Notes to The Possibilism-Actualism Debate
1. In free climbing one uses ropes and other safety gear solely to prevent one from falling to one’s death in case of a slip, but never as an aid in actual climbing—and free climbing difficult routes typically involves many arrested falls along the way. All that is required for the climb to be counted as a success is that each portion of the route (however subdivided) is successfully climbed unaided. By contrast, in free soloing, one climbs without any safety gear and, hence, a successful climb must be essentially flawless—the most famous example unquestionably being Alex Honnold’s ascent of the Free Rider route up El Capitan, as documented in the academy award winning movie Free Solo. The Dawn Wall was successfully free climbed by Tommy Caldwell and Kevin Jorgeson in 2015. Between them, they slipped off the wall many times on several of the most difficult pitches. Rather famously, in the most difficult pitch, Jorgeson fell eleven times over eight days before finally succeeding on what was quite likely to be his final attempt.
2. See Kripke 1972 and Forbes 1985, ch. 6, for detailed arguments. These arguments are summarized in the document “Arguments for Origin Essentialism”, which is a supplement to the entry on essential vs. accidental properties. Note that the idea here is simply to supply a plausible example of a true statement of the form “Possibly, something is F” where, intuitively, no actually existing thing could be F. Readers skeptical of the essentiality of ancestry can substitute an example they find more compelling.
3. A potential actualist move is worth addressing here. One might argue that, in fact, there is a straightforward way to account for (2) on actualist grounds. A widely-accepted contemporary metaphysical belief is that, for every set of objects, there exists the mereological sum consisting of exactly those objects. Given this, there are surely actual mereological sums of atoms that could have constituted children of Bergoglio. Hence, there is no need to postulate possibilia to provide truth conditions for the likes of (2). However, this objection misses the point. The general intuition that we are attempting to isolate with (2) is that
- (\(*)\)
- There could have been things other than the things that actually exist.
All that the actualist move just noted succeeds in showing is that perhaps (2) doesn’t entail (\(*)\). But it does not succeed in accounting for the intuition that (\(*)\) is true. For suppose we accept the proposed mereological gambit, i.e., that certain mereological sums of actual atoms could have been one of Bergoglio’s children. Is it not still the case that there could have been different atoms (or quarks or whatever basic building blocks you choose) than there are in fact? Indeed, is it not logically possible that the universe could have been composed of entirely different stuff altogether? If so, then the actualist still needs to account for (\(*)\).
Two further problems with the mereological gambit are worth noting. First, the fundamental premise of the gambit—that any collection of atoms constitutes a further physical object—is far from uncontroversial. Second, perhaps more seriously, it seems quite clear that no instance of a physical natural kind like a human being is identical with any given mereological sum of atoms, as the two have different temporal and modal profiles. (For an in-depth discussion of the first problem see the entry on mereology, especially §4; and for the second problem see the entry on material constitution.)
4. The choice of “bi-modal conception” here is not meant to rule out the prospect of further modes of being of the sort detailed in McDaniel 2017. See Turner 2010 for a robust defense of McDaniel’s “ontological pluralism” and van Inwagen 2014 for a skeptical critique.
5. Although actuality and mere possibility are not always explicitly characterized as distinct modes of being, that actualism is at root simply the denial of possibilism as per Poss and Act is at the core of the modern debate. While not entirely uniform in their terminology, the following quotes are representative.
I am an actualist. I deny that there are any mere possibilia, and instead insist that everything that exists actually exists. (Bennett 2006: 263)
Actualism is the thesis that everything is actual, that there are no non-actual things. Possibilism is its denial, the thesis that there are. (Curtis & Noonan 2021: 2)
It has seemed to me almost axiomatic that there is an intelligible distinction between what is necessary and what is contingent and that there is an ontological difference between actual objects and merely possible objects—between actual people and actual cities on the one hand, and merely possible people and merely possible cities on the other. We might call someone who takes modality seriously a modalist and someone who takes actuality seriously an actualist. My position is therefore a form of modal actualism. (Fine 2005: 2)
Actualism is the metaphysical position that everything that exists, exists at the actual world; there are no merely possible objects—objects that are possible but do not exist at the actual world. Possibilism is the position that there are merely possible objects. (Fitch 1996: 53)
An actualist identifies the realm of existence with what is actual, while a possibilist holds that in a more fundamental sense of ‘exists’, non-actual objects (‘merely possible’ objects) are among the existents. (Forbes 1985: 73–4)
I also advocate actualism, the view that everything that is, in any coherent sense of ‘is’, is actual. According to actualism there are no merely possible things, things that do not exist but somehow manage to subsist or have some alternative kind of being. (Hanson 2018: 234)
Actualism and possibilism are opposing views in the metaphysics of modality. In a nutshell, actualists believe that everything is actual, where ‘everything’ is completely unrestricted. Possibilists, on the other hand, think that besides the actual things, there are some merely possible things. (Kimpton-Nye 2021: 342)
[T]here are…two parts to the actualist thesis: (1) treating the quantifier as existentially loaded, and (2) rejecting the hypothesis that there exist possible but nonactual objects. (Linsky & Zalta 1994: 436)
Actualism is the view that there are in general no nonactual objects, and in particular no nonactual possible objects. (McMichael 1983: 73)
Rather than being Actualists, who believe: There is nothing except what actually exists, we ought, I have claimed, to be Possibilists, who believe: There are some things that are merely possible. (Parfit 2011: 719)
A possibile would be a thing that does not exist although it could have….[Possibilism is] the ontological claim that while indeed there are such things, they do not exist….Actualism is the view that there neither are nor could have been any entities that do not exist. (Plantinga 1987: 196)
Actualism is the view that everything that there is is actual, i.e., actually exists. Actualism thus opposes possibilism, the view that there are mere possibilia, entities that do not actually exist but that could have existed. (Rimell forthcoming: 4)
Actualism is the view according to which there are no nonactual, merely possible individuals. Its dual, possibilism, is the view according to which besides actual individuals there are merely possible individuals, individuals such as additional human beings to those who have appeared at some point or other in the history of the world. (Simchen 2006: 8–9)
[A]ccording to actualism, there are no merely possible individuals. (Stalnaker 2003: 126)
Actualism…is minimally the view that there are no objects that do not actually exist. (Tomberlin 1996: 263)
BF and BFC [i.e., the Barcan formula and its converse, respectively] are often discussed in relation to the actualist thesis that everything exists (everything actually exists)….If possibilia are what could exist, then the anti-actualist can defend BF and BFC by positing non-existent possibilia and quantifying over existent and non-existent possibilia. Given actualism, there are no non-existent possibilia to be quantified over. (Williamson 1998: 258–9)
[A]ctualism is the thesis that the domain of unrestricted quantification ranges over all and only actual existents. A corollary is the thesis that there are no merely possible individuals. (Woodward 2011: 155)
6. Fragment 7. Unsurprisingly, the interpretation of this passage is controversial; some (e.g., Palmer 2009: 125) take it to be a reference simply to the changeable nature of sensible things—that they are capable of being F at one time and not-F at another. Coxon, notably, argues strenuously against this interpretation:
The phrase εἶναι μὴ ἐόντα [“things to be that are not”] refers therefore not to the ambiguous being of sensible things (fr. 5, 8) but to the supposition that there are μὴ ἐόντα [“things that are not”], which could divide Being from itself. The emphatic pronoun σὺ [“you”] shows that some philosophers followed this “way”, i.e. asserted the reality of something with no being (sc. empty space). (2009: 309)
7. Translation by M. Adams (1987: 1068) from Avicenna 1926, Book I, Part 2, tractatus 6.
8. For Giles of Rome, see his Theoremata de Esse et Essentia [1953: 61–7]; for Henry of Ghent, see Wippel 1982: 403–404 and De Rijk 2005: 81; for Scotus, see Wolter 2003: 137–138; for Ockham, see M. Adams 1977 (esp. p. 147); and for Suarez, see Doyle 1967.
9. See, e.g., Cottrell 2018 for an illuminating discussion of Hume on intentionality. There was a good bit of discussion of the ground of possibility in the modern period, of course, most notably by Descartes and Leibniz, but abstract essences of one ilk or another rather than possibilia were typically taken to provide the ground in question (see, e.g., Brown 2008: 198–202 and R. Adams 1994: 13–14). Stang (2016: ch. 2) argues that, in fact, both Descartes and Leibniz were committed to unactualized possibilia, in the sense that their clearly held views entailed that there are such things, but neither was clearly explicit about embracing them. Indeed, Cunning (2018: §4) provides strong textual evidence for the claim that Descartes explicitly rejected them (his commitment to them, if Stang is correct, notwithstanding).
10. Notably Rusnock and George (2014), translators of all four volumes of Bolzano’s monumental Wissenschaftslehre (Bolzano 1837 [2014]).
11. Regarding the choice of “actual” to translate “wirklich”, Schnieder points out:
The German adjective “wirklich” is related to a family of words which are explicitly causal notions, such as the noun “Wirkung”, which means “effect,” the adjective “wirksam”, which means “effectual,” or the verb “wirken”; being derived from the causal verb “to act”, the English adjective “actual” behaves somewhat similarly in this respect. (2007: 526)
12. Meinong contrasted ordinary properties from non-ordinary (außerkonstitutorische) theoretical properties like existing, being an ordinary property, etc. Since Parsons 1980 this is usually referred to as the distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties. The distinction is reasonably intuitive but also theoretically important, as Rapaport (1978) showed that an injudicious appeal to extra-nuclear properties in the context of Meinongian-style object theories leads quickly to paradox.
13. See Simons 2013 for a detailed account of Meinong’s conception of modality. There are hints that Meinong gave some thought to possibilia, e.g., 1899: 198, but it appears he never elaborated.
14. That Meinong accepted Bolzano’s division of being into Wirklichkeit and Bestand is particularly clear in the following passage:
…[P]ure mathematical knowledge is never concerned with anything that is essentially actual (wirklich). The form of being (Sein) that mathematics is concerned with is never existence (Existenz). In this respect, mathematics never transcends subsistence (Bestand): a straight line exists no more than does a right angle; a regular polygon, no more than a circle. (1904b: 6, author’s translation)
15. See Meinong 1904b [1960]. Meinong did in fact toy with the idea of assigning a type of “quasi-being” (Quasisein) to his being-less objects (Nichtseiende) but rejected the idea roundly in his mature work (1904b: §4; see also Perszyk 1993: §2.4, and Jacquette 2001). See Chisholm 1973 for an early attempt to make sense of Meinong’s doctrine of Außersein, and Priest 2005 and Berto 2013 for logically and philosophically rigorous, sophisticated contemporary versions of Meinongianism. Priest in particular goes farther than Meinong in taking basically everything non-concrete—possibilia, fictional creatures, and mathematical objects alike—to lack being in any sense.
16. The quoted expressions are from Russell 1903, p. vii, but Russell’s use of “actual” and its cognates to refer to the spatio-temporal universe and its denizens is pervasive throughout the book.
17. Russell was particularly skeptical of modality in The Principles of Mathematics:
[T]here seems to be no true proposition of which there is any sense in saying that it might have been false. One might as well say that redness might have been a taste and not a colour. What is true, is true; what is false, is false; and concerning fundamentals there is nothing more to be said. (1903: 454)
Again, in Russell 1904b, while acknowledging that there might be legitimate epistemic modalities, he dismisses the idea of non-trivial logical modalities outright:
I should myself maintain that, in an ultimate logical sense—i.e., when all reference to our ignorance is excluded—all propositions are merely true or false. I should not now divide true propositions into necessary and contingent, or false propositions into impossible and possible. (1904b: 592–3)
See also Russell 1904a: 208–9. Granted, Russell is expressing skepticism about modal propositions, not possibilia, but it is reasonable to infer from his inability to make sense of the idea of a contingently false proposition that he would not have been able to make sense of the idea of a contingently non-existent object. For a comprehensive study of Russell’s view on modality throughout his career, see Baldwin 2017.
18. The word “actual” and its cognates had of course long been part of common English but it wasn’t really until C. I. Lewis and Rudolf Carnap that it was used to distinguish actually existing things from non-actual. Specifically, Lewis draws a distinction between “actual or existent” entities and those that are merely possible and proposes that the latter can be the referents of singular terms and included in the semantic analysis of names and predicates:
When it is desirable to refer to whatever a term would correctly name or apply to, whether existent or not, we shall speak of a classification instead of a class, and of the comprehension of the term. The comprehension of a term is, thus, the classification of all consistently thinkable things to which the term would correctly apply…. (1943: 238)
Moreover, he clearly conceives of possibilia as objects existing at other “Leibnitzian possible worlds”, a notion that he evidently took seriously:
This conception of possible world is not jejune: the actual world, so far as anyone knows it, is merely one of many such which are possible. (1943: 243)
Carnap (1947: §16), in comparing and contrasting his own modal semantics with Lewis’s, is more explicit about classifying Lewis’s non-existent but consistently conceivable things as “nonactual but possible objects” (1947: 66).
19. Quine (1948: 23) explicitly introduces “subsistence” to refer to the variety of being exhibited by Wyman’s mere possibilia: “Existence is one thing, [Wyman] says, subsistence is another”. In his own voice, of course, Quine harshly criticized Wyman’s terminology as “an ill-conceived effort to appear agreeable,” as it enabled Wyman to
preserv[e] an illusion of agreement [about the non-existence of Pegasus] between himself and us who repudiate the rest of his bloated universe.
20. The idea that abstract objects exist (rather than merely subsist) was not unprecedented among even American philosophers. Jared Sparks Moore (1927: 102) attributed the view to Alvin Thalheimer (1918)—although, interestingly, Moore appears to have been wrong about that; e.g., Thalheimer writes:
For me “existence” and “reality” are synonymous. The entities that exist are just those that are real. When I am defining “existence,” consequently, I am at the same time defining reality. Now, an entity to be real and existent, as I choose to use these terms, must be in time and space. (1918 [1920: 102])
Moore’s claim is doubly puzzling insofar as he even quotes Thalheimer’s assertion that a “definite position in time and space” is essential to existence (1918 [1920: 102]). That said, pages 15–16 of Thalheimer’s work (which Moore in fact references) do suggest that he acknowledged a broader notion of “absolute existence” that encompasses abstracta and concreta alike.
21. Williams (1959: 203) appears to be the first to have used the noun “actualism” for a view that rejected possibilia (and, more generally, all metaphysical entities purportedly exhibiting some lesser mode of being) and counted abstracta as actual alongside concreta:
The definitive principle of actualism is that the world is composed wholly of actual or factual entities, including concreta like a horse and abstracta like his neigh, and the sums and sets thereof, all on the one plane of particular and definite existents.
A horse’s neigh (i.e., an actual neigh emitted at a given time) might not be a quintessential abstract entity but Williams was a trope theorist and thought of the tropes constituting a concrete individual as “abstract particulars”. See, e.g., Williams 1953 (pp. 8ff). Note he also accepted that there are sets of abstract particulars and, hence, also included more familiar varieties abstracta into his ontology.
22. See also Williamson (2013: §1.3). As Williamson notes (2013: 12, note 19), this understanding of “merely possible F” is basically Bolzano’s—see Schnieder’s (2007: §3.1) compelling exposition of Bolzano on this point. Williamson himself takes it to be analytic that a merely possible F is not an F, but this doesn’t seem obvious across the board. It certainly holds for actually existing things x—the Pope is a merely possible father but obviously not a merely possible priest. However, his possible children, according to the typical possibilist, are merely possible beings, or merely possible objects. So these appear to be cases where an object x might be both a merely possible F and an F.
23. See, e.g., Prior 1957 (presciently); Plantinga 1976; Fine 1977; R. Adams 1981; Zalta 1983; Tomberlin & McGuinness 1994; Fitch 1996; Bennett 2005, 2006; Simchen 2006; Schnieder 2007; Woodward 2011; Parfit 2011 (Appendix J); Menzel 2020; and Warmke 2021.
24. See Menzel 2020 for an extended defense of the possibilism-actualism distinction in response to Williamson’s critique, as well as an assessment of Williamson’s proposed alternative. Curtis and Noonan (2021) offer a similar response to Williamson.
25. Linsky and Zalta do not themselves characterize their take on the issue as the dissolution of the possibilism-actualism distinction.
26. Linsky and Zalta 1994: 431: “Though we are possibilists, … ”.
27. The quote is from a very insightful discussion of the divide between the bimodal conception and the alternatives of Linsky & Zalta (1994) and Williamson (2013) found in footnote 26 (p. 125) of Cameron 2016.
28. The latter is trivial. To see the former, note that, formalized as Poss\(_{\sfA !}\), Poss is equivalent to \(\exists \sfx \neg(\sfA!\sfx \lor \Box\neg \sfA!\sfx)\). But note that, under A!Def, \(\Box\neg \sfA!\sfx\) is logically contradictory. For, unpacking \(\sfA!\sfx\), we have \(\Box\neg(\sfC!\sfx\vee\Box\neg \sfC!\sfx)\) and by De Morgan’s law (and the standard definition of the possibility operator \(\Diamond\)) we have \(\Box(\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx)\), which, in the basic modal logic T (described §3.2), is equivalent to \(\Box\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \Box\Diamond \sfC!\sfx\), which (in T) entails \(\Box\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx\), i.e., \(\Box\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \neg\Box\neg \sfC!\sfx\). So \(\exists \sfx \neg(\sfA!\sfx\vee\Box\neg \sfA!\sfx)\) is equivalent simply to \(\exists \sfx \neg \sfA!\sfx\), i.e., under A!Def, \(\exists \sfx \neg(\sfC!\sfx \lor \Box\neg \sfC!\sfx)\), which is equivalent to \(\exists \sfx (\neg \sfC!\sfx \land \Diamond \sfC!\sfx)\), i.e., the formalization Poss\(_{\sfC!}\) of Poss_{C}.
29. More accurately, possible world semantics generalizes contemporary model theory for classical logic, which, while unquestionably arising out of Tarski’s work, only first took its contemporary form in the mid-1950s, notably in Kemeny 1956a/b. See Hodges 1986.
30. We identify the 1-tuple \(\langle a \rangle\) simply with \(a\) so that, in the case of a 1-place predicate \(\pi\), \(\pi^\calI \subseteq D\). The account here differs from most modern accounts in that our Tarskian interpretations do not distinguish semantically between individual constants and variables; rather, given an interpretation \(\calI\), both are assigned semantic values in the universe \(D\) of \(\calI\). More commonly, an interpretation only provides semantic values for the non-logical symbols of a language; truth in an interpretation is then defined for formulas relative to a given assignment of values to the variables. (See §4 of the entry on classical logic for details.) Folding variable assignments into interpretations, as we’ve done here, simplifies the definitions of truth and logical consequence considerably.
31. There is of course also a proof-theoretic conception of a logic on which a logic is a formal language together with a deductive apparatus. However, the emphasis here on truth conditions makes the semantic conception preferable for present purposes. For more on this topic, see the entry on classical logic.
32. Roughly put, a natural language predicate is the result of uniformly replacing one or more occurrences of one or more names in a declarative sentence with variables or other placeholders.
33. The basic framework of possible world semantics sketched in this entry can be traced most clearly back to the work of Carnap (1946, 1947), which culminated in the work of Hintikka (1957, 1961), Bayart (1958, 1959), and Kripke (1959, 1963a, 1963b). See Copeland 2002 and 2006 for detailed historical studies.
34. Recall that we are identifying a 1-tuple a with its single member a. So a set of 1-tuples of members of D is just a subset of D.
35. By “sufficiently comprehensive” we simply mean a set that is large enough for \(\calM\) to yield intuitively correct truth conditions for the formulas of \(\scrL_\Box\). That there will always be such a set is problematic if the intended domain should have to include all possible individuals. Notably, Nolan (1996) and Sider (2009) have provide compelling arguments showing that David Lewis and Timothy Williamson (respectively) are committed to more possibilia (in their respective senses) than can constitute sets in standard Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, modified to accommodate urelements. (See Menzel 2014 for a generalization of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory on which such “over-sized” pluralities can still constitute sets.) An adaptation of a (further) paradox discovered by Russell (1903: Appendix B) appears to show that, given a fine-grained conception of propositions, there cannot be a set of all truths and, hence, a set of all worlds (see Grim 1984, 1986; Menzel 1986, 2012). And Kaplan (1995) uncovers a paradox inherent in the assumption (a) that there is a set of all worlds and (b) that propositions are sets of worlds.
36. It is typically built into the notion of a proof theory that its axioms and inference rules are decidable, that is, that there is an effective method for distinguishing axioms from non-axioms and for determining that a given rule has been applied. As a consequence, a proof theory should yield a method that enables one (in principle) to list (formally: recursively enumerate) the theorems of the system.
37. The acronym “SQML” itself is mostly due to Linsky and Zalta (1994), although they call their logic “the simplest QML” without ever folding in the “S”. However, their system is weaker (and, in the sense below at least, less simple) than the one presented here, since their notion of an interpretation includes an accessibility relation on worlds. That addition (with corresponding changes to the modal clause in the definition of truth at a world) invalidates schemas T and 5 of the deductive system SQML presented here. Accordingly, the deductive system for their logic (in effect) replaces those schemas with the Barcan Formula (schema BF discussed in the following section), which is valid in their model theory (and in SQML, although it is derivable in SQML). Williamson (1998) defines a system that is equivalent to the one here, which he describes as “the simplest and strongest sensible quantified modal logic” but, instead of calling it “SQML” (or “SASSQML”!), he calls it (more descriptively but rather less joyously) “LPC=S5”. (“LPC=” stands for lower predicate calculus with identity, another common name for what we are calling “FOL”.)
The claim that S5 is the least complicated propositional modal logic needs a bit of qualification. As it is usually presented, S5 is in fact semantically more complicated than many weaker systems, since it has stronger conditions on the accessibility relation on worlds (see §§7–8 of the entry on modal logic). However, it is well-known that its logical consequence relation is unchanged if conditions on accessibility are eliminated entirely, as in the presentation here (see, e.g., Hughes & Cresswell 1996: 61–2). So presented, S5 is in that sense simpler than any modal logic that is defined in terms of an accessibility relation.
38. Strictly speaking, there is no such thing as the deductive system for a given logic, as there are always infinitely many alternatives that yield the same theorems and there are often several that are equally elegant and convenient. We will ignore this subtlety here and simply choose systems that are in wide use.
39. A modal logic is normal if it includes all the theorems of K. Thus, T, S4, and S5 are all normal modal logics.
40. B is an immediate tautological consequence of \(\textbf{T}_{\Diamond}\) and 5. Schema 4 is demonstrated as follows:
1. | \(\Box\varphi \to \Diamond\Box\varphi\) | \(\textbf{T}_{\Diamond}\) |
2. | \(\Diamond\Box\varphi \to \Box\Diamond\Box\varphi\) | 5 |
3. | \(\Box\varphi \to \Box\Diamond\Box\varphi\) | 1, 2, PL |
4. | \(\Diamond\Box\varphi \to \Box\varphi\) | \(\textbf{5}_{\Diamond}\) |
5. | \(\Box(\Diamond\Box\varphi \to \Box\varphi)\) | 4, Nec |
6. | \(\Box\Diamond\Box\varphi \to \Box\Box\varphi\) | 5, K, MP |
7. | \(\Box\varphi \to \Box\Box\varphi\) | 3, 6, PL |
41. An occurrence of a term \(\tau\) in a formula \(\varphi\) is free if \(\tau\) is either an individual constant or that occurrence of \(\tau\) is not in the scope of a quantifier of the form \(\forall\tau\); if an occurrence of \(\tau\) in \(\varphi\) is not free, it is said to be bound. One term \(\tau'\) is substitutable for another \(\tau\) in \(\varphi\) just in case \(\tau'\) is a constant or \(\tau'\) is a variable and no occurrence of \(\tau\) is within the scope of a quantifier of the form \(\forall\tau'\). The idea, of course is that, if \(\tau\) is a variable, no occurrence of \(\tau\) should become bound after replacing a free occurrence of \(\tau'\).
42. Suppose \(\psi\) and \(\nu\) are as in Gen* and that \(\psi_1,\ldots,\psi_{n-1}, \psi\) is a proof of \(\psi\). We can suppose without any loss of generality that \(\nu\) does not occur anywhere in the proof (since, if it did, we could replace all occurrences of \(\nu\) with a variable that doesn’t occur in the proof and the result would also be a proof of \(\psi\)). It is easy to show that \((\psi_1)^\kappa_\nu, \ldots, (\psi_{n-1})^\kappa_\nu,\psi^\kappa_\nu\) is a proof of \(\psi^\kappa_\nu\). Hence, by Gen, we have \(\forall\nu\psi^\kappa_\nu\).
43. The Barcan Formula (more accurately, of course, the Barcan schema) is named after Ruth Barcan Marcus, the first logician to study the principle explicitly (Barcan 1946). The principle is often expressed in the equivalent form \(\forall \nu\Box \varphi \to \Box\forall \nu\varphi\), which follows immediately from BF, the standard definitions of \(\exists\) and \(\Diamond\), and a bit of propositional logic.
44. An exactly parallel argument with respect to the semantics of the necessity operator \(\Box\) and the universal quantifiers \(\forall\nu\) can of course be given for the validity of the equivalent form of the Barcan Formula mentioned in the preceding note.
45. The de re/de dicto distinction traces back to Aristotle (see Nortmann 2002) and was a matter of robust discussion in the medieval period (see the entry on medieval theories of modality). There are a number of formal definitions of the distinction in the literature but for purposes here the following will do: a formula \(\varphi\) exhibits de re modality if there is a subformula of \(\varphi\) (which might be \(\varphi\) itself) of the form \(\Box\psi\) or \(\Diamond\psi\) in which there is either an individual constant or a free occurrence of a variable; otherwise, \(\varphi\) exhibits de dicto modality. Thus, the modality of (our formalization of) (2), \(\Diamond\exists \sfx\sfB\sfx\), is de dicto whereas that of (4), \(\exists \sfx\Diamond \sfB\sfx\), is de re. A rather more interesting example of de re modality is seen in the formula \(\Box\forall \sfx(\neg \sfA!\sfx \to \Box\neg \sfA!\sfx)\) expressing, intuitively, that anything that fails to be actual in one world fails to be actual in all other worlds as well. (This is equivalent to the formula \(\textbf{Act}_{\sfA !}\) expressing actualism.) Informally put, then, the difference between de dicto propositions and de re is that the latter, and only the latter, require one to consider the properties that individuals in one world exemplify in other worlds (or, for the Lewisian, the properties that counterparts of individuals exemplify in other worlds).
46. The detour through CBF to get to \(\Box\)N was of course unnecessary—one can reason directly to \(\Box\)N in virtue of the unrestricted range of the quantifiers at every world and the fact that every object is identical to itself at every world. And it can be proved directly in SQML from Id1, Q2, Nec, Gen, and \(\exists\)Def.
47. There is a supplemental philosophical argument for necessitism that can be brought to bear here well. While, as noted, there is nothing inconsistent in the idea of a possibile utterly failing to be, the idea is exceedingly odd. For what contingent facts could have made it the case that, for a given possibile a, instead of it simply failing to be actual, there was no such thing as a at all? Many things can intuitively account for a merely possible object failing to be actual, e.g., the failure of two persons to meet who might otherwise have had children together. But what relevant, substantive difference distinguishes worlds in which a fails to be actual from those in which a fails altogether to be? No substantive answer is forthcoming; it would have to be taken as an inexplicable brute fact. For the possibilist, therefore, mere possibilia are most naturally taken to be necessary beings.
48. Because Kripke does not introduce D up front but rather defines it to be the union of the domains and domains can be empty, it is consistent with Kripke’s 1963 definition of an interpretation (1963b: 84–7) that every domain and, hence, D is empty. But this would render his definition of truth ill-defined, as that definition assumes that, in every interpretation, it is possible to assign values to all the variables. Compare, e.g., Fine’s (1978: 128) definition of a Kripke-style notion of interpretation in which he stipulates that at least one world of an interpretation has a non-empty domain. This stipulation is unnecessary in the definition here since it follows from the fact that D is already stipulated to be non-empty and exactly the union of the world domains.
49. More rigorously expressed, the issue here is the logical status of the general principle of (monadic) λ-conversion—\(\varphi^\nu_\tau \leftrightarrow [\lambda\nu\,\varphi]\tau \)—in modal contexts, where \([\lambda\nu\,\varphi]\) is a complex predicate signifying the property expressed by \(\varphi\). Specifically, it concerns the validity of (notably) the necessitated instance
\(\Box(\neg\exists \sfy\ \sfy=\sfa \leftrightarrow [\lambda \sfx\, \neg\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx]\sfa)\)
from which it follows that
\(\Diamond \neg\exists \sfy\ \sfy=\sfa \leftrightarrow \Diamond[\lambda \sfx\, \neg\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx]\sfa \)
Assuming that \(\sfa\) is contingent (so that the left side is true) the left-to-right direction here is inconsistent with serious actualism, since it follows that \(\sfa\) has the property \([\lambda \sfx\, \neg\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx]\) of non-existence at some world (its non-existence there notwithstanding). The serious actualist thus has to put restrictions on λ-conversion or on the principle of necessitation (in lieu of more extreme measures still). See Stalnaker & Thomason 1968; Thomason & Stalnaker 1968; Menzel 1993; and Fitting & Mendelsohn 1998 (chapters 9 and 10) for further discussion of the interplay between complex predicates and modality.
50. A central issue in the dispute is whether actualism entails serious actualism. Plantinga himself (1979: §III) initially argued that it does, although he later recanted, pointing out the “flocculent thinking” (1983: 12) of his earlier argument. He was not, however, persuaded by the arguments of Fine (1985) and Pollock (1985) against the entailment, which he also considered unsound and, indeed, in his 1985 reply to Pollock (Plantinga 1985: 316–325), he reverted to his original position, arguing anew that actualism does indeed entail serious actualism after all (1985: 319). Bergmann (1996) proffers a new argument for the entailment, which led to a subsequent exchange between Hudson (1997) and Bergmann (1999). See also Yagisawa 2005 for an argument against serious actualism and the reply by Stephanou 2007 (pp. 244ff). Menzel (1993: 141–2) suggests that the controversy conflates metaphysical and logical issues.
51. The preceding demonstration in the text of the invalidity of BF is of course informal and invalidity is a formal notion: a formula is invalid in KQML if there is a Kripke interpretation in which it is not true. It might be useful to demonstrate this formally for the formula
\(\Diamond\exists \sfx \sfB\sfx \to \exists \sfx\Diamond \sfB\sfx.\)
A moment’s reflection reveals that all we need is a single individual \(c\) and one additional world \(w\) other than the “actual” world \(w^\ast\). (Formally, of course, \(c,\) \(w,\) and \(w^\ast\) can be any three objects.) Specifically, then, for our desired interpretation \(\calK\), we let \(D = \{c\},\) \(W = \{w^\ast,w\},\) where \(\textit{dom}(w) = \{c\}\) and \(\textit{dom}(w^\ast) = \varnothing;\) and to interpret the predicate \(\sfB,\) we let \(\sfB_w^{\calK} = \{c\};\) the value of \(\sfB_{w^\ast}^{\calK}\) doesn’t matter (unless one imposes the serious actualism condition, in which case we should have to have \(\sfB_{w^\ast}^{\calK} = \varnothing.\)) Applying KQML’s clauses for truth at a world, it is easy to see that the antecedent of our conditional is true at \(w^\ast\) but that the consequent is false there: at \(w^\ast\), there is a world, viz., \(w,\) in whose domain something, viz., \(c\), is in the extension of \(\sfB;\) so \(\Diamond\exists \sfx \sfB\sfx\) is true at \(w^\ast.\) But, as \(\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) is empty, there is ipso facto nothing in \(w^\ast\)’s domain that is in the extension of \(\sfB\) at any world; so \(\exists \sfx\Diamond \sfB\sfx\) is false there.
52. More formally demonstrated, consider the following simple interpretation \(\calI\) for \(\scrL_\Box\): let \(D = \{c\}\), \(W = \{w^\ast,w\}\), and let \(\textit{dom}(w^\ast) = \{c\}\) and \(\textit{dom}(w) = \varnothing\). It should be obvious that N is false in \(\calI\), as \(c\) exists in the “actual world” \(w^\ast\) of \(\calI\) but not in \(w\). However, it might be useful to verify this by stepping through the truth conditional clauses for KQML:
- iff \(\forall \sfx\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) is \(\text{true}_{w^\ast}^{\calI}\)
- iff for all \(a\in\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\), \(\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) is \(\text{true}_{w^\ast}^{\calI[\frac{\sfx}{a}]}\)
- iff, for all \(a\in\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) and for all worlds \(u\in W\), \(\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) is \(\text{true}_{u}^{\calI[\frac{\sfx}{a}]}\)
- iff, for all \(a\in\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) and for all worlds \(u\in W\) and for some \(b\in dom(u)\), \(\sfx=\sfy\) is \(\text{true}_{u}^{\calI[\frac{\sfx}{a}][\frac{\sfy}{b}]}\),
- i.e., iff, for all \(a\in\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) and for all worlds \(u\in W\) and for some \(b\in dom(u)\), \(b\) is identical to \(a\),
- i.e., iff, for all \(a\in\textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) and for all worlds \(u\in W\), \(a\in dom(u)\).
But the latter is obviously false for \(a=c\) and \(u=w\), since \(\textit{dom}(w)\) is empty. Hence, \(\forall \sfx\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy\) is not \(\text{true}_{w^\ast}^{\calI},\) i.e., N is not true in \(\calI\).
53. It is worth pointing out that, like BF, the invalidity of CBF in KQML does not depend on instances (like the one in §3.3) involving identity. To see this, suppose our interpretation \(\calI\) in the preceding note also interprets the predicate \(\sfB\) so that \(\sfB_{\sfw^\ast}^\calI = \varnothing\) and \(\sfB_{\sfw}^{\calI} = \{c\}\). It is easy to see that \(\exists \sfx \Diamond \sfB\sfx\) is true at the actual world \(w^\ast\) in \(\calI\) (since there is something that exists in \(w^\ast\), namely \(c\), that is in the extension of \(\sfB\) at some world, namely \(w\) but that \(\Diamond\exists \sfx \sfB\sfx\) is not (since there is no world where something in that world is in the extension of \(\sfB\)). Hence the CBF instance
\(\exists \sfx \Diamond \sfB\sfx \to \Diamond\exists \sfx \sfB\sfx\)
is not true in \(\calI\).
54. The well-known theorem \(\Box(\varphi \to \psi) \to (\Diamond\varphi \to \Diamond\psi)\) of the basic system K appealed to here is proved as follows:
1. | \((\varphi \to \psi) \to (\neg\psi \to \neg\varphi)\) | PL |
2. | \(\Box((\varphi \to \psi) \to (\neg\psi \to \neg\varphi))\) | 1, Nec |
3. | \(\Box(\varphi \to \psi) \to \Box(\neg\psi \to \neg\varphi)\) | 2, K, MP |
4. | \(\Box(\neg\psi \to \neg\varphi) \to (\Box\neg\psi \to \Box\neg\varphi)\) | K |
5. | \((\Box\neg\psi \to \Box\neg\varphi) \to (\neg\Box\neg\varphi \to \neg\Box\neg\psi)\) | PL |
6. | \(\Box(\varphi \to \psi) \to (\neg\Box\neg\varphi \to \neg\Box\neg\psi)\) | 3, 4, 5, PL |
7. | \(\Box(\varphi \to \psi) \to (\Diamond\varphi \to \Diamond\psi)\) | 6, \(\Diamond\)Def |
55. We are relying here on the general theoremhood of
\(\forall\nu(\varphi \to \psi) \to (\varphi \to \forall\nu\psi)\)
in FOL when there are no free occurrences of \(\nu\) in \(\varphi.\)
56. The counter-model to BF in note 51 above also serves as a counter-model to \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx\) if we let \(\sfx^{\calK} = c\).
57. The need for such a modification of Nec also follows independently from the quick proof of \(\Box\textbf{N}\) from Id1 and Q2 alluded to in note 46.
58. In particular, if one simply replaces line 1 in the SQML proof of BF* with its FQ2 counterpart, viz.,
1\('\). | \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to (\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\) | FQ2 |
the first three steps in the argument become:
1. | \(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to (\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\) | FQ2 |
2. | \(\Box(\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to (\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx))\) | 1, Nec |
3. | \(\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Diamond(\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy \to \Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\) | 2, Nec, K, \(\Diamond\)Def, and PL |
Line 3, after a bit of elementary propositional modal logic, leads to
\(\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfx=\sfy \to (\Diamond\forall \sfx \Box \neg \sfB\sfx \to \Diamond\Box \neg \sfB\sfx)\)
i.e., line 3 of the original proof only follows on the assumption that \(\sfx\) is a necessary being. And continuing the original proof from this point under that assumption only leads to the conclusion that BF* holds under the assumption of full necessitism, that is, it is only possible to prove:
\(\Box\forall \sfx \Box\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx \to (\Diamond\exists \sfx \sfB\sfx \to \exists \sfx \Diamond \sfB\sfx)\)
which, of course, we already knew from the validity of BF in the necessitist context of SQML.
59. Williamson’s conception of metaphysical universality (2013: §3.3, §3.6) pushes this idea even farther—to see the fully general logical truths underlying logical truths like (∗), occurrences of definite predicates like “creates” must also be thought of as implicitly universally quantified (second-order) variables:
- (∗∗∗)
- \(\forall \sfF\forall \sfz \forall \sfy(\forall \sfx\,\sfF\sfz\sfx \to \sfF\sfz\sfy)\)
60. Specifically, a typical proof of a non-trivial instance of \(\textbf{CBF}_{\Box}\) in SQML has the following structure:
1. | \(\forall \nu\varphi \to \varphi\) | Q2 |
2. | \(\Box(\forall \nu\varphi \to \varphi)\) | 1, Nec |
3. | \(\Box\forall \nu\varphi \to \Box\varphi\) | 2, K and MP |
4. | \(\forall\nu(\Box\forall \nu\varphi \to \Box\varphi)\) | 3, Gen |
5. | \(\Box\forall \nu\varphi \to \forall\nu\Box\varphi\) | 4, FOL (see note 55) |
However, when we express line 1 “properly” as per KQ2 (assuming \(\nu\) is the only variable occurring free in \(\varphi\)), we have
1. | \(\forall\nu(\forall \nu\varphi \to \varphi)\) | KQ2 |
2. | \(\Box\forall\nu(\forall \nu\varphi \to \varphi)\) | 1, Nec |
and the proof is stalled unless we can move to
2*. | \(\forall\nu\Box(\forall \nu\varphi \to \varphi)\) | 2, \(\textbf{CBF}_{\Box}\) (!), MP |
which, of course, requires exactly the principle we are trying to prove.
61. This might at first sight seem like a significant shortcoming but, taking a further hint from Quine (1948: 27), one can do just as well in Kripke’s framework by introducing dedicated predicates like “Socratizes” that are axiomatized so as to apply essentially and uniquely to specific individuals, e.g.,
\(\Diamond\exists \sfx(\sfS\sfx \land \Box\forall \sfy\Box(\sfS\sfy \leftrightarrow \sfy=\sfx))\)
or, if the serious actualism constraint is assumed,
\(\Diamond\exists \sfx(\sfS\sfx \land \Box\forall \sfy(\sfS\sfy \leftrightarrow \sfy=\sfx))\)
With the help of Hodes’s (1984) “backtracking” operator \(\downarrow\) one could then even introduce, for each such predicate \(\pi\), an individual constant \(\kappa_\pi\) that, intuitively, denotes the unique thing that is (or could be) \(\pi\) and whose use in a given formula \(\varphi^\nu_{\kappa_\pi}\) can be unpacked in terms of \(\Diamond\) and \(\exists\):
\(\varphi^\nu_{\kappa_\pi} \equiv_\textit{df}\ \Diamond\exists \nu(\pi\nu\ \land \downarrow\!\varphi)\)
62. Kripke needs to specify all propositional tautologies here instead of schemas P1–P3 simply because tautologies containing free variables are no longer considered axioms and, hence, are no longer provable. Thus, they simply have to be stipulated en masse as available for closure. (See, e.g., the use of tautologies with free variables in the preceding SQML proof of \(\forall \sfx(\sfF\sfx \to \sfF\sfx)\).)
Strictly speaking, of course, the notion of a propositional tautology is essentially semantic: a formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_\Box\) is a propositional tautology if it is a substitution instance of a tautology of propositional logic; and a tautology of propositional logic is a formula in the language \(\scrL_0\) of propositional logic that is true in all interpretations of \(\scrL_0\) (i.e., true under all assignments of truth values to the propositional variables of \(\scrL_0\)). But the set of tautologies of propositional logic is decidable (e.g., via truth tables or semantic tableaux), so Taut does not undermine the purely proof theoretic nature of KQML.
63. For more discussion of this point see, e.g, Plantinga 1976: §1; Linsky & Zalta 1994: §3; and Menzel 1990: §3.
64. In addition to the serious actualism constraint, Jager also opts for what he calls de re interpretations of the necessity and negation operators that count formulas of the form \(\Box\varphi\) and \(\neg\varphi\) to be true at a world \(w\) of an interpretation \(\calH\) only if the denotations of the variables \(\nu\) with free occurrences in \(\varphi\) all exist in \(w\), that is, only if, for such \(\nu\), \(\nu^{\calH} \in \textit{dom}(w)\). The motivation here appears to be that formulas of this form are to be thought of as predications, i.e., using familiar \(\lambda\) notation for properties, of the form \([\lambda\nu_1\ldots\nu_n\,\Box\varphi]\) and \([\lambda\nu_1\ldots\nu_n\,\neg\varphi]\). However, were he to add an identity predicate to his framework, Jager’s semantics would have the unfortunate effect of trivially validating the necessitism principle \(\Box\)N. For let \(w\) be an arbitrary world of \(\calH\) and suppose \(\sfx^{\calH} \in \textit{dom}(w)\). Then \(\Box\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx\) will be true at \(w\) just in case \(\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx\) is true at every world \(u\) of \(\calH\) in which \(\sfx^{\calH} \in \textit{dom}(u)\), i.e., every world in which \(\sfx^{\calH}\) exists! Hence, one wouldn’t be able to express that there are contingent_{∃} beings. More critically still, if we were to add to Jager’s framework an “actually” operator \(@\) with associated de re truth conditions along the lines of those for \(\Box\) and \(\neg,\) the natural rendering of
- \((*)\)
- There might have been something distinct from every actually existing thing
namely, \(\Diamond\exists \sfx@\forall \sfy\,\sfx \neq \sfy\), would turn out false. For, presumably, on a de re interpretation for \(@\), formulas of the form \(@\varphi\) with \(\sfx\) free would be true at a world \(w\), for \(\sfx^{\calH} \in \textit{dom}(w)\), only if \(\sfx^{\calH} \in \textit{dom}(w^\ast)\) and \(\varphi\) is true at \(w^\ast\)—which, of course, could not be the case for \(\varphi = @\forall \sfy\,\sfx \neq \sfy\).
Jager appears to find justification for his semantical choices here in Plantinga’s (1976: 156–9) discussion of the de re/de dicto distinction, but I see nothing in that discussion suggesting Jager’s de re truth conditions. Indeed, it is clear they would not have been what Plantinga intended, as providing truth conditions for \((*)\) was the entire motivation for his 1976 paper (see p. 142). Plantinga endorses Jager’s (at the time unpublished) paper in note 8 of his 1976 article but it would have been easy to miss the problems above, as they require both adding identity and an “actually” operator to Jager’s framework and taking a fairly deep dive into Jager’s formal machinery. All that said, the above issues could be avoided without any essential modifications to Jager’s framework if one were simply to adopt standard (what Jager calls “de dicto”) truth conditions for \(\Box,\) \(\neg,\) and @.
65. There is little to distinguish between propositions and states of affairs in Plantinga’s work beyond the fact that the former are referred to by means of that-clauses and the latter by gerunds: that the earth is smaller than the sun vs. the earth’s being smaller than the sun. Indeed, Plantinga (1974: 45) acknowledges that Chisholm (1970, 1971) might well be correct in identifying the two. Nothing hangs on the matter for purposes here.
66. Plantinga also very often uses “actual” instead of “obtains” but this introduces a terribly confusing ambiguity that pervades Plantinga’s work. As the term has been used in this entry—and as it is most often used in the literature as well as by Plantinga himself—“actual” has a purely ontological meaning: for the possibilist, it indicates a certain privileged ontological status and, for the actualist, it is synonymous with “being” and “existence”. In this sense, every one of Plantinga’s states of affairs (including every possible world, as he defines them), qua necessarily existing abstract entity, is actual, regardless of whether or not it obtains. Thus, to start using “actual” also as a synonym for “obtains” invites a great deal of unnecessary confusion. Consequently, in our discussion of Plantinga (and Adams, below) we will consistently use “actual” only to indicate the relevant ontological state with one exception: we will continue to use “the actual world” to indicate the possible world that obtains (as it is defined below), as that expression is so pervasive both in Plantinga and in the broad literature. So long as its definition is borne in mind, this should not cause any confusion.
67. Boethius writes:
For were it permitted to fabricate a name, I would call that certain quality, singular and incommunicable to any other subsistent, by its fabricated name, so that the form of what is proposed would become clearer. For let the incommunicable property of Plato be called “Platonity”. For we can call this quality “Platonity” by a fabricated word, in the way in which we call the quality of man “humanity”. Therefore, this Platonity is one man’s alone, and this not just anyone’s, but Plato’s.… For “Plato” points out a one and definite substance, and property, that cannot come together in another. (ILI: PL 64, 462d–464C as quoted in Castañeda 1975: 135–6; Castañeda (his note 13) credits Paul Spade with the translation)
68. Fine (1994, 1995a, 1995b) has argued convincingly against this definition of the essential properties of an object in rather extraordinary philosophical and formal detail. His now classic counterexample is that, although Socrates could not have existed and failed to be a member of his own singleton set \(\{\)Socrates\(\}\), the property being a member of \(\{\)Socrates\(\}\) is in no wise part of Socrates’s essence. As with the distinction between propositions and states of affairs discussed in the preceding note, nothing of substance hinges on this issue for purposes here.
69. Some technical tweaks to basic possible world semantics are required to accommodate some of the distinctive idiosyncrasies of Lewis’s metaphysics, notably, his doctrine of counterparts. For this, see Hazen 1979. It should also be noted that there is disagreement in the literature as to whether Lewis’s account is genuinely reductive. See deRosset 2009a (§3) for an overview of the controversy and Cameron 2012 for a spirited defense of Lewis’s reductionism against several well-known objections.
70. This understanding of modalist semantics addresses a concern raised by Linsky and Zalta (1994: 442), namely, that Plantinga’s own account can’t be understood in terms of his semantics. For on his semantics, quantifiers range over essences and atomic formulas express coexemplification. But in order to define the notion of an essence, Plantinga needs to quantify over all individuals generally: an essence is a property that something (i.e., some individual) could have essentially and that nothing but that thing could have. More formally put: \(E\) is an essence just in case \(\Diamond\exists \sfx \Box\forall \sfy(\sfE\sfy \leftrightarrow \sfy=\sfx)\) (where, of course, the predicate \(\sfE\) signifies \(E\)). Likewise, the truth condition for atomic formulas is expressed in terms of the coexemplification relation on haecceities, but haecceities \(H\) and \(H'\) are coexemplified just in case there is something that exemplifies them both, \(\exists \sfx(\sfH\sfx \land \sfH'\sfx)\). On pain of circularity, then, the metalinguistic quantifiers here must be taken to range over all individuals, not just haecceities, and atomic formulas must be understood to express exemplification, as in standard first-order logic, not coexemplification.
But this situation would be objectionable only if Plantinga intended his haecceitist semantics to provide a fully-fledged theory of meaning for natural language that supplants our ordinary understanding of quantification and predication. But he clearly doesn’t (as the explications of essence and coexemplification just noted show). Rather, once again, the purpose of his haecceitist semantics is only to provide a framework that grounds the truth of de dicto modal propositions in the modal properties of haecceities when—as in the case of (2) and its ilk—ordinary, actually existing individuals are unavailable.
71. Peacocke (1978) showed that, with a sufficiently strong metalanguage, it is possible to formulate a theory of truth for a standard applied first-order modal language that both interprets modal operators homophonically while preserving at least the appearance of compositionality. The trick builds upon Fine’s (1977) notion of a “quasi-class” that enables one to simulate quantification over mere possibilia without any genuine commitment to them. Peacocke ingeniously adapts the idea to simulate quantification over infinite sequences of (pairwise possibly non-compossible) possibilia to reconstruct an apparently compositional, Tarski-style account. However, those simulated quantifications unpack by definition to infinitary sentences of the metalanguage with, in general, arbitrarily deep nestings of quantifiers, indexed modal operators, and correspondingly indexed “actually” operators, so the truth conditions Peacocke’s theory ultimately delivers are far less transparent than those of the possibilist or haecceitist. (See Stephanou 2001 for a comprehensive account of indexed modal and “actually” operators.)
72. Menzel 1990, Ray 1996, Chihara 1998, and Rayo 2012 are all attempts to show that possible world semantics can still be understood to be ontologically significant without any commitment to possibilia.
73. See, notably, the opening sentence of this encyclopedia’s entry on classical logic dating back to its earliest version: “Typically, a logic consists of a formal or informal language together with a deductive system and/or a model-theoretic semantics” (Shapiro 2000 [2017]).
74. Correia 1999 supplies a general possible world semantics for the propositional component of Q and related systems and proves their soundness and completeness with respect to their corresponding semantic theory.
75. Prior often appeals to propositions in his work and appears to take quantification over them to be ontologically committing (see, e.g., Prior 1961), but he ultimately considered them to be useful fictions or, at least, not to exist in any literal sense (see, e.g., Prior 1968a: 156, and Prior’s contribution to Kneale and Prior 1968, esp. pp. 92–4). Our discussion of Prior does not hang on the matter.
76. Prior uses identity statements instead of existence statements here—\(\rS\tau \eqdf \rS\tau = \tau\)—but, in the context of Q, existence statements work just as well and make the intended meaning of \(\rS\tau\)—that the referent of \(\tau\) is a necessary being—a bit clearer.
77. The reason for the latter is that, in \(\rS\tau_1 \to (\ldots \to (\rS\tau_n \to \theta)\ldots)\), each atomic subformula \(\rS\tau_i\) is paired with its own occurrence of \(\to\) (and, for \(n \gt 1\), its own subsequent pair of parentheses) and, hence, in the case \(n=0\) we’re simply left with \(\theta\). This is even clearer when the schematic formula here is expressed in Prior’s preferred Polish notation: \(C\rS\tau_1\ldots C\rS\tau_n\theta\).
78. These are basically the modal axioms in Prior 1968c, which are rather simpler—or, at least, more familiar to contemporary eyes—than the initial axiomatization he gave in Prior 1957 (ch. V) and discussed subsequently in 1959 and 1964. However, we must make an important qualification. We made the simplifying assumption above that the predicates of \(\scrL_{Q}\) all stand for wholly general properties and relations (and propositions, if propositional symbols—i.e., 0-place predicates—are included). Without this assumption, we have such instances as
\(◼(\sfC\sfg \to \sfE\sfg) \to (◼\sfC\sfg \to ◼\sfE\sfg),\)
where \(\sfC\) signifies the property being the creator of Joni Mitchell, \(\sfE\) the property being the creator of something, and \(\sfg\) God. It is true (analytically) in every world in which it is statable that God is the creator of Joni Mitchell only if God is the creator of something, \(\sfC\sfg \to \sfE\sfg\); and God is Joni’s creator in every world in which she exists. Hence, we have both \(◼(\sfC\sfg \to \sfE\sfg)\) and \(◼\sfC\sfg\). So with two applications of \(\textbf{MP}_{Q}\) we conclude that, in every world in which God exists, God creates something, \(◼\sfE\sfg\), i.e., that God cannot refrain from creating. This is, at the least, inconsistent with most western theologies and, hence, in Prior’s view (discussed at greater length below), shouldn’t be something that logic decides. (I follow Prior’s common practice here of drawing upon theology to illustrate a logical point!)
To short-circuit this sort of argument, just as he did for terms in SDef, Prior defines n-statability for n-place predicates \(\pi\) in terms of the n-statability of certain formulas that contain them, specifically:
- \(\textbf{SDef}_{\pi}\):
- \(\rS\pi \eqdf \rS\forall\nu_1\ldots\forall\nu_n\,\pi\nu_1\ldots\nu_n\), where the \(\nu_i\) are any pairwise distinct variables.
He then modifies \(\textbf{K}_{Q}\) in a manner similar to the way he modifies MP, only for predicates:
- K\(\astQ\):
- \(\rS\pi_1\ldots\pi_n \to ◼(\varphi \to \psi ) \to (◼\varphi \to ◼\psi )\), where \(\pi_1, \ldots, \pi_n\) are all of the predicates that occur in \(\varphi\) but not in \(\psi\)
Given \(\textbf{K}\astQ\) instead of \(\textbf{K}_{Q},\) the above reasoning only yields \(\rS\sfC \to ◼\sfE\sfg\), which is unproblematically true given its false antecedent. Note, too, that this revision would also require that corresponding modifications of S2, S3, and \(\textbf{MP}_{Q}\) to include the n-statability of both free terms and predicates, e.g.,
- S2*:
- \(\rS\varphi \to \rS\epsilon\), where \(\epsilon\) is either a predicate of \(\varphi\) or a term that is free in \(\varphi\).
79. A derived rule of inference is basically just a convenient shortcut and hence can be added to a logical system without any increase in deductive power. In the case of Nec\(\astQ,\) suppose we have derived \(\psi\) via a proof of length n; then we can extend the proof as follows:
1. | [some axiom] | … |
⋮ | ⋮ | ⋮ |
\(n\). | \(\psi\) | … |
\(n+1\). | \(◼\psi\) | \(n\), Nec\(_{Q}\) |
\(n+2\). | \(◼\psi \to (\rS\psi \to (\rS\psi \land ◼\psi))\) | Taut |
\(n+3\). | \(\rS\psi \to (\rS\psi \land ◼\psi)\) | \(n+1\), \(n+2\), MP\(_{Q}\) |
\(n+4\). | \(\rS\psi \to \Box\psi\) | \(n+3\), \(\Box\)Def\(_{Q}\) |
So Nec\(\astQ\) simply allows us to move directly from line \(n\) to line \(n+4\) without the intervening three steps.
80. See the indicated lines in the proofs of \(\Box\)Nec, the BF instance BF*, and the CBF equivalent CBF\(_{\Box}\):
- Proof of \(\Box\)Nec (line 5)
- Proof of BF* (line 2)
- Proof of CBF\(_\Box\) (line 2)
Note that, replacing Q2 with KQ2 in KQML has a similar effect—there will be no theorems of the form \(\Box\varphi\) if there are any free terms in \(\varphi\).
81. Prior pointed this out by means of the principle
- Q-Collapse:
- \(\rS\varphi\), for every formula \(\varphi\) of \(\scrL_{Q}\)
as the context of his observation was propositional logic. But in the context of full first-order Q, by principles S2 and S3, Q-Collapse and N\(_{Q}\) are equivalent.
82. Instead of this clause R. Adams (1974: 225) defines \(S\) to be maximal if it contains “one member of every pair of mutually contradictory propositions” and uses the clause here in 1981. His 1974 clause of course entails the 1981 clause but it can only be spelled out in terms of (im)possibility and, hence, bleeds conceptually into the second clause. A reasonable hypothesis here is that, subsequent to 1974, Adams wanted his definition to mirror more closely the notion of a maximal consistent set in logic, where maximality is purely a matter of form and does not involve the notion of consistency.
83. R. Adams himself often speaks as if world stories only “describe” possible worlds and that there are also honest-to-goodness possible worlds in addition to world stories. Consider, e.g., the following passage from 1981 (p. 21):
Some world-stories may not even contain enough to determine a world completely. I think there could be a pair of possible worlds that differed from each other only by the interchange of two individuals (or sets of individuals) that do not exist in the actual world….The only propositions that would be true in one of those worlds and false in the other are singular propositions that do not exist in the actual world. Therefore both these worlds are represented by a single world-story that does not discriminate between them.
In fact, the modal situation Adams describes can be at least roughly expressed without quantifying over worlds by means of generalized actuality operators (Hodes 1984, Stephanou 2001) and plural quantifiers (Linnebo 2004 [2022]). But these mechanisms were not available to Adams at the time, so it is difficult to see how he might have understood the above passage in a way that would be actualistically acceptable. Adams does indicate that he is sensitive to the tensions here and doesn’t really think there are worlds over and above world stories, but doesn’t address the matter any further:
Out of public and private habit I shall continue to speak of “possible worlds,” but when I do, it should be understood that some of the “worlds” are types that could be further differentiated by the addition of singular propositions about individuals that do not exist in the actual world. This may be less than we wanted in the way of possible worlds, but actualist intuitions make extremely plausible the claim that it’s all there is. (1981: 21)
84. Although he does not reference his 1974 definition in his 1981 paper, R. Adams in effect lays out its shortcomings in detail on pp. 21–2. In fact, it is possible to show rigorously that, under the assumption of strict actualism, the 1974 definition is fatally flawed. This can be seen by expressing it in a language with propositional quantifiers:
- WS\(_{74}\):
- \(\textit{World}(S) \eqdf \forall p(p \in S \lor \neg p \in S) \land \Diamond\forall p(p \in S \to p)\)
Let \(p\) be the proposition that Adams exists and consider a world story \(A\) that doesn’t contain \(p\). By the first conjunct of WS\(_{74}\), \(\neg p\) is in \(A\). Now let \(A^+\) be the (obviously inconsistent) set \(A \cup \{p\}\). Since (by hypothesis) \(A\) is a world story, the second conjunct of WS\(_{74}\) holds for \(A\): \(\Diamond\forall p(p \in A \to p)\); that is, informally put, circumstances could have been such that, all the propositions in \(A\) that would have existed under those circumstances would have been true. But in any such circumstances, Adams would not exist, and hence, under strict actualism, neither would the propositions \(p\) and \(\neg p\). (If Adams did exist under those circumstances, \(\neg p\) would exist and be false and, hence, those would not be circumstances in which all the members of \(A\) that exist are true.) But this means that, necessarily, all the members of \(A\) that exist are true if and only if all the members of \(A^+\) that exist are true, since \(A\) and \(A^+\) differ only in that \(p \in A^+\) and, necessarily, \(p\) doesn’t exist if all the members of \(A\) that exist are true. So \(A\) satisfies the second conjunct of WS\(_{74}\) if and only if \(A^+\) does. And, since \(A\) satisfies the first conjunct (by hypothesis), so does \(A^+\). So \(A^+\) satisfies the definition of a world story. But it is inconsistent so, assuming strict actualism, WS\(_{74}\) will not do.
85. What Adams appears to have in mind here can be expressed formally by means of a language with propositional quantifiers and with generalized actuality operators of the sort studied in Stephanou 2001. Specifically, Adams’ revised notion of maximality—call it maximality_{α}—can be expressed for sets \(S\) of actually existing propositions as follows:
\(\Box_1(\textit{Max}_{\alpha}(S) \leftrightarrow (\sfE !S \land @_0\forall p(@_1\exists q\, p=q \to (p \in S \lor \neg p \in S))))\)
That is, informally put, no matter how things might have gone, such a set \(S\) would have been maximal_{α} if and only if, for every actually existing proposition \(p\) that there would have been, either \(p\) or \(\neg p\) is a member of \(S\). (Serious actualism principles will preclude the possibility that \(S\) contains singular propositions about actually existing things that wouldn’t have existed.)
Adding the requirement of consistency yields Adams’ intended definition of a world:
\(\textit{World}(S) \eqdf \Diamond_1(\textit{Max}_{\alpha}(S) \land \forall p(p \in S \to p))\)
As it happens, however, Adams’ notion of a world here can be equivalently expressed with just the standard, unindexed “actually” operator \(@\) as follows:
\(\textit{World}(S) \eqdf \Diamond\forall p(p \in S\ \leftrightarrow (p \land @\exists q\,q=p))\)
That is, a set of (actually existing) propositions is a world just in case it is possible that it comprises exactly the true actually existing propositions. (Serious actualist principles will ensure that \(S\) itself exists under these conditions and principles of set existence will ensure that all of \(S\)’s members exist if \(S\) does.) As Adams notes (1981, p. 21), what worlds (i.e., world stories) there are is a radically contingent matter: had there been at least one individual \(b\) that is distinct from every actually existing individual, then there would have been infinitely many worlds other than those that actually exist; and had there been fewer individuals, then many of our actually existing worlds wouldn’t have existed at all. To be able to extend the concept of a world (story) into modal contexts, then, “World” has to be introduced as a primitive predicate and axiomatized with
\(\Box_1\forall S(\textit{World}(S) \leftrightarrow \Diamond_2\forall p(p \in S\ \leftrightarrow (p \land @_1\exists q\,q=p))\)
Here the initial modal operator \(\Box_1\) introduces a modal context and the actuality operator \(@_1\) brings us back to that context from the one introduced by the possibility operator \(\Diamond_2\) rather than to the actual world, as the ordinary unindexed “actually” operator would.
86. It has been apparent since Russell 1903 that propositions and sets together create a volatile logical mix. In Appendix B (§500) Russell showed that, under the “fine-grainedness” assumption (which seems clearly implicit in Adams’ work) that singular propositions about distinct things are themselves distinct, there can be no set of all propositions—and basically the same argument yields the conclusion that there can be no world stories as Adams defines them (Menzel 2012; see also the exchange Bringsjord 1985, Menzel 1986, Grim 1986).
87. The formal details here, which are certainly implicit (but only implicit) in R. Adams 1981; the basic approach to formalizing them follows Menzel 1991.
88. Adams broadens his observations about the truth of Adams doesn’t exist, \(\neg \sfE!\sfa\), at Adams-free worlds to negated atomic singular propositions in his principle (C4):
If \(\neg \sfE!\tau\) is true at \(w\), then, for atomic \(\varphi\) containing (pairwise distinct) \(\nu\), \(\nu_1\),…, \(\nu_n\), \(\neg \exists \nu_1\ldots\exists \nu_n\varphi^\nu_\tau\) is true at \(w\).
Expressed as an object language schema (\(\varphi\) is as above) we have:
\(\Box(\neg \sfE!\tau \to \neg \exists \nu_1\ldots\exists \nu_n\varphi^\nu_\tau)\)
But this will follow from SA by means of his underlying quantification theory and his rule of Necessitation (see below) and hence needn’t be asserted as a separate axiom schema.
89. Adams appears to suggest (1981: 27), not replacing Q2 with its free counterpart, but adopting both schemas and then restricting Necessitation to the free fragment of A, that is, to theorems whose proofs do not involve Q2. (Theorems relying upon Id1 would also have to be off limits, as we’ve seen.) As noted, though, given only FQ2, his inclusion of the serious actualism principle GSA renders Q2 otiose.
90. Adams’ principle (C6) is restricted to propositions of the form \(\triangle\psi\), for \(\psi\) atomic \((\triangle = \Box\text{ or }\Diamond),\) and (C7) to propositions of the form \(\exists \nu_1\ldots\exists\nu_n\triangle\varphi.\) But both are covered in the modalized serious actualism principle MSA. This is obvious in the former case. In the latter case, suppose \(\nu_1,\ldots,\nu_n\) and \(\tau\) are all free in \(\varphi\) (where \(\tau\neq\nu_i\)). Then we have the MSA instance \(\varphi \to \sfE!\tau\) and, after \(n\) applications of Gen, we have \(\forall\nu_1\ldots\nu_n(\triangle\varphi \to \sfE!\tau)\) which (by Q1, Q3, and a bit of propositional logic) is equivalent to \(\exists\nu_1\ldots\nu_n\triangle\varphi \to \sfE!\tau.\)
91. Adams himself (1981: 30) suggests replacing 4, B, and 5 with their “weak” counterparts:
- \(\textbf{W4}\):
- \(\Box \varphi \to \Box\neg\Diamond\neg\varphi\)
- \(\textbf{WB}\):
- \(\varphi \to \Box\neg\Box\neg\varphi\)
- \(\textbf{W5}\):
- \(\Diamond\varphi \to \Box\neg\Box\neg\varphi\)
But, given \(\Box\Diamond_A\), these are equivalent to 4_{A}, B_{A}, and 5_{A}, respectively.
92. In fact, Adams (1981: 31–2) discusses at some length a “full” perspectivalist principle (his principle (C6′)) that would count a modal proposition—hence the likes of \(\Diamond \sfP\sfa\)—true at an arbitrary world simply if it is true at the actual world. This would, of course, invalidate MSA. Adams acknowledges that (C6′) is “[t]he most tempting alternative” to his principles (C6) and (C7) which motivate MSA and render \(\Diamond \sfP\sfa\) false at worlds where \(a\) does not exist. However, he rejects (C6′) on the grounds that it would
violate the requirement…that what is true about an individual \(a\) at a world in which \(a\) does not exist must be determined by \(a\)’s non-existence there, together with propositions, true at that world, that are not about \(a\).
Note, however, that the “requirement” here is just a stipulation that the proper standpoint for evaluating modal propositions at a world \(w\) is within \(w\) rather than the actual world, i.e., it is simply the expression of a choice to reject the full perspectivalism of (C6′) in favor of (C6) and (C7). See Turner (2005: 205–6) for a more detailed response.
94. See also note 19 of the the entry on possible worlds for qualifications regarding the counterpart relation in Lewis’s mature theory.
95. Others have also argued that Lewis is an actualist or, at least, not a possibilist in the classical sense, e.g., van Inwagen (2008: 40–41), Williamson (2013: 22), and Plantinga (1987: 202–7).
96. Bricker’s own preferred “non-traditional” version of Leibnizian realism specifies the truth conditions for propositions relative to classes of worlds rather than to single worlds (2006: 53). See Bricker 2001 for detailed motivations.
97. McDaniel (2009: §6.2) suggests that Bricker’s gambit is best understood as the thesis that actuality and mere possibility are distinct modes of being. This would then be spelled out formally in terms of restricted quantifiers for both modes as detailed in §2 (of McDaniel 2009). However, the use here of only one type of restricted quantifier (for actually existing things) together with general, unrestricted quantifiers comports better with what Bricker calls one-property Leibnizian realism, on which there is but the one special mode of being indicated by “actuality”. McDaniel 2017 is a book-length development and defense of the idea that there are many modes of being. See van Inwagen 2014 for a robust critique of McDaniel’s thesis; van Inwagen 2009 provides helpful context.
98. Bricker’s definition of concreteness is a bit idiosyncratic: concreteness is not identified with being part of the (or some) causal order, as on the Bolzanian conception; rather, it is to be “fully determinate in all qualitative respects” (2006: 41), which does not on its face entail Bolzanian concreteness. Other elements of Bricker’s view, however, especially the role of possibilia as objects of thought, suggest otherwise:
Suppose… that a merely possible gold dodecahedron is an object of my thought. I ask: does this object of my thought instantiate the properties, being gold and being a dodecahedron? Or does it instead somehow represent, or encode, or stand in some pseudo-instantiation relation to these properties? I say the former. (2006: 45)
On the reasonable assumption that being gold entails existence within some causal order, typical possibilia for the Leibnizian realist will indeed be concrete in Bolzano’s sense.
99. This is rather easier to see in the equivalent form
\(\Pi \sfx ((\sfA!_{\exists}\sfx \land \sfC!\sfx) \lor \neg\Diamond \sfC!\sfx).\)
The right disjunct here will be false for any value of \(\sfx\) in the Leibnizian realist’s metaphysics, since every object is concrete in the world in which it exists. And, by DefA!\(_\boldsymbol{\exists}\), \(\Pi \sfx (\sfA!_{\exists}\sfx \land \sfC!\sfx)\) is \(\Pi \sfx (\exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx \land \sfC!\sfx)\) which, since everything is concrete in Lewis’s metaphysics, is equivalent to \(\Pi \sfx \exists \sfy\,\sfy=\sfx\), i.e., everything there (unrestrictedly) is exists in the actual world. For the Leibnizian, this is true only if the actual world is the only world there is.