Ibn Rushd [Averroes]

First published Wed Jun 23, 2021

The Andalusian philosopher, physician and judge Ibn Rushd (1126–1198) is one of the great figures of philosophy within the Muslim contexts, and a foundational source for post-classical European thought.

The hallmarks of Ibn Rushd’s work are his convictions that philosophy is capable of demonstrative certainty in many domains, that it is Aristotle who should be our preeminent guide in philosophy, and that philosophy should play a central role within religious inquiry, rather than being an alternative to religion. But part of what gives his ideas their enduring interest is the subtle way in which he promotes other methods of reasoning and persuasion in contexts where the rigors of Aristotelian demonstration are not a practical option. To grasp Ibn Rushd’s thought in full requires attending not only to the Aristotelian commentaries where he attempts to develop philosophy as a demonstrative science, but also to areas like religion, medicine, and law, where constraints of both subject-matter and audience require other argumentative and rhetorical techniques.

Often improperly referred to as Averroes—the corrupted form his name took in Latin—Ibn Rushd quickly achieved such prominence in later European thought as to rival the influence of Aristotle himself, whose works Ibn Rushd tirelessly championed. Most modern scholarship orients itself around his reception in Christian Europe, where he was known simply as “the Commentator,” and so fails to appreciate Ibn Rushd’s own distinctive philosophical achievements.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

Abū al-Walīd Muḥammad ibn Ahmad Ibn Rushd was born in Cordova in 1126. He belonged to an influential Andalusian family, famous for its judicial power and for its scholarship in the religious sciences. His father was a prominent judge, but the most important figure in the family was his grandfather, who also bears his name, Ibn Rushd, and so the philosopher is called “the grandson” (al-ḥafīd) to distinguish him from his grandfather (al-jadd). The latter was both a well-known judge and a famed jurist, being the author of many books in jurisprudence following the Mālikī school.

Unlike Ibn Sīnā and al-Ghazālī, Ibn Rushd did not write an autobiography, and as a result many aspects of his life are obscure and will remain so unless new documents are discovered. The limited information we have from his biographers unanimously agrees on his good conduct, his diligence in science, and his fairness as a judge, while noting his interests in philosophy and his adoption of certain “audacious” views. The surviving historical sources tell us much about his teachers in the religious sciences, but, with the exception of medicine, we know little about those who taught him in other fields. He was certainly not a disciple of either of his famous Andalusian contemporaries, Ibn Bājja or Ibn Tufayl, although he read their philosophical works. (Puig 1992 and Ben Sharīfa 1999 discuss the intellectual circles around Ibn Rushd.)

Ibn Rushd was 22 when the Almohads came to power in the western Maghreb and Andalusia. Given that the Ibn Rushds had been prominent in circles close to the previous Almoravid dynasty, it was imperative for the grandson to express in his writings, and perhaps even in person, his commitment to the new rulers and the Almohad creed (daʿwa) conceptualized by Muḥammad Ibn Tūmart (d. 1130). Some surviving testimonies suggest that Ibn Rushd did in fact adopt Ibn Tūmart’s creed at some point in his life (see Ben Sharīfa 1999).

Given the social position of his family, Ibn Rushd soon found himself in the ruling circles of Marrakesh and close to the princes, or at least some of them, in Andalusia. He engaged in debates on philosophical and theological issues with this inner circle, and there is a record of a meeting with Abū Yaʿqūb Yūsuf (r. 1163–84), the second Almohad ruler, who officially asked Ibn Rushd to comment on Aristotle’s works and render them accessible. Later he became chief physician to the caliph in Marrakesh.

Nevertheless, Ibn Rushd’s relationship with the Almohad creed was complex and seems to have evolved (Geoffroy 1999; Ben Ahmed 2020c). Recently discovered revisions to his al-Kashf ʿan manāhij al-adilla contain paragraphs where Ibn Rushd shows a sort of critical distance towards Ibn Tumart’s creed. These paragraphs, when added to his harsh criticism of the Almohads in his commentary on Plato’s Republic, may help us understand the evolution he underwent during his intellectual life. They may shed light in particular on the disgrace he suffered at the end of his career, when, for reasons that remain unclear, he fell out of favor with the Almohads and was exiled in Lucena, 60 km southeast of Cordova. According to one account, his death took place while he was confined to a residence in Marrakesh in 1198. (The definitive biography, in Arabic, is Ben Sharīfa 1999. For more on the historical context see Urvoy 1998 and Ben Ahmed 2020c.)

1.2 Works

Ibn Rushd remained productive for at least four decades. He was the author of a large corpus that extends over medicine, logic and philosophy in all its branches, including natural philosophy, astronomy, metaphysics, psychology, politics, and ethics. His work also includes the sciences of Islamic religion: jurisprudence (fiqh), the foundations of Islamic law (usūl al-fiqh), the foundations of religion (usūl al-dīn), and the science of the Arabic language, including grammar. With important exceptions, most of his works are available in the original Arabic. For those works that have been lost, while readers await the day of their rediscovery, they must generally make do with medieval translations in Hebrew or Latin.

Ibn Rushd’s work deploys various methods and styles. Many treatises are in the form of a commentary, most famously and extensively on Aristotle—covering nearly the whole Aristotelian corpusbut also on Galen’s medical treatises, as well as on other philosophers such as Plato, Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Bājja. Many other treatises, devoted to specific issues, are not in commentary form. (For a detailed inventory of texts and translations see §10.1.)

The focus of his commentaries was Aristotle because no one has yet surpassed his achievement: “no one who has come after him to this our time—and this is close to 1500 years later—has been able to add a word worthy of attention to what he said” (LongPhys proem; Harvey 1985, 83). Scholarship going back to the nineteenth-century has divided the commentaries into three kinds:

  • the epitome or short commentary (jawāmiʿ), which he favored at the start of his career;
  • the paraphrase or middle commentary (talkhīṣ), seemingly composed throughout his career;
  • the literal or long commentary (sharḥ or tafsīr), dating to his later years.

Inasmuch as Ibn Rushd routinely wrote different kinds of commentaries on the same Aristotelian treatise, some such distinction seems necessary. But recent scholarship has doubted whether this neat threefold distinction adequately captures Ibn Rushd’s complexly varied approach (Al-ʿAlawī 1986a; Druart 1994; Gutas 1993). At a minimum, it omits important categories of work, such as compendia (mukhtaṣarat), treatises (maqālāt), and answers to questions (masāʾil), to say nothing of the important treatises that focus on religious questions.

The most prominent of those independent religious treatises are

  • The Decisive Treatise (Faṣl al-Maqāl), an argument for the value of philosophy to Islam;
  • The Incoherence of the Incoherence (Tahāfut al-Tahāfut), a direct response to al-Ghazālī, whose work had achieved considerable influence at the time in Andalusia (Di Giovanni 2019);
  • The Exposition of the Methods of Proof concerning Religious Doctrines (al-Kashf ʿan manāhij al-adilla fī ʿaqāʾid al-milla), a philosophically nuanced alternative to the teachings of Ashʿarite theology.

These works, which seem to have had little influence on medieval Christian thought, have traditionally been seen as “theological” and contrasted with his supposedly “philosophical” works: the commentaries on Aristotle that circulated throughout medieval and Renaissance Europe in Latin and Hebrew translation. The latter were thought to be demonstrative, and aimed at the elites, whereas the former were said to be merely dialectical, and so aimed at a popular audience. Accordingly Ibn Rushd’s true position supposedly had to be sought in these Aristotelian commentaries.

This distinction has affected the direction of scholarship, causing great attention to be given to the “philosophical” works, which were thought to represent most truly his thought, and leaving the “theological” treatises to be comparatively neglected. Even where the latter are widely taught, they are set apart from his supposedly more philosophical commentaries. The result, ever since the initial research of Renan (1852), has been a segmented and fragmentary view of the Rushdian corpus that marginalizes important aspects of his thought.

An important correction to this tendency appears in Jamal Al-Dīn Al-ʿAlawī (1986a), who defends the unity and coherence of the Rushdian corpus. He proposes that Ibn Rushd’s works form a unity where there is no room to distinguish between what is a commentary on another text and what is an ostensibly original work. With this, Al-ʿAlawī attempted to close a gap in a body of work that should rightly be seen as continuous, and to reconnect texts that have been disassociated from their contexts.

2. Logic and Methodology

The general character of Ibn Rushd’s philosophy is illuminated by his overarching picture of logic. Most broadly, he understands it as the study of the conditions and rules that rightly guide the mind toward the conception (taṣawwur) of essences and the assent (taṣdīq) to propositions (CompLogic 1.1). Glossing Aristotle’s famous remark that “it is the mark of the educated person” to seek the appropriate level of precision in any inquiry, Ibn Rushd clarifies that the educated person is “one who has been instructed in the art of logic” (ParaEthics I.3, 3C).

In keeping with the weight he accords the subject, Ibn Rushd commented several times on each work in Aristotle’s logical Organon. Near the start of his career, he wrote a Compendium of Logic that includes Porphyry’s Isagoge and follows the usual Arabic practice of including the Rhetoric and Poetics as part of an expanded Organon (Black 1990). Later, he wrote a series of longer paraphrases of this same corpus (but treated the Isagoge separately, on the grounds that it is neither an introduction to nor even a part of logic). Toward the end of his life, he devoted one of his five long commentaries to the Posterior Analytics.

In line with the approach of his predecessors, Ibn Rushd divided logical processes into five types of argument: demonstrative, dialectical, rhetorical, poetical, and fallacious. These inferences are not distinguished by their forms, which are the same, but by their matter, that is, by their premises. The premises of demonstrative arguments are necessary (Thom 2019), the premises of dialectical arguments are generally accepted, the premises of rhetoric are generally received, the premises of poetic arguments are imaginative, and the premises of sophistical arguments are deceiving.

For Ibn Rushd, the center of logic and its very purpose is demonstration, for it is the only procedure that leads to certainty in philosophy: it is “the most perfect kind of reflection (naẓar), using the most perfect kind of inference (qiyās)” (Decisive Treatise 3). Accordingly, even in the context of Plato’s Republic, he begins his commentary by announcing that his goal is “to abstract such scientific arguments attributable to Plato as are contained in the Republic by removing from it its dialectical arguments.” However, this does not mean that non-demonstrative arguments are useless. Generally, where one kind of argument is not effective, other kinds of arguments should be used. Dialectic offers a path toward demonstration and to science, which, although it does not obtain certainty, is close to it. Rhetoric contributes, through its paradigms and enthymemes, to reinforcing and promoting demonstrative evidence. The study of sophistical reasoning is useful in assessing the faulty argumentative methods of the theologians (the mutakallimūn, that is, practitioners of kalām).

In light of the high status of demonstration, Ibn Rushd considered it with great care in his commentaries. He devoted a compendium, a paraphrase and a long commentary to the Posterior Analytics—which he calls the Book of Demonstration (Kitāb al-Burhān)—and wrote separate treatises on various special issues. The long commentary is probably the most appropriate text for his positions on the components of demonstration, its types, and its role in producing scientific knowledge. That commentary is also the occasion for a critical and severe interaction with the two Islamic authorities in logic before him, al-Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā.

The purpose of examining demonstrative arguments is to understand the absolute demonstration that gives complete certainty and constitutes a science (LongPostAn I.7 {180}). There are, however, other kinds of demonstration, less certain than the absolute one, but still demonstrative. In all, Ibn Rushd distinguishes three types (LongPostAn I.95 {348}):

  • an absolute demonstration (burhān muṭlaq), which establishes the existence of a thing on the basis of a cause that is known prior to its effect;
  • a demonstration of existence (burhān al-wujūd), which he calls a sign (dalīl), which establishes a thing’s existence without any grasp of its cause (see Elamrani-Jamal 2000);
  • a demonstration of the cause (burhān al-ʿilla or burhān al-sabab), which establishes the cause once the effect’s existence is known. (Al-ʿAlawī 1986b)

In mathematics, it is generally possible to frame absolute demonstrations, because the premises both supply the cause and are better known than their conclusions. In the natural sciences, however, and even in metaphysics, this ideal situation is generally not achievable. Here we begin with the accidental sensible features of things, and so extensive use must be made of the demonstration of existence (EpiPhys 1.105 {9}; Sylla 1979; Cerami 2014). Ibn Sīnā, whose views are often the target of Ibn Rushd’s logic, had denied that these count as a demonstration at all, on the grounds that they establish no substantial connection between the posterior cause and the prior effect. Ibn Rushd rejects this view (LongPostAn I.95 {349}), but admits that the demonstration of existence is less reliable than the other demonstrations. Certainty comes in degrees, and the differentiation in certainty between these demonstrations is one of the reasons why some sciences are superior to others (ParaPostAn §88–9).

Ibn Rushd’s enthusiasm for demonstration does not prevent him from valuing other logical arts, and he was particularly concerned with the place of dialectic. Broadly speaking, according to Aristotle, dialectic has three main uses: as intellectual training, as a path into the demonstrative sciences of philosophy, and as a means of conversing with ordinary people (Topics I.2). But Ibn Rushd devotes less space and shows less interest in this third feature of dialectic, and one wonders whether this is due to his critical reaction to the discursive practices of the mutakallimūn. Despite the many considerations that make dialectic more suitable when dealing with ordinary people, Ibn Rushd suggests that rhetorical and poetic statements are preferable (ParaTop I.5C {31}; Ben Ahmed 2010-2011, 299–302, 307–17). Hence their inclusion in the expanded Organon. The significance of rhetoric and poetics is a result he establishes in political science, but maintains even when it comes to teaching and anchoring theological truths. The bad example set by the dialectical syllogisms of the mutakallimūn shows how dialectical methods, in discussion with ordinary people, are actually disadvantageous.

Under the influence of al-Fārābī, Ibn Rushd puts emphasis on the need to introduce dialectic as a method (ṭarīq), a set of rules, techniques, and warnings (Ben Ahmed 2020a, 262–7). This conception of dialectic makes it distinct from both demonstration and sophistical reasoning, as well as from ordinary conversations. When used well, dialectic is a communal enterprise and so again different from other arts, such as demonstration, where there is no need for more than one party. A successful “partnership” in dialectic is one where each party does their best to commit themselves to the rules. From this perspective, it becomes evident that the questioner is not simply an adversary seeking to defeat his opponent, but rather a partner and a collaborator with the respondent in the search for knowledge. Any debate that is motivated by the pursuit of victory or by deriving pleasure from defeating one’s opponent is a debate that cannot fall under the method of dialectic. He writes, “the communal enterprise (al-ʿamal al-mushtarak) can be achieved in its utmost perfection only by both partners. They can have something in common when their aim is the assessment and the deduction of the truth, or the realization of their training. Thus, the respondent should perfect his response if he intends that aim, because the basest of the partners is the one who aims at the obstruction of the communal enterprise. But if their aim is to struggle against and defeat the other, then they will have nothing in common…. This is not the method of dialectic” (ParaTop 8.132D {233}; Ben Ahmed 2020a, 267)

At the far reaches of the logical arts, the connection to the genuine syllogism becomes remote. So, even while Ibn Rushd recognizes that poetics is a syllogistic art, he says that it lacks the power of a real syllogism and is thus unproductive (CompLogic 12.3). In his paraphrase of the Poetics, he avoids using the term “poetic syllogism” altogether.

In the realm of jurisprudence, Ibn Rushd is famous for his position on the logical and epistemological value of juridical inferences, which in his view produce nothing more than opinion (ann). Even when confronted with the surprising insertion of the word for jurisprudence (fiqh) into the Arabic translation of the Prior Analytics 68b10, Ibn Rushd chooses totally to ignore it. In his juridical writings, he openly denies the accuracy of the term ‘syllogism’ (qiyās) for what jurists had become accustomed to calling their juridical inferences (al-maqāyīs al-fiqhiyya or qiyās sharʿī). When jurists speak of qiyās, it is important to recognize that the term bears quite a different meaning (Abridgement 299 {130–1}; Bou Akl 2019). In particular, contrary to what happens in the syllogism, the qiyās of the jurists does not have the power to deduce the unknown from the known. And even in those cases where Ibn Rushd seems to accept juridical inference, he does not make use of logical vocabulary, but instead deploys the terms used by most of the jurists before him. Rather than engage in a “syllogistification” of the juridical inference, he focuses on the semantic and linguistic origins of juridical rules. For Ibn Rushd, every science has its own characteristics; therefore, anyone who tried to study logic while studying jurisprudence would fail at studying both (Abridgement 123 {37–38}).

3. Metaphysics

The divisions between metaphysics, natural philosophy, psychology, and theology are permeable for Ibn Rushd, and the systematic character of his thought makes it difficult to treat any part in isolation. (See the start of EpiMeta for his division of the sciences.) Here our method of proceeding is to begin with the most general principles of being, and then to turn, in the next section, to their causal relationships.

Of the various kinds of being, substances are what exist in the most proper sense (EpiMeta 4.138 {125}). Among substances, the most familiar are concrete individuals like dogs and stones (EpiMeta 2.58 {43}). But these are composite entities, and since the principles of a substance are themselves even more properly considered to be substances (EpiMeta 1.31 {15–16}; LongAnima II.8), the most fundamental substances in the sensible realm are the metaphysical ingredients of composite substances, matter and form (LongMeta VII.44 {960}).

Underlying all change, and enduring through it, is homogeneous matter, defined simply by its potentiality—that is, its potential to serve as subject for any earthly form (SubstOrb 1.50). Conceived of without form, it is perpetually enduring and numerically one everywhere: “all transient bodies share this body that is numerically one” (SubstOrb 2.87), because it is “deprived of the divisions of individual forms” (LongMeta XII.14 {1473}). Ibn Rushd worries in predictable ways about the reality of this so-called prime matter (mādda ʾūlā). On the one hand, he consistently counts it as a substance (e.g., ParaAnima 2.115). On the other hand, matter so-conceived is a “pure privation” and “does not exist outside of the soul” (LongMeta XII.14 {1473–4}). He offers the less-than-perspicuous compromise formula that prime matter lies “halfway, as it were, between absolute non-being and actual being” (quasi medium inter non-esse simpliciter et esse in actu) (LongPhys I.70; ParaPhys I.3.3.276).

Matter exists only when actualized by form, but the first form it receives is not the nature of the composite substance (dog, stone, etc.) but instead the “indeterminate dimensions” (al-abʿād ghayr al-maḥdūdat) that give matter its corporeal character: “the three dimensions that constitute the nature of body are the first state in matter, and matter cannot be devoid of them in any instance of generation: not that they exist in matter in actuality, but rather in some kind of potentiality different from the potentiality in which matter is constituted” (ParaGC I.4.26 {32}; SubstOrb 1.55). In postulating a persisting extended substratum beneath all physical change, Ibn Rushd has been said to take a step toward the res extensa of seventeenth-century mechanical philosophy (Hyman 1965). But his conception of matter, far from making further forms unnecessary, explains how multiple forms can be instantiated in the same material stuff: “the presence of dimension in prime matter is a prerequisite for the existence of contraries” (EpiMeta 3.126 {112}). Since forms, by their nature, are always individuals—universals, Ibn Rushd insists, do not exist outside the soul (EpiMeta 2.73–5 {57–9})—the theory does not require a “principle of individuation” for form. Extended matter does, however, serve as what might be called a principle of multiplication. If the material realm were not extended, “there would exist in it only one form at a given time” (SubstOrb 1.60; Di Giovanni 2007).

Alongside matter, the other internal principle of composite substances is form, and so form too counts as a substance (LongAnima II.2), and indeed is substance in the most proper sense of the term (Amerini 2008; Di Giovanni 2012). Substantial forms can be distinguished from accidents in that a subject (a dog, a stone) endures through the gain and loss of its accidents, whereas when the substantial form of the subject departs, the subject ceases to exist or exists only homonymously (ParaAnima 2.120)—as one might speak of cremating one’s grandfather. Interpreters have disagreed on whether Ibn Rushd allows a single substance to have multiple substantial forms. But at least sometimes he seems to suppose that one substance has just one form, as when he holds that “if prime matter were to have its own form, it would receive no other form, while enduring, but would immediately be corrupted as soon as that other form were generated” (LongPhys I.69; see SubstOrb 1.50). If elsewhere he seems to suggest that any necessary feature of a thing will count as a substantial form of it, this may mean merely that a substantial form is a composite of multiple discrete, incomplete constituents (Di Giovanni 2011; Cerami 2015, 521–4). Ibn Rushd is clear, at any rate, that the essence (dhāt) or quiddity (māhiyya) of a thing is accounted for entirely by its form, rather than by its form and matter (LongMeta VII.34 {896}). Thus, “form is the primary substance only because it is the cause of the determinate substance and the determinate substances come to be substance only by it” (LongMeta VII.5 {761k}).

Accidents, which can come and go from a substance, are inseparable from that substance, and are caused by it (EpiMeta 2.56 {42}; LongMeta XII.25 {1532–3}), but are not themselves a part of the substance (LongAnima II.4; Tahāfut I.6.216 {359}). They do not have existence in an absolute sense, but only relationally (LongMeta XII.3 {1415}; EpiMeta 1.28 {12}), and indeed Ibn Rushd generally does not refer to them as a form (ṣūra), preferring to reserve that term for the substantial form.

The earthly realm we have been describing is just one small and relatively insignificant part of what there is. Much more exalted, and a much worthier subject of intellectual contemplation, is the eternal heavenly domain. Here Ibn Rushd broadly follows standard premodern cosmology in describing the eight celestial spheres of the moon, the sun, the five planets, and the fixed stars. These spheres are solid, transparent bodies, spinning around the earth, luminous only at those points where the sphere thickens (SubstOrb 2.92). Celestial bodies are composites of matter and form, but of an utterly different kind. Their matter is actually existent, incorruptible and indivisible, with a determinate size and shape (SubstOrb 2.82; LongMeta XII.10 {1447}). Celestial matter is in potentiality only with regard to motion, and that motion, although generally circular, is extremely complex, with as many as 55 distinct motions identifiable among the eight spheres (LongMeta XII.48 {1679}). Each of these distinct motions requires a distinct actualizing form (EpiMeta 4.147 {135}; LongMeta XII.43 {1645}), but these are not material forms, inhering in the celestial matter (since that matter is already actualized). Instead, these celestial forms are separate and, like all forms not inhering in matter, they are therefore intellectual: “if there are these forms that have existence inasmuch as they are not in matter, then these are necessarily separate intellects, since there is no third kind of existence for forms qua forms” (EpiMeta 4.150 {139}; Incoherence I.6 {338}). In addition to intellects, these forms have desires, and indeed are aptly referred to as souls (LongMeta XII.36 {1593}; SubstOrb 1.71, 2.81). It is this desire, rather than any sort of physical contact, that moves the spheres, with the beauty of its celestial intelligence serving as a final cause, and its desire efficiently moving the sphere. Far from being cold bodies in empty space, these spheres are “alive, full of pleasure, and delighted in themselves” (EpiMeta 4.162 {152}). Adding to their delight is their partial understanding of and desire for the first and unmoved mover, which moves all of the spheres through their desire for this highest cause (LongMeta XII.44 {1649–50}; EpiMeta 4.154 {142}). (For this cosmology in its historical context, see Wolfson 1962 and Endress 1995.)

4. Natural Philosophy

The previous section followed the order of discovery, beginning with what is better known to us. Here we start with what is causally prior, and so begin with the First Cause. (On Ibn Rushd’s method of inquiry see Cerami 2015 ch. 7.) Although the existence of some kind of First Cause was undisputed, religious and philosophical authorities disagreed about the nature of creation. The most common view was that the world came into existence, from God, after having not existed, but Ibn Rushd follows Aristotle in supposing that the world has always existed, eternally. His strategy for explaining how an eternal world can have a First Cause turns on distinguishing between two kinds of causal orderings, essential and accidental.

Causes that are essentially ordered are simultaneous, such that the prior stages are a condition for the effect’s ongoing existence, as when waves move a ship, the wind moves the waves, and the wind is moved by elemental forces (QPhys 7.25 {235}; Incoherence I.1 {59}). In such a series there must be a first cause, because an endless such series would be actually infinite all at once, which Ibn Rushd regards as impossible (Incoherence I.4 {275}). The series could, moreover, never reach its end, since causal agency cannot pass through an infinitely long series in a finite time (LongPhys VII.6; QPhys 7.25 {235}). This First Cause cannot itself be something in motion, given the Aristotelian dictum that everything that is in motion must be moved by another (LongPhys VII.1; QPhys 7.30 {236}). In principle, Ibn Rushd allows that there could be many unmoved movers (QPhys 7.35 {238}), but at a minimum there must be one such thing that is immovable, and eternally so, because otherwise some still prior mover would be required to move the supposedly first mover, and this would lead again to an essentially ordered infinity of movers (EpiMeta 4.139 {126}). (For the intricate details see Twetten 2007.)

An accidental ordering takes place over time, as when rain comes from a cloud, the cloud comes from vapor, and vapor comes from a prior rain (Incoherence I.4 {268}). Such an ordering is circular, inasmuch as the materials from one stage are corrupted and reused in a later stage, and so there is no threat of an actual infinity. There is thus nothing incoherent about such a series extending infinitely far into the past and infinitely far into the future, and indeed Ibn Rushd argues that such an infinity can be proved in various ways (Davidson 1987). One fundamental proof arises from the nature of the First Cause. Since it is itself unmoved—that is, wholly changeless—its causal agency must likewise be eternal. “A thing lacking the potential for change and alteration cannot be changed at any time, since if it were then its alteration would be by cause of itself, and so there would be alteration without the possibility for it” (LongCaelo I.103). It is, for Ibn Rushd, incoherent to posit an eternally existing, changeless actuality, which suddenly springs into agency after having not acted for an eternity. In general, “the effect of a cause cannot be delayed after the causation” (Incoherence I.1 {15}). Similar considerations show that the world’s future existence must likewise be eternal (Incoherence 1.1 {22}).

For the reasons just rehearsed, an eternal and unchanging First Mover entails an eternal and unchanging first thing moved, and observation suggests that this must be the outermost sphere of the stars, whose diurnal rotation in turn moves everything within its ambit: “there is a moved thing that is first by nature, which moves the whole, and which terminates every movement whose mover is external…. The mover of this [first] moved thing is, of itself, not a body and is absolutely and essentially unmoved” (EpiPhys 8.242 {141}). Past this first ceaseless motion, the causal story becomes increasingly complex, under the influence of the celestial intelligences. Ibn Rushd is suspicious of the unrealistic convolutions of Ptolemaic cosmology, preferring to honor the principles of Aristotelian physics even where that leaves a gap between theory and observation (Sabra 1984; Endress 1995). A strikingly personal remark describes how he had once aspired to close that gap, but has now, in his old age, abandoned the project (LongMeta XII.45 {1664}). Anticipating the modern rise of scientific specialization, he yields the field to those who devote themselves solely to this one science (LongMeta XII.48 {1679}).

The spheres move eternally in majestic circles simply because it befits their lofty existence to do so (EpiMeta 4.152 {140}, LongMeta XII.36 {1595}, Incoherence I.15 {484}), but these motions have a subordinate effect of signal importance to us: they sustain the very existence of our sublunary world. Most basically, the motion of the celestial spheres—although they are not themselves hot (SubstOrb 2.95)—gives rise to heat in the fiery region immediately beneath the lunar sphere, and from heat and its contrary, cold, arise the four elements: earth, air, fire, water. “The existence of the celestial body entails necessarily the existence of the elements … as preserving, efficient, formal, and final cause” (EpiMeta 4.171 {161}; Incoherence I.3 {261}). The bodies that furnish our sublunary realm are various elemental mixtures, in which the elements themselves endure in an attenuated state, as the material strata above prime matter (EpiMeta 1.48 {32}; LongCaelo III.67; EpiGC I.121 {22–3}; see Maier 1982 ch. 6). The qualities of these elements—hot, cold, wet, dry—“are the causes of all natural things that come into being and pass away” (Incoherence II.1 {525}). The entire system so depends on the celestial spheres that “if the motion of the heavens were destroyed, … the world in its totality would be destroyed” (SubstOrb 4.117; Kashf 5.112 {191}).

Matter is, at least potentially, infinitely divisible, but at the level of elements and mixed bodies we can refer to the smallest body capable of still being a body of that kind—the minimum naturale—e.g., “the minimal possible magnitude of fire” (EpiPhys 7.212 {114}, Glasner 2009 ch. 8; Cerami 2015, 429–36). Any sort of mixed body requires a substantial form to actualize it, but Ibn Rushd’s view of how such forms emerge evolves. His early works hold that, at least at the level of living things, substantial forms cannot be generated by wholly natural processes, but require a celestial “giver of forms,” the Agent Intellect (EpiMeta 4.171 {162}). His later view is more thoroughly naturalistic, and argues that prime matter contains the potentiality for all substantial forms, which need only be actualized by a natural agent, along with the usual cooperation of the celestial bodies (LongMeta VII.31 {883}, XII.18.109 {1499}; see Davidson 1992 ch. 6; Freudenthal 2002; Cerami 2015 chs. 8–9).

Ibn Rushd’s naturalistic conception of generation and corruption is of a piece with one of his most famous philosophical stances, his rejection of al-Ghazālī’s occasionalism. On this theological tradition, “when a man moves a stone by leaning against it and pushing it, he does not push it, but it is the Agent who creates the motion” (LongMeta XII.18.112 {1504}). Ibn Rushd heaps scorn on this view in the Incoherence, resting his case most fundamentally on the link between a thing’s causal role and its defining nature: “it is self-evident that things have essences and attributes that determine the special functions of each thing and through which the essences and names of things are differentiated. If a thing did not have its specific nature, it would not have a special name nor a definition, and all things would be one” (II.1 {520}). (For discussion of this argument see Kogan 1985 ch. 3.)

For further details see the entry on Ibn Rushd’s natural philosophy and the entry on causation in Arabic and Islamic thought.

5. Psychology

In the Aristotelian tradition, Ibn Rushd postulates a special sort of substantial form—a soul—to account for living substances. Even in the mundane case of plants, the complexities of their operations require a special principle beyond what would be adequate for nonliving things: nutrition, for instance, “is ascribed to the soul because it is impossible for it to be ascribed to the powers of the elements” (LongAnima II.14). His theory of the soul’s operations distinguishes, most basically, between the nutritive, sensory, and rational levels. Judging from his casually flexible terminology, he sees no real difference between treating these as different souls within a single living thing or as parts of a single soul—parts characterized as a power (quwwa) or principle (mabdaʾ). Judging again from his varying formulations, he thinks there can be no definitive list of how many such powers of the soul there are. The question he does regard as meaningful is whether a power is distinguished solely in terms of its function, or also in terms of its substrate—as he puts it, whether it “differs from the other powers in subject as well as in intention (maʿnā), or only in intention” (LongAnima III.1; ParaAnima ¶276). Each of the five external senses, for instance, has its own subject, a sensory organ, whereas some of the higher sensory operations have dedicated organs, in the brain, whereas other operations, such as recollection (Black 1996) and choice (Phillipson 2013), are mere functions produced by multiple powers working in conjunction. This question of “subject” is particularly vexed, as we will see, for the powers of intellect.

The “foundation” of cognition at all levels is its passivity (LongAnima II.54). This is particularly clear for the five external senses, which have as their objects the material qualities of the external world. Color, for instance, the proper object of sight, is an elemental mixture on the surface of bodies (ParaParv I.10 {15}), which acts on an illuminated medium and then the organ of the eye, making its recipient at each stage be like the color itself. The general (although not perfect) reliability of the process—that a sense with respect to its proper sense object “does not err in regard to it for the most part” (LongAnima II.63)—is a product of the natural world’s causal regularity. Indeed, the passivity of the five senses is such that Ibn Rushd, when speaking most carefully, seems to treat these organs as themselves simply the corporeal media through which sensible qualities are conveyed to the one true principle of sensation, the common sense (al-ḥiss al-mushtarak). He writes, for instance, that “through the innermost of all the curtains of the eye, the common sense can perceive the form” (ParaParv I.19 {30}); here is where we pass from a purely corporeal stage to “the first of the spiritual stages” (ParaParv II.26 {42–3}). The lesson he draws from Aristotle’s notoriously obscure treatment of common sense (De anima 425b12ff) is that the principle of sensation is “one in number and multiple in extremities and organs,” like a point at the center of a circle (ParaAnima ¶260). Only here is perception both self-aware and capable of assimilating the objects of multiple sensory modalities. All subsequent cognition is dependent on the information collected at this stage. (See Black 2019 for the theory’s strict empiricism.)

To account for the functional role of common sense, Ibn Rushd accepts its traditional—even antiquated—location at the heart, with the concession that common sense has its origin there, but terminates in the brain (ParaParv II.36 {59}). This brings sensible forms to the higher sensory powers, of which he recognizes three that are distinct within the human brain both in function and in subject:

  • imagination (al-mutakhayyila, al-khayāl);
  • the cogitative power (al-mufakkira, al-mumayyiza);
  • memory (al-ḥāfiẓa, al-dhākira).

These faculties, listed in order from the anterior to the posterior of the brain’s supposed three chambers (ParaParv II.26 {42}), account for much of human cognition. Most basically (for details see LongAnima II.63, III.6; Blaustein 1984; Hansberger 2019), imagination allows us to form sensory images taken from sensation even when we are not presently sensing an object. The cogitative power refines these images so as to allow a distinct grasp of the “individual contents” (al-maʿānī al-shakhṣiya, known in the Latin tradition as “intentions”) that are confusedly contained within sensory experience. Memory stores and recalls these images. Ibn Rushd explicitly argues (Incoherence II.2 {546-7}) that the cogitative power can do all the work that Ibn Sīnā had split between a cogitative power and a further estimative power (al-quwwa al-wahmiyya). The overall process is compared to the gradual “abstracting and cleansing” of the rind, eventually leaving just the fruit itself (ParaParv II.26 {43}), these fruits being the “substantial differences” between individuals (LongAnima II.65). Nonhuman animals, because they lack a cogitative power entirely, are incapable of moving beyond superficial sensory appearances (LongAnima III.57).

In keeping with his broadly naturalistic orientation, Ibn Rushd allows the brain a much larger share of the cognitive load than one finds in most premodern philosophers. But the “fruit” these corporeal powers yield is always a representation of a particular individual. To think abstractly—to have universal concepts—requires the powers of intellect, and here is where his naturalism notoriously comes to an end. Ibn Rushd, though he deploys a bewildering variety of terms for different aspects of intellect, ultimately endorses just two intellectual powers distinct both in function and subject:

  • an agent intellect (ʿaql al-faʿʿāl), which illuminates imagined intentions, making them universal;
  • a material intellect (ʿaql al-hayūlāni), which receives those abstracted forms and thereby thinks—fittingly described as “material” not because it is corporeal but because it is a matter-like potentiality for receiving forms in the intelligible domain.

Following what was then the dominant Aristotelian view, he treats the agent intellect as a single, separate, eternal substance, and spends little time arguing for this doctrine, or even explaining how it “illuminates” imagined intentions (LongAnima III.17–18; Davidson 1992, pp. 315–18). In contrast, he discusses the material intellect at length in various treatises, with his views evolving dramatically over time (see Taylor 2009). Here we focus only on his final considered view of the subject, as set out in the Long Commentary, according to which the material intellect, like the agent intellect, is a single, separate, eternal substance (LongAnima III.5).

Ibn Rushd recognized the audacity of supposing that human beings share in a single intellect, writing that “this claim came to me after long reflection and intense care, and I have not seen it in anyone else before me” (CommAlex, p. 30). Indeed, he himself had once called such a view “repulsive” (ParaAnima ¶282). Still, we can understand why he was eventually drawn to it in light of his commitment to three propositions:

  1. Human beings think abstractly;
  2. Abstract thought is impossible for corporeal beings;
  3. Human beings are corporeal.

Although the trio is jointly contradictory, each claim is individually plausible: (A) seems obvious; (B) follows from the familiar Aristotelian argument that a power capable of understanding all bodies must itself contain the nature of no body (LongAnima III.4); (C) is a consequence of Ibn Rushd’s eventual conclusion that the various strategies for situating an immaterial power within a human being—his own and that of earlier commentators—were all failures. The genius of his ultimate position was to find a way for all three claims to be embraced. In one sense, human beings are individual composites of matter and substantial form, and so wholly corporeal. Although he consistently describes both the material and the agent intellect as parts of the human soul (e.g., LongAnima III.5 {406}), they are souls and actualities only equivocally: they are not the actuality of a body (LongAnima II.7, II.21, III.5 {396–7}). When human beings are conceived in this narrow way, (C) is true and (A) is false.

But of course there must be some sense in which (A) is true. Ibn Rushd insists that, even though we all share the material intellect, its thinking can count as my thinking. To explain this, he appeals to Aristotle’s doctrine that “the soul never thinks without an image” (De anima III.7, 431a17; Wirmer 2008, 367–75). The material intellect, although separate, is dependent both for its function and for its very existence on receiving imagined intentions from individual human beings (CommAlex p. 29); it is eternal only because the human species is eternal (LongAnima III.5 {407}). Each of us, therefore, partially controls the operation of this separate material intellect. Its operation is to think, but inasmuch as we each control our imagination, and the imagination is what triggers thought, it is appropriate to think of the thoughts we trigger as our thoughts, and to think of the two shared intellects, agent and material, as each a part of our soul (LongAnima II.60, III.18, III.36 {500}). With this, Ibn Rushd offers the first developed statement of the extended-mind thesis: that a being’s cognitive system extends beyond the individual organism. When human beings are conceived in this extended way, (A) is true and (C) is false.

Even if this extended conception of a human being is allowed, that still leaves a question about why these two separated intellects must each be singular, and so shared by all human beings. Ibn Rushd’s answer depends in part on an argument against private concepts: that without concepts that are literally shared, teachers could not convey knowledge to students (LongAnima III.5 {411–12}; Ogden forthcoming). He also argues that an intellect individuated by a corporeal subject would receive individualized forms (LongAnima III.5 {402}; Ogden 2016). Accordingly, he thinks the domain of actually intelligible concepts, and of the intellects in which those objects exist, must be entirely separate from the material realm, and cannot be individuated by matter. And, as we have seen in the previous two sections, he is for independent reasons committed to the existence of such a realm, among the celestial spheres. Accordingly, the human intellectual powers can be identified as the lowest members of this hierarchy (LongAnima III.19; Davidson 1992, 223–31; Taylor 1998).

For further information see the entry on Arabic and Islamic psychology and philosophy of mind.

6. Religion

6.1 God

Ibn Rushd believes that God’s existence can be demonstrated through a complex argument from Aristotelian physics, establishing the existence of a first cause (see §5). As with physical arguments in general, the argument is a mere sign (dalīl), starting from empirical features of the world that are better known to us even if causally posterior (LongMeta 12.5 {1423}; see §2) He rejects the a priori metaphysical arguments of Ibn Sīnā (Davidson 1987 ch. 10; Bertolacci 2007) and of the Ashʿarite theologians (Kashf 1), all of which he thinks not only fall short of being demonstrative but also fail to be persuasive to ordinary people. For them, one should follow the example of the Qurʾān and deploy arguments from design (Kashf 1.33–38 {118–22}).

In keeping with Aristotle’s remarks in Metaphysics XII.7, Ibn Rushd suggests that God serves not as an efficient cause, but only as a final and formal cause. Efficient causality prevails among natural bodies, when one actually moving body brings another body from potential to actual motion. The heavenly bodies, however, are already actual, and eternally so, and so in this domain efficient causation has no place (PossibConj 14.86). The relationship of First Cause to the celestial spheres, then, is that of intelligible to intellect—that is, the eternal thoughts of the First Cause are the forms that serve as final causes inspiring the celestial intelligences (LongMeta XII.36 {1592}; XII.44 {1652}; LongCaelo IV.1.654; Incoherence I.14 {481}; Conjunction Epistle 1, par. 3-4). God, being wholly immaterial, cannot directly act on the sublunary material realm at all, but plays a causal role only through the mediation of the celestial spheres: “the temporal cannot proceed from an absolutely eternal being, but only from an eternal being which is eternal in its substance but temporal in its movements, namely, the celestial body” (Incoherence I.13 {467}). (Interpretation here is more contentious than this brief summary suggests. For various approaches see Kogan 1985 ch. 5; Davidson 1992, 227–30; Adamson 2019; Twetten forthcoming.)

God alone, among intellectual beings, has no further object of intellectual contemplation that might serve as his final cause. On the contrary, “the First Form thinks of nothing outside itself” (LongAnima III.5 {410}; EpiAnima 219 {93}; EpiMeta 4.158 {147}; LongMeta XII.51 {1700}). This helps account for God’s unique simplicity as a pure mind, always fully actualized by nothing other than God. It leads to questions, however, about the sense in which God can be said to have knowledge of the created world. This is “the most powerful doubt” regarding this conception of God (EpiMeta 4.159 {148}), and it threatens to lead to the view al-Ghazālī had branded as heretical: that God does not know particulars (Incoherence II.4 {587}). Ibn Rushd denies that he is committed to this consequence. God has knowledge of the created world in his own manner, neither in universal nor particular, not as if his thoughts are caused by the world, but rather as the cause of the world (Incoherence I.3 {226-7}, I.13 {462}; Ḍamīma 7; LongMeta XII.51 {1707–8}). The divine mind’s “thinking its own self is identical with its thinking all existence” (Incoherence I.11 {435}).

For terms to apply to God and creatures in a non-univocal way (bi-ishtirāk) is a common state of affairs for Ibn Rushd (LongMeta XII.39 {1620–4}). It arises, for instance, not just in the case of knowledge but also in the case of will. For, since God “is exempt from passivity and change,” He does not exercise will in the usual sense of the term (Incoherence I.3 {148}). Still, in another sense God is “an intending and willing agent” (Kashf 5.80 {163}) in virtue of the special causal relationship that God has to the world. Similarly, Ibn Rushd affirms, in a special sense, that God is the creator of the world (QPhys 3; Kashf 5.78–91 {161–173}), and that God exercises providence (ʿināya) over all existent beings, though he denies that any individual enjoys a special divine providence (LongMeta XII.37 {1607}, XII.52; EpiMeta 4.176–81 {166–71}). It is difficult to assess the degree to which, on this account, either God’s will or the world is necessitated (Belo 2007; Hourani 1962; Taylor 2014).

The various strands of Ibn Rushd’s conception of God are set out on one hand against Ibn Sīnā’s insufficiently Aristotelian philosophy, and on the other hand against Ashʿarite theology (kalām). His systematic examination of the Ashʿarites in al-Kashf establishes at length that their methods are sophistical and delusional, drawing on two basic resources: the intention of Islamic law and Aristotle’s philosophy (Arfa Mensia 2019). But even where Ibn Rushd is examining the mutakallimūn and offering rival interpretations of religious texts, it is not his intention to set philosophy at the service of any kind of theology. Instead these writings are more appropriately classified as philosophical considerations on religious texts and theological issues.

Prophecy is a good example of how Ibn Rushd distinguishes himself both from the theologians and from previous philosophical approaches (Taylor 2018). The trustworthiness of prophecy is foundational to Islam: “the sending forth of prophets is based on the fact that revelation comes down to them from heaven, and on this our religion is based” (Kashf 4.58 {142}). The Ashʿarites had relied primarily on miracles to establish the veracity of the Prophet Muhammed. Ibn Rushd evaluates this approach from his Aristotelian background. His first step is to situate the miraculous (muʿjiz) as a tool of persuasion belonging to the art of rhetoric, standing to the prophetic claim as an extrinsic argument (Ben Ahmed 2012). Analogously, when I swear that something is true, the oath I advance has no intrinsic connection to what is claimed as being true. The Ashʿarites conceive of the relation between being prophetic and a miracle as that of a quality to its act. The miracle must be, in principle, an act that is generated from that quality, just as the act of healing the sick emanates from the quality of being a physician (Kashf 5.95–6 {177}). Accordingly, the proof that I am a prophet is that I can produce an extra-ordinary act, such as walking on water, turning a stick into a snake, or splitting the moon. Ibn Rushd responds by identifying a miracle as merely “an external sign” of prophecy. The act that more closely demonstrates prophecy is to establish a law that is useful for people. Thus it is the Qurʾān that proves Muhammad’s veracity: “Because of the universality of the teaching of the Precious Book and the universality of the laws contained in it—by which I mean their liability to promote the happiness of all mankind—this religion is common to all mankind” (Kashf 5.103 {184}). A miracle alone, in contrast, is at best complementary, and an argument from miracles is merely persuasive or rhetorical. (See further Arfa Mensia 1999, Ben Ahmed 2012).

6.2 Law

The Decisive Treatise argues forcefully that philosophy should have a prominent place in religious reflection, and specifically in Islamic law (sharīʿa). This stance, alongside his devotion to Aristotelian demonstration (see §2), might raise the question of Ibn Rushd’s “rationalism”: Does he regard philosophy as having some kind of priority in religious contexts? But this question is not Ibn Rushd’s, inasmuch as he establishes no hierarchy between philosophy and true religion. The law can serve as a kind of preamble to philosophy, addressed to a much wider audience and containing clues to guide the philosopher in theoretical matters. But there is no question of priority. As he famously writes, in a passage that (perhaps tellingly) echoes Aristotle’s Prior Analytics I.32, “Since the law is true, … we, the Muslim community, know firmly that demonstrative reasoning does not lead to disagreement with what the law sets down. For truth does not oppose truth, but rather agrees with and bears witness to it” (Decisive Treatise 12; see Taylor 2000).

The implicit target of the Decisive Treatise is al-Ghazālī’s notorious fatwa against metaphysics. By characterizing philosophy in narrowly metaphysical terms, as a science that leads from artifacts back to the Artisan through demonstrative methods, Ibn Rushd means to show that God cannot be demonstrably known without these methods. To prohibit this path to knowledge from those who are capable of it is an injustice both to God and to these scholars. In his Long Commentary on the Metaphysics (I.2 {10}), he goes so far as to distinguish between two types of sharīʿa, one general for everyone or most people, and the other “specific” to the philosophers. This might suggest that philosophy, for those capable of it, transcends the teachings of Islamic law (Taylor 2012), but it is not at all clear that Ibn Rushd ever commits himself to such a claim. Here in LongMeta, he may be speaking of sharīʿa only loosely, as a “way” or “method.” And even if he does mean that philosophy is literally a sharīʿa, it does not follow that it is a law that competes against religion. After all, the specific stands to the general as something that is complementary, not conflicting.

To be sure, the general sharīʿa of Islam is partially subject to the interpretation of philosophers, since they are the only ones who have the arsenal, namely demonstration, to bring out its hidden meanings, allegories, signs, and symbols. In the end, however, this serves sharīʿa itself, and cannot do otherwise since, as Ibn Rushd never tires of declaring, Islamic Law is true and it calls on everyone, including philosophers, to follow its prescriptions (e.g., Incoherence II.4; Decisive Treatise 11). Philosophers pursue one path to this truth—the most exalted path available to human beings—but there are other paths, such as the rhetorical and dialectical, that also arrive at this truth.

For all of Ibn Rushd’s involvement in esoteric questions of Aristotelianism, he was, at the same time, a practicing judge, deeply concerned with jurisprudential theory. Ibn Rushd’s principal work in this domain is the Distinguished Jurist’s Primer, a lengthy handbook on the causes of the jurists’ disputes and a comparison between the rationales for decision-making by different Sunni schools of jurisprudence. Its originality lies in the rational mechanisms that Ibn Rushd employs to establish general rules for understanding agreements and disagreements among jurists. He writes that “our intention in these matters is only the rules governing the law, not an enumeration of the branches, which would have no end” (Jurist’s Primer 26.241 {ii.202}). So rather than focus on counting the differences that exist between jurists and schools of jurisprudence, Ibn Rushd attempts to explain these differences by referring them to their principles, rules, and the causes that regulate them. By following the points of disagreement between the jurists and deducing the causes of this disagreement, and then bringing them back to the general principles and rules equivalent to a general maxim rooted in his soul (Jurist’s Primer 24.179, 220–1 {ii.148, 184-5}), the assiduous jurist (al-mujtahid) becomes capable of deciding about the unknown situations he will face.

What makes these general rules so important is the imitative and repetitive style of jurisprudence in Ibn Rushd’s day, which had been overwhelmed by a focus on individual cases and the endless branching of views. Thus, either the jurist works according to a rule that distinguishes similar cases from others, or he works according to ordinary common sense to produce controversial answers. This is what the writings of the Malikites suffered from in his time. Ibn Rushd insists on establishing jurisprudential maxims that make understandable the disagreement among schools of jurisprudence and jurists and provide the diligent jurist with basic mechanism for making decisions regarding emerging problems and cases.

7. Medicine

Writings in medicine occupy an important place in Ibn Rushd’s career. The practice of medicine was not his profession: “it is this part of medicine that I believe restrains me from being perfect in this art. And that I haven’t had much practice” (Kulliyyāt VII.517). Even so, he left many interesting texts: a Commentary on Ibn Sīnā’s Medical Poem, his al-Kulliyyāt (General Principles of Medicine), and various writings and commentaries on Galen. Indeed, it has been suggested that, near the end of Ibn Rushd’s career, he was forced to set aside his philosophical project of writing the long commentaries on Aristotle’s texts, and turn instead to Galen’s text on medicine (Al-ʿAlawī 1986a).

The commentary on Ibn Sīnā challenges the usual conception of a rivalry between the two great Islamic philosophers. He says that he chose to comment on Ibn Sīnā’s Poem because it is “better than many of the introductions written in medicine” (CommIbnSīnā 40). Even so, during the last decade of Ibn Rushd’s life, it is Galen who becomes one of his principal authorities. Still, Galen is often a target of criticism. In al-Kulliyyāt, for example, a work that he repeatedly revised (Gätje 1986), the revisions often move in a direction that is increasingly critical of Galen (Kulliyyāt II.162, II.184, etc.).

Medicine, for Ibn Rushd, is an art rather than a science, concerned with practice rather than theory (Chandelier 2019). According to the prologue of al-Kulliyyāt,

The art of medicine is an art that acts (sināʿa fāʿila) based on true principles; we seek through it to preserve the health of the human body and to eliminate disease as much as possible in each body. So the goal of this art is not to heal without fail (lā budda), but rather to act appropriately, to the appropriate extent and time, while waiting to achieve its goal, as with the art of navigation and the command of an army. (prol. 127)

This definition is based on the famous division of the arts into what belongs to the sphere of necessity and what belongs to the sphere of possibility. The art of medicine does not belong to the sphere where consequences follow actions necessarily, as with arts like carpentry. In medicine, even if the physician acts based on scientific principles, the intended end does not necessarily follow. As he puts it, “Apparently, we do not have any of the premises that bring us certainty in many of these pursuits. But even so we must try, insofar as we are able” (Kulliyyāt II.208). The practical dimension of medicine is similarly central to his commentary on Ibn Sīnā, which begins with Ibn Sīnā’s statement that “Medicine is preserving health and curing disease,” and comments: “This is the definition of medicine, and its completion would be to say that medicine is an art whose action is preserving health and curing disease, based on science and experience” (CommIbnSīnā 46; see also Kulliyyāt prol.131). As one may notice, Ibn Rushd insists on acting in both texts.

The purpose of al-Kulliyyāt, according to its prologue, is to draw from the art of medicine

a summary (jumla), sufficiently concise and brief to serve as an introduction for those who would like to explore the parts of the art, and also as a memorandum (tadhkira) for those who would like to reflect on the art. We seek those statements that correspond to the truth, even if they contradict the opinions of people who belong to the art. (prol. 127)

However, al-Kulliyyāt is not a book of medical generalities, as some translations tend to suggest. It is rather a book on the universals of medicine (kulliyyāt fī al-ṭibb), as its title suggests—that is, on the foundations, principles, and basic rules that regulate medical theory and practice. It thus provides the foundations (usṭuqsāt) of the medical art (Kulliyyāt III.282).

In the same vein, al-Kulliyyāt is far from being a textbook (kunnāsh); it is rather written against the tradition of textbooks that prevailed in the art of medicine. It is a defense of the art of “syllogistic” medicine against experiential medicine. He says: “As for those who limit themselves to the method of the textbooks without knowing the universal method, they will certainly make mistakes, as do the doctors of our time. As for limiting oneself to universal matters, this may be possible if the doctor is very skilled. Therefore, one of the considered conditions of perfection in the arts is that the craftsman have the power to deduce what he needs to deduce” (Kulliyyāt VII.552). The status of experience in medicine is limited but not entirely excluded: “Once the universals of the art of medicine are acquired, one needs the experience from which particular premises are acquired in order to be used in each particular case. These premises cannot be written in a book, because they are unlimited” (Kulliyyāt VII.517). Ibn Rushd makes an exception, however, in criticizing the manuals and textbooks on medical particulars, for Abū Marwān Ibn Zuhr, whose al-Taysīr can be trusted because the particulars it contains conform to the universal teachings of theoretical medicine (Kulliyyāt VII.583).

In sum, al-Kulliyyāt is an attempt to advance medical practice from the level of the infinite particulars, which cannot be assembled in a book, to the level of the rules (qānūn) and established principles (dustūr) that govern them (Kulliyyāt III.282). It is an attempt to upgrade medical discourse to the level of a science, linking its premises and principles to the Aristotelian natural sciences (Al-ʿAlawī 1986a, 180). This holistic methodology is characteristic of how Ibn Rushd approached the arts and sciences of his time. It shows his inclination to organize them in a way that protects them from chaos and elevates them to the level of scientific practice, established on the basis of universal principles and foundations. Particular cases, since they are unlimited, cannot be dealt with unless there are general laws that help us to deduce decisions about particulars on the basis of principles and foundations.

8. Ethics and Politics

The sciences, for Ibn Rushd, fundamentally divide into the theoretical (naẓarīya), which is aimed at knowledge (ʿilm), and the practical (ʿamalīya), which is concerned with voluntary action (Republic I.21; LongPhys proem). The chief practical science is politics, which Ibn Rushd sees as dividing, much like medicine, into a more theoretical and a more practical part. The first and more theoretical part examines voluntary actions in general, their associated dispositions (the virtues and vices), and the relationships between these elements. The second, more practical part examines how these dispositions become established within souls and how they are perfected and impeded (Republic I.21). The first part is found in Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, and the second part in his Politics. Although Ibn Rushd composed a commentary on the first of these, and although he knew the second was available in Arabic elsewhere, he complains that it “has not yet reached us on this peninsula” (ParaEthics X.160G). Accordingly, he chose to comment on Plato’s Republic as an alternative source for the second part of political science.

Following the Nicomachean Ethics, Ibn Rushd takes the goal of human life to be happiness (Hourani 1962). For ordinary people, the ultimate guide to happiness is the Qurʾān, which exhibits miraculous wisdom in the rules it sets out to promote human flourishing (see §6.1). But the ultimate human happiness, for those who are capable of it, is to become perfect in the theoretical sciences (LongPhys proem). Such perfection arrives when human beings conjoin themselves to the separate Agent Intellect, which is to say that they pass from a partial conception of intelligible objects to a conception of the Agent Intellect itself. At this point a human being in some sense takes on an “eternal existence” (PossibConj 5.41; LongPhys proem), and is “made like unto God” (LongAnima III.36 {501}), and even “becomes one of the eternal, incorporeal beings” (PossibConj 5.40). This notion of conjunction (ittiṣāl) had a complex history among earlier Aristotelians, and Ibn Rushd’s views about what it involves, and whether it is possible, developed over time (Davidson 1992, 321–56; Black 1999). The texts here are complicated, but suggest that he rejected al-Fārābī’s complaint that conjunction is nothing other than “an old woman’s tale” (PossibConj 14.85; Epistle 1 par. 40), and that he accepted it as, in some sense, the goal of human life, one that would be achieved through contemplation, with the assistance of prayer and the Qurʾān (PossibConj 15.103–4).

A perfect, conjoined grasp of the theoretical sciences carries with it, necessarily, the complete possession of the moral virtues. One so possessed will be perfect both in intellectual understanding and in “the activity proper to him” (LongAnima III.36 {500, 501}). If this sort of moral excellence is not much on display in those we see make the greatest claims to the possession of science, this only testifies to the poverty of their achievements (LongPhys proem). The perfection Ibn Rushd describes, however, through conjunction with the Agent Intellect, seems to entail something other than personal immortality. For he expressly refuses, against al-Ghazālī, to endorse bodily resurrection (Incoherence II.4 {580–6}), and yet he also insists that the human soul is individuated in virtue of its body. So, as he explicitly concludes, “if the soul does not die when the body dies, or if there is anything of this kind within the soul, then it must, once it has left the bodies, be one in number” (Incoherence I.1 {29}). So—although scholarship is not unanimous on this point—it seems that Ibn Rushd, whatever he might have thought about conjunction, did not mean for the promise of the soul’s immortality to extend to each of us as individuals (Taylor 1998).

Just as the theoretical part of medicine has as its aim the more practical business of preserving health and curing disease, so too, in the political sphere, the first part has as its end the perfection of the second part. This is to say that the goal of ethical inquiry is ultimately “the governance of cities” (ParaEthics I.3, 3F). This instrumental conception of ethics looks strange from the perspective of later European philosophy, but it is what Aristotle himself expressly affirms at Nicomachean Ethics I.2, and it comports well with Ibn Rushd’s orientation away from individual human beings as the ultimate locus of value in the universe.

From the start, Ibn Rushd announces that the goal of his commentary on the Republic will be to strip away the parts that are merely dialectical, so as to identify the claims that achieve the level of demonstrative science (Republic I.21). Accordingly, he attends very selectively to the ten books that comprise Plato’s Republic, dispensing entirely with the first and tenth books and the first half of the second book, and merging the rest into three books. The first presents political science and reflects on the components of the virtuous city, especially the guards. The second considers virtuous governments and the qualities of the ruler of the virtuous city and the philosopher. The third is devoted to non-virtuous governments, comparisons between them, and the transition from one to another.

The Platonic text is subjected to two parallel frameworks. The first is Aristotelian, both in its overarching theoretical framework—replacing the dialectical and dialogical character of the Platonic text with Aristotle’s ethical and logical framework (Butterworth 1986)—and in its particular details, as when Ibn Rushd emphasizes the role of logic rather than mathematics in the training of the guards and the ruler of the virtuous city (Republic II.76–7). The second is the contextualization of this text in the Islamic and Andalusian environment. Ibn Rushd takes the Umayyad, Almoravid, and Almohad dynasties as examples of many of the issues he deals with in the text, and harshly criticizes the current Almohad reign (e.g., Republic III.103) as well as the position of the philosopher at the time, which he compares to being surrounded by ferocious monsters (Republic II.64). This critical attitude is particularly notable when he discusses how women, sharing the same natures as men, are suited to the same activities, fit to serve as guardians, philosophers, and rulers. Yet, as things are, these capacities are not fostered: “since women in these cities are not prepared with respect to any of the human virtues, they frequently resemble plants. Their being a burden upon the men in these cities is one of the causes of poverty” (Republic I.54).

It is clear that Ibn Rushd comments on the Republic only for lack of Aristotle’s superior work. At the end of his paraphrase on the Nicomachean Ethics, he describes the shortcomings in Plato’s treatise, and criticizes Ibn Bājja for having judged the Republic as the perfect treatise on the virtuous city. What is less clear is exactly what Ibn Rushd’s own textual sources were. Did he deal directly with Plato’s text, with the assistance of Galen, al-Fārābī, and Aristotle’s Rhetoric? Or was the Platonic text not in his hands, which means that he was commenting on Galen’s Compendium on Plato’s Politics, with the help of al-Fārābī and Aristotle? While the use of Aristotle’s and al-Fārābī’s texts is clear, the question of his access to Plato remains obscure (Mahdi 2016).

9. Reception

Our focus has been Ibn Rushd. But in studying this subject one cannot help but notice the strange way in which modern scholarship has concerned itself more with the later reception of his ideas than around Ibn Rushd himself. Here we briefly consider the reception of his thought in Muslim, Jewish, and Christian contexts.

9.1 Arabic

Ibn Rushd is often described as a philosopher who failed to attract the attention of his first audience, resulting in the death of his philosophy at the hands of its intended Islamic readers, a state of affairs that is said to have continued until its revival in the ideological debates of the Arab Renaissance (nahḍa) (Kügelgen 1994, al-Jābirī 1998). To be sure, Ibn Rushd’s influence in Muslim contexts cannot compare to the overwhelming influence of Ibn Sīnā, nor even to Ibn Rushd’s own influence in Europe. Still, the commonly heard claim that he had no influence on Islamic thought is false.

First, recent scholarship has shown that Ibn Rushd had successors. Ben Sharīfa (1999) identifies 39 direct disciples of Ibn Rushd, most of whom were faithful, and some of whom continued his work in philosophy and related sciences.

Second, after Ibn Rushd’s death, his works were hardly ignored by the leading scholars in Andalusia and Morocco. Theologians, mathematicians, sufīs, historians, physicians, philosophers and literary figures used Ibn Rushd’s works extensively. In medicine and logic, his influence on Ibn Ṭumlūs has recently become apparent (Ibn Ṭumlūs 2020; Ben Ahmed 2016, 2017, 2019c, 2020a). His influence also extended to Ashʿarite theology, as when Abū al-Ḥajjāj Yūsuf al-Miklātī quoted Ibn Rushd’s epitome on the Metaphysics and the Incoherence of the Incoherence to refute the philosophers (Ḥamdān 2005). The same can be said of certain Maghrebi mathematicians who benefited from the conceptual arsenal provided by Ibn Rushd’s philosophical writings. In this context, one can cite the example of Ibn Haydūr al-Tādilī, who put forward the concept of “the one” (al-wāhid) as crystallized by Ibn Rushd (Ibn Haydūr 2018). Ibn Ṭumlūs, al-Miklāti, Ibn ʿAmīra al-Makhzūmī, and Ibn Haydūr, among others, appropriate Ibn Rushd’s philosophical analysis without naming him, whereas Ibn Sabʿīn on occasion uses Ibn Rushd’s writings without name even while in other places he criticizes him by name—thus complicating the task of identifying the texts used. Some of these texts, in particular in jurisprudence and religion, were part of the curriculum in Andalusia until its fall (Ben Sharīfa 1999; Akasoy 2008; Ben Ahmed 2019b). Indeed, in Muslim contexts, some of Ibn Rushd’s works have been in constant use from the latter’s lifetime until today. They formed part of the training of scholars such as Ibn al-Tilimsānī and Ibn Khaldūn, as well as part of the curriculum of important teachers such as Abū ʿAbd al-Lāh al-Ābilī (Ibn al-Khaṭīb 1975, iii: 507; Ibn Khaldūn 2004).

Third, evidence has emerged that some of Ibn Rushd’s books were transmitted east, to Egypt and the Levant, and used by philosophers and scholars there. In addition to copies of the Kashf and the Incoherence found in Turkey, Egypt, and India, and the testimony of Maimonides, who from Egypt was able to acquire most of Ibn Rushd’s commentaries (Davidson 2005, 108–10), we can identify the spread of Ibn Rushd’s ideas among some philosophers, as is the case with the theory of the unity of truth adopted by Abd al-Latīf al-Baghdādī (Ben Ahmed 2019a). Moreover, some of Ibn Rushd’s philosophical and metaphysical positions concerning causality and location were adopted by thinkers who were generally regarded as enemies of philosophical and rational thought, as is the case with Ibn Taymiyya, who made extensive and explicit use of Ibn Rushd’s texts and adopted some of his positions in his crystallization of his conception of the history of philosophy and kalām (Ben Ahmed 2019b, 2020b, 2020d; Hoover 2018).

Fourth, we now also have evidence that Ibn Rushd’s texts reached Iran in the sixteenth century and became widely known to scholars in the seventeenth century. The catalogues indicate that dozens of them were transcribed during this time. The large number of copies reflects another phenomenon that we should not continue to ignore: the demand for the teaching of these books and their use by students and teachers in madrasas in Safavid Iran. Some thinkers and philosophers used them in their debates and teaching. Suffice it to mention here Abd al-Razzāq al-Lāhījī, Mullah Rajab ʿAlī Tabrīzī, and Muḥammad Ṭāhir Waḥīd al-Zamān Qazwīnī (Endress 1999, 2001, 2006; Pourjavady and Schmidtke, 2015; Ben Ahmed forthcoming).

9.2 Hebrew

Ibn Rushd’s philosophy quickly found a second home in Judaism, where it became so prominent as even to supplant Aristotle as the paramount authority in philosophy and science (Harvey 2000). The first and critical event was Maimonides’ acquisition of Ibn Rushd’s commentaries, perhaps around 1190. His subsequent praise of this work precipitated a four-century fascination with Ibn Rushd among Jewish philosophers (Harvey 1992), especially focusing on his commentaries but even extending to some of his religious treatises.

As Jewish authors began to write increasingly in Hebrew, Ibn Rushd’s texts followed, thanks to a series of Arabic-to-Hebrew translations from 1230 onward (see Zonta 2010 and, in more detail, Tamani and Zonta 1997, 31–49). By 1340, virtually all of the commentaries were available in Hebrew, even while very little of Aristotle himself was translated. In parallel with this process, Jewish authors began to write commentaries on Ibn Rushd, giving rise to a extensive series of “supercommentaries” (Glasner 2011). The leading example of this phenomenon is Gersonides’ series of supercommentaries on Ibn Rushd in the 1320s (Glasner 1995).

The extent to which Ibn Rushd took precedence over other sources of Aristotelianism is quite startling. A typical example is Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera, whose introduction to his thirteenth-century encyclopedia clarifies that “all that I write are the words of Aristotle as explained in the commentaries of the scholar Averroes, for he was the last of the commentators and he incorporated what was best from the [earlier] commentaries” (in Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera §4). Each of the various types of Rushdian commentary had their champions at different times. Here is the advice of Moses Almosnino from the sixteenth-century: “do not squander your time with the epitomes and middle commentaries of Averroes, but read only the long commentaries, for if you read the long commentaries carefully you will have no need to read any other book in order to understand anything of natural science” (in Harvey 1985, 61).

Other important figures from the thirteenth century are Isaac Albalag and Isaac Polqar. Prominent fourteenth-century figures are Gersonides and Moses Narboni (see Hayoun 2005), whose commentary on Ibn Rushd’s theory of conjunction has been translated into English along with Ibn Rushd’s epistle. Prominent names from the fifteenth century include Abraham Bibago and Elijah Del Medigo (see Hayoun 2005). Sixteenth-century figures such Abraham de Balmes attempt more accurate Latin translations of Ibn Rushd, drawing on earlier Arabic-to-Hebrew translations (Ivry 1983, Hasse 2016).

See also the entries on the influence of Arabic and Islamic Philosophy on Judaic thought and the influence of Islamic thought on Maimonides.

9.3 Latin

Ibn Rushd’s influence on Christian Europe, from the early thirteenth-century through the Renaissance, was massive, and has been extensively studied. Translations from Arabic into Latin began with Michael Scott, around 1220, and by the middle of the century most of the Aristotelian commentaries had been translated (Burnett 2010, 820–21; Hasse 2016, 341–57). Almost immediately after the work of translation began his ideas grew in influence (Gauthier 1982), and already by the 1230s he is known as “the Commentator.” Concerns quickly arose, however, over certain contentious claims, and by the 1260s the term ‘Averroist’ was used in a pejorative sense, particularly with regard to the unicity of the intellect (Kuksewicz 1968; see §5 above), the eternity of the world (Dales 1990; see §4), and the threat of determinism (Martin 2015, see §6.1). Even usually temperate authors such as Thomas Aquinas roused themselves to heated invective in considering these doctrines, and in 1270, and again in 1277, lists of condemned propositions were directed at the arts faculty at the University of Paris, many concerning views associated with Ibn Rushd (Brenet 2015; Wippel 1995).

The situation was, however, more complex than a simple opposition between the “Averroists” and their opponents. At a minimum, the field divides into three groups. First are those whose enthusiasm for a Rushdian reading of Aristotle leads them take boldly heterodox views in tension with Christianity. Leading figures here are Siger of Brabant, Boethius of Dacia, and John of Jandun (Brenet 2003). Even in this case there are doubts, however, regarding whether Ibn Rushd is the prime impetus behind their views; Van Steenberghen (1980) prefers the label “radical Aristotelianism.” Second are those at the opposite extreme, opposing not only Ibn Rushd’s most radical ideas but even Aristotelianism itself, as when Peter John Olivi complains of Aristotle that “without reason he is believed, as the god of this age” (Peter John Olivi §3). Bonaventure becomes a leading figure in this movement (Mahoney 1988). Third are the great majority of philosophers in between, including Thomas Aquinas and other leading figures of the age, who reject Ibn Rushd’s readings of Aristotle when they conflict with Church authority, even while in most matters they continue to rely on “the Commentator.” Thus a papal decree from 1341 calls on the arts faculty at Paris to follow “the science of Aristotle and his commentator Averroes, and other ancient commentators and interpreters of Aristotle, except in cases that run counter to the faith” (in Putallaz 2010, 111).

Where that third group agrees most fundamentally with Ibn Rushd is in the conviction that the way forward in philosophy, at least in general, is to adhere faithfully to the mind of Aristotle (§1.2 above). Here Ibn Rushd looms particularly large over the history of European philosophy, all the way through the Renaissance (Akasoy and Giglioni 2010, Hasse 2016). During these later years his name continues to be divisive: large numbers of theologians make common cause with the new breed of humanists against a persistent line of “Averroists” who continue to defend even Ibn Rushd’s most notorious doctrines. The most controversial figures are now Italian, and often associated with the University of Padua, such as Paul of Venice, Pietro Pomponazzi, Agostino Nifo, and Giacomo Zabarella. Yet even while fierce debate endures over the unity of the intellect and other such causes célèbres, the general run of scholars and students continues, page by page, to rely on Ibn Rushd as the paramount guide to Aristotle. New editions, new supercommentaries, and even whole new translations appear until nearly the end of the sixteenth century, most famously the Junta editions of Aristotle with Ibn Rushd’s commentaries, from 1552 and again 1562, which remain in use to this day.

Where Ibn Rushd’s influence is perhaps even more important, but less easy to pin down, concerns the relationship between philosophy and religion (Klima 1998, Marenbon 2007, Normore 1995). The most distinctive feature of the “Averroists” is their inclination to pursue philosophical arguments to their logical conclusion, regardless of Church doctrine. To be sure, this has close affinities with Ibn Rushd’s insistence that philosophy should inform religious study (see §6.2), but in the censorious context of premodern Christianity such an approach was especially perilous. Figures like Siger of Brabant would stake out boldly heterodox-looking claims, only to backtrack and insist that they were merely describing what pure philosophical reason would show, not defending these views as true. Often they would later disavow even their earlier strictly philosophical claims. The autonomy of reason, against the claims of religion, was not a principle that could be easily defended at this time.

For further information see the entry on the influence of Arabic and Islamic philosophy on the Latin West. A particularly valuable collection of papers is found in Niewöhner and Sturlese (1994).


For a brief narrative sketch of Ibn Rushd’s literary output, see §1.2. Here we provide bibliographical details regarding all of Ibn Rushd’s surviving work. In each case we list the best Arabic text where that is available, or otherwise the best surviving witnesses to the original, in Hebrew or Latin. In parentheses, where possible, we suggest dates of composition. Sometimes these are a matter of conjecture; in other cases, the text itself provides a precise date. (For a detailed inventory of texts and dating see Al-ʿAlawī 1986a.)

Contrary to what is often said, most of Ibn Rushd’s work has survived in Arabic. (Of the 49 works listed below, 14 are not extant in Arabic.) Where the Arabic is available, we do not list the various medieval translations (Hebrew and Latin) that were made. We also do not provide a comprehensive list of all available modern translations outside of English. But, in cases where an English translation is not available, we list available translations in other European languages.

Where the medieval Latin translation remains useful to consult, we refer to the most commonly used edition:

  • Aristotelis opera cum Averrois commentariis (Venice: Junta, 1562), available online.

A. Works of Ibn Rushd

A1. Religious Treatises

Abridgement of al-Ghazālī (Ḍarūrī fī uṣūl al-fiqh) (1157)

An abridgement of al-Ghazālī’s Mustaṣfā min ʿilm al-ʿuṣūl, extant in Arabic:

Al-Ḍarūrī fī uṣūl al-fiqh: Mukhtaṣar al-Mustaṣfā, edited by Jamāl Al-Dīn Al-ʿAlawī (Beirut: Dār al-gharb al-Islāmī, 1994).

There is a French translation, with a revised edition:

Le philosophe et la loi; Edition, traduction, et commentaire de l’Abrégé du Mustaṣfā, ed. and tr. Ziad Bou Akl (Berlin: De Gruyter, 2015)

References are to the page of the French plus the {page} of the Al-ʿAlawī edition.

The Distinguished Jurist’s Primer (Bidāyat al-mujtahid wa-nihāyat al-muqtaṣid) (begun 1169; completed 1188)

Extant in Arabic in many imperfect editions, including:

Bidāyat al-mujtahid wa nihāyat al-muqtaṣid, 2 vols., 6th ed. (Beirut: Dār al-Maʿrifa, 1982).

Translated into English:

The Distinguished Jurist’s Primer: A Translation of Bidāyat al-Mujtahid, tr. I. A. K. Nyazee, reviewed by M. Abdul Rauf, 2 vols. (Reading: Garnet, 2006).

References are to the (book.page) of the translation, plus the {volume.page} of the Arabic.

Decisive Treatise (Faṣl al-maqāl) (1178/9)

The Arabic with facing English translation is available here:

The Book of the Decisive Treatise Determining the Connection Between the Law and Wisdom; and Epistle Dedicatory, tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2001).

References are to the (section) of this text.

A Question on Divine Knowledge (al-Ḍamīma)(1179?)

This brief treatise has traditionally been described as an appendix to the Decisive Treatise, and more recently as a prefatory epistle, but in fact all we know is that it is mentioned in the Decisive Treatise. The Arabic, with facing English translation, is available here:

The Book of the Decisive Treatise Determining the Connection Between the Law and Wisdom; and Epistle Dedicatory, tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2001).

Al-Kashf ʿan manāhij al-adilla fī ʿaqāʾid al-milla (Exposition of the Methods of Proof concerning Religious Doctrines) (1179/80?)

The Kashf is extant and available in various imperfect Arabic editions, including:

Al-Kashf ʿan manāhij al-adillah fī ʿaqāʾid al-millah, ed. Muṣṭafā Ḥanfī (Beirut: Markaz Dirāsāt al-Waḥdah al-ʿArabīyah, 1998). [Bibliographies commonly misattribute editorship of this work to M. A. Al-Jābirī, who in fact merely supervised the edition.]

Fouad Ben Ahmed is preparing a new edition that draws on previously unused manuscripts.

There is an English translation:

Faith and Reason in Islam: Averroes’ Exposition of Religious Arguments, tr. Ibrahim Y. Najjar (Oxford: Oneworld, 2001).

References are to (chapter.page) of the translation, plus {Arabic page}.

The Incoherence of the Incoherence (Tahāfut al-Tahāfut) (1180/81)

Extant in Arabic:

Tahāfut al-Tahāfut, ed. Maurice Bouyges (Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1930).

In English translation:

Tahāfut al-Tahāfut (The Incoherence of the Incoherence), tr. Simon van den Bergh, 2 vols. (London: Luzac, 1954).

References are to (part.discussion) of the translation, plus {Arabic page}, which is given marginally in the translation.

A2. Aristotelian (and Related) Commentaries

Compendium on Logic (Mukhtaṣar al-Manṭiq / Kitāb al-ḍarūrī fī-l-manṭiq) (1157)

One of Ibn Rushd’s earliest works, a summary of logic that briefly runs through the entire extended Organon. An edition of the Arabic, with English translation, is forthcoming:

Short Commentaries on Aristotle’s Organon, ed. and tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Albany, NY: SUNY Press, forthcoming).

Three sections of this work were earlier published:

Three Short Commentaries on Aristotle’s Topics, Rhetoric, and Poetics, ed. and tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1977).

References are to the (treatise.section) of the forthcoming translation.

Porphyry, Isagoge


See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (circa 1170)

The Arabic is not extant, but there is a translation in Hebrew:

Commentarium medium in Porphyrii Isagogen et Aristotelis Categorias, ed. Herbert A. Davidson (Cambridge, MA: Mediaeval Academy of America, 1969), available online.

And in Latin:

Commentum medium super libro Porphyrii: translatio Wilhelmo de Luna adscripta, ed. Roland Hissette (Louvain: Peeters, 2016).

It has also been translated into English:

Middle Commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge and on Aristotle’s Categoriae, tr. Herbert A. Davidson (Cambridge, MA: Mediaeval Academicy of America, 1969).



See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1164?)

Extant in Arabic:

Talkhīṣ Kitāb al-Maqūlāt, ed. Maḥmūd Qāsim and Charles E. Butterworth (Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1980).

And it has been translated:

Middle Commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories and De Interpretatione, tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Princeton, NJ.: Princeton University Press, 1983).

De interpretatione


See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1165?)

The Arabic is available in various editions, including

Talkhīṣ kitāb al-ʿIbāra / Averrois Cordubensis in librum Aristotelis De interpretatione, ed. Maḥmūd Qāsim, Charles E. Butterworth, Aḥmad ʿAbd al-Majīd al-Harīdī (Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1981).

Available in translation into English:

Middle Commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories and De Interpretatione, tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Princeton, NJ.: Princeton University Press, 1983).

Prior Analytics


See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1166?)

Available in multiple Arabic editions, including

Talkhīṣ kitāb al-qiyās / Averrois Cordubensis in Aristotelis Priorum analiticorum libros, ed. Maḥmūd Qāsim, Charles E. Butterworth, Aḥmad ʿAbd al-Majīd al-Harīdī (Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1983).

Multiple English translations, including

Middle Commentary on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, ed. Maḥmūd Qāsim, Charles E. Butterworth, Aḥmad ʿAbd al-Majīd al-Harīdī (Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1983).

Posterior Analytics


See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1170)

Available in multiple Arabic editions, including

Talkhīṣ Kitāb al-Burhān, ed. Mahmūd Qāsim (Cairo: al-Haya al-ʿĀmma li al-Kitāb, 1982).

No modern translation has been made, but there is a Latin translation in Junta 1562 vol. 1 pt. 2b.

Long Commentary (after 1186)

Extant in Arabic but only through I.23 (85a11):

Sharḥ al-Burhān li-Arisṭū wa-Talkhīṣ al-Burhān, ed. ʿAbd al-Raḥmān Badawī (Kuwait: al-Majlis al-Waṭanī li-1-ṭaqāfa wa-l-funūn wa-1-ādāb, 1984), 155–486.

The complete Hebrew translation has been transcribed online.

No modern translation has been made, but three Latin translations, each based on an earlier, complete Hebrew translation, are printed in Junta 1562 vol. 1 pt. 2a.

References are to (book.comment) of the Junta edition, plus {Arabic page}.



See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1168)

Available in multiple Arabic editions, including

Commentarium Medium in Aristotelis Topica, ed. Charles E. Butterworth and Aḥmad ʿAbd al-Majīd al-Harīdī (Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1979).

No modern translation, but a Latin translation is available in Junta 1562 vol. 1 pt. 3.

References are to the Latin (book.page {Arabic page}).

Sophistical Refutations


See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1174?)

Available in multiple Arabic editions, including

Talkhīs al-Safsaṭa, ed. M. Salīm Sālim (Cairo: Dār al-Kutub, 1973).

No modern translation, but a Latin translation is available in Junta 1562 vol. I pt. 3.



See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1175)

In Arabic, with a French translation:

Commentaire moyen à la Rhétorique d’Aristote, ed. and tr. M. Aouad, 3 vols. (Paris: Vrin, 2002).

Book I has been translated into English:

Three Arabic Treatises on Aristotle’s Rhetoric: the Commentaries of al-Fārābī, Avicenna, and Averroes, tr. Lahcen Elyazghi Ezzaher (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 2015), 72–181.



See CompLogic, above.

Paraphrase (1176?)

Extant in Arabic:

Commentarium medium in Aristotelis De arte poetica liber, ed. Charles E. Butterworth with the assistance of Aḥmad ʿAbd al-Majīd al-Harīdī (Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-Miṣriyya al-ʿāmma li-l-kitāb, 1986).

In English translation:

Averroes’ Middle Commentary on Aristotle’s Poetics, tr. Charles E. Butterworth (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1986; repr. South Bend, IN: St. Augustine’s Press, 2000).


Epitome (1159, revised after 1186)

The four short commentaries on physical treatises—Physics, De caelo, On Generation and Corruption, and Meteorology—were conceived of as a single work, Al-jawāmiʿ fī l-falsafa. They are, however, often edited and translated separately.

Extant in Arabic:

Epitome in physicorum libros, ed. Josep Puig (Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Científicas: Instituto Hispano-Arabe de Cultura, 1983).

Translated into Spanish:

Epítome de física, tr. Josep Puig (Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Científicas: Instituto Hispano-Arabe de Cultura, 1987).

References are to (book.page) of the translation plus {Arabic page}.

Paraphrase (1169)

Not extant in Arabic, but it survives in two distinct Hebrew versions. Only the first two books of the more popular Kalonymus translation have been edited and translated:

Averroes on the Principles of Nature: The Middle Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics I–II, edited and translated by Steven Harvey (Harvard: Ph.D. dissertation, 1977).

The Latin translation (Junta 1962, vol. 4) is based on the Hebrew.

A detailed outline (taqsīm) of the text is extant in Arabic:

Min Talkhīṣ al-Samāʿ al-ṭabīʿi: Taqsīm al-Samāʿ al-ṭabīʿi, ed. Jamāl al-Dīn al- ʿAlawī, Revue de la Faculté des lettres et des sciences humaines, Dhar al-Mahraz de Fes 7 (1983-1984), 20555.

Long Commentary (1186)

Not extant in Arabic. A Hebrew translation survives but is not yet edited (save for the edition with translation in Harvey 1985 of the important proem). The Latin translation is available in Iunta 1562, vol. 4, available online. The Latin text of Book VII is available in a modern edition:

Commentarium Magnum In Aristotelis Physicorum Librum Septimum (Vindobonensis [Vienna] lat. 2334), ed. H. Schmieja (Paderborn, 2006), available online.

References are made to (book.comment) of the Latin text.

Glasner (2009) contains much useful information about the various commentaries on the Physics and their various translations.

De caelo

Epitome (1159)

Extant in Arabic:

Rasāʾil Ibn Rushd (Hyderabad: Daʾirat al-Maʿārif al-ʿUthmāniyya, 1947).

No modern translation.

Paraphrase (1171)

Extant in Arabic:

Talkhīṣ al-Samāʾ wa-l-ʿālam, ed. Jamāl al-Dīn al-ʿAlawī (Fes: Faculté des Lettres, 1984), available online.

There is no modern translation, but there is a Latin version in Iunta 1962, vol. 5.

Long Commentary (1188)

The whole surives only in Latin:

Commentum magnum super libro De celo et mundo Aristotelis, ed. Francis J. Carmody and Rüdiger Arnzen, 2 vols. (Leuven: Peeters, 2003), available online.

A third of the Arabic (= I.61–140 and II.1–42) survives:

Sharḥ al-Samāʾ wa-l-ʿālam, ed. Asʿad Jumʿa, 2 vols. (Tunis: Markaz al-Nashr al-Jāmiʿī, 2002).

References are to the (book.comment.page) of the Latin edition.

On Generation and Corruption

Epitome (1159)

Extant in Arabic:

Epitome del libro sobre la generación y la corrupción, edition and Spanish translation by Josep Puig Montada (Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Científicas, 1992).

Available in English:

Averroes on Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione: Middle Commentary and Epitome, tr. Samuel Kurland (Cambridge, MA: Mediaeval Academy of America, 1958).

References are to (book.page) of the translation, plus {Arabic page}.

Paraphrase (1172)

Extant in Arabic:

Mittlerer Kommentar zu Aristoteles’ De generatione et corruptione, ed. Heidrun Eichner (Paderborn: F. Schöningh, 2005), available online.

Available in English:

Averroes on Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione. Middle Commentary and Epitome, tr. Samuel Kurland (Cambridge, MA: Mediaeval Academy of America, 1958).


Epitome (1159)

Extant in Arabic:

Kitāb al-Āthār al-ʿulwiyya / Averroes’ Epitome Meteorologica, edited by Suhayr Faḍllallāh Abū Wāfiya and Suʿād ʿAlī ʿAbd-al-Rāziq, revised by Zaynab Maḥmūd al-Khuḍayrī (Cairo: al-Majlis al-aʿla li-1-Thaqāfa, 1994).

No modern translation.

Paraphrase (1173?)

Extant in Arabic:

Talkhīṣ al-Āthār al-ʿulwiyya, ed. Jamāl-al-Dīn alʿAlawī (Beirut: Dār al-Gharb al-Islāmī, 1994).

Translated into Latin in Junta 1962, vol. 5, available online.

De anima

Epitome (circa 1158-1160)

Extant in Arabic in various editions, including

Talkhīṣ Kitāb al-nafs, ed. Aḥmad Fuʾād al-Ahwānī (Cairo: Maktabat al-Nahḍa al-Miṣrīyya, 1950).

There is a Spanish translation:

La psicología de Averroes: commentario al libro “Sobre el alma” de Aristóteles, tr. Salvador Gómez Nogales (Madrid: Universidad Nacional de Educacion a Distancia, 1987).

References are to the (Spanish page {Arabic page}).

Paraphrase (1172/1181)

Extant in Arabic, with facing English translation:

Middle Commentary on Aristotle’s De Anima, ed. and tr. A. L. Ivry (Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2002).

Long Commentary (1186)

Survives only in Latin:

Averrois Cordubensis Commentarium magnum in Aristotelis De anima libros, ed. F. S. Crawford (Cambridge, MA: Medieval Academy of America, 1953), available online.

An English translation carefully compares the Latin with surviving Arabic fragments:

Long Commentary on the De anima of Aristotle, tr. Richard C. Taylor, with Thérèse-Anne Druart (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2009).

References are to (book.comment {Latin page}).

Parva naturalia (1170)

The sole commentary has traditionally been described as an epitome, but recent scholarship suggests that it might better be thought of as a paraphrase (Hansberger 2019). It is extant in Arabic:

Compendia librorum Aristotelis qui Parva naturalia vocantur, ed. Henry Blumberg (Cambridge, MA: Mediaeval Academy of America, 1972).

And has been translated:

Epitome of Parva naturalia, tr. Henry Blumberg (Cambridge, MA: The Mediaeval Academy of America, 1961).

References are to (book.page) of the English plus {Arabic page}.

De animalibus

Paraphrase (1170)

Extant in Latin and Hebrew, and covering only the Parts of Animals and the Generation of Animals. Only the Latin has been edited, in volume 6 of the 1562 Junta edition, available online.


Epitome (composed circa 1161, but revised around 1180 and again in the early 1190s)

Extant in Arabic in various non-critical editions, including:

Compendio de Metafisica: texto Arabe, ed. Carlos Quirós Rodríguez (Madrid: Estanislao Maestre, 1919).

An English translation has been made based on careful study of the manuscript tradition:

Averroes on Aristotle’s Metaphysics: An Annotated Translation of the So-Called “Epitome,” tr. Rüdiger Arnzen (Berlin: De Gruyter, 2010).

References are to (chapter.page) of the translation, plus {Arabic page}.

Paraphrase (1174)

Extant only in Hebrew, in two translations:

Il Commento medio di Averroè alla Metafisica di Aristotele nella tradizione ebraica, ed. Mauro Zonta, 2 vols. (Pavia: Pavia University Press, 2011).

This work includes an Italian translation of Bks. I–II.

Long Commentary (after 1190)

Extant in Arabic:

Tafsīr Mā baʿd al-ṭabīʿa, ed. Maurice Bouyges, 3rd ed., 3 vols. (Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1990).

There is an English translation of Book XII:

Ibn Rushd’s Metaphysics: A Translation with Introduction of Ibn Rushd’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Book Lām, tr. Charles Genequand (Leiden: Brill, 1984).

And a French translation of Book III:

Grand commentaire (Tafsīr) de la Métaphysique Livre Bêta, tr. Laurence Bauloye (Paris: Vrin, 2002).

And a French translation of books I, II, IV, and VI:

Traduction commentée du Grand commentaire d’ Averroès aux livres petit Alpha, grand Alpha, Gamma et Epsilon de la Métaphysique d’ Aristote, tr. Karim Kaddour (Paris: Université Panthéon- Sorbonne - Paris I, 2018).

For the remainder, there is a Latin translation, in Junta 1562 vol. 8, available online.

References are to (book.comment {Arabic page}).

Nicomachean Ethics

Paraphrase (1177)

The Arabic is not extant, but the work has survived in Hebrew:

The Hebrew Version of Averroes’ Middle Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, ed. Lawrence V. Berman (Jerusalem: Israel Academy of Sciences and Humanities, 1999).

An independent Latin translation, printed in Junta 1562 vol. 3, is available online. A modern edition of Book X of the Latin translation has made been, along with a French translation:

Le plaisir, le bonheur, et l’acquisition des vertus: édition du Livre x du Commentaire moyen d’Averroès à l’Éthique à Nicomaque d’Aristote, ed. and tr. Frédérique Woerther (Leiden: Brill, 2018).

References are to (book.chapter, page) of the Junta edition.

Plato’s Republic

Not extant in Arabic, but it has survived in Hebrew:

Averroes’ Commentary on Plato’s Republic, ed. and tr. Erwin I. J. Rosenthal (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1956).

For an improved English translation see

Averroes on Plato’s Republic, tr. Ralph Lerner (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1974).

References are to (treatise.page) of the Hebrew, given in the margin of Lerner’s translation.

A3. Medical Treatises

Al-Kulliyyāt fī al-ṭibb (General Principles of Medicine) (1162–69, subsequently revised)

The original redaction is extant in Arabic, in many editions, including:

Al-Kulliyyāt fī al-ṭibb, ed. Murād Maḥfūẓ et al., with an introduction by Aḥmad Maḥfūẓ (Beirut: Markaz Dirāsāt al-Waḥda al-ʿArabiyya, 1999). [Bibliographies commonly misattribute editorship of this work to M. A. Al-Jābirī, who in fact merely supervised the edition.]

The Latin (Colliget), which translates a significantly revised version of the text, is found in

Iunta 1562, vol. 10, available online.

It is also available in a modern Spanish translation:

El libro de las generalidades de la medicina, tr. M. C. Vázquez de Benito, C. Álvarez de Morales (Madrid: Trotta, 2003).

References are to (book.page) of the Arabic text.

Commentary on Ibn Sīnā’s Medical Poem (Sharḥ li-Urjūza fī al-ṭibb / Avicennae Cantica) (between 1184 and 1195)

The Arabic text, with Latin and a modern Spanish translation:

Avicennae Cantica, ed. and tr. J. Coullaut Cordero, E. Fernández Vallina, and M. C. Vázquez de Benito (Salamanca: Universidad de Salamanca, 2010).

References are to the Arabic text, by page number.

Commentaries on Galen (1190s)

Extant in Arabic:

Averrois in Galenum, ed. Maria de la Conceptión Vázquez de Benito (Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Cientfficas, 1984).

Translated here:

Medical Manuscripts of Averroes at El Escorial, tr. Georges C. Anawati and P. Ghalioungui (Cairo: Al Ahram Center for Scientific Translations, 1986).

A4. Brief Works

Many brief treatises survive. The most prominent are these:

Questions on Logic

Various questions are extant in Arabic:

Maqālāt fī l-manṭiq wa-l-ʿilm al-ṭabīʿī (Essais de logique et de physique d’Ibn Rochd), ed. Jamal al-Dīn al-ʿAlawī (Casablanca: Dār al-Nashr al-Maghribiyya, 1983), 71–221.

The material on assertoric propositions has been translated:

Nicholas Rescher, “Averroes’ Quaesitum on Assertoric (Absolute) Propositions,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 1 (1963) 80–93.

A lengthy collection of these questions is also available in Latin, in Junta 1562 vol. 1 pt. 2b, ff. 75v–119v, available online.

Questiones on Physics

Partially extant in Arabic:

Maqālāt fī l-manṭiq wa-l-ʿilm al-ṭabīʿī (Essais de logique et de physique d’Ibn Rochd), ed. Jamal al-Dīn al-ʿAlawī (Casablanca: Dār al-Nashr al-Maghribiyya, 1983), 225–63.

A longer series of questions is extant in Hebrew. The Hebrew has mainly not been edited, but it has been translated:

Averroes’ Questions in Physics, tr. Helen Tunik Goldstein (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1991).

Question 6 in Goldstein corresponds to 258–63 in ʿAlawī’s edition of the Arabic, available online.

Question 7 in Goldstein corresponds to 225–43 in ʿAlawī’s edition, available online.

References are to the (question.paragraph) of the translation, plus {Arabic page}.

De separatione primi principii (1190s?)

This single treatise is apparently extant only in Latin, and has been edited and translated:

Carlos Steel and Guy Guldentops, “An Unknown Treatise of Averroes against the Avicennians on the First Cause: Edition and Translation,” Recherches de théologie et philosophie médiévales 64 (1997) 86–135.

De substantia orbis (1178–9)

This collection of six short treatises on cosmology and metaphysics is extant in Hebrew and has been translated:

De substantia orbis: Critical Edition of the Hebrew Text with English Translation and Commentary, ed. Arthur Hyman (Cambridge, MA: Medieval Academy of America, 1986), available online.

References are to (treatise.page) of the translation.

On the Possibility of Conjunction

Extant only in Hebrew, which has been edited and translated into English:

The Epistle on the Possibility of Conjunction with the Active Intellect by Ibn Rushd with the Commentary of Moses Narboni, tr. Kalman P. Bland (New York: Jewish Theological Seminary of America, 1982).

References are to (section.page) of the translation.

On the Conjunction of Intellect, Epistle 1

This letter seems to reflect Ibn Rushd’s mature views about the material intellect. Extant in Hebrew, edited with German translation:

Drei Abhandlungen über die Conjunction des separaten Intellects mit dem Menschen. Von Averroes (Vater und Sohn), aus dem Arabischen übersetzt von Samuel Ibn Tibbon, ed. and tr. Yiṣḥaq Hercz (Berlin: H. G. Hermann, 1869), 3–10 and 1–47.

Also available in French:

La Béatitude de l’âme: Éditions, traductions et études, tr. Marc Geoffroy and Carlos Steel (Paris: Vrin, 2001), 198–222.

On the Conjunction of Intellect, Epistle 2

Extant in Hebrew, edited with a German translation:

Drei Abhandlungen über die Conjunction des separaten Intellects mit dem Menschen. Von Averroes (Vater und Sohn), aus dem Arabischen übersetzt von Samuel Ibn Tibbon, ed. and tr. Yiṣḥaq Hercz (Berlin: H. G. Hermann, 1869), 10–14 and 48–56.

Also available in French:

La Béatitude de l’âme: Éditions, traductions et études, ed. and tr. Marc Geoffroy and Carlos Steel (Paris: Vrin, 2001), 222–36.

A Latin translation of these two epistles was made from the Hebrew and joined with other material, under the title De animae beatitudine. Printed in Junta vol. 9, it is also available in a modern edition and French translation, with extensive explanatory material:

La Béatitude de l’âme: Éditions, traductions et études, ed. and tr. Marc Geoffroy and Carlos Steel (Paris: Vrin, 2001).

Commentary on Ibn Bājja’s Epistle on the Conjunction of the Intellect with Man

Extant in Arabic:

Aḥmad Fuʾād al-Ahwānī, Talkhīṣ kitāb al-nafs (Cairo: Maktabat al- Nahḍa al-Miṣriyya, 1950), pp. 90–95.

Translated into Spanish:

Salvador Gómez Nogales, La psicologia de Averroës: commentario al libro sobre el alma de Aristoteles (Madrid: Universidad Nacional de Educacion a Distancia, 1987), pp. 214–21.

Commentary on Alexander’s De intellectu

Extant in Arabic:

Mauro Zonta, “La tradizione giudeo-araba ed ebraica del De intellectu di Alexxandro di Afrodisia e il testo originale del Commento di Averroè,” Annali di Ca’ Foscari, 40 (2001): 17–35.

And in Hebrew:

Herbert A. Davidson, “Peruš Ibn Rušd le-maʾamar be-sekel šel Aleksander me-Afrodisiyas,” in Sefer ha-yovel li-Shelomoh Pines: bi-melot lo shemonim shanah / Schlomo Pines Jubilee Volume, 2 vols. (Jerusalem: Universitah ha-‘Ivrit, 1988–90) I:205–17.

B. Other Works

For recent bibliographies see Other Internet Resources. For comprehensive older bibliographies see

  • Georges C. Anawati, Bibliographie d’Averroes (Ibn Rushd) (Algiers: Jāmiʻat al-Duwal al-ʻArabīyah, 1978).
  • Philipp W. Rosemann. “Averroes: A Catalogue of Editions and Writings from 1821 Onwards,” Bulletin de philosophie médiévale 30 (1988) 153–221.

For a good book-length summary of Ibn Rushd’s philosophy in English, see

  • Majid Fakhry. Averroes (Ibn Rushd): His Life, Works and Influence (Oxford: Oneworld, 2001).

For a state-of-the-art recent study, in Italian, see

  • Matteo Di Giovanni. Averroè (Rome: Carocci, 2017).

Works Cited in this Entry

  • Adamson, Peter (2019). “Averroes on Divine Causation,” in Adamson and Di Giovanni (2019), 198–217.
  • Adamson, Peter and Matteo Di Giovanni (eds.) (2019). Interpreting Averroes: Critical Essays (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Akasoy, Anna A. (2008). “Ibn Sabʿīn’s Sicilian Questions: The Text, Its Sources, and Their Historical Context,” al-Qanṭara 29: 115–46.
  • Akasoy, Anna A. and Guido Giglioni (eds.) (2010). Renaissance Averroism and Its Aftermath: Arabic Philosophy in Early Modern Europe (Dordrecht: Springer).
  • Al-ʿAlawī, Jamal Al-Dīn (1986a). Al-Matn al-Rushdī: Madkhal li-qirāʾa jadīda [The Rushdian Corpus: An Introduction to a New Reading] (Casablanca: Dār Tubqāl).
  • ––– (1986b). “Naẓariyyat al-burhān wa dalālatuhā fī al-khiṭāb al-falsafiy ʿinda Ibn Rushd,” in Un Trait d’union entre l’Orient et l’Occident: al-Ghazzali et Ibn Maimoun (Rabat: Maṭbaʿat al-maʿārif al-jadīda), 43–101.
  • Amerini, Fabrizio (2008). “The Semantics of Substantial Names: The Tradition of the Commentaries on Aristotle’s Metaphysics,” Recherches de théologie et philosophie médiévale 75: 395–440.
  • Arfa Mensia, Mokdad (1999). “Malāmiḥ min naẓariyyat Ibn Rushd fī al-nubuwwa,” in M. Arfa Mensia (ed.), Ibn Rushd faylasūf al-sharq wa-l-gharb (Tunis: Dār al-Gharb al-Islāmī), I:219–57.
  • ––– (2019). “Dogmatics, Theology, and Philosophy in Averroes,” in Adamson and Di Giovanni (2019), 27–44.
  • Belo, Catarina (2007). Chance and Determinism in Avicenna and Averroes (Leiden: Brill).
  • Ben Ahmed, Fouad (2010–11). “Averroes’ Philosophical Approach to Dialectics: Values, Usages, and Limits,” Mélanges de l’Université Saint-Joseph 63: 259–322.
  • Ben Ahmed, Fouad (2012). “Al-Tamthīl tadlīlan fī naẓariyyat al-nubuwwa,” in Tamthilāt wa Istiʿārāt Ibn Rushd: min manṭiq al-burhān ilā manṭiq al-Khaṭāba (Beirut, Algeria, Rabat: Manshurāt Ḍifāf, Manshurāt al-Ikhtilāf, Dār al-Amān), 133–70.
  • ––– (2016). “Three Masters and One Disciple: Ibn Ṭumlūs Critical Incorporation of Al-Farābī, al-Ġazālī, Ibn Rushd,” in Andreas Speer and Thomas Jescke (eds.), Schüler und Meister, 39th Kölner Mediaevistentagung (Berlin: De Gruyter), 537–56.
  • ––– (2017). Ibn Ṭumlūs al-faylasūf wa al- ṭabīb (620/1223): Sīrat bībliyūgrafiyya, with an introduction in English (Beirut, Rabat, Alger, Tunis: Manshūrat Ḍifāf, Dār al-Amān, Manshūrāt al-Ikhtilāf, Kalima li al-Nashr).
  • ––– (2019a). “Fī munāhaḍat Ibn Sīnā wa as-sīnawiyya: ʿAbd-Allaṭīf al-Baghdādī wa iṣlāḥ al-falsafa fī al-qarn at-thālith ʿashar al-mīlādī,” Hespéris-Tamuda 54: 129–64.
  • ––– (2019b). “Ibn Rushd in the Ḥanbali Tradition: Ibn Taymiyya and Ibn Qayyim al-Jawziyya and the Continuity of Philosophy in Muslim Contexts,” The Muslim World 19: 561–81.
  • ––– (2019c). “Ibn Tumlūs’ Logic and Medicine: An Overview of the Current State of Scholarship,” in Jean-Baptiste Brenet and Olga L. Lizzini (eds.), La philosophie arabe à l’étude: sens, limites et défis d’une discipline moderne / Studying Arabic Philosophy: Meaning, Limits and Challenges of a Modern Discipline (Paris: Vrin), 705–21.
  • ––– (2020a). “Ibn Ṭumlūs on Dialectic Reasoning: The Extent of His Reliance on al-Fārābī and Ibn Rušd,” in Nadja Germann and Steven Harvey (eds.), The Origin and Nature of Language and Logic in Medieval Islamic, Jewish, and Christian Thought (Turnhout: Brepols).
  • ––– (2020b). “Re-writing the History of Philosophy in Sunni Muslim contexts: Ibn Taymiyyah and the Impact of Ibn Rushd,” Hespéris-Tamuda 55: 303–54.
  • ––– (2020c). “Fī murājaʿat ʿalāqat Ibn Rushd bi al-maḏhab al-Ashʿarī wa bi al-ʿaqīda al-muwaḥḥidiyya,” in Jamāl ʿAllāl al-Bakhtī (ed.), al-Fikr al-Ashʿarī bi al-Andalus: Tārīkh wa ishkālāt (Tetouan: Markaz Abū al-Ḥasan al-Ashʿarī), 477-539.
  • ––– (2020d). “What Were Ibn Rushd’s Works Doing in Egypt and the Levant in the 14th Century? Ibn Rushd in the Library of Ibn Taymiyya,” Al-Ibānat 6: 183–233.
  • ––– (forthcoming). “Ibn Rushd in Irān: «En Orient, après Averroès…» Revisited,” in Science, Philosophy and Kalām in Islamic Civilisation: The Old and the New (International colloquium organized by the Société internationale d’histoire des sciences et de la philosophie arabes et islamiques, Naples, 9–11 September 2019).
  • Ben Sharīfa, Muḥammad (1999). Ibn Rushd al-Ḥafīd: Sīra wathāʾiqīyya (Casablanca: Maṭbaʿat al-Najāḥ al-Jadīda).
  • Bertolacci, Amos (2007). “Avicenna and Averroes on the Proof of God’s Existence and the Subject Matter of Metaphysics,” Medioevo 32: 61–97.
  • Black, Deborah L. (1990). Logic and Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics in Medieval Arabic Philosophy (Leiden: Brill).
  • ––– (1996). “Memory, Individuals, and the Past in Averroes’ Psychology,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 5: 161–87.
  • ––– (1999). “Conjunction and the Identity of Knower and Known in Averroes,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 73: 159–84.
  • ––– (2019). “Constructing Averroes’ Epistemology,” in Adamson and Di Giovanni (2019), 96–115.
  • Blaustein, Michael A. (1984). Averroes on the Imagination and the Intellect (Ph.D. dissertation, Harvard University).
  • Bou Akl, Ziad (2019). “Averroes on Judicial Reasoning,” in Adamson and Di Giovanni (2019), 45–63.
  • Brenet, Jean-Baptiste (2003). Transferts du sujet: la noétique d’Averroès selon Jean de Jandun (Paris: Vrin).
  • ––– (2015). Averroès l’inquiétant (Paris, Les Belles Lettres).
  • Burnett, Charles (2010). “Arabic Philosophical Works Translated into Latin,” in Pasnau and Van Dyke (2010), 814–22.
  • Butterworth, Charles E. (1986). Philosophy, Ethics, and Virtuous Rule: A Study of Averroes’ Commentary on Plato’s “Republic” (Cairo: AUC Press).
  • Cerami, Cristina (2014). “Signe physique, signe métaphysique: Averroès contre Avicenne sur le statut épistémologique des sciences de l’être,” in C. Cerami (ed.), Nature et sagesse: les rapports entre physique et métaphysique dans la tradition aristotélicienne: recueil de textes en hommage à Pierre Pellegrin (Louvain-la-Neuve: Peeters) 429–74.
  • ––– (2015). Génération et substance : Aristote et Averroès entre physique et métaphysique (Berlin: De Gruyter).
  • Cruz Hernández, Miguel (1997). Abū-l-Walīd ibn Rušd (Averroes): vida, obra, pensamiento, influencia, 2nd ed. (Cordova: Caja de Ahorros y Monte de Piedad de Córdoba).
  • Dales, Richard C. (1990). Medieval Discussions of the Eternity of the World (Leiden: Brill).
  • Davidson, Herbert A. (1987). Proofs for Eternity, Creation and the Existence of God in Medieval Islamic and Jewish Philosophy (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • ––– (1992). Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Averroes on Intellect: Their Cosmologies, Theories of the Active Intellect, and Theories of Human Intellect (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • ––– (2005). Moses Maimonides: The Man and His Works (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Di Giovanni, Matteo (2006). “Averroes on the Species of Celestial Bodies,” Miscellanea mediaevalia 33: 438–64.
  • ––– (2007). “Individuation by Matter in Averroes’ Metaphysics,” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale 18: 187–210.
  • ––– (2011). “Substantial Form in Averroes’s Long Commentary on the Metaphysics,” in P. Adamson (ed.), In the Age of Averroes: Arabic Philosophy in the Sixth/Twelfth Century (London: Warburg Institute) 175–94.
  • ––– (2012). “Averroes’ Notion of Primary Substance,” in A. Musco et al. (ed.), Universality of Reason: Plurality of Philosophies in the Middle Ages (Palermo: Officina di Studi Medievali, 2012) III: 55–65.
  • ––– (2019). “Averroes, Philosopher of Islam,” in Adamson and Di Giovanni (2019), 9–26.
  • Druart, Thérèse-Anne (1994). “Averroes: The Commentator and the Commentators,” in Lawrence P. Schrenk (ed.), Aristotle in Late Antiquity (Washington: Catholic University of America Press) 184–202.
  • Elamrani-Jamal, Abdelali (2000). “La demonstration du signe (burhān al-dalīl) selon Ibn Rushd (Averroès),” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale 11: 113–31.
  • Endress, Gerhard (1995). “Averroes’ De caelo: Ibn Rushd’s Cosmology in His Commentaries on Aristotle’s On the Heavens,” Arabic Sciences and Philosophy 5 (1995) 9–49.
  • ––– (1999). “Le projet d’Averroès: constitution, réception et édition du corpus des œuvres d’Ibn Rušd,” in Gerhard Endress and Jan A. Aertsen (ed.), Averroes and the Aristotelian Tradition: Sources, Constitution and Reception of the Philosophy of Ibn Rushd (1126–1198) (Leiden: Brill), 3–31.
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Other Internet Resources


Thanks for their help and advice to Peter Adamson, Matteo Di Giovanni, Stephen Ogden, Richard Taylor, and David Wirmer.

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