Isaac (Yitzḥak) Polqar was a Jewish Averroist who was active in northern Spain from the second half of the thirteenth century and the first half of the fourteenth century. Jewish Averroism refers in this context to Jewish philosophers from the thirteenth to the sixteenth century, whose worldview had two main characteristics: firstly, they adopted the philosophy of Ibn Rushd (Averroes), whom they considered the best interpreter of Aristotle. Secondly, they interpreted Judaism in light of Averroes’ Aristotelianism on the assumption that Judaism and true philosophy must always coincide. In addition to his initial goal of giving the principles of Judaism a radically naturalistic Averroistic interpretation, Polqar, in a more apologetic vein, sought to defend that interpretation from criticisms leveled against it by Christians and converts, as well as by members of his own Jewish community who held more traditional views. Polqar is best known as the main interlocutor of his former teacher, Abner of Burgos (see entry), especially after the latter converted to Christianity and used his expertise in Biblical, Talmudic, and philosophical texts to attack the faith of his birth.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Polqar and Abner of Burgos: Judaism vs. Christianity
- 3. Determinism and Free Will
- 4. Conclusions
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1. Life and Works
Isaac Polqar was a Jewish philosopher who was a member of the Jewish Averroist School. He lived from the second half of the thirteenth century to the first half of the fourteenth century in northern Spain. Little is known about Polqar’s life and family. A short poem, written in his honor by a contemporary poet, Samuel Ibn Sasson, reveals that Polqar was known for his philosophical knowledge as well as for his expertise in the study of the Bible and the Mishnah. In addition, Sasson indicates that Polqar was also a poet, a physician, and a respected figure in his community (Baer 1938: 200).
Polqar wrote several books, most of which are lost. He mentions some of these books in his main work ʿEzer ha-Dat (In Support of the Law): Peirush le-Sefer Bereshit (Commentary on Genesis) [ʿEzer ha-Dat: 39]; Peirush le-Sefer Kohelet (Commentary on Ecclesiastes) [ʿEzer ha-Dat: 121, 123]; Sefer Peirush le-Tehillot (Commentary on the Book of Psalms) [ʿEzer ha-Dat: 131]; and Musar ha-Banim (Instruction of the Sons) [ʿEzer ha-Dat: 158]. Two of Polqar’s works—Iggeret ha-Tiqvah (Epistle on Hope) and Sefer be-Hakḥashat ha-ʿiẓtagninot (Refutation of Astrology)—are mentioned by Abner of Burgos, the famous convert to Christianity and polemicist against Judaism, in his Teshuvot la-Meḥaref (Response to the Blasphemer) and Minḥat Qenaot (A Jealousy-Offering). Two of Polqar’s works are extant: Teshuvat Apikoros (A Response to the Heretic), a letter he addressed to Abner, and his major corpus, ʿEzer ha-Dat (In Support of the Law). In addition, Polqar completed Isaac Albalag’s work Tiqqun Deʿot ha-Philosophim (Rectifying the Opinions of the Philosophers), a free paraphrase of al-Ghazālī’s Maqasid al-Falāsifa (The Opinions of the Philosophers), most of which consists of Albalag’s own ideas and of a critique of al-Ghazālī’s presentation of philosophical ideas (see Vajda 1960: 268).
Polqar’s main work ʿEzer ha-Dat is comprised of five treatises. In the opening treatise, Polqar argues for the primacy of Jewish Law over other existing religious laws. For him, the Torah is the best law, and Moses, the lawgiver, is the paramount leader. Together, they provide Jewish believers with the necessary groundwork for attaining their ultimate purpose: the world to come. In this treatise Polqar highlights particular themes, such as the exile and its meaning, faith in the messiah’s ultimate arrival, Talmudic methodology and its authority, and how to interpret the words of the Sages. The choice of these themes seems to have been motivated by the Christians having made use of them in order to argue for the superiority of Christianity over Judaism.
The second treatise is composed of several different dialogues. The main dialogue depicts a lively debate between two men with disparate worldviews: one is an old man who represents a traditional and anti-philosophical approach, while the other is a young man who is strongly drawn to philosophy. The debate between these two figures reflects a well-known controversy between traditionalist Jews who were suspicious of philosophy and Jewish philosophers who aimed to reconcile the study of philosophy with revelation. In this dialogue, the traditionalist, as we shall see below, accuses the philosophers of holding heretical views such as denying God’s unity, His omnipotence, His omniscience, and so forth, as a result of following Greek philosophy. The young philosopher, on the other hand, claims that there is no contradiction between the Jewish faith and Aristotelian philosophy.
The third treatise of the book is most likely based on the correspondence between Polqar and his former teacher Abner regarding astrology. The dialogue in this treatise is between a philosopher (ḥaver) and an astrologer (hover). Whereas the latter holds an extreme view of determinism, the former believes in man’s free will.
The fourth treatise of the book presents a typology of four different groups of people, who, according to Polqar, constitute the greatest enemies of Judaism and, as a consequence, of philosophy. The first group consists of those who reject science while claiming to be true believers. The second includes the Kabbalists, who claim to have access to esoteric knowledge reaching back to the prophets, and who reject the philosopher’s methods (such as syllogism) as legitimate tools for evaluating knowledge claims. The third group comprises those who accuse philosophers of holding radical naturalistic views. According to this group, philosophers assert that everything is governed by nature and that even God cannot change its course. For these traditionalists, then, philosophers have turned nature into God’s rival, not His intermediary. The fourth group includes people who believe in magic, witchcraft, and the like.
The fifth treatise ends the book and describes a conversation between a spirit and a man who lives in the material world. These two figures debate the question of which is preferable: to be alive, when one can fully enjoy bodily and intellectual pleasures, or to be dead, when one’s soul is free from bodily desire. Polqar concludes this section with a revelation: the two interlocutors hear the voice of the angel Gabriel, who supports the spirit’s position according to which the soul’s detachment from the body is preferable.
2. Polqar and Abner of Burgos: Judaism vs. Christianity
Polqar’s objection to Abner’s decision to abandon the faith of his birth and to accept Christianity stems from his view that a true religion cannot, under any circumstances, contradict basic philosophical principles. Christianity, for Polqar, does contradict those principles, and so it follows that Christianity is not a true religion:
The essential principle and purpose of all knowledge in the view of all nations is the knowledge of the existence of God, may He be blessed, through whose power the encompassing sphere is moved. This was first explained by our religion in the verse “I am the Lord” [Exod. 20:2]. The second principle is His unity. This is explained in the verse “you shall have no other gods before me” [Exod. 20:3] and in the verse “Hear O Israel! The Lord is our God, the Lord is One” [Deut. 6:4]. The third principle is that He has no body, which is also known and revealed in the verse “Take therefore good heed to yourself: for you saw no manner of form” [Deut. 4:15], and also that He is not a force within a body, in the sense that nothing that happens to dark bodies can be verified of Him, which is known and evident from the verse “I the Lord have not changed” [Mal. 3:6]. It is known by every intelligent person that these beliefs are explained with firm proofs and full demonstration in the books about physics and metaphysics written by Aristotle, as is obvious to those who make the effort to study them, so that no one will reject them and deny them unless he is a denier of the first principle, which the ancient sages considered to be punishable by stoning. (Teshuvat Apikoros: 2b; cf. ʿEzer ha-Dat: 35–36)
The philosophers, Polqar claims, have already demonstrated “these beliefs”, that is, the three philosophical principles: the existence of God, His Unity, and His being neither a body nor a force in a body, principles that were fully maintained by Jews. While Christians sought to reconcile these principles with their theological doctrines, their attempts to do so were unsuccessful in Polqar’s view.
Polqar’s fundamental objection to Christianity as contradicting philosophical principles is reflected in his disputes with Abner regarding (1) monotheism vs. the Trinity, and (2) God’s incorporeality vs. the Incarnation.
While Christianity, as perceived by Polqar, accepts the existence of God, it rejects the other two principles—God’s unity and incorporeality—because of its acceptance of the doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation. Hence, Christianity cannot be a true religion. Polqar presents his critique chiefly in the second chapter of Teshuvat Apikoros and in the second section of treatise one of ʿEzer ha-Dat, where he enumerates the three principles that should form the foundation of any true religion. Although he does not explicitly mention Christianity, we can confidently assume, based on Abner’s reference to this chapter in his Teshuvot la-Meḥaref, that the object of this critique is the Christian believer.
2.1 Monotheism vs. the Trinity and God’s Incorporeality vs. the Incarnation
2.1.1 Monotheism vs. the Trinity
For Polqar, since the philosophers have already demonstrated that God exists and that He is neither a body nor a force in a body, there is no need to repeat these arguments. For Abner, on the other hand, justifying the Trinity and the Incarnation and showing that these two doctrines are in agreement with philosophical interpretations is the basis upon which he wished to show the validity of Christianity and to convince as many Jews as possible to convert. To achieve this purpose, he quotes biblical verses and midrashim. One particularly interesting text he uses is the midrash on Psalms 50:1, and he writes:
This is what is written in the midrash on the verse which says: “God (El), the Lord [YHVH] God (Elohim) spoke and summoned the world” [Psalms 50:1]. Why did it mention the Name three times? To teach you that the Holy One, blessed be He, created the world with these three names which stand for the three attributes with which He created the world. And these are they: Wisdom [Ḥokhma], Understanding [Tevunah], and Knowledge (Daʿat). Wisdom from whence? Because it is said
the Lord founded the earth by wisdom, etc.… Understanding? Because it is said “He established the heavens by understanding”. Knowledge? Because it is said “by His knowledge the depths burst apart…”
One must conclude from this passage that the world could not have been created unless the Creator possessed these three attributes which are indicated by His three names, “God (El), God (Elohim), and the Lord (YHVH)”, because they are three (parts) of the one divine substance. They are indicated by those three names (“Wisdom” (Ḥokhma), “understanding” (Tevunah), and “knowledge” (Daʿat) because of their essential characteristics. For it would not be fitting to say that the Holy One, blessed be He, created the world by means of the power of “names”, as the fools think, or by means of any other thing other than Himself and His truth. Indeed, He Himself is His wisdom, and He Himself is His understanding, and He Himself is His knowledge. (Teshuvotla-Meḥaref: 15b–16a)
God created the world with three divine attributes: Wisdom (Ḥokhma), denoted by His name YHVH (Lord); Understanding [Tevunah], denoted by His name El (God); and Knowledge [Daʿat], denoted by His name Elohim (God). Abner identifies Ḥokhma with universal wisdom, which is eternal and separate from matter. Christians call this characteristic the “Father”. God’s wisdom, which is “the cause of everything” (sibbat ha-kol), is the primary “source” of all created beings. Tevunah is the particular knowledge that is “born” from the universal wisdom and is acknowledged by Christians as the “Son”. Daʿat is placed between the two attributes: it is the intermediary between Ḥokhma and Tevunah, between universal and particular wisdom. It has a role similar to the syllogistic middle term, which connects the major term and the minor term; without a middle term, there is no valid syllogism and without Daʿat there is no particular knowledge. Abner continues to argue that Daʿat denotes Elohim because of its grammatically plural appearance: exactly
Since “knowledge” (Daʿat) is between the two names, God (El) and Lord (YHVH), in the verse, “For the Lord is an all-knowing God”—and since it is the “Holy Spirit”, as has been mentioned, it is fitting that the name “God” (Elohim) is related to knowledge, since it is between the two other names—El and YHVH—in the verse “God (El), God (Elohim), and the Lord (YHVH)”. For this reason, it is in the plural, like the words “God” and “knowledge”. It teaches us about itself and the other two, just as the relationship teaches us about itself and the two related things altogether. For this reason, the name “God” (Elohim) by itself teaches us about the three attributes together. (Teshuvot la-Meḥaref: 17a)
The plural form Elohim indicates a relation which is derived from the other two divine names, El and YHVH. Daʿat, which denotes God’s name Elohim, is what the Christians refer to as the “Holy Spirit”. Using this midrash serves Abner’s goal: demonstrating the existence of the Trinity from rabbinic sources. He argues that the Sages’ purpose in this midrash is to demonstrate that the names of God parallel the existence of three aspects in Him, without damaging His unity. He reinforces this claim by using Aristotelian notions such as the “Active Intellect” and syllogism, thus supporting his argument from a philosophical point of view as well. Abner reinforces his claim by suggesting that the justification for the Trinity—intellect (sekhel), the intellectually cognizing subject (maskil), and the thing that is intellectually cognized (muskal)—is accepted by Aristotelians and that therefore, the Trinity does not imply multiplicity in God.
2.1.2 God’s Incorporeality vs. the Incarnation
For Maimonides and Polqar, the belief in the unity of God is the fundamental principle of any true religion. For Abner, on the other hand, the Incarnation is the most important doctrine in Christianity: the belief in the Trinity being not an independent doctrine, but merely a prerequisite for believing in the Incarnation:
First of all, the Christians are not required to maintain the belief in the Trinity except that it is necessary for belief in the Incarnation of God in human form because of the attribute “Son” which creates particulars in the existence, as has been explained. For without this, neither the immortality of the soul after death nor their receipt of reward and punishment in the world to come could be established. In this way the Torah, which gives existence and permanence to the existence of the human species and individual personalities according to what is possible, is established. Furthermore, as I proved above, the beliefs which cause the performance of the commandments are (the ones which are) incumbent upon us to believe in. (Teshuvot la-Meḥaref: 21b)
This statement emphasizes two things, the first of which is the Incarnation’s key role in the existence of particulars in the world. In other words, if there were no Incarnation, there would be no created things. Belief in the three substantive attributes is essential for existence because it explains the becoming of the world and the existence of multiplicity through the “Son”. Secondly, Abner stipulates that the fulfillment of two important theological principles—retribution in the form of rewards and punishments and the immortality of the soul, two Jewish principles—is dependent on belief in the Incarnation. God as an active force in the world governs individuals: namely, each person is rewarded or punished according to his deeds. Thus, only acceptance of the doctrine of God’s Incarnation in the Son can make it possible to believe in the immortality of the soul and the redemption of human beings (cf. Hecht 1993: 494).
2.2 The Authority of the Talmud and the Jewish Sages
In Teshuvot la-Meḥaref, Abner consistently uses Jewish sources in order to prove that the doctrines of the Christian faith are true. He aims to show that although the Jews of his own time reject Christianity altogether, the Talmudic Sages, upon whom they rely, tacitly accepted Christianity’s fundamental beliefs. Once again, this topic is omitted in Teshuvat Apikoros; however, Polqar devotes two different chapters in ʿEzer ha-Dat to illustrating the erroneous use the Christians made of these texts.
In his Teshuvot la-Meḥaref, Abner discusses rabbinic texts in extensive detail. When it suits his purposes, he cites rabbinic texts to show that the Talmudic Sages did, in fact, accept Christian doctrines; however, they could not disclose them to the people, who were not ready to accept these beliefs (cf. Teshuvot la-Meḥaref: 15b; 16b; 17a; 18ab). In other cases, Abner accuses the Jewish Sages of behaving unethically (Ibid: 33b; 34b). In ʿEzer ha-Dat, Polqar does not offer a detailed response to Abner’s hermeneutical attacks. Instead, he proposes a general solution that clarifies the role of the Talmud and the significance of the rabbinic texts.
The closing sections of treatise one in ʿEzerha-Dat exemplifies Polqar’s threefold method. Firstly, he sets forth the importance of the Oral Law, which is necessary for filling out the written law. While the Written Torah only sketches out the general features of the law, the Oral Law explains in detail how man should interpret and apply that law. Secondly, he narrates the historical events that led Rabina and Rav Ashi, the two Amoraic sages who compiled and revised the Babylonian Talmud, to write down the Oral Law: the exile and the great risk of losing Talmudic foundations, rulings, and interpretations. Thirdly, Polqar proclaims that the Talmud has many layers of meaning; some assertions must be taken at face value, while other must be understood in an esoteric sense.
In addition to the Talmud, Polqar lists other texts that were written by the Jewish Sages but cannot be considered “Talmud”, since this word refers only to the rabbinic interpretations of the commandments. Because these texts are only of an aggadic and not a halakhic nature, they do not possess any intrinsic authority, but have value only if they accord with or can be interpreted to accord with fundamental philosophical principles.
Polqar argues forcefully, in a general fashion, that all of Abner’s allegations are, in principle, invalid. Polqar lists two main justifications for his wholesale rejection of Abner’s allegations. Firstly, according to Polqar, if rabbinic passages contradict fundamental philosophical principles, then they should be viewed as non-halakhic midrashic texts. Insofar as all the quotations that Abner uses in Teshuvot la-Meḥaref are not considered “Law”, we need not accept the conclusions drawn from them. He writes:
Moreover, look at the confusion of your thought in your dependence upon a few legends of the Talmud that one cannot explain and take in any manner one wishes. Even if they are elucidated and explained correctly according to your opinion, they are (just) the teachings of individuals, on account of which we will not turn aside or deviate in any direction from the belief in the Torah of Moses, may peace be upon him. They do not suffice for Jews, since he [Moses] was the master of all the prophets and the Sages, according to the belief of all the nations. All the more so (they do not suffice) for negating and overturning [the Torah]. (Teshuvat Apikoros: 6b)
Not only are we not obliged to accept the sources cited by Abner, but—and this is Polqar’s second reason for dismissing Abner’s claims—Abner’s reading of these sources, according to Polqar, is tendentious. Abner deliberately reads these passages so that they cohere with his line of thought, without considering the possibility of other interpretations.
In the process of invalidating Abner’s use of the Talmudic passages, Polqar reveals his view of the hierarchy of Jewish sources. Naturally, he ranks the “Torah of Moses” as the highest source. Unlike the Sages of the Talmud, whose legal teachings are incumbent only upon Jews, the Torah of Moses offers fundamental universal truths accepted by both Judaism and Christianity.
Polqar concludes his discussion regarding the Talmudic Sages by rejecting the opinions of the heretics (epikursin) who mock and deny the veracity of some of the Talmudic stories, interpretations, and rulings [ʿEzerha-Dat: 65–67]. The Talmud is a source of knowledge for two types of students: the first is intelligent, perceptive, and a quick learner, while the second has a limited understanding, and therefore depends on traditional knowledge without developing the urge to discover its profound meanings. The Talmudic Sages, Polqar maintains, deliberately included popular knowledge in their teachings as a pathway for the second type of student, so that he, too, could have a part in true knowledge.
The Sages’ goal was to provide each student with knowledge that suited his abilities. The perceptive disciple grasps the true meaning that will, eventually, lead him to the ultimate goal: the eternity of his soul. The other disciple remains at a lower level of attaining knowledge, and is guided by the Sages for educational purposes only.
2.3 The Messiah: has he already come?
Determining whether or not the messiah to whom Hebrew sources refer has already come, as Christians maintain, could not be demonstrated through philosophical investigation. It could only be demonstrated by interpreting scriptural verses and rabbinic texts well known to both Abner and Polqar, and by examining how the picture of the messiah and the messianic era that emerges from that interpretation coheres or does not cohere with past empirical events. In other words, Polqar chose prophetic verses that show that Jesus did not bring about the messianic era described by the prophets. On the other hand, Abner, who sought to prove just the opposite, used the same verses, as well as others, to demonstrate that Jesus and the messianic era he inaugurated did in fact correspond precisely to what the prophets had described.
One of the main differences between Judaism and Christianity is rooted in each religion’s approach to the messiah. While Christianity considers the messiah to be both divine and human, Judaism sees in the messiah a human being of extraordinary character. Christian dogma educates its believers to live their lives as if the messiah has already come; their way of living is a preparation for the world to come. In Judaism, the messianic era is located in the future, and it features the restoration of Jewish sovereignty over the land of Israel and a world in which all nations dwell in peace with one another. Thus, if the Jews accept the view that Jesus is the messiah, it follows that any hope they maintain for that restoration is only folly and illusion.
Polqar presents his theory regarding the messiah in the fifth chapter of his Teshuvat Apikoros and in the sixth chapter (sha’ar) of treatise one of ʿEzer ha-Dat. The texts presented in both works are almost identical, and differ in only two places. The first difference is that the first paragraph in ʿEzer ha-Dat contains a reference to Bilʿam that is omitted from Teshuvat Apikoros, while the second difference is that it is only in Teshuvat Apikoros that Polqar refers to the Muslims (Ishmaʿelim); this reference is absent from ʿEzer ha-Dat.
Rejecting the claim that the messianic era has already begun, Polqar focuses on three prophetic predictions concerning the nature of the messianic era; none of these, Polqar maintains, have come to pass. The first is Ezekiel’s prophecy that the Israelites will reside in the land of Israel. Ezekiel foresaw that
they [the Israelites] shall remain in the land which I gave to my servant Jacob…they and their children and their children’s children shall dwell there forever, with my servant David as their prince for all time.
Reality, however, shows that the Jews do not reside in the land of Israel. On the contrary, they have suffered a long and painful exile, while foreigners settled in the land.
The second prediction concerns the war between Gog and Magog. Ezekiel prophesized that only after that war “I [LORD] will be zealous for My holy name” [Ezek. 39:25], and “I will never again hide my face from them” [Ezek. 39:29]. The Jews’ dreadful condition proves that the war has not yet occurred, and therefore that the messiah cannot have come. Finally, the third prediction concerns the rebuilding of Jerusalem and the holy temple; as Amos states, “In that day I will set up again the fallen booth of David” [Amos 9:11]. He also predicts the third ingathering of the Jews: “And I will plant them upon their soil nevermore to be uprooted from the soil I have given them, says the Lord your God” [Amos 9:15]. The first ingathering was connected with the building of the First Temple; the second was connected with the Second Temple; the third is to occur upon the building of the Third Temple. Polqar cites these verses to indicate that Jerusalem and the Temple have not yet been rebuilt; it follows that this third ingathering has not yet occurred.
Before quoting the relevant verses from the prophetic books, Polqar sets forth two principles that must be taken into account when examining the prophecies. Firstly, he declares that any prophecy stating that the Jews will never again be exiled cannot be applied to the Second Temple period, especially if the word “forever” [leʿolam] appears in it, insofar as the current situation shows that the Second Temple period was followed by exile. Secondly, Polqar states that all of the prophecies concerning the Second Temple period which predict the building of Zion and Jerusalem cannot be applied to Jesus, for “those who believe in him [Jesus] are further from him than they are from ruling over that land” [Teshuvat Apikoros: 4b]. Merging these two principles with his interpretation of the prophetic message serves Polqar’s goal: rejecting Christianity as a true religion. Abner, not surprisingly, applies these very prophecies to the Second Temple period and to Jesus (cf. Joseph Shalom in Rosenthal 1961: 44). According to him, the arrival of the messiah was the final stage in establishing the correct beliefs, which is to say the fundamental Christian theological doctrines, in the hearts of human beings. The Trinity, he states, was originally concealed from the people of Israel due to its complexity and to the risk it posed: if it were misunderstood, it might lead the Jews to worship idols. The final Incarnation, namely the Incarnation in Jesus, would guarantee the people’s belief in reward and punishment in this world and the next.
3. Determinism and Free Will
It would appear that a religious person, especially one who belongs to the Jewish faith, which stresses praxis, must affirm the position that human beings have free will; for if free will were denied, it would necessarily follow that the commandments have no meaning. But how can this religious affirmation co-exist with the fundamental religious affirmation of God’s omniscience?
According to the theory of radical determinism, any action we take only appears to be the result of our choosing that particular action over others. In truth, however, our choice is the outcome of various predetermined factors that cause it to happen in a certain time and place. Unlike radical determinists, the non-radical determinists, such as Polqar rejected the view according to which man’s actions are determined and only appear to be the result of one’s free choice. The non-radical determinists admit that there is a connection between the upper-lunar world and the sublunary world, however this connection is restricted merely to natural events; for example, an occurrence of an eclipse is determined and therefore can be known and predicted, unlike man’s decision to act in a certain way. For Abner, determinism is entailed by God’s omniscience, His absolute knowledge of past, present, and future. Any affirmation of one’s liberty in making decisions and choosing specific actions is incompatible with this idea of God’s perfect knowledge. In sum, for Abner, ascribing free will to human beings denies God’s omniscience. In opposition to Abner, Polqar attempts to reconcile the idea of man’s ability to choose with the concept of God’s perfect knowledge. Polqar rejects Abner’s view and contends that allowing man’s free will alongside God’s omniscience is the only way to defend God’s perfection.
In his Minḥat Qenaot, Abner raises several arguments which support his radical determinism. One of these arguments is directly concerned with the question of man’s free will. He writes:
The third argument, particular to man, is from the aspect of the intellectual soul. He [Isaac] said that the intellectual soul is separate and distinct from matter, and that the heavenly bodies, insofar as they are material, lack the power to act upon it through anything. And because one could object that a separate power can act upon the intellectual soul by compelling it to act or to receive an action, and to will at times or not to will at times, he bolstered his utterances in this third argument by saying that if human accidents came about through necessitation and decree, then the propositions of our Holy Law would be destroyed; and all its commandments and prohibitions would be in vain; and it would not be proper for the righteous man to receive reward for his good deeds, nor would it be proper to punish the wicked, since all their actions would be necessitated. Isaac took this support from the statements of Moses the Egyptian and the other early theologians who spoke about this matter. (Minḥat Qenaot, Chapter 2)
Material objects cannot influence things that are separate from matter. Since the intellectual soul is separate from matter, material objects—and here Abner is referring to the heavenly bodies—cannot act upon it. However, Abner responds, while Polqar’s argument explains why material bodies cannot act upon man’s intellectual soul, it fails to explain why the separate intellects cannot act upon it. Abner stated that due to the weakness of his argument, Polqar needed to strengthen it from a theological point of view; therefore, he supplemented his original argument with the claim that the Mosaic commandments have no validity unless we assume that humans have free choice. Therefore, Abner concludes that:
Isaac not only wished to do away with astral decrees, but he also wished to do away with God’s knowledge and His decrees concerning all accidental and possible things. Because of this, he said in his book that we ought not to believe in any way that such things can be known, or observed by any knower, before they exist. Hence he implied that they cannot be known nor observed by God. (Minḥat Qenaot, Chapter 2)
To support his contrary conclusion, Abner quotes verses from the Old and New Testaments that in his view clearly show that God, with His eternal knowledge, governs things in a particular manner. For example, Job 34:21–22 states: for His eyes are upon a man’s ways; He observes his every step. Neither darkness nor gloom offers a hiding-place for evildoers; and Psalms 33:13–15, The Lord looks down from heaven; He sees all mankind. From His dwelling-pace He gazes on all the inhabitants of the earth—He who fashions the hearts of the all, who discerns all their doings. Presumably, since Polqar’s last point here is in Abner’s view purely theological, it is sufficient for Abner to respond to it by citing biblical proof texts.
Polqar’s response to Abner leans first on Maimonides’ argument according to which God’s knowledge and human knowledge have nothing in common [ʿEzer ha-Dat: 136–137; Guide of the Perplexed 3:20]. Therefore, we cannot even ask what God knows, or in what way He knows it. After establishing that the knowledge of God is essentially different from that of humans, Polqar seems to contradict his own view that God’s knowledge does not change. According to one passage, God
desires (ḥafeẓ) possibility as long as [the possible] exists, and then He produces things from this absolute potentiality and possibility when He so desires (yaḥfoẓ). (ʿEzer ha-Dat: 137).
How can Polqar claim that God “desires” something, when desiring something implies an external need? Here it seems as if Polqar uses the word “desire” to indicate the laws of nature: natural, accidental, and voluntary causes are within the natural laws. Just as there are natural causes in the natural order, similarly, Polqar claims, the natural order contains possibility. Thus, asking why possibility exists is similar to asking why a stone falls down when we throw it: it falls because that is its nature.
After establishing that God’s knowledge is essentially different from human knowledge, Polqar turns to answer the following question: if God’s knowledge is eternal, unchangeable, and complete, how is it possible to argue that men are free to choose their actions? In one of his arguments, Polqar claims that men do have the liberty of choosing, but that this ability is restricted to intellectuals. If a man does not actualize his intellect, he is no different from an animal which acts on instinct alone:
The second argument is that it has been demonstrated that the existence of something separate and distinct from matter is more excellent and worthy than something material. Similarly, actions that are separate from matter are greater and more powerful than material actions. Also, the regression of the series of all agents terminates at a thing that is utterly separate from matter, so that we truly say that [only] separate things are truly agents, and material things are acted upon. Now man's rational soul, from which desire and volition are produced, is separate from matter, and is analogous to the supernal agents. Hence it is impossible for a material body to act upon it [man’s rational soul]. This is what the rabbis meant when they said (Talmud Sab. 156a): “Israel is not subject to fate” and “The gentiles are intimidated, but Israel is not intimidated”, as I explained above [ʿEzer ha-Dat: 124]. Hence those who maintain that the qualities of the soul proceed from, and are decreed by, the heavenly bodies simply err and are mistaken. (ʿEzer ha-Dat: 139–140)
“Israel”, Polqar’s term for intellectuals, refers to those people who use their intellectual faculty, the non-material part of their soul, in order to know God. According to Polqar, most human beings are like animals, enslaved to their desires, and consequently lack freedom of choice; controlled by their desires, they differ from the intellectuals, who live in accordance with the intellectual soul and who therefore are capable of choosing proper actions. Paradoxically, however, if the intellectuals constantly follow their rational faculty, they, similar to the separate intellects, are prevented from choosing how to act because they are constantly directed by the rational force. It would then follow that living according to the intellect does not guarantee unconditional freedom, as intellectuals are still subject to reason. That said, it seems likely that Polqar would agree that following the intellect necessarily leads one to make rational decisions in one’s life, which is the proper way to live.
Abner alleged that Polqar
not only wished to do away with astral decrees, but also wished to do away with God’s knowledge and His decrees concerning all accidental and possible things. (Minḥat Qenaot, Chapter 2)
Polqar certainly did away with astral decrees, insofar as he demonstrated that the heavenly bodies do not influence man’s intellectual soul, because heavenly bodies are material bodies, and material bodies cannot act upon man’s non-material soul. Abner’s additional argument, that the separate intellects can act upon one’s soul even if we accept that the heavenly bodies do not, is presented by Polqar himself as follows:
The activities of the rational soul are not generated from it by virtue of its being rational. Therefore, I can reply to my critic that a material agent may act upon it from the aspect of its not being rational, a fortiori that an immaterial agent may act upon it. Moreover, the human soul is not entirely separate from matter, but only the acquired intellect, which is the agent intellect. Its activity takes place only through the intermediary of the intellect that is acted upon, which Aristotle considered to be subject to generation and destruction. (ʿEzer ha-Dat: 140)
Interestingly, the astrologer’s objection, as presented by Polqar, includes activities (peʿulot ha-Nefesh) which clearly belong to the practical part of the soul in the intellectual part of the soul (ha-nefesh ha-hoga). In his view, one’s activities, since they do not derive from the intellectual soul, are subject to being changed by a material agent, here the heavenly bodies. These activities are even more subject to an immaterial agent: the separate intellect. The human soul, argues the astrologer, is not entirely separate from matter, and therefore the claim that heavenly bodies can act upon it stands.
Polqar, well aware of Abner’s objection in Minḥat Qenaot, replies to the astrologer as follows:
From what you have written in your astrology, the activity of wisdom in the human soul is decreed from the heavens. Now will you say of this activity that it is not generated and originated in the soul by virtue of the latter’s being rational? As for your remark in your answer that “a fortiori an immaterial agent can act upon it”, you know well that our only disagreement concerns the activity of the heavenly bodies, and not the activities of the separate entities. (ʿEzer ha-Dat: 140)
Polqar clearly considers Abner’s objection to be valid, and therefore he narrows his argument. Here he makes it clear that he rejects only the idea that the heavenly bodies, or any other material body, act upon one’s intellectual soul. In contrast, the Active Intellect acts upon one’s intellectual soul; indeed, separate intellects are the only entities that can act upon man’s intellectual soul. The Active Intellect acts upon one’s soul according to one’s level of study of the theoretical sciences: the more one occupies oneself with studying the sciences, the more the Active Intellect acts upon one’s intellectual soul. Therefore, Polqar argues, his argument rejecting astrology is valid.
Man’s will vs. natural will
In the last argument, the scholar clarifies to the astrologer the main differences between human will and the will of “natural things”:
The third argument: It is known that natural things behave in one manner without the possibility of their being able to change their function and to act in a manner opposite to that to which they are accustomed. The soul’s actions [mifʿalei ha-nafshyyim] are those that occasionally effect one thing and occasionally effect its opposite, according to their choice. If the acts of the soul were necessitated and compelled and decreed, then they would be similar to natural acts, with absolutely no difference between them. If this were so, then how could the soul be considered to be the perfection of a natural body? For then the perfection of a body would only be through its natural deeds, which would abolish the existence of every soul. All these are sophistries, calumnies, and follies. (ʿEzer ha-Dat: 140)
Polqar argues that depriving humans of free choice, as Abner suggests, would entail that natural things and things endowed with souls would operate in a similar manner. This would mean that human actions would not only be similar to natural actions, such as the occurrence of an eclipse or the rising of the sun, but that human actions would also be essentially similar to the actions of the separate intellects. In other words, there would be no difference between the actions of perfect beings, such as the separate intellects, and the actions of imperfect beings, such as humans, who are comprised of material and non-material parts. Moreover, if man’s “voluntary” actions were determined in the same way as the actions of natural things, there would be no essential difference between man’s perfect part, his soul, and his imperfect part, his body; for if all actions of man’s soul, bodily and intellectual, happened necessarily, such a distinction would no longer exist.
In sum, Polqar’s discussion of God’s foreknowledge and man’s free will is a direct reply to the arguments raised by Abner in Minḥat Qenaot. Polqar clearly modified his arguments so as to make them more efficient against Abner’s objections. Polqar concludes the debate between the scholar, presumably presenting his own view, and the astrologer, presumably representing Abner, as follows: firstly, possible and accidental things are not predestined and cannot be known by any knower (including God) before they happen. Secondly, man’s intellectual soul is free from determinism. Finally, natural things are essentially different from psychic things: the former act in a necessary way, while the latter act in a contingent manner.
Polqar’s project is threefold. Firstly, he seeks to defend Judaism as a true religion against Christianity. For Polqar, true religion coincides with philosophical principles. His defense of Judaism against the Christian convert Abner of Burgos essentially consists of the claim that while Judaism coincides with true philosophy and hence is a true religion, Christianity contains doctrines such as the Trinity and the Incarnation that contradict true philosophy and hence is not a true religion. In addition to his critique of Christianity, Polqar uses hermeneutical arguments to reinforce his position that Judaism is a true religion. Secondly, Polqar, similarly to his fellow Jewish Averroists, wishes to defend the discipline of philosophy. By philosophy, Polqar means Averroes’ interpretation of Aristotle. As a consequence, he offers an Averroistic interpretation of Judaism and becomes one of the main representatives of Jewish Averroism. His Averroistic commitments also determine his interpretation of Maimonides: his preference for Maimonides’ radical views over his harmonizing views, as well as his occasional deviation from Maimonides. Polqar’s third aim is to defend his philosophical interpretation of Judaism. From a social and political point of view, Polqar’s unreserved embrace of philosophy raised problems within the Jewish community: he had to refute the Jewish traditionalists’ charge that he was a heretic, led astray by philosophy, to avoid weakening a community already under considerable pressure in its Christian environment through internal conflict stemming from views perceived as unorthodox. This explains his use of an “esoteric” writing practice through which he conceals some of his more radical views from the non-philosophers among his readers. This strategy is explicitly highlighted in the introduction to ʿEzer ha-Dat, where he declares that due to political and social circumstances he must conceal his genuine opinion in order to avoid being accused of heresy by those who are incapable of understanding his philosophical approach. Polqar’s identification of Judaism and true philosophy, moreover, requires a clarification of the difference between true science and pseudo-science (for example, astrology and divination), and between correct and incorrect interpretations of Judaism (among the latter, for example, those of the Kabbalists). The major claim guiding my interpretation is that Polqar advances a systematic naturalistic interpretation of Judaism, which in many cases does not agree with traditional Jewish views.
Polqar’s philosophy should thus be seen as part of the Jewish Averroist school and as one of several attempts made by post-Maimonidean Jewish thinkers to use Maimonides’ ideas and methods to bring the Aristotelian philosophy taught by Averroes and the principles of the Jewish faith more closely together.
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Other Internet Resources
- Lasker, Daniel, Christian Concepts/Hebrew Terminology: Medieval Hebrew Philosophical Terminology in the Making, talk at the PESHAT conference, Jerusalem 2011.
- Seligsohn, Richard Gottheil, M., Ibn Pulgar, Isaac Ben Joseph, brief article in the Jewish Encyclopedia.
- Belasco, G., 1904, Isaac Pugar's “Support of the Religion”, paper in the The Jewish Quarterly Review, 17(1): 26-56.