation of political citizenship. (Cordelli 2015a: 90)

At the same time, it is a narrower understanding of relational goods than other notions discussed in recent literature (Seglow 2013), which include relationship goods that do not flow from personal, but from more anonymous, relationships such as those between co-citizens.

“Personal relationship goods in general” are personal relationship goods that are accessible to, valuable for, and possibly owed to people of any age. For the purpose of this entry, “personal relationship goods for children” are personal relationship goods that have only been said to be owed to children.

The main philosophical issue raised by personal relationship goods is the following: They are highly valuable for all individuals (in ways explained below) both non-instrumentally and instrumentally. And they are especially important for children, because they are essential for their survival, for flourishing qua children and for developmental reasons. For these reasons, it is clear that personal relationships generate weighty reasons for action. The main task of practical philosophers is then to see how weighty these reasons are, and, in particular, whether personal relationship goods also generate moral duties: Are there any duties to ensure people enjoy (opportunities to) them? And if so, are some of these duties duties of justice? Are they enforceable as in a) feasible to enforce and b) legitimate to enforce? And what kind of measures can states take to ensure a fairer distribution of these goods?

2. Personal Relationship Goods in General

Two bodies of philosophical work, on the ethics of care and on associative duties, are centered around the normative significance of personal relationship goods and the moral and political issues they raise.

2.1 The Ethics of Care

An influential strand of feminist ethics developed over the past four decades, the ethics of care, is one area of philosophy that implicitly recognizes personal relationship goods because “care” is, itself, a main relationship good which has been claimed to play a central role in moral, and, more recently, in political thinking.

Perhaps the best way to individuate the ethics of care is as a strand of ethics concerned with the meeting of the needs of others within personal relationships (Tronto 1993). But “care” is used in feminist ethics to refer to slightly different things (Collins 2015). The reference to needs is the common link between different accounts of the proper subject-matter of the ethics of care. (In this entry, “needs” and “important interests” are used interchangeably). The ethics of care is, first, about a type of work, or labor, as when someone is said to “take care of” someone else in situations like nursing a baby or looking after an ill person. Some care ethicists ascribe special, if not exclusive, moral value to caring for those individuals who cannot meet the needs in question themselves (Bubeck 1995). This meaning often extends to a wider range of activities such as education or physical and mental health care. According to a second view, the ethics of care is about close relationships between persons, based on a special emotional bond and including a commitment to each other’s wellbeing (Ruddick 1998). Much of the ethics of care—at least in early stages—has focused on close personal relationships such as mothering or friendship; the assumption here is that caring meets the need for bonding, or attachment (Gheaus 2009: 64). In a third way, “care” is understood as a disposition to behave in certain ways: to be attentive and sensitive to other people’s needs and willing to help them. In this sense, “care” is a virtue, and the ethics of care a form of virtue ethics. As a virtue, care is a general attitude, opposed to callousness and indifference to the needs of others.

Whether understood as an activity, relationship or disposition geared towards meeting needs, care has been attributed universal moral value. Many care ethicists were interested in the crucial role of care-giving for agency and for individual and species survival. First, without receiving care within relationships, infants are unlikely to survive, let alone thrive (Ruddick 1989). Moreover, care is necessary for the coming into existence of persons: it is only within relationships with good care-givers that children can acquire moral knowledge and dispositions and, ultimately, full agency (Held 1993). Similarly, some care ethicists argue that friendship is necessary for developing a rich sense of autonomy, since friends give us the most direct access to particular values and conceptions of the good (Friedman 1993) Second, as Eva Kittay argues, care has universal value because most individuals require it to different degrees at different moments throughout their lives beyond infancy or childhood: some of us only during illness and old age, while others—people who are chronically ill or disabled—more or less continuously (Kittay 1999).

Because it is necessary for the creation of persons, care ethicists have claimed that care is more basic to morality than rights and duties, since in its absence most rights are useless. Care being so basic to our survival and flourishing provides a presumptive reason to assume there are duties to ensure that everyone receives sufficient care. It is difficult to determine what some care ethicists think about such a duty, because the ethics of care has, at least in the beginning, been coined in opposition to the language of rights and duties (Gilligan 1982; Noddings 1984). More generally, much of the ethics of care arose from a skepticism concerning moral principles (Collins 2015). Thus, the question of whether we have a general duty of beneficence to extend our care to those who seem to be left out has not received much attention (but for a recent exception see Collins 2013).

More recently, care ethicists interested in theories of distributive justice have defended the view that care is one of the goods whose distribution should concern us. This means that we ought to shape institutions to ensure that everyone receives care in accordance to the demands of justice. Kittay proposed a principle of distributing care that regulates both the giving and the receiving of care:

To each according to his or her need for care, from each according to his or her capacity for care, and such support from social institutions as to make available resources and opportunities to those providing care, so that all will be adequately attended in relations that are sustaining. (Kittay 1999: 113)

Similarly, Daniel Engster (2007) believes that care is the core of morality: because human dependency is universal, individuals have a moral duty to care for others as well as a moral right to receive care when they cannot meet the relevant needs themselves. The duty is to give care, when possible, directly; but, because uncoordinated individuals cannot ensure that everyone receives adequate care, governments should take on the responsibility to organize it such that it reaches all individuals in times of need.

A new wave of philosophical work (reviewed in section 3) looks more closely at the goods that are uniquely available through personal relationships, including relationships based on care, and provides a variety of reasons why there may be duties to provide these goods. Most of these views have a particular interest in reasons why the distribution of (access to) these goods is a matter of justice.

2.2 Material and Non-Material Needs

Because of their central concern with meeting needs, care ethicists have identified different goods generated by different types of caring relationships; for instance, according to Ruddick, the three main aims of mothering are to protect the child from physical harm, to foster her physical, emotional and intellectual growth and to socialize her (Ruddick 1989). To fulfill such aims, and especially the second two, one has to provide a mix of material and non-material care-giving. Care ethicists in general have not operated with the distinction between material and non-material care-giving. This distinction is crucial for establishing which are the goods that can be uniquely realized in caring, and, more generally, in personal relationships. And some have proposed definitions of care that indirectly exclude some of the personal relationship goods from the scope of care. For instance, according to Engster, care is

everything we do directly to help individuals to meet their vital biological needs, develop or maintain their basic capabilities, and avoid or alleviate unnecessary or unwanted pain and suffering, so that they can survive, develop and function in society. (Engster 2007: 29)

This implies that meeting some of the psychological needs of an adult friend—those related to flourishing rather than with avoiding suffering—may not qualify as care.

Yet, material care-giving may be available outside any (personal) relationship: for instance, robots can actually or conceivably provide it. It is likely that the goods that require only material care-giving can be realized outside any relationship with people and therefore are not personal relationship goods. Note that the distinction between material and non-material care-giving does not overlap with that between material and non-material needs: It may take some non-material care-giving in order to meet a material need—if, for instance, it turned out that physical health and normal development depends in part on providing emotional nurturance. Further, it might matter non-materially that some material needs are supplied by a person rather than a robot.

It is normatively important whether some non-material care-giving, too, can be given outside relationships—for instance, whether robots can successfully be used to meet the psychological needs that are usually met by those who relate to us within caring relationships. Some argue that we should use robots to make certain kinds of emotional care-giving available—for instance, to ensure that elderly people living alone (usually in highly atomized societies) have access to robot-provided companionship (Aronson 2014). However, one can plausibly assume that no robot can provide genuine companionship, which requires access to another individual’s mind. (At least, as Brake (2017) notes, unless and until we will have developed true artificial intelligence.) The same is true for other personal relationship goods—attention, affection, sympathy, encouragement etc.—which are necessary to meet psychological needs. Therefore, of the senses of “care” outlined above, the most relevant for personal relationship goods is that of caring relationships (see also Brake 2017).

2.3 Personal Relationships: Reasons, Duties and Goods

The interest in how personal relationships and the goods they produce generate reasons has given rise to a large and growing body of literature outside the ethics of care (Scheffler 2001; Kolodny 2003; Keller 2013; Seglow 2013). Our reasons to be partial towards our close associates often take the form of prima facie duties. Unlike some of the care ethicists (Noddings 2002), its authors do not assume that (close) personal relationships are the paradigm of the rest of morality. Rather, they start from the observation that people have special permissions towards, and owe special duties to, those with whom they are in personal relationships, such as friends, spouses, or family members. Often such duties are called associative duties. (Although it is also possible that the reasons generated by personal relationships are not moral reasons, in which case they do not generate moral duties; for an argument why not all good reasons are moral reasons see Susan Wolf 1992).

There is a debate over whether or not all associative duties can be reduced to impartial duties. One plausible interpretation is that we all have a general duty to protect the vulnerable and those with whom we stand in personal relationships are unusually vulnerable to us; and we have powerful consequentialist reasons to welcome the formation of personal relationships—and hence the generation of associative duties—in order to solve coordination problems (Goodin 1985). A common complaint about reductionist, or impartial, theories is that they are self-effacing (Keller 2013; Collins 2013): it seems appropriate for the agent who is subject to the duty to be motivated by their attitude towards the individual to whom the duty is owed, or maybe by the value of the relationship, rather than by impartial considerations.

Assuming associative duties are indeed irreducible to impartial duties, what is their ground? Most prominent families of accounts point to personal projects, to the value the relationship or the value of the person to whom the duty is being owed (for a recent critical discussion see Keller 2013). On the first kind of view, agents’ ground projects—that is, fundamental commitments that are closely connected to their practical identity—give rise to reasons (Williams 1981), and possibly duties, and some personal relationships are amongst these projects. According to another view, projects are not morally appropriate grounds for associative duties; rather, associative reasons respond to the value of the person with whom one has a personal relationship (Keller 2013). But strangers have the same moral value as our associates; this account will struggle to explain why we only have reasons of partiality towards those with whom we are in relationships. Finally, perhaps the most widespread family of views justifies associative duties as grounded in the non-instrumental value of relationships (Scheffler 2001; Seglow 2013), or in their final value (Kolodny 2003), or in their moral goodness (Jeske 2008). According to some philosophers, moreover, the value of some personal relationships is partly constituted by parties living up to their associative duties (Raz 1989; Brighouse & Swift 2014). One version of this view, that is particularly interesting for this entry, is Jonathan Seglow’s appeal to relationship goods in order to justify associative duties (Seglow 2013). Seglow argues that the most plausible way of interpreting the claim that relationships generate duties on account of their value is to see how the relationships contribute to the flourishing of the people involved. And this, in turn, is best understood in terms of the goods uniquely made possible by relationships such as friendships, parent-child relationships and membership in various associations. According to Seglow, personal relationship goods are distinctive to these relationships: for instance parents and children owe each other love, co-citizens owe each other respect, etc.

Note that there is also logical space for the possibility that some associative duties exist independently from the value of the relationship, for pragmatic reasons, while others, which some have called pure associative duties, exist in virtue of the non-instrumental value of the relationship (Macleod 2010a).

The existence and weight of personal relationship goods is widely acknowledged irrespective of one’s position on these debates, namely whether one thinks that (a) personal relationships generate associative duties or merely (non-moral) reasons, (b) associative duties are reducible to impartial duties or not and (c) associative reasons are grounded in personal projects, the value of individuals to whom the duty is being owed, or the value of the relationship. Obviously, some goods that are crucial for most people’s wellbeing can only exist due to human beings’ relational nature: friendship, love, emotional care, attention, affection, company etc.

Personal relationship goods are not always easy to individuate. This is illustrated in debates about one particular personal relationship, and the good that it generates, namely love—a topic that has received much recent philosophical interest. Love is a form of valuing another individual, whether as an appropriate response to her value (Velleman 1999) or by bestowing value on her through the relationship with the beloved (Frankfurt 2004), perhaps by creating a common history between the individuals in the relationship (Kolodny 2003, 2010). In either case, love has been said to depend on, or even be constituted by, other personal relationship goods. On David Velleman’s (1999) account, according to which love is an appraisal of value, an ability to pay special attention to some individuals to whom one is willing to become vulnerable is what makes possible love for particular individuals. Others, too, think that loving consists in directing one’s attention in order to attend to the valuable features of the beloved (Jollimore 2011) and some of Velleman’s philosophical predecessors, such as Iris Murdoch, believed that attention is the very essence of love and claimed that “Love is the extremely difficult realization that something other than oneself is real” (Murdoch 1959: 51). On this view, love seems to respond to a need to be seen by others, to be known as one really is rather than be a mere pretext for other individuals’ projections. An alternative view identifies love as a form of robust concern, or care, for the beloved, for her own sake (Soble 1990; LaFollette 1996; Frankfurt 1999).

The existence of personal relationship goods and of the reasons that flow from personal associations create several moral problems: One is to explain why it is justified to display partiality towards some individuals, given the standard assumption that morality requires us to treat people impartially. The various accounts of associative reasons/duties outlined at the beginning of this section grapple with this problem.

A second problem is that it seems morally objectionable, and possibly wrong, that people do not benefit equally from personal relationships and the goods they generate. Some people are lonely, out of no choice or fault of their own; and those who do enjoy (good) personal relationships have partners who can be very unequally resourceful and/or invested in the relationship. This is a distributive objection (Scheffler 2001), and it obtains independently from the truth about the existence and nature of associative duties. However, if we do have associative duties towards our near and dear, rather than mere reasons to bestow personal relationship goods onto them, the inequalities and unfairness are even more evident. Personal relationship goods have both instrumental and non-instrumental value (the next section unpacks these different kinds of value and the way it bears on matters of justice). To illustrate, love is non-instrumentally valuable to the beloved, and it also allows the beloved to enjoy other desirable things—such as pleasure, or the advantages of having someone who knows her well and who is motivated to serve her interests. Therefore, the enjoyment of functional loving relationships makes one better off. Further, some of the benefits that loving relationships bestow on the beloved can have a positional aspect—that is, they give the beloved a competitive edge over others when it comes to opportunities for goods that are external to the relationship. For instance, the formal and informal education that loving and resourceful parents give to their children do not merely make these children better off than they would otherwise be; but, because they place them in more advantageous positions in the competition for the social goods, they render children who do not benefit from loving and/or resourceful parents worse off (Brighouse & Swift 2006).

The distributive objection provides support to the belief that there are moral duties to try and associate with those who don’t yet benefit from close relationships in order to give them an opportunity to enjoy various personal relationship goods (Collins 2013) or to create the social conditions in people are likely to form valuable relationships (as surveyed in section 6).

3. The Value of Personal Relationship Goods

Personal relationship goods have been argued to have constitutive value, as explained in 3.1. Maybe even more obviously, they are valuable as instrumental to various important ends, explored by subsections 3.2 to 3.7. Philosophers advance arguments proceeding from the particular kinds of value of personal relationship goods to the conclusion that there are duties to provide them. In some cases, they may generate duties of justice and individual entitlements.

3.1 Constitutive Value

One of the main insights of the ethics of care is that some goods that are only available through close personal relationships are essential for any flourishing life. Other philosophers have, more recently, defended more specific claims.

First, personal relationship goods realized in close relationships are constitutive of good lives (Liao 2006; Lynch et al. 2009; Gheaus 2009, 2017; Brownlee 2013, 2016a). This is perhaps most obvious for those goods that have an affective quality (that is, most of them). The largest longitudinal study in adult development to date (Vaillant 2012) indicates that personal relationships are—most likely thanks to the goods they generate—indispensable to subjective life satisfaction (but also positively correlated with other valuable outcomes such as longevity and health—see 3.2). And an extensive study conducted by a team of philosophers and sociologists in Ireland revealed that close relationships and the unique goods they generate are for many adults the most important component of their life plans, or at least more important than other forms of advantage (Lynch et al. 2009). For children, too, some personal relationship goods, especially those available in parent-children relationships, are constitutive of good lives: it is hard to see how a good childhood could be (entirely) devoid of loving care from parental figures, kindness from adults in general and friendship with peers. Familial relationship goods—including the special sort of intimacy between parents and children and the unique fiduciary responsibility of parents—have also been said to be constitutive of (most) potential parents’ full flourishing (Brighouse & Swift 2014). On this latter account, the goods have constitutive value in an objective sense.

Further personal relationship goods that are political may contribute in a constitutive way to good, or flourishing, lives (Brownlee 2013: 200; Gheaus 2018). These goods include non-discrimination, non-marginalization and non-domination by fellow citizens with whom we stand in personal relationships, such as those with whom we work in political organizations or with whom we repeatedly share public spaces.

Because personal relationship goods are part and parcel of good lives, some believe we have duties to extend our friendship to others if we can (Collins 2013). Onora O’Neill (1988) thinks that adults have a fundamental duty to be kind and cheerful towards children, and involved in their lives, but perhaps the duty could be extended to all individuals. The duty is, originally, incomplete, or imperfect—that is, not owed to all children and up to the agent to judge when to exercise. O’Neill acknowledges that part of the duty can become perfect—and its recipients can acquire corresponding rights—through institutionalization, which is what happens when children are being taken into care; but she doubts that all the moral duties associated with the roles of parent, teacher or social worker can be institutionalized. More generally, one view is that duties with respect to at least some of the personal relationship goods are matters of benevolence rather than justice, and that attempts to institutionalize them would be particularly stigmatizing or otherwise self-defeating (Gheaus 2009; Valentini 2016). Another, possibly compatible, view, defended by Kimberley Brownlee is that the provision of some personal relationship goods is a matter of justice when they are constitutive of minimally good lives. Specifically, her claim is that there is a human right to the unconditional provision of enough opportunities for decent interpersonal contact (Brownlee 2013, forthcoming). With respect to familial relationship goods, Harry Brighouse and Adam Swift (2014) argue that adults who would make adequate parents are owed an opportunity to enjoy the goods of intimate, caring and authoritative relationships with children.

3.2 Survival, Health and Development

First and foremost, personal relationship goods are necessary for minimally functional lives (Kittay 1999; Liao 2006; Gheaus 2009; Brownlee 2013, 2016a). As already noted, a foundational claim of the ethics of care is that all individuals go through periods of vulnerability—most notably childhood—during which they cannot survive, let alone flourish, without the care of another human being. Relying on empirical research, Brownlee (2013) extends a similar claim to people of all ages. She argues that chronic lack of adequate social contact

generates the same threat response as pain, thirst, hunger, or fear by setting off a chain of anxiety-inducing physiological reactions known as the ‘fight or flight’ response. (p. 211)

and leads to a host of physical and mental health problems such as high blood pressure, obesity, diminished immunity, alcoholism, suicidal tendencies and depression. Adequate social contact, in this context, includes ongoing relationships that are not (significantly) abusive or neglectful and that provide psychological support and acceptance. Not only children’s health, and that of individuals who are ill or disabled, but everybody’s, depends on being in some personal relationship(s). Further, she claims, individuals’ emotional, linguistic, and social abilities also depend on enough social contact.

Brownlee argues that, because “when we are deprived of adequate social connections … we tend to break down mentally, emotionally, and physically” (2016a: 55), we have rights to the provision of those personal relationship goods that make minimally adequate lives possible. A group of personal relationship goods that has obvious instrumental value are those realized in very close caring relationships. It is difficult to dispute that some such goods, including affection, companionship, emotional care, attention, encouragement and so on contribute to other aspects of individuals’ wellbeing. More controversially, Matthew Liao argues—relying on empirical sources—that lack of love threatens the physical, psychological and social development of children and therefore entitles them to love (Liao 2006, 2015; Cowden 2012a). (The alleged duty to love children is more fully discussed in section 4).

3.3 Autonomy

Certain personal relationship goods have been argued to be instrumentally valuable in a way that provides a direct reason for their universal provision: If we cannot develop autonomy without enjoying some of these goods, and if we owe individuals help to develop and preserve their autonomy, then all individuals are entitled to the personal relationship goods necessary for autonomy.

As we have seen, with respect to children the argument is straightforward: it is difficult to see how one could acquire moral responsibility, and eventually become fully autonomous, without close and ongoing relationships with moral mentors. As Virginia Held argues, it is the work of parents to create persons (Held 1993). But adults, too, have been said to require enough decent human constant in order to maintain their autonomy: if social deprivation is likely to seriously erode mental health, then it will eventually also undermine autonomy (Brownlee 2013). One illustration, often discussed by Brownlee (2013, forthcoming), is that of prisoners held in isolation who sometimes end up preferring brutal interaction with interrogators to continued forced solitude. Even less than minimally decent relationships seem desirable compared to the mental suffering, and eventual psychological disintegration provoked by complete social isolation.

3.4 Necessary to Secure Other Rights

If, as the arguments in subsection 3.2. and 3.3. indicate, some personal relationship goods are essential for survival and health and for developing autonomy, then they are also necessary in order to ensure the securing of various (human) rights. This at least will be the case on the interest theory of rights (Brownlee 2013, forthcoming): If rights protect powerful interests, and if we have powerful interests in surviving, in opportunities to preserve our health, and to pursue our (reasonable) conception of life etc., then our social needs have to be met for our rights to be respected. She concludes this is a reason to believe that we also have an even more urgent right to those personal relationship goods that are necessary in order to stay alive, remain healthy, develop, and have the physical and psychological conditions necessary to pursue any life plans.

Note that the same logic could apply to a theory focused on individuals’ entitlements to certain capabilities or functionings, rather than to a theory of human rights. Martha Nussbaum (2000; 2011: 33–34), for instance, believes that some of the core capabilities to which we all have a claim of justice are capabilities for affiliation and emotion. If, indeed, being affiliated and enjoying the capacity of forming attachments with others are preconditions for achieving other capabilities—such as bodily health, practical reasoning, or play—then the former are more basic. Similarly, on one view (Wolff & de-Shalit 2007), some forms of advantage are “fertile”, in the sense that their achievement either conditions or makes more likely the achievement of other forms of advantage. In this sense, personal relationship goods are “fertile”, provided that the above arguments concerning their instrumental value are correct.

3.5 Primary Goods as All-Purpose Goods

Several arguments support the conclusion that certain personal relationship goods are akin to primary goods in the sense that John Rawls gives to this term: that is, goods whose distribution is a concern of justice. A first reason is that some personal relationship goods are all-purpose: whatever else one may want, one will need these goods in order to pursue one’s conception of a worthwhile life (Kittay 1999; Brake 2017; Cordelli 2015a, 2015b).

As Elizabeth Brake (2017) notes, not all goods that are necessary for the pursuit of any life plan are properly conceived of as primary goods:

being normally needed for the pursuit of plans of life and the development and exercise of the moral powers are necessary, not sufficient conditions, for inclusion on the list of primary goods. After all, oxygen, water, and food are ineliminable to survival, but they are not included on the list of primary goods. (p. 138)

However, as she further notes, while individuals can buy various care services, especially those concerning the meeting of material needs, they cannot buy caring relationships. This means that the implementation of just distributions of other goods cannot ensure that all individuals will have proper access to personal relationship goods. Brake’s example is that of elderly individuals living alone, with little mobility and without any social relations, for whom no level of material wealth alone can provide adequate conditions for forging caring relationships. If we cannot obtain (opportunities to enjoy) personal relationship goods in exchange for money, and if these goods are all-purpose goods, then there is a Rawlsian case for including them on the agenda of justice (Brake 2017). (Note that, under certain conditions, this could also qualify oxygen and clean water as primary goods.)

3.6 Primary Goods as Necessary for the Two Moral Powers

Some philosophers (Brake 2017; Cordelli 2015a) claim that certain personal relationship goods are akin to Rawlsian primary goods because they are necessary to develop the two moral powers of persons: a sense of justice and the capacity for a conception of the good. If so, this is a second Rawlsian argument for them. It appears different from the argument in the previous section, since some goods may be all-purpose, yet not strictly necessary for developing the two moral powers (for example, money).

In this sense, one way in which some personal relationships goods are relevant is because of their role in self-formation and, more or less directly, in the acquisition of self-respect. Not only care ethicists (Held 1993), but also contemporary philosophers influenced by Hegel have noted this; the latter elaborated on the Hegelian idea that we gain self-consciousness only through a process of mutual recognition. This insight has been applied to various contexts. The child’s subjectivity is shaped within her the relationship with her primary care-givers—including her identity alongside various categories such as gender and her future (in)ability to relate to others as equals, in non-dominating ways (Benjamin 1988). Through relationships in which they receive other people’s recognition, individuals gain self-confidence, self-respect and self-esteem (Honneth 1992, 1995: ch. 5). If this is correct, and if the social bases of self-respect is a primary good—as Rawls (1971) definitely believed—this is another reason to think that access to some personal relationship goods is a matter of justice.

Within analytical political philosophy, Brake (2017) noted that the goods uniquely created by caring relationships are usually necessary at all stages of life in order to exercise the two moral powers. This is very likely, given their role in maintaining mental health; but perhaps even when personal relationship goods are not necessary for mental health, they are required for maintaining as sense of justice and revising life plans, as suggested by Cordelli:

many relational resources should count as primary goods … because they secure those conditions of support, stability, and the self-confidence that foster the development and maintenance of the first moral power over time. Further, relational resources also play a relevant role in helping individuals revise their life plans. (Cordelli 2015a: 97)

3.7 Primary Goods as Necessary for Equality of Opportunity

If they have the instrumental value attributed to them by the above arguments, then it is plausible that universal enjoyment of personal relationship goods is also necessary in order to ensure (fair) equality of opportunity. This is a third Rawlsian argument for being concerned with their distribution. Some argue that a minimum of social resources are necessary for an individual to enjoy equal opportunities (Cordelli 2015b) and that “[s]ocial deprivation conflicts with equality of opportunity” (Brownlee 2013, 214). And some egalitarians noted that the quality of personal, micro-interactions between parents and children are an important determinant of children’s future opportunities (Swift 2003; Brighouse & Swift 2009, 2014); presumably, some of the influencing of future opportunities is due to the benefits in motivation and self-confidence that come with being well loved and emotionally cared for by one’s parents.

Some philosophers sympathetic to the aim of including personal relationship goods on the agenda of justice deny that the principle of equal opportunities to positions of advantage – like good jobs – requires that all adults enjoy certain relationship goods, like those uniquely available through marriage. Brake (2017) illustrates this claim with the case of gay people who can have equal opportunities for advantageous jobs without having access to marriage. It seems, however, that, if the arguments at 3.2 are correct, some decent social contact that goes beyond occasional social interactions with strangers is necessary for mental health and hence also for equality of opportunity. Further, if the principle of fair equality of opportunity applies to all positions of advantage, it should also apply to marriage.

4. Personal Relationship Goods for Children

Some personal relationship goods have been said to be especially important, and possibly owed only to, children. Alternatively, some of them may be owed to children in a more robust way than they are owed to adults—as outcomes to children and as mere opportunities to adults (Macleod 2010b; Lindblom 2018). Children can fully enjoy these goods only if they are well cared for; and some of these goods—discussed below—are themselves personal relationship goods.

During childhood, personal relationship goods are instrumental to the good life of children in two ways: by allowing them to enjoy good health and pleasure during childhood and, due to their developmental role, by contributing to their future adult flourishing, including their future ability to relate to others (Vaillant 2012). Because of this double aspect, conflicts are in principle possible between allowing children to enjoy personal relationship goods in ways that maximize childhood wellbeing versus allowing them to enjoy these goods in ways that optimize the wellbeing of the future adult (Hannan 2018). For instance, it is possible that it is best for a child qua child to enjoy as much time as possible in playful interaction with loving adults, while for the future adult it may be more instrumentally valuable to use the time for honing competitive abilities. An interesting possibility, so far unexplored by normative theorists, is that personal relationship goods are also of developmental value for adults. Given that we are capable of some degree of psychological development throughout our lives—or, in neurobiological terms, some degree of brain plasticity—it is possible that enjoying the goods of personal relationships can help foster psychological development during adulthood. For the purpose of this section, the assumption is that the goods discussed below are of particularly high value to children thanks to their developmental role, and that childhood is a period of life which is developmentally special, thus requiring that we pay special attention to developmental goods.

4.1 The Right to Familial Relationship Goods

It is undeniable that children have claims with respect to their wellbeing against adults—whether collectively or specifically against their parents—and many think these are claims of justice. Brighouse and Swift (2014) influentially defend the institution of the family by appeal to family relationship goods, many of which are relational: parental love, trustworthy and spontaneous intimacy and being subject to beneficial authority from an individual who loves, knows and is responsible for the child.

Being part of a family relationship, and enjoying its goods is also good for adults, and possibly part of the distribuenda of justice for both children and adults. Brighouse and Swift believe that adults’ entitlement is to an opportunity to enjoy family life, and it is conditional on them being adequate parents. For children, presumably, the entitlement to familial relationship goods is unconditional and it is to the actual outcomes rather than to mere opportunities. Brighouse and Swift make an exception for one of the goods, namely love; they—like many other philosophers—believe there cannot be a right to be loved. This issue deserves a separate discussion.

4.2 The Right to be Loved

On one view (Liao 2006, 2015) children have a right to be loved on grounds of the huge instrumental value that love has for childhood wellbeing and development. He claims that the empirical literature shows that children who lack love suffer in terms of physical health and development, learning ability, interest in interacting with the environment, ability to sleep and mental health. The right is said to be held by each child primarily against her biological biological parents, but all of us have secondary duties to ensure that all children are loved. A similar claim, that love is irreplaceably instrumental to children leading meaningful childhoods has been recently endorsed (Ferracioli 2014) but also criticized (Grahle 2016).

There are several objections to Liao’s thesis. The most prominent is that there cannot be rights without correlative duties, and there cannot be a duty to do what we cannot do; since we cannot fully control our love for particular persons, there cannot be a right to love (Cowden 2012b; Brighouse & Swift 2014). Against this objection, (which he anticipates) Liao (2006) argues that we can do more than it is commonly assumed in order to control our feelings of love. However, as Brake (2011) noted, love is responsive to the qualities of the beloved—which are outside of the lover’s control and which can change—and therefore there are important limits to agent’s abilities to control their loving. This may be enough to show that there cannot be a duty to love.

A different objection to the claim that children have a right to be loved is that, contra Liao’s interpretation, all that the empirical literature shows is that children require certain parental behavior in order the thrive (Cowden 2012a, 339):

the internal emotion of love is neither necessary nor sufficient for the child’s best interests and does not constitute a primary essential condition for a good life.

If so, then children have an interest, and possibly a right, only in the behavioral aspects of love which, presumably are possible to control. In addition, it may be impossible to measure the impact of love as emotion, rather than as behavior, on children (Cowden 2012a, 2012b).

Finally, it is possible that some of the intrinsic value of love consists in the confirmation, or maybe conferral, of value on the beloved. This validation depends on the lover enjoying the beloved for her own (the lover’s) sake, independently from the lover’s will (or duty) to enjoy her. In turn, this requires that the emotional response to the beloved is not fully controlled by the lover but consists, at least in part, in a spontaneous reaction to the beloved (Gheaus 2017). In this case, too, there cannot be a duty (and hence a right) to be loved, because these would be incompatible with the full value of love. This is the reason why even a perfect love drug, one inducing all the subjective experiences and behaviors associated with love, would not be capable of creating the same value that genuine love creates (Nyholm 2015).

4.3 The Right to Non-Parental Care-Giving

Children may have a right to non-parental emotional care received within enduring, robust, and protected relationships between children and adults who are not their parents (Gheaus 2011). Empirical literature seems to indicate that some non-parental care in good childrearing institutions often confers overall benefit to children older than one (Waldfogel 2006). Additional grounds include the minimization of the risk of serious failures of care (such as abuse and neglect) and a more egalitarian redistribution of opportunities to good care: If all children are exposed to various care-givers and styles of childrearing, it will hopefully be easier for them to overcome the effects of more minor failings of care (Gheaus 2011). Further, by undermining the parental monopoly of care over children it would diminish objectionable domination of the child (especially assuming that non-parental care benefits the child) (Gheaus 2011).

In particular, if children have long-term non-parental carers alongside with parents, they may have better chances to encounter people able to love them. This consideration is particularly important if indeed there cannot be a duty to love. It is an interesting question whether any of the value of the parent-child bond would be lost if more than two people were emotionally and responsibly involved long-term in the life of the child. The experience of living and loving in extended families and the general belief that the parent-child bond is no less valuable in families with many children than in families with one or two children suggest a negative answer.

4.4 The Right to Solitude

For both children and adults, periods of solitude can be a condition for a good life (as well as for fully enjoying relationships with others). Unlike adults, children cannot decide to exit all relationships; nor should they, provided they are subject to the legitimate authority of guardians. Therefore they must rely on adults in order to have some protected time during which to be free from others’ company if they chose so. Recently, it has been argued that children greatly benefit from having a significant amount of unstructured time during which they can realize a number of goods—such as play or creativity—to which they have unique, or privileged access (Macleod 2010b, 2014; Brighouse & Swift 2014; Brennan 2014; Gheaus 2015a, 2015b). It is possible that occasional voluntary solitude is necessary for the full enjoyment of such goods. The existence of the right will depend on how these goods contribute to children’s wellbeing qua children, to their developmental interests, and—in cases of conflict between the two—on how we ought to weight the child’s interest in wellbeing during childhood against her interest in future wellbeing.

5. Personal Relationship Goods and Distributive Justice

There are several reasons to be concerned with the distribution of personal relationship goods, yet there are also theoretical difficulties with, and mere peculiarities about, putting these goods on the agenda of distributive justice.

5.1 State Neutrality

People vary in the weight they give to personal relationship goods in their views of how to live, and different ways of distributing personal relationship goods will inevitably reflect some, but not other, individuals’ conception of the good. There may be no neutral justification for particular ways of attempting to distribute certain relationship goods—even if there are some neutral justifications for wanting to distribute some of them in the first place. To decide on any particular set of institutions, one would need to know how to balance the distribution of a relationship good against the distribution of another, or perhaps against the distribution of non-relational goods. More generally, including personal relationship goods amongst the primary goods will raise the indexing problem (Brake 2017) by making it difficult to establish who are the worse off without assigning relative weights to different goods such as money and personal relationship goods. Doing this would involve some kind of perfectionism.

Against this worry, Brake thinks that making caring relationships and their goods available to all “is relatively low cost and does not interfere with implementing the existing principles” (Brake 2017, 141), and, in particular, “it would not conflict with distribution of income and wealth” (Brake 2017, 143). Yet, it is not clear this would solve the indexing problem, since trade-offs will still be needed. Moreover, funding institutions and programs to facilitate access to personal relationship goods (of the kind discussed in section 4) could be costly, partly because caring relationships and the personal relationship goods they provide take time, and time is expensive. The provision of most personal relationship goods cannot happen without people spending enough time together. For instance, providing parents, or adult children, with care breaks and flexible working hours is going to be expensive.

Also, supporting these relationships could take particular forms, each of which may reflect different conceptions of the good. Should we ensure that people may work shorter hours in order to have more time for their personal relationships, or should the state create good caring institutions to try and meet children’s interests in personal relationship goods outside the family, and possibly more efficiently? Adults who prefer to work (and earn) more will favor the latter solution, while those who give more weight to personal relationships will favor the former, and there may not be any neutral justification to prefer one solution over the other. Similarly, some people will prefer that society be shaped such that the elderly have an opportunity to be cared for by their adult children, while others will favor having opportunities to institutional care-giving, or care-giving provided by strangers. In ideal circumstances, all these preferences could be equally accommodated—but if and when this is not possible, how to decide?

One possibility is to appeal to a Dworkinian hypothetical insurance scheme (Dworkin 2000) to establish a way of distributing personal relationship goods without violating state neutrality (see Bou-Habib 2013 for an application of this device to the question of individual access to the material resources needed for child-rearing). For this we should be able to determine what opportunities for personal relationship goods would the average person chose for herself, under conditions of perfect information and rationality.

5.2 Which Principle of Distribution?

So far, the right principle for distributing personal relationship goods has received little attention: views ranged from requiring equal access to love and care (Lynch et al. 2009) to sufficient access to socially decent relationships (Brownlee 2013, 2016a); or, perhaps “different principles govern the distribution of different relational opportunities” (Cordelli 2015a: 103).

Brownlee thinks that, in order to respect the human right against social deprivation it is enough to have “minimal opportunities for non-threatening, decent, or supportive social interaction” (Brownlee 2013, 206) rather than relationships with friends or loved ones. She doubts that equality of social connection is valuable in itself; yet, the rich arguments that she provides concerning the importance of personal relationship goods suggest that justice requires more than the securing of the human right she advocates. And her worry that requiring equality instead of sufficiency could lead to leveling down can be assuaged by adopting a prioritarian principle.

In this context, it is important to know that sufficiency may ensure the full benefits to which personal relationship goods are instrumental: Some empirical research indicates that, while social isolation is a major risk factor, there is little or no variation across moderate to high levels of social relationships (House 2001).

5.3 Which Metric of Justice?

Does the identification of the correct metric of justice bear on the thesis that justice requires the distribution of personal relationship goods? According to Cordelli,

although it might be easier for welfarist or perfectionists to include relational goods within their metric of justice, even those who adopt a non-welfarist and non-perfectionist, resourcist metric have good internal reasons to include (opportunities for) relational resources. (2015a: 89)

To judge this, it is useful to operate with the following distinction (Gheaus 2018): On the one hand, there is the question of the metric of justice, that is, what should we make sure people have a fair amount of. Examples include resources, (opportunities for) wellbeing and capabilities. The correct metric of justice has been the subject of a long, and not yet concluded, debate. On the other hand, one can be concerned with the distribuenda of justice—that is, what should we make sure our institutions and policies make available to individuals in order to bring about a just distribution of the right metric of justice. Examples include money, rights, leisure time, and, possibly, opportunities for relationships. It is possible that people who disagree about the correct metric of justice will—at least occasionally—agree about the distribuenda.

Understood as part of the distribuenda of justice, personal relationship goods—and relationship goods in general—can plausibly be accommodated by different conceptions of the right metric (Gheaus 2018). Indeed, friendship has been presented as one amongst the many resources to be distributed by justice (Cordelli 2015a) and some see the ability to form and maintain caring, meaningful relationships as a basic capability (Nussbaum 2000: 82–83). Good family relationships—including childrearing—have been presented as a main contributor to wellbeing for at least some individuals (Arneson 2014).

5.4 The Holistic Egalitarian Challenge

Even if personal relationship goods can be accommodated by any metric of justice, there is another serious objection to seeing them as the proper object of (re)distribution. Many egalitarians think that what matters for realizing justice is equality of overall advantage, and that losses of advantage in one area of life can be compensated by higher levels of advantage in another. In this sense, they are holistic. If this is correct, it means that it could be just for some people to enjoy hardly any (opportunities for) personal relationship goods—beyond what they need for minimal functioning and autonomy—as long as they enjoy other goods more abundantly. Rejecting holism will make it difficult for a theory to avoid being (perhaps, mildly) perfectionistic; at the same time, it seems very counterintuitive that the unchosen lack of certain kinds of goods—which likely include personal relationship goods—from an individual’s life can be adequately compensated for by any amount of other goods.

5.5 Fully Rivalrous Resources?

Often, the goods that are the object of just distributions are rivalrous: money, health care etc. Some personal relationship goods do not seem to be fully rivalrous: with respect to attention, friendship, or the emotions of love, it is not true that consumption by one individual prevents simultaneous consumption by others. As Brownlee puts it:

If each of us gives love to everyone and seeks love from everyone, it’s not the case that there will be an insufficient amount of love to go around. (2016a: 71)

At the same time, since everybody’s resources are finite, there are obvious limits to home many people can simultaneously enjoy a person’s love, friendship, attention, company etc. The fact that personal relationship goods are not fully rivalrous should, in principle, create a relative abundance that facilitates their distribution, especially if the right principle of distribution is sufficiency rather than equality.

5.6 Duty Bearers?

Some believe that the duty to provide personal relationship goods is primarily a responsibility of individuals, not of institutions, because

[i]f no one will take on the job of associating with a given person, then that person’s social needs go unmet despite the presence of appropriate institutions. (Brownlee 2016a: 69)

It is not obvious that this argument succeeds. We all have an obvious and powerful interest in many personal relationship goods—especially in those that are necessary for survival, health and autonomy—any yet it is often unclear who is under the duty to satisfy the interest. So, the question is whether the existence of a right requires a priorly specified duty and duty-bearer. Some (Cowden 2012a, b) assume a positive answer, while others (Brighouse & Swift 2014; Brownlee 2013) believe this is not necessary on an interest theory of rights. If rights are grounded in powerful interests that can be satisfied without imposing disproportionate burdens on others, it is possible to identify them prior to having in place a system that allocates correlative duties to particular individuals.

Another question is whether there can be any direct duties to offer company, affection or even love, or whether duties with respect to providing these goods are in fact merely duties to create the conditions in which personal relationships can thrive. One of the arguments discussed above with respect to a possible right to parental love may generalize to all types of love—romantic, erotic, friendship—and even to lesser kinds of affection. It is possible that one of the psychological needs met by close relationships is that others want us to be part of their lives for self-interested reasons. When some people want our company for their own sake, this is a confirmation that we are important for their well-being (in some cases in a non-fungible way). This kind of validation is possible only if the love, or affection, is not entirely given out of duty. Therefore, it seems that a duty to provide this particular personal relationship good—the recognition that one is important for another person’s wellbeing—would be self-defeating, because it would be incompatible with some personal relationship goods having the full the intrinsic value they have when given out of inclination. Therefore, it is possible that the reasons for offering love, friendship, and even company may bear on the value of what is offered in a way in which the reasons for offering other kinds of goods do not. It is possible that only love, friendship and company given out of certain reasons—having to do with the appreciation of the individuality of the one to whom they are offered—will (fully) do. (In contrast, the satisfaction of one’s interests in, say, nutrition, shelter or health care, are indifferent to the reasons why others are providing these goods.) Perhaps the best solution to this worry is to admit that perfect distributive justice can only be realized indirectly, when people go above and beyond their duty in providing personal relationship goods (Gheaus 2017).

Both considerations above suggest that, when people’s powerful interests in certain relationship goods generate duties, these are, in the first instance, collective duties to provide the conditions in which the kinds of relationships that generate these duties can flourish. As the next section shows, there are many policies and institutions that, individually or together, can achieve this goal.

5.7 Implementation Issues

There are obvious problems of implementing requirements of justice with respect to (opportunities for) personal relationship goods that have to do with both the feasibility and the desirability of various implementation methods. It seems important to draw a distinction between how feasible it is to enforce duties corresponding to the right to enjoy personal relationship goods, and how desirable it is to enforce the duties in particular circumstances. Some (Cowden 2012b) run the two considerations together, while others (Brownlee 2013) distinguish them.

For instance, it may be undesirable to enforce a duty to provide personal relationship goods because we lack a legitimate way of doing it—we do not know how to enforce the duty without violating some rights. As some have noted (Collins 2013), duties to associate with others in adult personal relationships limits freedom of association; but perhaps freedom of association is much more restrictive in nature and scope than we tend to think (Brownlee forthcoming).

If a person has a right to a certain good, this means that if the right is violated she is owed compensation. But, in some cases, the loss cannot be compensated because certain goods have significant and unique non-instrumental value. At least some personal relationship goods—such as love and friendship—are like this (Gheaus 2009). The loss of other personal relationship goods seems impossible to compensate due to their instrumental value to survival, functioning and autonomy. Even if emotional care for children, or decent social interaction amongst adults, had only instrumental value, if it is true that these goods are necessary for minimally good health, their absence cannot be compensated.

The impossibility of compensation may be relevant for the importance of protecting the any rights to personal relationship goods—like in the case of the right to life. It may count as an argument that it is more urgent to provide (opportunities to) personal relationship goods than other goods to the provision of which we have a right.

5.8 The Bads of Personal Relationships?

A topic so far not discussed by philosophers is that of the fair distribution of the bads of personal relationship goods. We are, neuro-biologically, prone to connect to other people, but relationship often go badly, creating bads as well as goods—especially when people’s attachments to others are dysfunctional (Bowlby 1968, 1973, 1980). In particular, bad relationships early in life—with parents and parental figures—can make people unable to form and maintain healthy relationships, and this generates relationship bads. Psychological evidence indicates that insecure attachment and the ensuing relationship dysfunctions is inter-generationally transmitted (Jones et al. 2015). Whose obligation is it to address the possible unfairness that some people, out of no fault or choice of their own, have to shoulder a much larger share of relationship bads than others? Obviously, we cannot directly distribute relationship bads. And it is not obvious how we could legitimately restrict childrearing to prevent the creation of any such bads, as some of the philosophical literature on licensing parents suggests (see the discussion in 6.2). Maybe justice requires that we share the costs of helping people to overcome bad relationship dynamics—for instance through psychotherapy and counseling? This, however, will lead to a fair redistribution only if it leaves everybody having (equally good) relationships. If not, it will only be an improvement in the quality of relationships. Such improvement seems desirable, in spite of possible distributional complaints; this is likely to be an area where leveling down is, all-things-considered, undesirable.

6. Policies and Institutions

Philosophers working on justice in childrearing, marriage, and the ethics of care suggest or defend several institutions and policies that could promote a fair distribution of personal relationship goods.

6.1 General Measures

There is general agreement that states cannot distribute personal relationship goods—or the relationships that generate them—directly, but it can shape society in numerous ways that would affect both the existence and the distribution of these goods (Brake 2017; Cordelli 2015a). More specifically, policies and institutions—including social norms—can enable people to meet other people in conditions that make them more likely to relate to them in personal ways, encourage people to voluntarily enter personal relationships and influence people’s internal resources and abilities to have good relationships (Cordelli 2015a).

Care ethicists who believe that care-giving should be treated as a primary good advocate the creation of social safety networks to support care-givers and make sure that, by performing the time-intensive work of care, they do not end up socially disadvantaged (Kittay 1999). One view is that we ought to socially support care-giving through a restructuring of economies, such that all individuals have access to jobs remunerated well enough to allow them to care for themselves and their dependents (Engster 2007; Cordelli 2015a) and, moreover, that jobs should not systematically interfere with workers’ ability to care, and that governments should ensure enough caring services (Engster 2007).

But more specific measures have also been proposed in order to ensure that all individuals have access to personal relationships and their goods—including caring relationships. Most generally, states could educate citizens to be competent care-givers (Brake 2017) and even target boys as future care-givers (Behrends & Schouten 2017). More generally, states could inculcate sociability through education (Cordelli 2015a). Further, states could support the civil society by encouraging volunteering and educational organizations (Cordelli 2015a), for example by using tax-incentives to encourage engagement in voluntary associations—this could mean the provision of each citizen with a voucher or tax-credit to be spent in support of qualifying associations that produce personal relationship goods (Cordelli 2015a). Also, states could create, run and subsidize cultural centers and social clubs (Brake 2017). They could also design public spaces such that people have ample opportunities to socialize on playgrounds, parks and other public spaces (Brake 2017; Brownlee 2016a).

Brake (2010, 2012) defends a radically reformed institution of marriage, justified by reference to the goods created by caring relationships between spouses, but which would allow individuals to de-bundle these goods and spread them across several relationships. Currently, spouses can confer various advantages—including relational advantages—on each other, but the institution of marriage restrict access to these advantages by organizing them around monogamous sexuality. If marriage were to be minimal, that is if people could associate with each other for the sake of forming caring (and not necessarily sexual) relationships, and also to choose the number of partners and the kind of relational goods at the center of their union, this would give them more ample and fair opportunities to form and protect their caring relationships.

Brownlee (2013, forthcoming) advocates a reform of the punishment and medical care institutions to avoid long-term isolation whenever possible, in order to ensure that prisoners’ and patients’ right against social deprivation is not violated. Quarantine, she thinks, should only be used when strictly necessary, and even then individuals should be enabled to remain in touch with their near and dear with the help of technology; and particular individuals (such as parents) ought to be allowed to take more risks than they currently may for the sake of avoiding separation from their children. She also argues that the practice of punishing through solitary confinement should be abolished.

Finally, several philosophers defended the proposal that states should ensure everybody’s access to caring relationships (which, presumably, includes access to some personal relationship goods) by requiring all citizens to spend some time caring for those in need. This policy could mean the creation of a “care corps” service based on conscription (Bubeck 1999; Fabre 2006; Robeyns 2011) or voluntary, state-incentivized, participation (Brake 2017). Depending on how such a service would be set up, it could encourage the formation of robust, long-term personal relationships—for instance, by enabling continuity in care between the care-givers and those in need for care. Yet, if there cannot be a duty to love, this proposal could only work for some, but not all personal relationship goods.

As mentioned above, due to personal histories that go back to their childhood, many people fail to enjoy personal relationship goods altogether (when they are unable to enter or maintain relationships) or else disproportionately struggle with the bads of personal relationships. To the extent to which they are not responsible for this situation, there is a case for arguing that they are entitled to subsidized programs—such as counseling or therapy—to remedy their inability to relate to others in healthy ways.

Some proposals have to do specifically with enabling adults to enjoy the personal relationship goods that families make available. Richard Arneson (2014) argues that non-parents ought to subsidize parents in order to ensure that the less well-off parents—who would otherwise need to spend most of their time in payed jobs—have access to the meaningful work of childrearing.

6.2 Measures Aimed at Children

Children have the strongest case for an entitlement to certain personal relational goods, within ongoing caring relationships, on the double ground that they are being owed the goods for their wellbeing qua children and for the sake of the developmental importance of the goods. One of the developmental reasons is to enable the future adults to secure personal relationship goods for themselves (Brighouse & Swift 2014; Brownlee 2016a).

As in the general case, a variety of state measures can ensure a fair provision of personal relationship goods to children. Most basically perhaps, the elimination of child poverty—which, in practice would mean the elimination of poverty in general—is needed in order to allow all parents to parent well (Brighouse & Swift 2014).

Further, states can and should be held accountable for ensuring that children have adequate parents or parental figures (Ferracioli 2014). The fair provision of personal relationship goods for children may start with regulating procreation. Lisa Cassidy argues that those people who do not expect to make good parents have a duty to abstain from having children (Cassidy 2006), and several philosophers argues that people who decide to have children are under a duty to adopt instead of bringing new ones into existence (Friedrich 2013; Collins 2013; Rulli 2016). Nobody, to the best of my knowledge, argues in favor of enforcing these duties via state policy. A milder, and in some conditions possibly justified, approach would be for states to nudge prospective adequate parents to adopt rather than procreate. Another way of curtailing the kind of procreation that results in some children lacking due access to personal relationship goods would be the introduction of parental licenses. Licensing procreators would require those who fail to obtain them to refrain from procreating. It is however difficult to see what legitimate means of enforcing such licenses exist (Engster 2010; De Wispelaere & Weinstock 2012).

While it is hard to find legitimate ways to regulate procreation—although perhaps we should not stop searching for solutions—the situation is a bit more hopeful with respect to regulating in order to ensure better parenting and, more generally, better child-rearing. On the first count, there is a convincing case for licensing biological parents (LaFollette 2010) although implementation is difficult. But a bundle of second-best policies include the introducing of parenting classes, perhaps mandatory (Cutas & Bortolotti 2010; De Wispelaere & Weinstock 2012) and the encouragement of fathers to take up parental leave in order to be involved in childcare from the start.

Beyond improving parental care, states have also been said to have a duty to create robust, state-subsidized and mandatory institutional care to complement parental care, with the aim of containing abuse and neglect care and giving more children the opportunity to enjoy personal relationship goods (Gheaus 2011). States could also make sure that all schools put the intrinsic goods of justice on their curricula (Macleod 2018), including any such goods that are relational in nature—for instance, by adding counseling and guidance functions to the academic function of schools. Finally, the parents of a growing number of children world-wide engage in long-term migration. These children spend a significant time of their childhoods physically separated from their parents and without good alternative parental figures. One remedial solution would be for states to use some of the remittances sent by migrant parents in order to organize counseling and emotional support for the children left behind (Gheaus 2013).

Some policies that have been proposed for other reasons may, as a side-effect, also ensure that more children enjoy the personal relationship goods they are owed. Such is Arneson’s (2014) proposal discussed in the previous subsection; Gina Schouten’s (2015) suggestion that states support gender justice by subsidizing parental leaves, care breaks for parents and good quality childcare institutions; and, possibly, Anne Alstott’s (2004) suggestion that states help parents to honor the demanding, non-exit demand of parenting through financial support.


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The author would like to thank Elizabeth Brake, Kimberley Brownlee, Chiara Cordelli, Adelin Dumitru, Marko Konjovic, Lars Lindblom, Colin Macleod, Tim Meijers, Jonathan Seglow, Christine Straehle and Adam Swift for valuable comments and suggestions. This article has received funding from the Ramon y Cajal programme and from the European Research Council (ERC) under the European Union’s Horizon 2020 Research and Innovation programme (Grant Agreement Number: 648610).

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