Supplement to The Possibilism-Actualism Debate

Classical Possibilism and Lewisian Possibilism

David Lewis is often thought of as a typical, perhaps even the quintessential, possibilist. In fact, however, Lewis’s mature theory, as laid out in his definitive account in his 1986 treatise On the Plurality of Worlds, is quite idiosyncratic. It is important, therefore, to contrast it with the classical variety of possibilism at issue in this article.

A detailed account of Lewis’s theory of worlds can be found in §2.1 of the entry on possible worlds, so we will only reiterate its most characteristic theses here:

  1. There is a plurality (indeed, a plenitude) of worlds.
  2. Worlds are maximal and connected concrete objects. That is, (i) anything that bears any spatio-temporal relation to any part of a world, no matter how far separated in time or space they might be, is also a part of that world; and (ii) any two parts of a world bear some spatio-temporal relation to each other. It follows that worlds do not overlap; nothing is a part of more than one world.
  3. To exist in a world is to be one of its parts. Hence, by thesis 1, nothing exists in more than one world.
  4. All worlds, hence all the things that exist in them, are on an ontological par; they all exist in exactly the same sense. There is thus no distinguished mode of being indicated by “actual” and its cognates and no distinguished actual world.
  5. As a corollary to thesis 4, “actual” and “the actual world” are indexical expressions like “present” and “the present moment”: an utterance of “the actual world” simply indicates the world of the speaker; likewise, to say that an object is actual is to say nothing more than that it exists in the same world as the speaker.
  6. Modality is not primitive. As in standard possible world semantics, modal operators are understood semantically as quantifiers over worlds, and worlds themselves, as seen above, are defined in non-modal terms.
  7. Because nothing exists in more than one Lewisian world, ipso facto nothing in one world has properties in another. Lewis thus accommodates the intuitive truth of de re modal propositions[93] like Bergoglio could have been a Tango dancer instead of a priest, \(\Diamond (\sfT\sfb \land \neg \sfP\sfb)\), by means of his doctrine of counterparts, where (roughly) an object \(a\) in a world \(w\) is a counterpart of an object \(b\) if \(a\) resembles \(b\) more than any other object in \(w\) does.[94] Thus, in particular, \(\Diamond (\sfT\sfb \land \neg \sfP\sfb)\) is true just in case there is a world \(w\) in which some counterpart of Bergoglio is a Tango dancer and not a priest.

As per thesis 4, Lewis roundly rejects bi-modalism (argued with particular vigor in Lewis 1990)—there is no distinguished mode of being that we in the actual world exhibit that the inhabitants of other worlds do not. Hence, if “actual” and its cognates are taken to indicate the mode of being that you and I share, as they do in the classical possibilism-actualism debate, Lewis is clearly an actualist: to be actual (in this sense) is just to be and, hence, all things in all worlds are equally actual. Hence, he will agree that there neither are nor could be things that fail to be actual (in this sense) and, hence, as per Act, that there neither are nor could be things that contingently fail to be actual. Moreover, because worlds and their inhabitants are all concrete for Lewis, there are, necessarily, no non-concrete things and, hence, ipso facto, necessarily, there are no contingently non-concrete things; that is, on Lewis’s understanding of contingency, there is no world in which something fails to be concrete but, in some other world, has a concrete counterpart. Hence, he is also an actualist in the sense of ActC which, as noted, is independent of the bi-modal conception.[95]

Unfortunately, things often get a bit murky in discussions of Lewis because, as noted in thesis 5, he does not use the word “actual” to indicate the mode of being that we enjoy (and that, according to the classical possibilist, some things do not) but, rather, to indicate this world and its inhabitants. And, of course, Lewis believes there are many things that are not actual in this sense, many things that only exist in other worlds—which things he labels possibilia, their existing as robustly and in the same sense as we notwithstanding. And that of course is why Lewis is often said to be a possibilist.

We can express Lewis’s brand of possibilism formally by extending the language \(\scrL_\Box\) to a language \(\scrL^{+}_\Box\) with two “outer” quantifiers \(\Pi\) and \(\Sigma\), that is, quantifiers ranging unrestrictedly over everything in every world of the Lewisian universe (Hazen 1976: §4). The usual quantifiers, as in standard possible world semantics, will be restricted to the world(s) introduced by the given modal context (= the actual world in non-modal contexts). With this additional apparatus we can define an actuality predicate that, at each world, will be true of exactly the things that exist in that world and thus reflect the idea that “actual” is an indexical:

\(\sfA!_{\exists}\sfx \eqdf \exists \sfy\, \sfy=\sfx\)

Lewis’s brand of possibilism can now be expressed formally as the thesis that there are (unrestrictedly) things that are not actual in the given sense but which could have been:

\(\Sigma \sfx (\neg \sfA!_{\exists}\sfx \land \Diamond \sfA!_{\exists}\sfx)\)

As we can now clearly see, the claim “There are things that are not actual but which could have been” in Lewis’s mouth—formally, Poss\(_{\sfA!_{\exists}}\)—does not express what it does for the classical possibilist—formally, Poss\(_{\sfA!}.\) For Lewis, actuality is relational—it is a property one thing has relative to another just in case they are both parts of the same world. Hence, the fact that there are things that fail to be actual in his sense, i.e., actual relative to me (say), is no more ontologically significant than the fact that, say, there are things that fail to be within five meters of me. Non-actual objects in Lewis’s sense are no different, ontologically, from actual objects; they are simply not here (in the broadest possible sense). But, in the context of the possibilism-actualism debate, the difference between actual and merely possible objects is not simply a difference in relative location, it is an absolute, qualitative difference, regardless of whether this is understood in terms of modes of being or concreteness. Hence, Lewis’s relativized distinction between the actual and the merely possible does not correspond to “what is at stake in the actualism–possibilism debate” (Williamson 2013: 22). See Linsky and Zalta 1991 for related discussion.

However, in an important 2006 paper, Phillip Bricker pointed out that a seemingly minor but arguably essential amendment to Lewis’s metaphysics yields an unambiguously possibilist variant. To motivate the amendment, Bricker argues as follows:

I take it to be conceptually evident that actuality is absolute, not relative, and that, moreover, the distinction between the actual and the merely possible is a distinction in ontological status: whatever is ontologically of the same fundamental kind as something actual is itself actual. When Lewis insists, then, that all worlds are ontologically on a par, I can only understand this—his protests notwithstanding—as saying that all worlds are equally actual. But that makes Lewis’s defense of a plurality of worlds incoherent. For there could be no good a priori reasons for believing in a plurality of actual concrete worlds. And an analysis of modal operators as quantifiers over concrete parts of actuality, no matter how extensive actuality may be, is surely mistaken. (2006: 41–2)

Bricker’s response to this “conceptually evident” observation is not to abandon Lewis’s plurality of worlds but (in effect) to supplement it with the thesis that actuality is a distinct, primitive property that exactly one world—ours, of course—possesses.[96] Moreover, on Bricker’s amendment, the actual world is only contingently actual (2006: §IV); other worlds than ours could have been actual. The resulting thesis, which Bricker calls Leibnizian realism, is a fully robust form of classical possibilism in the sense of Poss: there are things that are contingently non-actual, i.e., things that fail to be actual but could have been. However, this is a philosophical modification only; no formal modifications are required. Rather, as suggested by McDaniel (2009: §2, esp. pp. 302ff), the inner quantifiers can be understood, not simply as semantically restricted, but as expressing absolute actuality, a “fundamentally different” way of being than that exhibited by things that are not, in fact, actual but only could have been.[97]

As Bricker agrees with Lewis that the inhabitants of all worlds are concrete, the Leibnizian realist appears not to be a possibilist in the sense of PossC: if there are no worlds in which anything is non-concrete, then there is ipso facto nothing that is contingently non-concrete.[98] However, since worlds do not overlap, nothing in a non-actual world is concrete in the actual world; and this permits a modest modification of PossC that yields a clear sense on which the Leibnizian realist accepts the existence of contingently non-concrete things:

There are possibilia, that is, things that are not actually concrete but which could have been concrete

that is, formally:

\(\Sigma \sfx(\neg (\sfA!_{\exists}\sfx \land \sfC!\sfx) \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx)\)

Its denial in turn yields what would seem to be the only conceivable form of actualism in the context of Leibnizian realism, viz.,

\(\neg\Sigma \sfx(\neg (\sfA!_{\exists}\sfx \land \sfC!\sfx) \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx)\)

which, in effect, says that there is only the one actual world.[99]

Copyright © 2022 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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