First published Tue Aug 14, 2007; substantive revision Fri May 8, 2020

Al-Ghazâlî (c.1056–1111) was one of the most prominent and influential philosophers, theologians, jurists, and mystics of Sunni Islam. He was active at a time when Sunni theology had just passed through its consolidation and entered a period of intense challenges from Shiite Ismâ’îlite theology and the Arabic tradition of Aristotelian philosophy (falsafa). Al-Ghazâlî understood the importance of falsafa and developed a complex response that rejected and condemned some of its teachings, while it also allowed him to accept and apply others. Al-Ghazâlî’s critique of twenty positions of falsafa in his Incoherence of the Philosophers (Tahâfut al-falâsifa) is a significant landmark in the history of philosophy as it advances the nominalist critique of Aristotelian science developed later in 14th century Europe. On the Arabic and Muslim side al-Ghazâlî’s acceptance of demonstration (apodeixis) led to a much more refined and precise discourse on epistemology and a flowering of Aristotelian logics and metaphysics. With al-Ghazâlî begins the successful introduction of Aristotelianism or rather Avicennism into Muslim theology. After a period of appropriation of the Greek sciences in the translation movement from Greek into Arabic and the writings of the falâsifa up to Avicenna (Ibn Sînâ, c.980–1037), philosophy and the Greek sciences were “naturalized” into the discourse of kalâm and Muslim theology (Sabra 1987). Al-Ghazâlî’s approach to resolving apparent contradictions between reason and revelation was accepted by almost all later Muslim theologians and had, via the works of Averroes (Ibn Rushd, 1126–98) and Jewish authors, a significant influence on Latin medieval thinking.

1. Life

Later Muslim medieval historians say that Abû Hâmid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazâlî was born in 1058 or 1059 in Tabarân-Tûs (15 miles north of modern Meshed, NE Iran), yet notes about his age in his letters and his autobiography indicate that he was born in 1055 or 1056 (Griffel 2009, 23–25). Al-Ghazâlî received his early education in his hometown of Tus together with his brother Ahmad (c.1060–1123 or 1126) who became a famous preacher and Sufi scholar. Muhammad went on to study with the influential Ash’arite theologian al-Juwaynî (1028–85) at the Nizâmiyya Madrasa in nearby Nishapur. This brought him in close contact with the court of the Grand-Seljuq Sultan Malikshâh (reg. 1071–92) and his grand-vizier Nizâm al-Mulk (1018–92). In 1091 Nizâm al-Mulk appointed al-Ghazâlî to the prestigious Nizâmiyya Madrasa in Baghdad. In addition to being a confidante of the Seljuq Sultan and his court in Isfahan, he now became closely connected to the caliphal court in Baghdad. He was undoubtedly the most influential intellectual of his time, when in 1095 he suddenly gave up his posts in Baghdad and left the city. Under the influence of Sufi literature al-Ghazâlî had begun to change his lifestyle two years before his departure (Griffel 2009, 67). He realized that the high ethical standards of a virtuous religious life are not compatible with being in the service of sultans, viziers, and caliphs. Benefiting from the riches of the military and political elite implies complicity in their corrupt and oppressive rule and will jeopardize one’s prospect of redemption in the afterlife. When al-Ghazâlî left Baghdad in 1095 he went to Damascus and Jerusalem and vowed at the tomb of Abraham in Hebron never again to serve the political authorities or teach at state-sponsored schools. He continued to teach, however, at small schools (singl. zâwiya) that were financed by private donations. After performing the pilgrimage in 1096, al-Ghazâlî returned via Damascus and Baghdad to his hometown Tûs, where he founded a small private school and a Sufi convent (khânqâh). In 1106, at the beginning of the 6th century in the Muslim calendar, al-Ghazâlî broke his vow and returned to teaching at the state-sponsored Nizâmiyya Madrasa in Nishapur, where he himself had been a student. To his followers he justified this step with the great amount of theological confusion among the general public and pressure from authorities at the Seljuq court (al-Ghazâlî 1959a, 45–50 = 2000b, 87–93). Al-Ghazâlî regarded himself as one of the renewers (singl. muhyî) of religion, who, according to a hadîth, will come every new century. In Nishapur, al-Ghazâlî’s teaching activity at the Nizâmiyya madrasa led to a controversy that was triggered by opposition to his teachings, particularly those in his most widely read work, The Revival of the Religious Sciences, and by accusations that these show a distinct influence from falsafa. Al-Ghazâlî was summoned to defend himself in front of the Seljuq governor Sanjar (d. 1157). The latter, however, acquitted him from all charges and supported his teaching activity in Nishapur (Garden 2014: 143–168). On this occasion, al-Ghazâlî again asked to be released from his obligations at the Nizâmiyya madrasa, a request that was denied. All this time, he continued to teach at his zâwiya in Tûs where he died in December 1111 (Griffel 2009, 20–59).

2. Al-Ghazâlî’s Reports of the falâsifa’s Teachings

After having already made a name for himself as a competent author of legal works, al-Ghazâlî published around 1095 a number of books where he addresses the challenges posed by falsafa and by the theology of the Ismâ’îlite Shiites. The movement of falsafa (from Greek: philosophía) resulted from the translation of Greek philosophical and scientific literature into Arabic from the 8th to the early 10th centuries. The Arabic philosophers (falâsifa) were heirs to the late-antique tradition of understanding the works of Aristotle in Neoplatonic terms. In philosophy the translators from Greek into Arabic focused on the works of Aristotle and although some distinctly Neoplatonic texts were translated into Arabic—most notably the pseudo-Aristotelian Theology, a compilation from Plotinus’ Enneads—the most significant Neoplatonic contributions reached the Arabs by way of commentaries on the works of the Stagirite (Wisnovsky 2003, 15). Falsafa was a movement where Christians, Muslims, and even pagan authors participated. After the 12th century it would also include Jewish authors. For reasons that will become apparent, al-Ghazâlî focused his comments on the Muslim falâsifa. In the early 10th century al-Fârâbî (d. 950) had developed a systemic philosophy that challenged key convictions held by Muslim theologians, most notably the creation of the world in time and the original character of the information God reveals to prophets. Following Aristotle, al-Fârâbî taught that the world has no beginning in the past and that the celestial spheres, for instance, move from pre-eternity. Prophets and the revealed religions they bring articulate the same insights that philosophers express in their teachings, yet the prophets use the method of symbolization to make this wisdom more approachable for the ordinary people. Avicenna continued al-Fârâbî’s approach and developed his metaphysics and his prophetology to a point where it offers comprehensive explanations of God’s essence and His actions as well as a psychology that gives a detailed account of how prophets receive their knowledge and how they, for instance, perform miracles that confirm their missions. Avicenna’s philosophy offers philosophical explanations of key Muslim tenets like God’s unity (tawhîd) and the central position of prophets among humans.

In his autobiography al-Ghazâlî writes that during his time at the Baghdad Nizâmiyya he studied the works of the falâsifa for two years before he wrote his Incoherence of the Philosophers in a third year (Ghazâlî 1959a, 18 = 2000b, 61). It is hardly credible, however, that al-Ghazâlî began to occupy himself with falsafa only after he became professor at the Nizâmiyya in Baghdad. This account is apologetic and aims to reject the claim of some of his critics that he had learned falsafa before his own religious education was complete. Most probably he had become acquainted with falsafa while studying with al-Juwaynî, whose works already show an influence from Avicenna. Al-Ghazâlî’s response to Aristotelianism, the Incoherence of the Philosophers, is a masterwork of philosophical literature and may have been decades in the making. It is accompanied by works where al-Ghazâlî provides faithful reports of the philosophers’ teachings. Two of those works have come down to us. The first is an almost complete fragment of a long book where al-Ghazâlî copies or paraphrases passages from the works of philosophers and combines them to a comprehensive report about their teachings in metaphysics (Griffel 2006, al-Akiti 2009). The fragment unfortunately bears no title. The second work, the Doctrines of the Philosophers (Maqâsid al-falâsifa, on the translation of the title see Shihadeh 2011, 90–92), is a loosely adapted Arabic translation of the parts on logics, metaphysics, and the natural sciences in Avicenna’s Persian work Philosophy for ‘Alâ’ al-Dawla (Dânishnamah-yi Alâ’î) (Janssens 1986). Previously it has been assumed that the Doctrines of the Philosophers was written as a preparatory study to his major work, the Incoherence. This can no longer be upheld. Both reports of al-Ghazâlî stand only in a very loose connection to the text of the Incoherence of the Philosophers. The Incoherence and the Doctrines use different terminologies and the latter presents its material in ways that does not support the criticism in the Incoherence (Janssens 2003, 43–45). The Doctrines of the Philosophers may have been a text that was initially unconnected to the Incoherence or that was generated after the composition of the latter. Only its introduction and its brief explicit create a connection to the refutation in the Incoherence. These parts were almost certainly written (or added) after the publication of the Incoherence (Janssens 2003, 45; Griffel 2006, 9–10).

The Doctrines of the Philosophers was translated into Latin in the third quarter of the 12th century and into Hebrew first in 1292 and at least another two times within the next fifty years. These translations enjoyed much more success than the Arabic original. Whereas in Arabic, numerous books that follow a similar goal of presenting (and soon also improving) Avicenna’s philosophical system were composed during the 12th and 13th centuries, none of them were translated into Latin and very few became available in Hebrew. In the Latin as well as in the Hebrew traditions, translations of The Doctrines of the Philosophers overshadowed all of al-Ghazâlî’s other writings. The Latin translation, sometimes referred to as Summa theoricae philosophiae or as Logica et philosophia Algazelis, was the only book by al-Ghazâlî translated during the period of the transmission of Arabic philosophy to Christian Europe (the part on logic is edited in Lohr 1965, the two remaining parts on metaphysics and the natural sciences in al-Ghazâlî 1933). It was translated by Dominicus Gundisalivi (Gundissalinus, d. c. 1190) of Toledo in collaboration with someone referred to as “Magister Iohannes” (d. 1215), also known as Iohannes Hispanus (or Hispalensis), probably an Arabized Christian (a Mozarab), who was dean at the cathedral of Toledo in the 1180s and 1190s (Burnett 1994). The two translators seem to have omitted the short introduction and the explicit where the work is described as an uncommitted report of the falâsifa’s teachings. A small number of Latin manuscripts show signs that this translation was revised during the 13th century (Lohr 1965, 229) and in one case they preserve a Latin rendition of al-Ghazâlî’s original introduction (edited in Salman 1935, 125–27). That, however, had next to no influence on the text’s reception (Salman 1935), and the version that circulated among readers of Latin does not include al-Ghazâlî’s distancing statements (al-Ghazâlî 1506). The book thus concealed its character as a report of Avicenna’s teachings and its author “Algazel” was considered a faithful follower of Avicenna who had produced a masterful compendium of the latter’s philosophy. During the late 12th, the 13th, and the 14th centuries the Summa theoricae philosophiae was a principal source on the teachings of the Arabic philosophers in books by authors like Albert the Great (d. 1280) and Thomas Aquinas (d. 1274) that were essential to the development of the Latin philosophical tradition. The work was still used sporadically in the 15h century and even more often in the 16th century (Minnema 2014; Alonso 1958; d’Alverny 1986). Al-Ghazâlî’s identification as one of them is usually attributed to the limited knowledge of Latin scholars about matters relating to the authors of the texts they read. The assumption, however, that the Doctrines of the Philosophers is not merely a report of the teachings of the falâsifa but rather represents al-Ghazâlî’s genuine positions in philosophy is not limited to the Latin tradition. There are Arabic manuscripts that attribute a text that is quite similar to the Doctrines of the Philosophers to al-Ghazâlî without mentioning that the teachings therein are an uncommitted report. The oldest of these manuscripts was produced at the beginning of the 13th century at Maraghah, an important center of scholarship in NW Iran and is available in facsimile (Pourjavady 2002, 2–62). It shows that also in the Arabic tradition, the positions reported in the Doctrines of the Philosophy were closely associated with al-Ghazâlî. The “mis-identification” of al-Ghazâlî as a follower of Avicenna may have its roots in an attitude among some Arabic readers of al-Ghazâlî who saw in him a closer follower of the falâsifa than the mainstream Arabic tradition wished to acknowledge.

In its several Hebrew versions, al-Ghazâlî’s Doctrines of the Philosophers (known as De’ôt ha-fîlôsôfîm and Kavvanôt ha-fîlôsôfîm) was one of the most widespread philosophical texts studied among Jews in Europe (Steinschneider 1893, 1:296–326; Harvey 2001). The translator of the first Hebrew version of 1292, the Jewish Averroist Isaac Albalag, attached his own introduction and extensive notes to the text (Vajda 1960). This and the other two Hebrew translations attracted a great number of commentators, including Moses Narboni (d. 1362), who was active in southern France and Spain, and Moses Almosnino (d. c.1580) of Thessalonica (Steinschneider 1893, 1:311–25). Al-Ghazâlî’s Doctrines of the Philosophers was a very popular text up to the 16th century and over 75 manuscripts of the Hebrew translations are extant (Eran 2007, Harvey 2015: 289). Some Jewish scholars, like the 14th century Katalan Hasdai Crescas, saw in this Avicennan text a welcome alternative to the equally widespread teachings of Averroes (Harvey and Harvey 2002; Harvey 2015: 300–302). In fact, by the 15th century the Hebrew version of al-Ghazâlî’s Doctrines of the Philosophers may have replaced Averroes as the most popular source among Jews for the study of the Aristotelian natural sciences (Harvey 2015: 289). Although the Hebrew translations make the character of the work as a report clear, al-Ghazâlî was—as in the Latin tradition—regarded as a much closer follower of falsafa than in the mainstream Arabic tradition. The Hebrew tradition, for instance, makes widely available the translation of a text ascribed to al-Ghazâlî where the author responds to questions about astronomy and cosmology that are quite far from Ash’arism and much closer to Aristotelianism (Langermann 2011). This relatively widespread Hebrew text (edited and translated in al-Ghazâlî 1896), referred to as Teshuvôt she’alôt, “Answers to Questions,” or more recently as the “Hebrew Ajwiba,” exists in eleven Hebrew manuscripts (Harvey 2015: 298). Its Arabic original is known only from a very small number of manuscripts, among them the one from Maraghah (Pourjavady 2002, 63–99). Accounts saying that al-Ghazâlî taught philosophical positions he had openly condemned in his Incoherence were relatively widespread in Hebrew literature (Marx 1935, 410, 422–24). Moses Narboni, for instance, believed that al-Ghazâlî used a stratagem to teach philosophy at a time when it was, according to Narboni, officially prohibited. By pretending to refute philosophy in his Incoherence he could justify the writing of the Doctrines. The Doctrines is therefore the main work on philosophy by al-Ghazâlî, Narboni suspected, while the Incoherence serves only the function of legitimizing the former’s publication by saying that a refutation must rely on a thorough knowledge of what is to be refuted (Chertoff 1952, part 2, 6–7). This tendency among Hebrew authors to disentangle al-Ghazâlî from the criticism of philosophy expressed in his Incoherence led the Algerian Jewish scholar Abraham Gavison (fl. 16th cent.) to report erroneously that al-Ghazâlî was the author of both The Incoherence of the Philosophers as well as its repudiation The Incoherence of the Incoherence (Tahâfut al-tahâfut), a work in reality written by Averroes (Gavison 1748, fol. 135a). In addition to his Doctrines, his Incoherence, which was translated in 1411, and the text known as Teshuvôt she’alôt (whose ascription to al-Ghazâlî is doubtful), at least two other works by al-Ghazâlî were translated into Hebrew: Mishkât al-anwâr and Mîzân al-’amal (Steinschneider 1893, 1:326–48, the text Moznei ha-’iyyunîm mentioned there is not by al-Ghazâlî).

3. Al-Ghazâlî’s “Refutations” of falsafa and Ismâ’îlism

Al-Ghazâlî describes the Incoherence of the Philosophers as a “refutation” (radd) of the philosophical movement (Ghazâlî 1959a, 18 = 2000b, 61), and this has contributed to the erroneous assumption that he opposed Aristotelianism and rejected its teachings. His response to falsafa was far more complex and allowed him to adopt many of its teachings. The falâsifa are convinced, al-Ghazâlî complains at the beginning of the Incoherence, that their way of knowing by “demonstrative proof” (burhân) is superior to theological knowledge drawn from revelation and its rational interpretation. This conviction led “a group” among the Muslim falâsifa who disregard Islam and who neglect its ritual duties and its religious law (sharî’a). In his Incoherence al-Ghazâlî discusses twenty key teachings of the falâsifa and rejects the claim that these teachings are demonstratively proven. In a detailed and intricate philosophical discussion al-Ghazâlî aims to show that none of the arguments in favor of these twenty teachings fulfills the high epistemological standard of demonstration (burhân) that the falâsifa have set for themselves. Rather, the arguments supporting these twenty convictions rely upon unproven premises that are accepted only among the falâsifa, but are not established by reason. By showing that these positions are supported by mere dialectical arguments al-Ghazâlî aims to demolish what he regarded was an epistemological hubris on the side of the falâsifa. In the Incoherence he wishes to show that the falâsifa practice taqlîd, meaning they merely repeat these teachings from the founders of their movement without critically examining them (Griffel 2005).

The initial argument of the Incoherence focuses on apodeixis and the demonstrative character of the arguments refuted therein. While the book also touches on the truth of these teachings, it “refutes” numerous positions whose truths al-Ghazâlî acknowledges or which he subscribed to in his later works. In these cases al-Ghazâlî wishes to show that while these particular philosophical teachings are sound and true, they are not demonstrated. The ultimate source of the falâsifa’s knowledge about God’s nature, the human soul, or about the heavenly spheres, for instance, are the revelations given to early prophets such as Abraham and Moses. Their information made it into the books of the ancient philosophers who falsely claimed that they gained these insights by reason alone.

Among the twenty discussions of the Incoherence, sixteen are concerned with positions held in the falâsifa’s metaphysics (ilâhiyyât) and four with positions that appear in their natural sciences (tabî’iyyât). The 17th discussion on causality will be analyzed below. The longest and most substantial discussion is the first, which deals with Avicenna’s and al-Fârâbî’s arguments in favor of the world’s pre-eternity (Hourani 1958, Marmura 1959). Al-Ghazâlî denies that this position can be demonstratively proven and draws from arguments that were earlier developed by anti-Aristotelian critics such as the Christian John Philoponus (Yahyâ l-Nahwî, c.490–c.570) of Alexandria. Philoponus’ arguments, most importantly those that deny the possibility of an infinite number of events in the past, had entered the Arabic discourse on the world’s creation earlier during the 9th century (Davidson 1987, 55–56, 86–116, 366–75).

At the end of the Incoherence al-Ghazâlî asks whether the twenty positions discussed in the book are in conflict with the religious law (sharî’a). Most of them are wrong, he says, yet pose no serious problems in terms of religion, where they should be considered “innovations” (singl. bid’a). A small group of positions is considered wrong as well as religiously problematic. These are three teachings from Avicenna’s philosophy, namely (1) that the world has no beginning in the past and is not created in time, (2) that God’s knowledge includes only classes of beings (universals) and does not extend to individual beings and their circumstances (particulars), and (3) that after death the souls of humans will never again return into bodies. In these three cases the teachings of Islam, which are based on revelation, suggest the opposite, al-Ghazâlî says, and thus overrule the unfounded claims of the falâsifa. What’s more, these three teachings may mislead the public to disregarding the religious law (sharî’a) and are, therefore, dangerous for society (Griffel 2000, 301–3). In his function as a Muslim jurisprudent al-Ghazâlî adds a brief fatwâ at the end of his Incoherence and declares that everybody who teaches these three positions publicly is an unbeliever (kâfir) and an apostate from Islam, who can be killed (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 226).

Al-Ghazâlî’s efforts in dealing with the philosophical movement amount to defining the boundaries of religious tolerance in Islam. Soon after the Incoherence, he wrote a similar book about the movement of the Ismâ’îlite Shiites, known as the “Bâtinites” (“those who arbitrarily follow an inner meaning in the Qur’an”). Initially the Ismâ’îlite Shiites were supporters of the Fâtimid counter-caliphate in Cairo and opposed the political and religious authority of the Sunni caliph in Baghdad and the Seljuq Sultans that he installed. During al-Ghazâlî’s lifetime, however, there occurred a schism within the clandestine Ismâ’îlite movement. The “new propaganda” of the Ismâ’îlites in Iraq and Iran was now independent from the center in Cairo and developed its own strategies. A key element of their—not entirely unsuccessful—efforts to persuade people to their camp was their criticism of sense perception and of rational arguments (al-Ghazâlî 1954, 34; 1964b, 76, 80). Al-Ghazâlî was closely familiar with the Ismâ’îlites’ propaganda efforts but did not always have reliable information on their teachings on cosmology and metaphysics. These were deeply influenced by cosmological notions in late antique Gnostic and Neoplatonic literature (Walker 1993, de Smet 1995). What information he got, al-Ghzâlî seems to have received from the Persian writings of the Ismâ’îlite propagandist and philosopher Nâsir-i Khosrow (d. c. 1075), who lived a generation earlier in Balkh in Khorasan and in the remote region of the Pamir Mountains (Andani 2017). Al-Ghazâlî, however, did not know about the schism within the movement. In his book on the Scandals of the Esoterics (Fadâ’ih al-Bâtiniyya) he looks closely at those teachings that he knew and discusses which of them are merely erroneous and which are unbelief. He assumes—wrongly—that the Ismâ’îlite propagandists teach the existence of two gods. Yet this presentation is not so much a misunderstanding on the side of al-Ghazâlî but rather a deliberate misrepresentation, based on a long discourse of anti-Ismâ’îlite polemics (Andani 2017: 193). This assumed dualism and the Ismâ’îlites’ denial of bodily resurrection in the afterlife leads to their condemnation by al-Ghazâlî as unbelievers and apostates from Islam (al-Ghazâlî 1964b, 151–55 = 2000b, 228–29).

4. The Place of falsafa in Islam

In his attempt to define the boundaries of Islam al-Ghazâlî singles out a limited number of teachings that in his opinion overstep the borders. In a separate book, The Decisive Criterion for Distinguishing Islam from Clandestine Unbelief (Faysal al-tafriqa bayna l-Islâm wa-l-zandaqa) he clarifies that only teachings that violate certain “fundamental doctrines” (usûl al-‘aqâ’id) should be deemed unbelief and apostasy. These doctrines are limited to three: monotheism, Muhammad’s prophecy, and the Qur’anic descriptions of life after death (al-Ghazâlî 1961, 195 = 2002, 112). He stresses that all other teachings, including those that are erroneous or even regarded as “religious innovations” (singl. bid’a), should be tolerated. Again other teachings may be correct, al-Ghazâlî adds, and despite their philosophical background, for instance, should be accepted by the Muslim community. Each teaching must be judged by itself, and if found sound and in accordance with revelation, should be adopted (al-Ghazâlî 1959a, 25–27 = 2000b, 67–70). This attitude leads to a widespread application of Aristotelian teachings in al-Ghazâlî’s works on Muslim theology and ethics.

Al-Ghazâlî’s refutations of the falâsifa and the Ismâ’îlites have a distinctly political component. In both cases he fears that the followers of these movements as well as people with only a cursory understanding of them might believe that they can disregard the religious law (sharî’a). In the case of the Ismâ’îlites there was an additional theological motive. In their religious propaganda the Ismâ’îlites openly challenged the authority of Sunni theology, claiming its religious speculation and its interpretation of scripture is arbitrary. The Sunni theologians submit God’s word to judgments that appear to be reasonable, the Ismâ’îlites said, yet they are purely capricious, a fact evident from the many disputes among Sunni theologians. No rational argument is more convincing than any of its opposing rational arguments, the Ismâ’îlites claimed, since all rational proofs are mutually equivalent (takâfu’ al-adilla). Only the divinely guided word of the Shiite Imam conveys certainty (al-Ghazâlî 1964b, 76, 80 = 2000b, 189, 191). In response to this criticism al-Ghazâlî introduces the Aristotelian notion of demonstration (burhân). Sunni theologians argue among each other, he says, because they are largely unfamiliar with the technique of demonstration. For al-Ghazâlî, reason (‘aql) is executed most purely and precisely by formulating arguments that are demonstrative and reach a level where their conclusions are beyond doubt. Al-Ghazâlî wrote in one of his letters to a student that later circulated as an independent epistle: “A [valid] rational demonstration is never wrong” (Griffel 2015: 110–112). This also implies that the results of true demonstrations cannot conflict with revelation since neither reason nor revelation can be considered false. If demonstration proves something that violates the literal meaning of revelation, the scholar must apply interpretation (ta’wîl) to the outward text and read it as a symbol of a deeper truth. There are, for instance, valid demonstrative arguments proving that God cannot have a “hand” or sit on a “throne.” These prompt the Muslim scholar to interpret the Qur’anic passages where these words appear as symbols (al-Ghazâlî 1961, 175–89 = 2002, 96–103). The interpretation of passages in revelation, however, whose outward meaning is not disproved by a valid demonstration, is not allowed (Griffel 2000, 332–35; 2009, 111–16).

Al-Ghazâlî’s rule for reconciling apparent conflicts between reason and the literal meaning of revelation was widely accepted by almost all later Muslim theologians, particularly those with rationalist tendencies. Ibn Taymiyya (1263–1328), however, criticized al-Ghazâlî’s rule from an scriptualist angle. Ibn Taymiyya (1980, 1:86–87) rejected al-Ghazâlî’s implication that in cases of conflict between reason and the revealed text, priority should be given to the former over the latter. He also remarked that al-Ghazâlî’s own arguments denying the possibility that God sits on a “throne” (Qur’an 2.255), for instance, fail to be demonstrative. Ibn Taymiyya flatly denied the possibility of a conflict between reason and revelation and maintained that the perception of such a disagreement results from subjecting revelation to premises that revelation itself does not accept (Heer 1993, 188–92).

On the falâsifa’s side Averroes accepted al-Ghazâlî’s rule for reconciling conflicts between reason and the outward meaning of revelation but he did not agree with his findings on what can and cannot be demonstrated (Griffel 2000, 437–61). Averroes composed a refutation of al-Ghazâlî’s Incoherence, which he called The Incoherence of the [Book of the] Incoherence (Tahâfut al-tahâfut). This work was translated twice into Latin in 1328 and 1526, the later one on the basis of an earlier Hebrew translation of the text (Steinschneider 1893, 1:330–38). The two Latin translations both have the title Destructio destructionum (the later one is edited in Averroes 1961). They were printed numerous times during the 16th century and made al-Ghazâlî’s criticism of Aristotelianism known among the Averroists of the Renaissance. The Italian Agostino Nifo (c.1473– after 1538), for instance, wrote a Latin commentary to Averroes’ book. While accepting the principle that only a valid demonstration allows interpreting the Qur’an symbolically, Averroes maintained that Aristotle had already demonstrated the pre-eternity of the world, which would elevate it, according to al-Ghazâlî’s rules, to a philosophical as well as religious doctrine. Averroes also remarked that there is no passage in the Qur’an that unambiguously states the creation of the world in time (Averroes 2001, 16). Al-Ghazâlî was clearly aware of this but assumed that this tenet is established through the consensus (ijmâ’) of Muslim theologians (Griffel 2000, 278, 429–30; 2002, 58). While al-Ghazâlî condemns the pre-eternity of the world at the end of his Incoherence of the Philosophers, the subject of the world’s pre-eternity is no longer raised in his later more systematic work on the boundaries of Islam, The Decisive Criterion for Distinguishing Islam from Clandestine Unbelief.

5. The Ethics of the Revival of the Religious Sciences

Soon after al-Ghazâlî had published his two refutations of falsafa and Ismâ’îlism he left his position at the Nizâmiyya madrasa in Baghdad. During this period he began writing what most Muslim scholars regard as his major work, The Revival of the Religious Sciences (Ihyâ’ ‘ulûm al-dîn). The voluminous Revival is a comprehensive guide to ethical behavior in the everyday life of Muslims (Garden 2014: 63–122). It is divided into four sections, each containing ten books. The first section deals with ritual practices (‘ibâdât), the second with social customs (‘âdât), the third with those things that lead to perdition (muhlikât) and hence should be avoided, and the fourth with those that lead to salvation (munjiyât) and should be sought. In the forty books of the Revival al-Ghazâlî severely criticizes the coveting of worldly matters and reminds his readers that human life is a path towards Judgment Day and the reward or punishment gained through it. Compared with the eternity of the next life, this life is almost insignificant, yet it seals our fate in the world to come. In his autobiography al-Ghazâlî writes that reading Sufi literature made him realize that our theological convictions are by themselves irrelevant for gaining redemption in the afterlife. Not our good beliefs or intentions count; only our good and virtuous actions will determine our life in the world to come. This insight prompted al-Ghazâlî to change his lifestyle and adopt the Sufi path (al-Ghazâlî 1959a, 35–38 = 2000b, 77–80). In the Revival he composed a book about human actions (mu’âmalât) that wishes to steer clear of any deeper discussion of theological insights (mukâshafât). Rather, it aims at guiding people towards ethical behavior that God will reward in this world and the next (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 1:4–5).

In the Revival al-Ghazâlî attacks his colleagues in Muslim scholarship, questioning their intellectual capacities and independence as well as their commitment to gaining reward in the world to come. This increased moral consciousness brings al-Ghazâlî close to Sufi attitudes, which have a profound influence on his subsequent works such as The Niche of Lights (Mishkât al-anwâr). These later works also reveal a significant philosophical influence on al-Ghazâlî. In the Revival he teaches ethics that are based on the development of character traits (singl., khulq, pl. akhlâq). Performing praiseworthy deeds is an effect of praiseworthy character traits that warrant salvation in the next life (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 1:34.4–5). He criticizes the more traditional concept of Sunni ethics that is limited to compliance with the ordinances of the religious law (sharî’a) and following the example of the Prophet Muhammad. Traditional Sunni ethics are closely linked to jurisprudence (fiqh) and limit itself, according to al-Ghazâlî, to determining and teaching the rules of sharî’a. Traditional Sunni jurisprudents are mere “scholars of this world” (‘ulamâ’ al-dunyâ) who cannot guide Muslims on the best way to gain the afterlife (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 1:30–38, 98–140).

In his own ethics al-Ghazâlî stresses that the Prophet—and no other teacher—should be the one person a Muslim emulates. He supplements this key Sunni notion with the concept of “disciplining the soul” (riyâdat al-nafs). At birth the essence of the human is deficient and ignoble and only strict efforts and patient treatment can lead it towards developing virtuous character traits (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, book 23). The human soul’s temperament, for instance, becomes imbalanced through the influence of other people and needs to undergo constant disciplining (riyâda) and training (tarbiya) in order to keep these character traits at equilibrium. Behind this kind of ethics stands the Aristotelian notion of entelechy: humans have a natural potential to develop rationality and through it acquire virtuous character. Education, literature, religion, and politics should help realizing this potential. Al-Ghazâlî became acquainted with an ethic that focuses on the development of virtuous character traits through the works of Muslim falâsifa like Miskawayh (d. 1030) and Muslim scholars like al-Râghib al-Isfahânî (d. c.1025), who strove to make philosophical notions compatible with Muslim religious scholarship (Madelung 1974). As a result al-Ghazâlî rejected the notion, for instance, that one should try to give up potentially harmful affections like anger or sexual desire. These character traits are part of human nature, al-Ghazâlî teaches, and cannot be given up. Rather, disciplining the soul means controlling these potentially harmful traits through one’s rationality (‘aql). The human soul has to undergo constant training and needs to be disciplined similar to a young horse that needs to be broken in, schooled, and treated well.

At no point does al-Ghazâlî reveal the philosophical origins of his ethics. He himself saw a close connection between the ethics of the falâsifa and Sufi notions of an ascetic and virtuous lifestyle. In his Revival he merges these two ethical traditions to a successful and influential fusion. In his autobiography al-Ghazâlî says that the ethics of the falâsifa and that of the Sufis are one and the same. Congruent with his position that many teachings and arguments of the falâsifa are taken from earlier revelations and from the divinely inspired insights of mystics, who existed already in pre-Islamic religions (Treiger 2012, 99–101) he adds that the falâsifa have taken their ethics from the Sufis, meaning here mystics among the earlier religions (al-Ghazâlî 1959a, 24 = 2000b, 67).

Another important field where al-Ghazâlî introduced Avicennan ideas into Ash’arite kalâm in a way that this tradition eventually adopted them is human psychology and the rational explanation of prophecy (Griffel 2004, al-Akiti 2004). Based on partly mis-translated texts by Aristotle (Hansberger 2011), Avicenna developed a psychology that assumes the existence of several distinct faculties of the soul. These faculties are stronger or weaker in individual humans. Prophecy is the combination of three faculties which the prophet has in an extraordinarily strong measure. These faculties firstly allow the prophet to acquire theoretical knowledge instantly without learning, secondly represent this knowledge through symbols and parables as well as divine future events, and thirdly to bring about effects outside of his body such as rain or earthquakes. These three faculties exist in every human in a small measure, a fact proven by the experience of déjà vu, for instance, a phenomenon referred to in the Arabic philosophic tradition as “the veridical dream” (al-manâm al-sâdiq). Al-Ghazâlî adopted these teachings and appropriated them for his own purposes (Treiger 2012). The existence of the three faculties in human souls that make up prophecy serves for him as an explanation of the higher insights that mystics such as Sufi masters have in comparison to other people. While prophets have strong prophetic faculties and ordinary humans very weak ones, the “friends of God” (awliyâ’, i.e. Sufi masters) stand in between these two. They are endowed with “inspiration” (ilhâm), which is similar to prophecy and which serves in al-Ghazâlî as one of the most important sources of human knoweldge. Unlike Avicenna, for whom prophets and maybe also some particularly talented humans (’ârifûn in his language) acquire the same knowledge that philosophers reach through apodictic reasoning, in al-Ghazâlî the prophets and awliyâ’ have access to knowledge that is superior to that available solely through reason.

Despite the significant philosophical influence on al-Ghazâlî’s ethics, he maintained in Islamic law (fiqh) the anti-rationalist Ash’arite position that human rationality is mute with regard to normative judgments about human actions and cannot decide whether an action is “good” or “bad.” When humans think they know, for instance, that lying is bad, their judgment is determined by a consideration of their benefits. With regard to the ethical value of our actions we have a tendency to confuse moral value with benefit. We generally tend to assume that whatever benefits our collective interest is morally good, while whatever harms us collectively is bad. These judgments, however, are ultimately fallacious and cannot be the basis of jurisprudence (fiqh). “Good” actions are those that are rewarded in the afterlife and “bad” actions are those that are punished (al-Ghazâlî 1904–07, 1:61). The kind of connection between human actions and reward or punishment in the afterlife can only be learned from revelation (Hourani 1976, Marmura 1968–69). Muslim jurisprudence is the science that extracts general rules from revelation. Like most religious sciences it aims at advancing humans’ prospect of redemption in the world to come. Therefore it must be based on the Qur’an and the sunna of the Prophet while it uses logic and other rational means to extract general rules.

Al-Ghazâlî was one of the first Muslim jurists who introduced the consideration of a “public benefit” (maslaha) into Muslim jurisprudence. In addition to developing clear guidance of how to gain redemption in the afterlife, religious law (sharî’a) also aims at creating an environment that allows each individual wellbeing and the pursuit of a virtuous and pious lifestyle. Al-Ghazâlî argues that when God revealed divine law (sharî’a) He did so with the purpose (maqsad) of advancing human benefits in this world and the next. Al-Ghazâlî identifies five essential components for wellbeing in this world: religion, life, intellect, offspring, and property. Whatever protects these “five necessities” (al-darûriyyât al-khamsa) is considered public benefit (maslaha) and should be advanced, while whatever harms them should be avoided. The jurisprudent (faqîh) should aim at safeguarding these five necessities in his legal judgments. In recommending this, al-Ghazâlî practically implies that a “maslaha mursala,” a public benefit that is not mentioned in the revealed text, is considered a valid source of legislation (Opwis 2007 and 2010, 65–88).

6. Cosmology in the Revival of the Religious Sciences

Despite his declared reluctance to enter into theological discussions, al-Ghazâlî addresses in his Revival important philosophical problems related to human actions. In the 35th book on “Belief in Divine Unity and Trust in God” (Kitâb al-Tawhîd wa-l-tawakkul) he discusses the relationship between human actions and God’s omnipotence as creator of the world. In this and other books of the Revival al-Ghazâlî teaches a strictly determinist position with regard to events in the universe. God creates and determines everything, including the actions of humans. God is the only “agent” or the only “efficient cause” (fâ’il, the Arabic term means both) in the world. Every event in creation follows a pre-determined plan that is eternally present in God’s knowledge. God’s knowledge exists in a timeless realm and does not contain individual “cognitions” (‘ulûm) like human knowledge does. God’s knowledge does not change, for instance, when its object, the world, changes. While the events that are contained in God’s knowledge are ordered in “before” and “after”, there is no past, present, and future. God’s knowledge contains the first moment of creation just as the last, and He knows “in His eternity,” for instance, whether a certain individual will end up in paradise or hell (Griffel 2009, 175–213).

For all practical purposes it befits humans to assume that God controls everything through chains of causes (Marmura 1965, 193–96). We witness in nature causal processes that add up to longer causal chains. Would we be able to follow a causal chain like an “inquiring wayfarer” (sâlik sâ’il), who follows a chain of events to its origin, we would be led through causal processes in the sub-lunar sphere, the “world of dominion” (‘âlam al-mulk), further to causes that exist in the celestial spheres, the “world of sovereignty” (‘âlam al-malakût), until we would finally reach the highest celestial intellect, which is caused by the being beyond it, God (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 13:2497–509 = 2001, 15–33; see also idem 1964a, 220–21). God is the starting point of all causal chains and He creates and controls all elements therein. God is “the one who makes the causes function as causes” (musabbib al-asbâb) (Frank 1992, 18).

God’s “causal” determination of all events also extends to human actions. Every human action is caused by the person’s volition, which is caused by a certain motive (dâ’iya). The person’s volition and motive are, in turn, caused by the person’s convictions and his or her knowledge (‘ilm). Human knowledge is caused by various factors, like one’s experience of the world, one’s knowledge of revelation, or the books one has read (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 13:2509–11 = 2001, 34–37). There is no single event in this world that is not determined by God’s will. While humans are under the impression that they have a free will, their actions are in reality compelled by causes that exist within them as well as outside (Griffel 2009, 213–34).

Al-Ghazâlî viewed the world as a conglomerate of connections that are all pre-determined and meticulously planned in God’s timeless knowledge. God creates the universe as a huge apparatus and employs it in order to pursue a certain goal (qasd). In two of his later works al-Ghazâlî compares the universe with a water-clock. Here he describes three stages of its creation. The builder of the water-clock first has to make a plan of it, secondly execute this plan and build the clock, and thirdly he has to make the clock going by supplying it with a constant source of energy, namely the flow of water. That energy needs to be carefully measured, because only the right amount of energy will produce the desired result. In God’s creation of the universe these three stages are called judgment (hukm), decree (qadâ’), and pre-destination (qadar) (al-Ghazâlî 1971, 98–102; 1964a, 12–14). God designs the universe in His timeless knowledge, puts it into being at one point in time, and provides it with a constant and well-measured supply of “being” (wujûd). According to Avicenna’s explanation of creation—which al-Ghazâlî was not opposed to—“being” is passed down from God to the first and ontologically highest creation and from there in a chain of secondary efficient causes to all other existents. It is important to acknowledge, however, that God is the only true efficient cause (fâ’il) in this chain. He is the only “agent,” all other beings are merely employed in His service (Griffel 2009, 236–53).

Nature is a process in which all elements harmoniously dovetail with one another. Celestial movements, natural processes, human actions, even redemption in the afterlife are all “causally” determined. Whether we will be rewarded or punished in the afterlife can be understood, according to al-Ghazâlî, as the mere causal effect of our actions in this world. In the 32nd book of his Revival al-Ghazâlî explains how knowing the Qur’an causes the conviction (i’tiqâd) that one is punished for bad deeds, and how that conviction may cause salvation in the afterlife:

…and the conviction [that some humans will be punished] is a cause (sabab) for the setting in of fear, and the setting in of fear is a cause for abandoning the passions and retreating from the abode of delusions. This is a cause for arriving at the vicinity of God, and God is the one who makes the causes function as causes (musabbib al-asbâb) and who arranges them (murattibuhâ). These causes have been made easy for him, who has been predestined in eternity to earn redemption, so that through their chaining-together the causes will lead him to paradise. (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 11:2225.)

All these are teachings that are very close to those of Avicenna (Frank 1992, 24–25). Al-Ghazâlî also followed Avicenna in his conviction that this universe is the best of all possible worlds and that “there is in possibility nothing more wondrous than what is” (laysa fî-l-imkân abda’ mimmâ kân) (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 13:2515–18 = 2001, 47–50). This led to a long-lasting debate among later Muslim theologians about what is meant by this sentence and whether al-Ghazâlî is, in fact, right (Ormsby 1984). It must be stressed, however, that contrary to Avicenna—and contrary to Frank’s (1992, 55–63) understanding of him—al-Ghazâlî firmly held that God exercises a genuine free will and that when He creates, He chooses between alternatives. God’s will is not in any way determined by God’s nature or essence. God’s will is the undetermined determinator of everything in this world.

7. Causality in al-Ghazâlî

Al-Ghazâlî’s cosmology of God’s determination and His control over events in His creation through chains of causes (singl. sabab) aimed at safeguarding the Sunni doctrine of omnipotence and divine pre-determination against the criticism of Mu’tazilites and Shiites. Humans have only the impression of a free will (ikhtiyâr). In reality they are compelled to choose what they deem is the best action (khayr) among the present alternatives. Avicenna’s determinist ontology, where every event in the created world is by itself contingent (mumkim al-wujûd bi-dhâtihi) yet also necessitated by something else (wâjib al-wujûd bi-ghayrihi), provided a suitable interpretation of God’s pre-determination and is readily adopted by al-Ghazâlî although he never admits that or uses Avicenna’s language. In Avicenna the First Being, which is God, makes all other beings and events necessary. In al-Ghazâlî God’s will, which is distinct from His essence, necessitates all beings and events in creation. The adaptation of fundamental assumptions in Avicenna’s cosmology together with an almost wholesale acceptance of Avicenna’s psychology and his prophetology led Frank (1992, 86) to conclude “that from a theological standpoint most of [Avicenna’s] theses which he rejected are relatively tame and inconsequential compared to those in which he follows the philosopher.”

While al-Ghazâlî’s determinist cosmology is a radical but faithful interpretation of the Ash’arite tenet of divine pre-determination, the way al-Ghazâlî writes about it in his Revival and later works violates other principles of Ash’arism and has led to much confusion among modern interpreters. The remainder of this article will make an attempt to resolve current interpretative problems and explain al-Ghazâlî’s innovative approach towards causality.

7.1 Occasionalism versus Secondary Causality

Al-Ash’ari (873–935), the founder of the theological school that al-Ghazâlî belonged to, had rejected the existence of “natures” (tabâ’i’ ) and of causal connections among created beings. In a radical attempt to explain God’s omnipotence, he combined several ideas that were developed earlier in Muslim kalâm to what became known as occasionalism. All material things are composed of atoms that have no qualities or attributes but simply make up the shape of the body. The atoms of the bodies are the carrier of “accidents” (singl. ‘arad), which are attributes like weight, density, color, smell, etc. In the cosmology of al-Ash’arî all immaterial things are considered “accidents” that inhere in a “substance” (jawhar). Only the atoms of spatially extended bodies can be substances. A person’s thoughts, for instance, are considered accidents that inhere in the atoms of the person’s brain, while his or her faith is an accident inhering in the atoms of the heart. None of the accidents, however, can subsist from one moment (waqt) to the next. This leads to a cosmology where in each moment God assigns the accidents to bodies in which they inhere. When one moment ends, God creates new accidents. None of the created accidents in the second moment has any causal relation to the ones in the earlier moment. If a body continues to have a certain attribute from one moment to the next, then God creates two identical accidents inhering in that body in each of the two subsequent moments. Movement and development generate when God decides to change the arrangement of the moment before. A ball is moved, for instance, when in the second moment of two the atoms of the ball happen to be created in a certain distance from the first. The distance determines the speed of the movement. The ball thus jumps in leaps over the playing field and the same is true for the players’ limbs and their bodies. This also applies to the atoms of the air if there happen to be some wind. In every moment, God re-arranges all the atoms of this world anew and He creates new accidents—thus creating a new world every moment (Perler/Rudolph 2000, 28–62).

All Ash’arite theologians up to the generation of al-Ghazâlî—including his teacher al-Juwaynî—subscribed to the occasionalist ontology developed by al-Ash’arî. One of al-Juwaynî’s late works, the Creed for Nizâm al-Mulk (al-‘Aqîda al-Nizâmiyya), shows, however, that he already explored different ontological models, particularly with regard to the effects of human actions (al-Juwaynî 1948, 30–36; Gimaret 1980, 122–28). A purely occasionalist model finds it difficult to explain how God can make humans responsible for their own actions if they do not cause them. As a viable alternative to the occasionalist ontology, al-Ghazâlî considered the Avicennan model of secondary causes. When God wishes to create a certain event He employs some of His own creations as mediators or “secondary causes.” God creates series of efficient causes where any superior element causes the existence of the inferior ones. Avicenna stresses that no causal series, in any of the four types of causes, can regress indefinitely. Every series of causes and effects must have at least three components: a first element, a middle element, and a last element. In such a chain only the first element is the cause in the real sense of the word (‘illa mutlaqa) of all subsequent elements. It causes the last element of that chain—the ultimate effect—through one or many intermediaries (singl. mutawassat), which are the middle elements of the chain. Looking at a chain of efficient causes, the “finiteness of the causes” (tanâhî l-’ilal) serves for Avicenna as the basis of a proof of God’s existence. Tracing back all efficient causes in the universe will lead to a first efficient cause, which is itself uncaused. When the First Cause is also shown to be incorporeal and numerically one, one has achieved a proof of God’s existence (Avicenna 2005, 257–9, 270–3; Davidson 1987, 339–40).

7.2 The 17th Discussion of the Incoherence

Al-Ghazâlî offers a brief yet very comprehensive examination of causality within the 17th discussion of his Incoherence of the Philosophers. The 17th discussion is not triggered by any opposition to causality. Rather it aims at forcing al-Ghazâlî’s adversaries, the falâsifa, to acknowledge that all prophetical miracles that are reported in the Qur’an are possible. If their possibility is acknowledged, a Muslim philosopher who accepts the authority of revelation must also admit that the prophets performed these miracles and that the narrative in revelation is truthful. Al-Ghazâlî divides the 17th discussion into four different sections. He presents three different “positions” (singl. maqâm) of his (various) opponents and addresses them one by one. His response to the “second position”, which is that of Avicenna, is further divided into two different “approaches” (singl. maslak). This four-fold division of the 17th discussion is crucial for its understanding. Al-Ghazâlî addresses different concepts about causality within the different discussions and develops not one, but at least two coherent responses.

For a detailed discussion of the four parts in the 17th discussion the reader must be referred to chapter 6 in Griffel 2009 (147–73). The following pages give only an outline of al-Ghazâlî’s overall argument. In the opening sentence of the 17th discussion al-Ghazâlî introduces the position he wishes to refute and he lines out elements that alternative explanations of causality must include in order to be acceptable for al-Ghazâlî. This opening statement is a masterwork of philosophical literature:

The connection (iqtirân) between what is habitually believed to be a cause and what is habitually believed to be an effect is not necessary (darûrî), according to us. But [with] any two things [that are not identical and that do not imply one another] (…) it is not necessary that the existence or the nonexistence of one follows necessarily (min darûra) from the existence or the nonexistence of the other (…). Their connection is due to the prior decision (taqdîr) of God, who creates them side by side (‘alâ al-tasâwuq), not to its being necessary by itself, incapable of separation. (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 166)

Al-Ghazâlî lays out four conditions that any explanation of physical processes that is acceptable to him must fulfill: (1) the connection between a cause and its effect is not necessary, (2) the effect can come to exist without this particular cause (“they are not incapable of separation”), (3) God creates two events concomitant, side by side, and (4) God’s creation follows a prior decision (taqdîr). On first sight, it seems that only an occasionalist explanation of physical processes would fulfill these four conditions, and this is how this statement has mostly been understood. Rudolph (in Perler/Rudolph 2000, 75–77), however, pointed out that not only occasionalism but other types of explanations also fulfill these four criteria. Most misleading is the third requirement that God would need to create events “side by side.” These words seem to point exclusively to an occasionalist understanding of creation. One should keep in mind, however, that this formula leaves open, how God creates events. Even an Avicennan philosopher holds that God creates the cause concomitant to its effect, and does so by means of secondary causality. While the 17th discussion of al-Ghazâlî’s Incoherence points towards occasionalism as a possible solution, it also points to others. Al-Ghazâlî chooses a certain linguistic association to occasionalism, which has led many interpreters of this discussion to believe that here, he argues exclusively in favor of it.

It is important to understand that al-Ghazâlî does not deny the existence of a connection between a cause and its effect; rather he denies the necessary character of this connection. In the First Position of the 17th discussion al-Ghazâlî brings the argument that observation cannot prove causal connections. Observation can only conclude that the cause and its effect occur concomitantly:

Observation (mushâhada) points towards a concomitant occurrence (al-husûl ‘indahu) but not to a combined occurrence (al-husûl bihi) and that there is no other cause (‘illa) for it. (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 167.)

It would be wrong, however, to conclude from this argument that al-Ghazâlî denied the existence of causal connections. While such connections cannot be proven through observation (or through any other means), they may or may not exist. In the First Position al-Ghazâlî rejects the view that the connection between an efficient cause and its effect is simply necessary per se, meaning that the proximate cause alone is fully responsible for the effect and that nothing else is also necessary for the effect to occur. In another work this position is described as one held by “materialists” (dahriyyûn) who deny that the world has a cause or a maker (al-Ghazâlî 1959a, 19 = 2000b, 61). The Mu’tazilite view of tawallud, meaning that humans are the sole creators of their own actions and their immediate effects, also falls under this position (al-Ghazâlî 2000, 226.13–14). Like in the connection between a father and his son, where the father is not the only efficient cause for the son’s existence, so there may be in every causal connection efficient causes involved other than the most obvious or the most proximate one. The proximate efficient cause may be just the last element in a long chain of efficient causes that extends via the heavenly realm. The intellects of the celestial spheres, which were thought to be referred to in revelation as “angels,” may be middle elements or intermediaries in causal chains that all have its beginning in God. Al-Ghazâlî rejects the position of the materialists and the Mu’tazilites because it does not take account of the fact that God is the ultimate efficient cause of the observed effect. God may create this effect directly or by way of secondary causality. Discussing the example that when fire touches a ball of cotton it causes it to combust, al-Ghazâlî writes about the First Position that the fire alone causes combustion:

This [position] is one of those that we deny. Rather we say that the efficient cause (fâ’il) of the combustion through the creation of blackness in the cotton and through causing the separation of its parts and turning it into coal or ashes is God—either through the mediation of the angels or without mediation. (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 167.)

Secondary causality is a viable option for al-Ghazâlî that he is willing to accept. Still he does not accept the teachings of Avicenna, which are discussed in the Second Position. Avicenna combines secondary causality with the view that causal processes proceed with necessity and in accord with the natures of things, and not by way of deliberation and choice on the side of the efficient cause. The ultimate efficient cause in a cosmology of secondary causality is, of course, God. The Avicennan opponent of the Second Position teaches secondary causality plus he holds that the causal connections follow with necessity from the nature of the First Being. They are not created through God’s deliberation and choice but are a necessary effect of God’s essence.

7.3 Two Different Concepts of the Modalities

When al-Ghazâlî writes that the connection between a cause and its effect is not necessary he attacks Avicenna’s necessitarian ontology not his secondary causality. The dispute between al-Ghazâlî and Avicenna is not about causality as such, rather about the necessary nature of God’s creation. Kukkonen (2000) and Dutton (2001) have shown that the two start with quite different assumptions about necessity. Avicenna’s view of the modalities follows the statistical model of Aristotle and connects the possibility of a thing to its temporal actuality (Bäck 1992). A temporally unqualified sentence like, “Fire causes cotton to combust,” contains implicitly or explicitly a reference to the time of utterance as part of its meaning. If this sentence is true whenever uttered, it is necessarily true. If its truth-value can change in the course of time, it is possible. If such a sentence is false whenever uttered, it is impossible (Hintikka 1973, 63–72, 84–6, 103–5, 149–53). In Aristotelian modal theories, modal terms were taken to refer to the one and only historical world of ours. For Avicenna, fire necessarily causes cotton to combust because the sentence “Fire causes cotton to combust,” was, is, and will always be true.

Al-Ghazâlî’s understanding of the modalities developed in the context of Ash’arite kalâm and does not share the statistical model of Aristotle and Avicenna. Ash’arite kalâm developed an understanding that is closer to our modern view of the modalities as referring to synchronic alternative states of affairs. In the modern model, the notion of necessity refers to what obtains in all alternatives, the notion of possibility refers to what obtains in at least in one alternative, and that which is impossible does not obtain in any conceivable state of affairs (Knuuttila 1998, 145). Ash’arite kalâm pursued the notion that God is the particularizing agent (mukhassis) of all events in the world, who determines, for instance, when things come into existence and when they fall out of existence (Davidson 1987, 159–61, 176–80). The idea of particularization (takhsîs) includes implicitly an understanding of possible worlds that are different from this. The process of particularization makes one of several alternatives actual. In his Creed for Nizâm al-Mulk, al-Juwaynî explains the Ash’arite understanding of the modalities. Every sound thinking person finds within herself, “the knowledge about the possibility of what is possible, the necessity of what is necessary, and the impossibility of what is impossible” (al-Juwaynî 1948, 8–9). We know this distinction instinctively without learning it from others and without further inquiry into the world. It is an impulse (badîha) in our rational judgment (‘aql). Al-Juwaynî explains this impulse:

The impulsive possibility that the intellect rushes to apprehend without [any] consideration, thinking, or inquiry is what becomes evident to the intelligent person when he sees a building. [The building] is a possibility that comes into being (min jawâz hudûthihi). The person knows decisively and offhand that the actual state (hudûth) of that building is from among its possible states (ja’izât) and that it is not impossible in the intellect had it not been built. (al-Juwaynî 1948, 9)

The intelligent person (al-‘âqil)—here simply meaning a person with full rational capacity—realizes that all the features of the building, its height, its length, its form, etc., are actualized possibilities and could be different. The same applies to the time when the building is built. We immediately realize, al-Juwaynî says, that there is a synchronic alternative state to the actual building. This is what we call possibility or more precisely contingency (imkân). Realizing that there is such an alternative is an important part of our understanding: “The intelligent person cannot realize in his mind anything about the states of the building without comparing it with what is contingent like it (imkân mithlihi) or what is different from it (khilâfihi).” (al-Juwaynî 1948,9.)

In at least three passages of the Incoherence al-Ghazâlî criticizes Avicenna’s understanding of the modalities. Here he refers to another, closely related dispute, namely that for Avicenna the modalities exist in reality while for al-Ghazâlî they exist only as judgments in the minds of humans (al-Ghazâlî 2000, 42.2–5, 124.10–11, 207.4–14). He denies Avicenna’s premise that possibility needs a substrate. This premise is Aristotelian—it is the basis to the principle of entelechy, namely that all things have potentialities and are driven to actualize them (Dutton 2001, 26–7) Al-Ghazâlî shifts, as Kukkonen (2000, 488–9) puts it, the locus of the presumption of a thing’s actual existence from the plane of the actualized reality to the plane of mental conceivability.

When al-Ghazâlî says that “according to us” the connection between the efficient cause and its effect is not necessary, he aims to point out that the connection could be different even if it never will be different. For Avicenna, the fact that the connection never was different and never will be different implies that it is necessary. Nowhere in his works requires al-Ghazâlî that any given causal connection was different or will be different in order to be considered not necessary. We will see that he, like Avicenna, assumes causal connections never were and never will be different from what they are now. Still they are not necessary, he maintains. The connection between a cause and its effect is contingent (mumkin) because an alternative to it is conceivable in our minds. We can imagine a world where fire does not cause cotton to combust. Or, to continue reading the initial statement of the 17th discussion:

(…) it is within divine power to create satiety without eating, to create death without a deep cut (hazz) in the neck, to continue life after having received a deep cut in the neck, and so on to all connected things. The falâsifa deny the possibility of [this] and claim it to be impossible. (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 166.)

Of course, a world where fire doesn’t cause combustion in cotton would be radically different from the one we live in. A change in a single causal connection would probably imply that many others would be different as well. Still, such a world can be conceived in our minds, which means it is a possible world. God, however, did not choose to create such an alternative possible world (Griffel 2009, 172–3).

In the initial statement of the 17th discussion al-Ghazâlî claims that “the connection [between cause and effect] is due to the prior decision (taqdîr) of God.” When he objects to Avicenna that these connections are not necessary, al-Ghazâlî wishes to point out that God could have chosen to create an alternative world where the causal connections are different from what they are. Avicenna denied this. This world is the necessary effect of God’s nature and a world different from this one is unconceivable. Al-Ghazâlî objects and says this world is the contingent effect of God’s free will and His deliberate choice between alternative worlds.

7.4 The Cum-Possibility of Occasionalism and Secondary Causality

In the Second Position of the 17th discussion al-Ghazâlî presents two different “approaches” (singl. maslak) in order to counter Avicenna’s position that the necessary connection between existing causes and effects renders some miracles in the Qur’an impossible. In the First Approach al-Ghazâlî denies the existence of “natures” (tabâ’i’) and of causal connections and maintains that God creates every event immediately. This is the part of the 17th discussion where he presents occasionalism as a viable explanation of what we have usually come to refer as efficient causality. God’s eternal and unchanging knowledge already contains all events that will happen in creation. By creating combustion every time fire touches cotton, God follows a certain custom (‘âda). In real terms, however, combustion occurs only concomitantly when fire touches cotton and is not connected to this event. In the First Approach of the Second Position in the 17th discussion (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 169.14–171.11) and in some of his later works (al-Ghazâlî 1962), he maintains that causal processes may simply be the result of God’s habit and that He creates what we consider a cause and its effect individually and immediately. When God wishes to perform a miracle and confirm the mission of one of His prophets, he suspends His habit and omits to create the effect He usually does according to His habit.

The Second Approach (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 171.12–174.8) presents a very different explanation of prophetical miracles. Marmura (1981) called it “al-Ghazâlî’s second causal theory.” Here al-Ghazâlî accepts the existence of “natures” (tabâ’i’) and of unchanging connections between causes and their effects. In the second causal theory al-Ghazâlî merely points out that despite human efforts in the natural sciences, we are far away from knowing all causes and explaining all processes in nature. It may well be the case that those miracles that the falâsifa deny have immanent natural causes that are unknown to us. When Moses, for instance, threw his stick to the ground and it changed into a serpent (Qur’an, 7.107, 20.69, 26.32) the material of the wooden stick may have undergone a rapid transformation and become a living animal. We know that wood disintegrates with time and becomes earth that fertilizes and feeds plants. These plants are, in turn, the fodder of herbivores, which are consumed by carnivores like snakes. The falâsifa cannot exclude that some unknown cause acts as a catalyst and may rapidly expedite the usually slow process where the matter of a wooden stick is transformed into a snake. These and other explanations given in the Second Approach are only examples of how the prophetical miracles may be the result of natural causes that are not fully understood by humans.

Marmura (1965, 183; 1981, 97) rejected the suggestion that al-Ghazâlî might have held occasionalism and secondary causality as two cum-possible cosmological explanations. Marmura conceded that al-Ghazâlî makes use of causalist language “sometimes in the way it is used in ordinary Arabic, sometimes in a more specifically Avicennian / Aristotelian way” and that this usage of language is innovative for the Ash’arite school discourse (1995, 89). Yet in all major points of Muslim theology al-Ghazâlî held positions that follow closely the ones developed by earlier Ash’arite scholars, namely the possibility of miracles, the creation of humans acts, and God’s freedom during the creation of the universe (1995, 91, 93–97, 99–100). In Marmura’s view, al-Ghazâlî never deviated from occasionalism, while he sometimes expressed his opinions in ambiguous language that mocked philosophical parlance, probably in order to lure followers of falsâfa into the Ash’arite occasionalist camp.

That al-Ghazâlî considered occasionalism and secondary causality as cum-possible explanations of God’s creative activity is stated, however, in a passage in the 20th discussion of the Incoherence on the subject of corporeal resurrection in the afterlife. The falâsifa argue that corporeal resurrection is impossible because it requires the transformation of substances like iron into a garment, which is impossible. In his response, al-Ghazâlî refers to the Second Approach of the Second Position in the 17th discussion where, he says, he had already discussed this problem. He argues that the unusually rapid recycling of the matter that makes up the piece of iron into a piece of garment is not impossible. “But this is not the point at issue here,” al-Ghazâlî says. The real question is whether such a transformation “occurs purely through [divine] power without an intermediary, or through one of the causes.” He continues:

Both these two views are possible for us (kilâhumâ mumkinân ‘indanâ) (…) [In the 17th discussion we stated] that the connection of connected things in existence is not by way of necessity but through habitual events, which can be disrupted. Thus, these events come about through the power of God without the existence of their causes. The second [view] is that we say: This is due to causes, but it is not a condition that the cause [here] would be one that is well-known (ma’hûd). Rather, in the treasury of things that are enacted by [God’s] power there are wondrous and strange things that one hasn’t come across. These are denied by someone who thinks that only those things exists that he experiences similar to people who deny magic, sorcery, the talismanic arts, [prophetic] miracles, and the wondrous deeds [done by saints]. (al-Ghazâlî 2000a, 222.)

Al-Ghazâlî maintained this undecided position throughout his lifetime. Given the fact that neither observation nor any other means of knowing (including revelation) gives a decisive proof for the existence or non-existence of a connection between a cause and its effect, we must suspend our judgment on this matter. God may create through the mediation of causes that He employs, or directly without such mediation. This undecided position is unfortunately nowhere clearly explained. It can be gathered from isolated statements like the one above and the fact that after the Incoherence al-Ghazâlî wrote books where he maintained a distinctly occasionalist cosmology (al-Ghazâlî 1962) and others like the 35th book of his Revival or the Niche of Lights, where he uses language that is explicitly causalist. In none of these books, however, he commits himself to the position that the cause is connected to its effect. God may create the two independently from one another or He may create them through the mediation of secondary causes. In his very last work, completed only days before his death, al-Ghazâlî discusses whether God creates “through the mediation” (bi-wâsita) of his creations or not, and maintains that the matter cannot be settled decisively (al-Ghazâlî 1985, 68–69).

In all this al-Ghazâlî accepted the unchanging character of this creation. Once God chose to create this world among alternatives, He also chose not to change the rules that govern it. While it is conceivable and therefore possible that God would break his habit or intervene in the assigned function of the secondary causes, He informs us in His revelation that He will not do so. In the 31st book of his Revival, al-Ghazâlî says that God creates all things one after the other in an orderly manner. After making clear that this order represents God’s habit (sunna), he quotes the Qur’an (33:62 and 48:23): “You will not find any change in God’s habit.” (al-Ghazâlî 1937–38, 11:2084–85.) This verse is quoted several times in the Revival; in one passage al-Ghazâlî adds that we should not think God will ever change His habit (ibid, 4:12). Prophetical miracles are merely extraordinary occurrences that take place within the system of the strictly habitual operation of God’s actions or within the “natural laws” that govern the secondary causes. Miracles are programmed into God’s plan for His creation, so to speak, from the very beginning and do not represent a direct intervention or a suspension of God’s lawful actions (Frank 1992, 59; idem, 1994, 20). Given that there will never be a break in God’s habit, an occasionalist universe will always remain indistinguishable from one governed by secondary causality.


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