Process Philosophy

First published Mon Oct 15, 2012; substantive revision Thu May 26, 2022

Process philosophy is based on the premise that being is dynamic and that the dynamic nature of being should be the primary focus of any comprehensive philosophical account of reality and our place within it. Even though we experience our world and ourselves as continuously changing, Western metaphysics has long been obsessed with describing reality as an assembly of static individuals whose dynamic features are either taken to be mere appearances or ontologically secondary and derivative. For process philosophers the adventure of philosophy begins with a set of problems that traditional metaphysics marginalizes or even sidesteps altogether: what is dynamicity or becoming—if it is the way we experience reality, how should we interpret this metaphysically? Are there several varieties of becoming—for instance, the uniform going on of activities versus the coming about of developments? Do all developments have the same way of occurring quite independently of what is coming about? How can we best classify into different kinds of occurrences? How can we understand the emergence of apparently novel conditions? Can we conceive of becoming or dynamic being independently of space and time?

While process philosophers insist that all within and about reality is continuously going on and coming about, they do not deny that there are temporally stable and reliably recurrent aspects of reality. But they take such aspects of persistence to be the regular behavior of dynamic organizations that arise due to the continuously ongoing interaction of processes. In order to articulate a process view of reality, special theoretical efforts are required, however, since the standard theoretical tools of Western metaphysics are geared to the static view of reality. Especially the standard interpretation of predicate logic in terms of static individuals with properties that are exemplified timelessly or at a temporal instant consolidates what is from the process-philosophical perspective an unhelpful theoretical bias. This has forced upon process philosophy a double role as a metaphysical and metaphilosophical enterprise—pushing for a paradigm change, process philosophy has the double task of developing new explanatory concepts and providing arguments for why these concepts better serve the aims of philosophy.

Process philosophy centers on ontology and metaphysics, but it has full systematic scope: its concern is with the dynamic sense of being as becoming or occurrence, the conditions of spatio-temporal existence, the kinds of dynamic entities, including mental occurrences and actions, the relationship between mind and world, and the realization of values in action. Some approaches to process philosophy are conceived on the grand scale and offer a full-scope metaphysics in the form of a systematic theory or comprehensive philosophical view. Other approaches, especially more recent ones, take a more modest approach. They pursue the specific problems that the various philosophical disciplines are engaged in while focusing on the dynamic aspects of each sub-domain. Such process ontologies, process ethics, process epistemologies, process theories of mind etc. are contributions to ‘process philosophy’ more broadly conceived as a research paradigm of philosophical inquiry. They share the guiding idea that natural existence consists in modes of becoming and types of occurrences. ‘Processists’ agree that the world is an assembly of physical, organic, social, and cognitive processes that interact at and across levels of dynamic organization. However, within that broad framework, process philosophers debate about how such a world of processes is to be construed, how it relates to the human mind (which is another process) and how the dynamic nature of reality relates to our scientific theories. In consequence, process philosophers also differ in their view on the role of philosophy itself and in their choice of theoretical style.

Process philosophy opposes ‘substance metaphysics,’ the dominant research paradigm in the history of Western philosophy since Aristotle. Substance metaphysics proceeds from the intuition—first formulated by the pre-Socratic Greek philosopher Parmenides—that being should be thought of as simple, hence as internally undifferentiated and unchangeable. Substance metaphysicians recast this intuition as the claim that the primary units of reality (called “substances”) must be static—they must be what they are at any instant in time. In contrast to the substance-metaphysical snapshot view of reality, with its typical focus on eternalist being and on what there is, process philosophers analyze becoming and what is occurring as well as ways of occurring. In some process accounts, becoming is the mode of being common to the many kinds of occurrences or dynamic beings. Other process accounts hold that being is ongoing self-differentiation; on these accounts becoming is both the mode of being of different kinds of dynamic beings and the process that generates different kinds of dynamic beings. In order to develop a taxonomy of dynamic beings (types and modes of occurrences), processists replace the descriptive concepts of substance metaphysics with a set of new basic categories. Central among these is the notion of a basic entity that is individuated in terms of what it ‘does.’ This type of functionally individuated entity is often labeled ‘process’ in a technical sense of this term that does not coincide with our common-sense notion of a process. Some of the ‘processes’ postulated by process philosophers are—in agreement with our common-sense understanding of processes—temporal developments that can be analyzed as temporally structured sequences of stages of an occurrence, with each such stage being numerically and qualitatively different from any other. But some of the ‘processes’ that process philosophers operate with are not temporal developments in this sense—they are, for example, temporal but non-developmental occurrences like activities, or non-spatiotemporal happenings that realize themselves in a developmental fashion and thereby constitute the directionality of time. What holds for all dynamic entities labelled ‘processes,’ however, is that they occur—they are in some fashion intimately connected to time, and often, though not necessarily, are related to the directionality or to the passage of time.

Process philosophers claim that there are many sound philosophical reasons to take the processual aspects of nature, cognition, and action as fundamental features of reality. The perhaps most powerful argument for process philosophy is its wide descriptive or explanatory scope. If we admit that the basic entities of our world are processes, we can generate better philosophical descriptions of all the kinds of entities and relationships we are committed to when we reason about our world in common sense and in science: from quantum entanglement to consciousness, from computation to feelings, from things to institutions, from organisms to societies, from traffic jams to climate change, from spacetime to beauty. Moreover, results in cognitive science, some philosophers have claimed, show that we need a process metaphysics in order to develop a naturalist theory of the mind and of normativity. These arguments form the background for the processist criticism of the focus on substance in Western philosophy. The bias towards substances seems to be rooted partly in the cognitive dispositions of speakers of Indo-European languages, and partly in theoretical habituation, as the traditional prioritization of static entities (substances, objects, states of affairs, static structures) at the beginning of Western metaphysics built on itself. In contrast, process philosophy shows fewer affinities to any particular language group and can allude to a rich tradition of reflection in many of the great schools of Eastern thought. As recently appeared, process philosophy also has an increasing practical dimension, since only if we re-visualize our world as a system of interactions can we come to grips, conceptually and ethically, with the new phenomena of artificial life, artificial intelligence, and artificial sociality, and investigate the exceptionality of human capacities and the scope of moral obligation. Thus contemporary process philosophy holds out the promise of offering superior support for the three most pressing tasks of philosophy at the beginning of the 21st century. First, it provides the category-theoretic tools for an integrated metaphysics that can join our common sense and scientific images of the world. Second, it can serve as a theoretical platform upon which to build an intercultural philosophy and to facilitate interdisciplinary research on global knowledge representation by means of an ontological framework that is no longer parochially Western. Third, it supplies concepts that facilitate interdisciplinary collaboration on reflected technology development, and enable the cultural and ethical imagination needed to shape the expectable deep socio-cultural changes engendered by the increased use of technology, especially automation.

1. Historical contributions

The history of process philosophy extends far into antiquity, both in Eastern and Western thought. In the Western tradition it is the Greek theoretician Heraclitus of Ephesus (born ca. 560 B.C.E.) who is commonly recognized as the founder of the process approach. The few remaining fragments of Heraclitus’ doctrine are often interpreted as championing a philosophy of ubiquitous and radical flux, epitomized in the slogan panta rhei (“everything flows”). But Heraclitus’ claims are more sophisticated. To be sure, the fragments contain an unambiguous commitment to ubiquitous dynamicity: “this world-order … is … an ever living fire…” (Fr. 217, Kirk-Raven-Schofield). Whatever exists is a transformation of this cosmic fire, turning into apparently stable forms of matter such as sea and earth (Fr. 218), but all the while remaining present in these apparent stabilities (Fr. 204). Cosmic fire is the source of change of all observable cosmological and natural processes. Moreover, Heraclitus also postulates that all observable changes result from a “strife” of opposing forces to overcome each other, thus creating transformative power as the ruling condition of existence: “war is the father of all and king of all” (Fr. 212). However, Heraclitus’ reputation as the great proponent of radical flux (alteration at every instant) may be mainly due to the influence of his early commentators: Plato, Aristotle, Melissus, and Theophrastus. For one must not overlook that in the fragments we have from Heraclitus, dynamicity is tied inextricably to balance or “measure” (Kirk 1951). While fire is postulated as an underlying pervasive cosmic factor that is creative and self-moving, the changes produced by fire happen in a regulated, measured way. Fire is “kindling in measures and going out in measures” (Fr. 217) and “all things are an equal exchange for fire and fire for all things, as goods are for gold and gold for goods” (Fr. 219). Furthermore the opposing forces, which are manifestations of fire, form unities of cyclical alternation—“day night, winter summer, war peace, satiety hunger unity”(Fr. 204)—that proceed within the limits of a quantitative measure (metron) reinforced by a “law” of nature (Fr. 226). The unity of opposites thus creates an overall balance of reciprocity by cyclical transitions between extremes—“these things change places and are those, and those change places again and are these” (Fr.202). The “same rivers” are constituted by the regular flow patterns of “different and different waters” which “scatter and…gather…come together and flow away…approach and depart” (Fr. 214). Moreover, the unity of opposites also produces the dynamic arrest we know from “the bow or the lyre” (Fr. 209), i.e., the motionless dynamic presence resulting from the tension of a ‘backstretched connection’ (palintonos harmoniē) pulling equally into two opposite directions. In short, Heraclitus articulated three fundamental insights that became seminal in the history of Western process philosophy, despite the somewhat tendentious portrait of his thought in Greek antiquity. First, Heraclitus assigned to process or dynamicity the role of an explanatory feature, not only of a feature of nature to be explained. Second, he suggested that processes form organizational units and occur in a quantitatively measurable and ordered fashion. Third, he contrasted dynamic transitions or alterations with dynamic permanence, and thus for the first time identifies, and differentiates between, two basic ‘Gestalts’ or forms of dynamicity.

The direct counter-model to Heraclitus’ explanation of natural changes was the atomism of Leucippus, Democritus, and Epicurus, who viewed matter as constituted by inert material atoms with permanent properties (e.g., weight) and took natural developments to be the macroscopic effects of atoms colliding and changing their spatial positions. Aristotle complained that the source of motion for these collisions remained unexplained and developed a philosophy of nature that includes a coherent account of the source of motion in natural occurrences, allowing also for explanations in terms of self-realizing and self-maintaining structural or formal factors. In Aristotle’s view an item in nature persists by the active exercise of a collection of capacities, a self-maintaining internal process organization (physis, or more generally morphē) that realizes a characteristic sort of functioning; by means of these characteristic types of functioning we sort entities into natural kinds. These kind-specific capacities must be realized within a matter or medium (hylē) that supports the relevant process organizations but that also harbors counteracting, disintegrative tendencies, due to the fact that the elemental components of matter (fire, water, earth, or air) actively strive towards their “natural place” further up or down. If Aristotle indeed took these active elemental tendencies as fundamental and allowed for elemental transformations as changes per se without an underlying substratum or prime matter (as argued in Gill 1989), he can be counted as a process philosopher. But Aristotle also supplied in his characterization of substance (ousia) those aspects that subsequent history selected to form the basic tenets of the paradigm of ‘substance metaphysics.’ In addition, substance-metaphysics could also draw on Aristotle’s classification of changes (kineseis) into generation, destruction, alteration, and locomotion, since this classification rests on a sophisticated doctrine of “potential” vs. “actual” features that are all attributed to a static subject of change. Aristotle’s distinction between kinesis (in this context: change, transition towards a goal) and energeia (in this context: activity), on the other hand, must again be counted as an important contribution to process thought. Aristotle’s distinction is formulated in relation to agentively initiated changes and activities, but the logical distinction arguably extends beyond actions to occurrences in general. Changes such as building a house or learning lead to an end (telos) that lies “beyond,” and are incomplete as long as the end is not reached—“someone who is building a house, has not built it” (Metaphysics Theta 6). In contrast, activities such as seeing or living well are ends in themselves and complete at any moment for as long as they last—“he who is seeing has seen.” Aristotle’s distinction between changes and activities is significant in its own right, but even more seminal for present-day process philosophy, since it is the first attempt to classify types of occurrences in terms of logical and linguistic features of associated expressions (see section 3 below).

The history of Western metaphysics since Aristotle was mainly focused on elaborating various versions of substance metaphysics—in fact, as one might say with Hegel, “the history of [Western] metaphysics is the tendency towards substance.” However, interspersed in this history of substance metaphysics are pockets of process thought, partly as supplementary elements to an otherwise substance-geared theory, and partly as independent process-philosophical explorations. For example, the neo-Platonic philosopher Plotinus (204–270) introduced the thought that the dynamicity of being is the “emanation of the divine.” Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274), Aristotle’s most famous commentator in the middle ages, kept some of the processual aspects of Aristotle’s scheme more clearly in view than later scholastics. Renaissance philosopher Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597) offered mereological descriptions of the diffusion of processes in order to develop a “metaphysics of light.” G. W. Leibniz (1646–1716) devised a fully-fledged process-based metaphysics, postulating as basic individuals so-called “monads.” Monads are ordered sequences of states of affairs consisting of the co-exemplification of properties during some period of time. But monads are not static: they are endowed with an inherent “active force” that engenders the transitions between states. Moreover, since Leibniz took temporal relations to be “founded” in the properties of monads, states of monads are per se not temporally discrete.[1]

A special branch of process thought opened up in late 18th and early 19th century German Idealism, when Johann G. Fichte, Friedrich W. J. Schelling, and Georg W. F. Hegel responded to Immanuel Kant’s system of a transcendental idealism. All three of these thinkers alerted to the processual nature of the “transcendental subject,” and aimed to overcome Kant’s incongruous postulate of unknowable “things in themselves” by focusing on the process by which the world of knowable appearances, including reflective reasoning, is generated—this process, or so the argument goes, is the most promising candidate for reality in itself. Hegel provided the most comprehensive and detailed elaboration of this basic idea. He postulated that reality is the self-unfolding of dynamic structures or templates (“Begriffe”); among these templates external contrasts arise, which trigger self-modifications of the templates into more differentiated versions; these in turn create further external contrasts. The result is an increasingly interrelated web of dynamic dependencies, and the “movement of reflection” that drives the interrelated differentiations of the templates in the end reaches a dynamic fixed point. According to Hegel’s dynamic structuralism, self-unfolding reality differentiates itself into mental, natural, socio-cultural, and institutional processes, and, in fact, over time develops any possible differentiation, so that in the end reality occurs as the totality of all possible forms of mutual conditioning. Hegel argued that this overall “movement” of gradual self-determination by internal and external differentiation drives all actual and possible developments according to its inner necessity—reality is “reason” articulating itself as and within the world. Hegel called this movement “dialectics” and his philosophical system was an attempt to work out the ‘logic’ underlying the total dialectical development of reality. Schelling claimed that Hegelian dialectics provides, at best, a description of the development of constraining conditions on reality’s self-unfolding. But, Schelling argued, the productive dynamicity of the process that is being constrained is neither included nor explained in Hegel’s system, and correctly so, since the latter is necessarily transcendent to conscious human thought. From the perspective of contemporary process ontology, the development of German Idealism between 1790 and 1850 in the debate between Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling displays in instructive ways the limitations of a process metaphysics that puts the occurrence type of productions center-stage and, in particular, understands cognition as a production: as a development with a product or result. As pictures are the products of paintings, mental representations (thoughts, concepts) were taken to be the quasi-objects that result from the productive developmental occurrences of perceiving and thinking. When we conceive of an occurrence as a production, we separate conceptually between the product and the process generating the product. Thus, productions are precisely the type of occurrences that prevent us from conceiving the dynamic presence of reality in itself as “process and result rolled into one,” as Hegel envisaged. The metaphilosophical debate between Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling, which deeply influenced the further development of ‘continental’ philosophy from Nietzsche to Heidegger to Derrida and onwards, can be viewed as ensuing from the assumption that cognitions are productions of sorts—if cognitions had been assigned another occurrence type, this specific metaphilosophical debate could not have got off the ground.

Hegel assumed that the process of reality follows certain principles that can be fathomed by philosophical inquiry. This thesis is the hallmark of speculative process metaphysics, which has a number of adherents also among later process philosophers but has been championed most explicitly by Alfred N. Whitehead in his “philosophy of organism,” worked out during the early decades of the 20th century. The basic unit of reality in Whitehead’s system is an event-like entity called “actual occasion,” which is the procedural integration or “concrescence” of processes of data transfer (“prehensions”) into unities that become new data. Each actual occasion is the growing together of the total available information of the universe at that time, according to certain principles, repeating and reinforcing certain patterns (“eternal objects”) and thereby creating new ones. Whitehead’s process metaphysics is arguably the most comprehensive descriptive metaphysical framework we have to date—as Whitehead’s followers, past and present, have shown, not only can it be used for the interpretation of familiar domains of philosophical concern, but it can also provide illuminating descriptions for scientific domains where other metaphysical theories have little to offer, such as discourse pragmatics in linguistic typology, the neuro-psychological foundations of value judgments, quantum physics, or measurements in astrophysics.[2] By refurbishing Plotinus’s idea of divinity coming about in the world’s becoming, Whitehead’s philosophy also provided a new impetus to the philosophy of religion. Charles Hartshorne, perhaps the most eminent American philosopher of religion of the Twentieth century, adopted and expanded Whitehead’s ideas for a process view of God and developed the position of process theism in the style of rational speculative process thought. It is important to note, however, that while the early followers of Whitehead such as Hartshorne and Paul Weiss embraced the speculative principles of his philosophy, many present-day Whiteheadians are content to put the system’s ontological concepts to descriptive use.

Other proponents of speculative process metaphysics between 1850 and 1950, such as Charles S. Peirce, Samuel Alexander, C. Lloyd Morgan, and Andrew Paul Ushenko, contributed two new motives for process thought, namely, the philosophical explanation of evolutionary processes and the philosophical explanation of emergence and self-organization. However, they also created an image of process metaphysics that in the eyes of their contemporaries appeared methodologically problematic. The first step of these process-philosophical enterprises seemed legitimate business—surely it was important to identify the limitations of mechanistic explanations in science. But it was the second step, the endeavor of drafting purely speculative explanations for the direction and the origin of emergent evolution, that went against the positivist temper of the time. Such explanations did not sit well with the philosophers who defined and shaped the “analytic” method in postwar Anglo-American philosophy. As they rejected any empirical claims that would go beyond what was scientifically proven, and assigned to philosophy the more mundane task of analyzing conceptual contents (as well as linguistic and social practices, and phenomenal experiences), they increased the intersubjective verifiability of philosophical claims. But in the course of this important methodological revision the ontological categories of process metaphysics were mostly thrown out wholesale with the bathwater of the speculative explanations these categories were embedded in.

Nevertheless, twentieth century speculative process metaphysics is paralleled by an analytic-interpretive strand in contemporary process thought. This variety of process thought also proceeds from the theoretical intuition that processuality, in its various modes, is the primary starting point for a philosophical description of the world or of reality, but does not speculate about how reality develops. Here processuality either is a defining trait of the basic categories postulated for the analysis of common sense and scientific reasoning, in the style of analytic philosophy; or processuality is conveyed in the network of metaphors selected for the interpretation of human experience and the conditions of human existence, in the style of so-called ‘continental’ philosophy. Often contributions to analytic-interpretive processism are also placed somewhere in the middle between the poles of analytic versus continental methods in contemporary philosophy. The following examples will illustrate this methodological openness of non-speculative contemporary process philosophy.

Based on their analyses of phenomenal experience, the investigations of the “reflex arc” that were coming out of the psychology laboratory, and an analysis of human social praxis, William James and John Dewey each developed contributions to a process-based pragmatist metaphysics. James’ process-based account of the self loomed less large for the history of process philosophy, until recently at least, than Dewey’s more comprehensive view. Dewey holds that all existents are events whose characters we determine by giving them meaning in our interaction. For Dewey meanings are not abstract or psychic objects but aspects of human cooperative behavior—in our interactions with the world we create significances and thus determine what kind of situation occurs. Working from studies of social interaction, George Herbert Mead added to process-based pragmatism the thesis that mind emerges from social communicative actions. On the side of ‘continental’ philosophy, Henri Bergson arrived at a process metaphysics again based on an investigation of phenomenal experience, like James and Dewey. But while Dewey and other pragmatists put the process-character of being partly into the hand of human agents and their practical and theoretical interpretations of an ongoing situation, Bergson argued that the process-character of being is precisely out of our cognitive reach, at least in so far as we try to conceptualize what we experience. As long as we understand conscious experience as a subject-object relation, Bergson pointed out, we merely follow the theoretical habits in which we have been conditioned by the substance-metaphysical tradition. However, when we carefully attend to what we take in during conscious experience, especially our self-experience, without forcing a conceptualization of that experiential content or the act of experience, we find not a relation and ready-made relata but an interactivity—an ongoing interfacing out of which world and self arise in our conceptualizations. In immediate, non-conceptualized experience we grasp the dynamicity of this interfacing as becoming or the flow of duration (“durée”), but this felt dynamic content of our experience transcends what we can conceptually articulate. As soon as we try to conceptualize what we have grasped in “intuition” we turn the continuous complex flow of experience into a sequence of discrete units, into pluralities of states of objects at locations that engender Zeno’s paradoxes of motion, and we transform our entangled being with the world into the ever puzzling opposition of a subject and an object.

Martin Heidegger’s early and late philosophy also presents an analytic-interpretive contribution to process philosophy, without speculative formulations of metaphysical ‘laws of development,’ but with a view to the metaphilosophical and practical implications of process metaphysics. In Sein und Zeit (1927) Heidegger presents what could be called an ‘adverbial model’ of process metaphysics; based on an analysis of human existence (“Dasein”) Heidegger shows that what the metaphysical tradition understood as entities or factors standing in relational constellations—e.g., space, world, self, others, possibility, matter, function, meaning, time—can be viewed as ‘adverbial modifications’ of Dasein, as modes and ways in which Dasein occurs, while Dasein itself is the interactivity of “disclosure” or ‘taking as.’ Since Heidegger’s ‘taking as’ is an understanding that is ineradicably practical, his early philosophy bears certain affinities to the pragmatist tendency in twentieth century American process thought. In Heidegger’s later work, however, human understanding is no longer the dynamic ‘locus’ but more a dimension of the process of being (“clearing”).

While many twentieth century American process thinkers were influenced by Whitehead, some turned elsewhere or went their own ways. For example, W. H. Sheldon championed a largely dialectical view of the dynamic nature of reality with process as a principle of conflict resolution. Wilfrid Sellars, one of the great figures in post-war analytical philosophy, worked out what appears to be the first consistently nominalist and naturalist system ever developed in the history of Western philosophy; this is often overlooked, however, since the system relies on a process ontology that Sellars only briefly sketched but never elaborated. Naturalism implies a nominalist account of properties, Sellars argued, which in turn can only succeed if we take qualia to be aspects of processes—by categorizing blue as sensing-blue-ly, we can make better sense of how physical processes engender sensory contents (Sellars 1981). With the envisaged process-based solution to the body-sensory problem, which in many ways anticipates current ideas of “embodied cognition,” Sellars could further suggest a new process-based re-interpretation of intentionality. Any kind of content, Sellars argued, from the lowliest sensory content in bacteria to the norm-governed contents of conceptual experience to the contents of scientific theories, is nothing else but a way of functioning. Taking over from Sellars the idea that content is function, present-day functionalist theories of mind and cognition typically fail to acknowledge Sellars and thereby miss the decisive element for a successful functionalist ‘reduction’ of intentionality and the mental, namely, that the reductive basis, functions, are not static input-output tables but ongoing processes in natural systems that realize, in this ongoingness, normative socio-cultural practices (Seibt 2016). Recently American process metaphysics gained another important voice in Nicholas Rescher who, like Sellars, consistently pursued a systematic approach in philosophy. Rescher made important contributions to all philosophical disciplines; originally these were framed as components of a system of “methodological pragmatism” and “pragmatic idealism”. In the mid-1990s, however, Rescher sketched a process metaphysical embedding for his system, using familiar philosophical terminology, and thus presented the first systematic overview of the explanatory potential of a non-Whiteheadian process metaphysics that forfeits technical expenditure and operates with a notion of process that is close to our common-sense understanding of developments. In parallel, since the past four decades and with increasing intensity, researchers working in the intersection of ontology and linguistics, in philosophy of mind and cognitive science, in philosophy of biology or of quantum physics, have addressed specific questions in these areas with greater attention to types of processes and processual structures. These more targeted investigations will be taken up below.

Generally speaking, current Western process philosophy has abandoned all speculative aspirations and develops the descriptive, analytic-interpretive strand of process thought (the exception might be the use of process metaphysics in areas of philosophy of physics where physics itself is speculative, see footnote 19). While interest in processism most recently has increased in analytic philosophy of science, of mind, and of action, process thought is currently also used to highlight productive affinities between the continental and analytical trajectories of twentieth century metaphilosophical criticism of traditional metaphysics. Such analytic-continental cross-overs enabled by attention to process can also be observed in philosophy of cognition and in the philosophy of technology, often combined with alignments with the “4E paradigm of cognition” or “post-phenomenology”, respectively. Another more encompassing exploration across borders, a detailed historical and systematic comparison between Western and Eastern process philosophy (e.g., Daoism) is an important task yet to be undertaken.

2. Three tasks of process philosophy

As may have become clear from the brief review of historical contributions to (Western) process philosophy in section 1, process philosophy is a complex and highly diversified field that is not tied to any school, method, position, or even paradigmatic notion of process. Some process philosophers (e.g. Whitehead) took organismic processes as their central model for a concept of occurrences that generate the internal and external coherence of an entity. Others (e.g. James) chose as their canonical illustrations individual psychological processes, or (e.g. Alexander) took evolutionary development as paradigmatic. Some process philosophers (e.g. Whitehead and Morgan) articulated their approach in the form of an axiomatic theory and in close relation to science, while others (e.g. Bergson) worked from an almost mystical sort of sympathetic apprehension of reality and insisted that process metaphysics could, if at all, only be expressed by means of a highly metaphorical use of language. Some processists (e.g., Roger Boscovich) championed a materialist position, while others endorsed idealism (e.g., Leibniz and Hegel). The historical overview in the preceding section also displays that the tools of process philosophy are not tied to any specific method of philosophical inquiry, giving present-day process philosophers a broad spectrum of approaches with which to build their theories: by conceptual analysis (via informal and formal reconstructions of conceptual contents); by the integrative interpretation of scientific results; or by phenomenological investigations. Similarly, while compatibility with recent results of science is for many process philosophers a privileged methodological constraint, others take science to be merely an aspect of the more comprehensive philosophical datum of cultural praxis.

In short, process philosophy is best understood as the effort to replace a longstanding philosophical research paradigm, in a sense close to T. Kuhn’s use of the term, i.e., to replace a set of longstanding fundamental assumptions that delimit the scope of legitimate topics and direct theory construction. For example, process philosophers assume that the only primary or basic ontological categories should be terms for occurring entities, and that certain formal theories—for example, set theory—are ill-suited of themselves, without modifications, to express the dynamic relationships among occurrences. Or again, process thinkers hold that philosophical research may legitimately address ‘creative’ phenomena that cannot be described as the modification of a pre-existing and persistent unit, such as phenomena of complexity or self-organization. What unifies contemporary process-philosophical research more than any other aspect, however, is its metaphilosophical aim to revise long-standing theoretical habits. Given its current role as a rival to the dominant substance-geared paradigm of Western metaphysics, process philosophy has the overarching task of establishing the following three claims:

  • Claim 1: The basic assumptions of the ‘substance paradigm’ (i.e., a metaphysics based on static entities such as substances, objects, states of affairs, or instantaneous stages) are dispensable theoretical presuppositions rather than laws of thought.
  • Claim 2: Process-based theories perform just as well or better than substance-based theories in application to the familiar philosophical topics identified within the substance paradigm.
  • Claim 3: There are other important philosophical topics that can only be addressed within a process metaphysics.

Contributions to current process-philosophical research typically focus on (aspects of) only one of these three components of a theory revision.[3] More often than not, however, the larger purpose of the contribution remains implicit, which is one of the reasons why contemporary process philosophy, especially non-Whiteheadian process thought, does not clearly stand out as a unified effort at theory revision. Process philosophy currently presents itself as an internally diversified, geographically and disciplinarily distributed phenomenon of innovative thought in Western philosophy. Accordingly, there are significant differences in how process philosophers approach claims (1)–(3). In the following the focus will be on arguments for claims (1)–(3) within contemporary analytical process philosophy. The reader should thus keep in mind that the pointers set in the following sections are partially representative at best and need to be supplemented by introductions to, e.g., contemporary Whiteheadian process thought and French process thought (Gilles Deleuze, Alain Badiou). In addition, pointers to process-philosophical contributions to the philosophy of religion are all but omitted, since extensive and in-depth treatments are provided in the entries on Charles Hartshorne and process theism.

In order to support (Claim 1), two strategies have been pursued. The first strategy is to argue that the core assumptions of the substance paradigm—especially the focus on discrete, countable, static individuals and the neglect of dynamic aspects—simply reflect the cognitive dispositions that are typical for the speakers of the languages in which Western metaphysics were mainly developed, such as Ancient Greek, Latin, German, and English.[4] The second strategy is to select a well-known argument for the necessity of substance-based metaphysics and to show that it involves a petitio principii. For example, consider Peter F. Strawson’s widely accepted argument against the very possibility of process metaphysics.[5] Strawson’s argument can be reconstructed as follows:

  1. For objective and identifiable concrete entities to be knowable, they must be (i) distinguishable from other co-existents, and (ii) reidentifiable for one or more members in a community of speakers and knowers.
  2. Distinguishability and reidentifiability are conditions of “referential identification” for a community of knowers; they require a matrix for the emplacement of our experiential encounters with entities in a unified all-encompassing framework of coordination.
  3. Spatio-temporal location provides such a matrix; in order to constitute the space-time framework essential for interpersonal communication entities must “confer upon it their own fundamental characteristics. That is to say they must be three-dimensional objects with some endurance through time … They must collectively have enough diversity, richness, stability, and endurance to make possible just that conception of a single unitary [space-time] framework which we possess” (Strawson 1959, p. 39).
  4. Only one category of entities possesses these required features: “Of the categories of object which we recognize, only those satisfy these requirements which are, or possess, material bodies—in the broad sense of the expression. Hence given a certain general feature of the conceptual scheme which we possess, and given the character of available major categories, things which are, or possess, material bodies must be [epistemologically] basic particulars” (ibid.).

If this line of reasoning were correct, the substance paradigm would be indispensable, and (Claim 1) above would be false. For it is clear that any viable metaphysical theory must have room for identifiable individuals that can be located in space and time. However, step (4) in Strawson’s argument begs the question on two counts.

All of the conditions that Strawson requires in step (3) (diversity, richness, stability, and endurance or transtemporal sameness) arguably are fulfilled as much by the entities that we conceptualize as physical processes as by entities that “are or possess bodies.” For example, William Penn (2022) recently argued for an exclusively process-based version of scientific realism—already the praxis of natural science, but in particular also the scientific models for the fundamental constitution of matter, commits to a thoroughly processual ontology without underlying “basic particulars”: the stability of recurrent dynamic patterns does not entail staticity. Furthermore, one might argue that the entities we conceptualize as processes are physically realized without being literally embodied, and for some of them it holds that we can point at them and distinguish them (“this trickle versus that trickle”) and re-identify them (“the trickle was gone for a minute, but then it came again”). In nature’s spatio-temporal framework we distinguish and re-identify both things and processes. That Strawson’s argument could have appeared plausible is perhaps due to the fact that his illustrations for processes are sounds and explosions, which are not, like many other physical processes, lasting occurrences with determinate location (such as fires, tornadoes, or waterfalls). The initial plausibility of step (4) may also derive from a core assumption of the substance paradigm, namely, the thesis that all processes can be ontologically understood as modifications of substances. On this reductionist view, all processes are ‘owned’ and we identify them via their owner: the murder of Cæsar, the construction of the forbidden city, etc. But the fact that these processes involve certain things and persons is merely one of the aspects that an ontological interpretation of processes should capture, and not a decisive one, since many processes (e.g., tornadoes, lightening bolts, today’s rush-hour in New York) lack a proper ‘subject’ altogether.

Even more important is the second question-begging element involved in step (4) of Strawson’s argument, for it displays the theoretical bias of the substance paradigm at a more fundamental level. Strawson sets up conditions for the ontological category or entity type that can constitute a space-time framework and claims in step (4) (i) that “things that are or possess bodies” can fulfill these conditions, and (ii) that therefore such things are “basic particulars.” In this way Strawson turns a common sense concept, viz. “material thing,” into a basic ontological category without asking whether it is possible that what we common-sensically call a ‘thing’ might not also ontologically be interpreted in terms of a category from process metaphysics (e.g., as a bundle of activities or, in a Whiteheadian fashion, as ongoing pattern of events). Strawson elsewhere rejects such an interpretation as “revisionary metaphysics” while metaphysics based on material things or substances is “descriptive,” but these adjectives are themselves in need of a convincing justification—as long as an ontological category fully captures the inferential content of a common sense concept, it is as descriptive as any other.

In short, then, Strawson’s argument fails on two counts. It is simply not the case that material things are the indispensable basis for a framework of knowable, uniquely located, re-identifiable items. Physical processes of a suitable sort can accomplish this task as well. Moreover, even if material things were the only candidates for epistemically reidentifiable items, it still would be an open question how we should interpret things ontologically. To be sure, the rebuttal of Strawson’s argument does not suffice to establish Claim 1, but it keeps process philosophy in the running.

3. Beyond traditional ‘bifurcations’: process-philosophical approaches to old questions

The best way to show that the core assumptions of the substance paradigm are not laws of thought is to dispense with them while working out philosophical accounts that are anchored in a new research paradigm. Whitehead’s philosophy still is the most comprehensive, systematic, and detailed proposal for such a fundamental theory revision, but, as often remarked upon, the depth of Whitehead’s philosophical revision does not make for easy access. Accordingly, contemporary processists fall essentially into three groups. The first group pursues the task of explicating Whitehead’s philosophy to the philosophical mainstream, e.g., by putting metaphilosophical issues centerstage (Auxier and Herstein 2017).[6] The second group adopts selected insights or elements of Whitehead’s scheme, partly without attribution, in order to work out, in mainstream terminology, a solution to a specific problem. The third group develops distinctly non-Whiteheadian routes into process philosophy, guided by research in linguistics or new branches and results of science. In the following the focus will be on the third group, with occasional pointers to contributions to the second.

The last mentioned research line in contemporary analytical process philosophy takes its departure from mid-20th century philosophical and linguistic research on discourse about occurrences. Zeno Vendler (1957) and Anthony Kenny (1963) argued that actions can be sorted into various types according to certain logical and linguistic features of verbs denoting these actions. The resulting classifications of “action types” are similar, but Vendler’s fourfold division operated with fewer criteria and thus proved more influential: whether a “verb” denotes a “state”, “activity”, “accomplishment”, or “achievement” depends on whether in present tense the progressive form needed, whether it can be combined with the verb “finish,” or whether it applies an any moment of a temporal interval at which it applies. Certain problems with Vendler’s and Kenny’s classifications were first noted by linguists Henk Verkuyl (1972) and Barry Taylor (1977). Most seminal, however, was Alexander Mourelatos’ (1978) observation that the distinctions that Vendler and Kenny tried to capture do not pertain to the lexical semantics of “action verbs” but to the semantics of entire sentences, and not of sentences about actions but about occurrences in general. This renders the classificatory task much more complex than Vendler and Kenny envisaged. Since then the linguistic discussion has produced (under the keywords “Aktionsart,” “verbal aspect,” and “aspectuality”) a plethora of theories about the many different ways in which natural languages express the dynamic aspects of a situation. These linguistic theories provide essential data for analytical process ontology, but one must not overlook that there are language-specific interplays between verb semantics, tense system, and aspectual meanings, and that ontology should be guided by inferential differences that hold across languages.[7]

Informed by these early inquiries into the inferential characteristics of occurrence types, analytical process ontologists have offered various criteria sets for the classification of occurrences and their relationships to other categories: some promote a division between ongoing (“processes”) and completed (“events”) occurrences, while others argue that ongoing occurrences should be distinguished further into non-developmental and developmental processes.[8] There is also considerable disagreement on how to categorize these occurrence types: are they concrete or abstract? Are they particular or general entities? Mourelatos also showed that the logical criteria of Vendler’s and Kenny’s classifications actually function in two ways: they can be used to distinguish various types of occurrences such as processes and events, but they also highlight inferential analogies between processes and stuffs on the one hand, and events and things on the other hand. Most analytical processists characterize processes (or which ever label is used for the basic category) as dynamic individuals that are concrete particulars or else are abstract general patterns. By contrast, heeding the inferential analogies in our reasoning about activities and stuffs, “General Process Theory” rejects the presupposition that concrete individuals need to be particulars: “general processes” (or “dynamics”) are introduced as a new ontological category of concrete, dynamic entities that are non-particular (i.e., possibly multiply occurrent in space and time), determinable, and “functionally individuated” (by contextually determined sections of process networks).[9] However, both particularist and non-particularist interpretations agree that processes cannot be individuated in terms of their spacetime location alone and cannot be identified with materially filled space-time regions, thus parting company with “four-dimensionalism,” (a position in contemporary ontology that is occasionally misunderstood as a process-based approach). Furthermore, while processists agree that processes combine and that they exhibit common features, there is disagreement on how to articulate such process combinations (e.g., by a special mereology), and whether the shared patterns of processes belong into a different category (as Whitehead suggested) or are themselves processes as well.

In short, analytical process philosophy has worked out concepts and theories of its own, however pedestrian and patchwork, as an alternative to Whitehead’s sophisticated system of categories, and there is a multitude of approaches within analytical process ontology. Besides different classifications of occurrences and different ontological characterizations of processes, there appear to be two research lines, one with focus on the role of processes in the philosophy of time, action, or experience (see e.g. the work of Antony Galton, Rowland Stout, and Helen Steward), and one with focus on the role of processes in scientific reasoning (see section 4 below). Despite all differences in constructive detail, however, Whiteheadian and non-Whiteheadian process philosophy both recommend themselves as gateways to renovating philosophical discourse by deconstructing traditional dichotomies. Here are just a few of the topics where processists promise philosophical advance.

(i) Beginning with a familiar Whiteheadian move, the rejection of the traditional “bifurcation of nature” into a physical and a mental domain, the process approach opens up new ways of looking at a wide variety of issues, and in particular on the relationship between mind and nature. Whiteheadians argue that the traditional mind-body problem dissolves if all basic constituents of reality are short-lived processes of information transfer that exhibit both ‘mental’ and ‘physical’ aspects in different accentuations according to context. Quite independently of Whitehead’s philosophy and commitments to panpsychism, a number of analytical philosophers have argued that the present-day debate in philosophy of mind and philosophy of action has been hampered by an ontology that is focused on upshots (states, and state-like events) and promote a theoretical ‘Gestalt’ switch in the metaphysics of experience and agency (Stout 2017). Helen Steward (1997, 2012) criticizes the standard conception of perception and agency as a causal sequence of states, some of which are physical and some mental; in order to make room for agentive freedom within the natural world Steward proposes that we view agency as a special form of downward causation, taking our bearings from the hierarchical systems of functioning in biological organisms (2017). Others have pointed out that our common sense (teleological) explanations of actions commit us to ongoing occurrences (Stout 1996) or that we can best make sense of the unity of our experience if we take processes to be the objects of our experiences rather than states or things (Soteriou 2013).[10] The so-called “dynamical hypothesis” in cognitive science (Van Gelder 2000) generated a line of philosophical research on dynamic models of the mind that is strongly guided by scientific research, especially by cognitive science using a connectionist model of the mind (see below).

(ii) Similarly, as non-Whiteheadian analytical processists have pointed out, process metaphysics reconfigures the traditional problem of universals since it abandons the substance-metaphysical principle that concrete entities are fully determinate while general or indeterminate entities are abstract (i.e., they must not be, undergo, or initiate changes).[11]

(iii) Processists also have offered novel approaches to the problem of persistence, either by taking persistent entities to be “enduring” patterns of processes (Whitehead), or by questioning the idea that “perdurance” vs. “endurance” accounts of persistence form a theoretically necessary exclusive dichotomy.[12]

(iv) The dichotomy of ‘fact’ and ‘norm,’ some processists argue, is another traditional “bifurcation” that can be bridged. Some natural processes realize a certain form of low-degree normativity. In some process organizations (e.g., far-from-equilibrium systems) each component process presupposes every other for its own occurrence; in the context of these particular process organizations the dependence amongst the single processes is not merely a matter of linear causation but constrained by the simultaneous interactions of the entire system, ensuring that each process is ‘functional for’ the occurrence of the system.[13]

(v) Finally, the process approach also can be used to sidestep traditional dichotomies in the philosophy of religion. While the opposition between “immanence” and “transcendence” traditionally is taken to amount to an exclusive alternative, whether in application to universals or to God, the tools of process metaphysics allow us to pursue a third option that exploits the explanatory grammar of the ‘mode.’ We often consider the mode or way in which a process, or collection of processes, occurs as a separate kind of process (compare, e.g., scratching a violin string with a bow vs. playing a tone on the violin; or a free market economy vs. a planned economy). Processes that are modifications of other processes are both immanent in the sense that they affect (by constraining and enabling) how the modified processes occur, but are transcendent in the sense that they are multiply realizable, that is, they are not themselves dependent on the particular spatio-temporal occurrences of the processes that realize them.[14]

In addition, there is a host of other contemporary issues where attention to processes generates novel answers that advance our understanding of the familiar questions of philosophy in important ways, even without challenging some central, defining, dichotomy. Cases in point are the ‘process account of causation’ (Salmon 1984, 1997)[15] or N. Rescher’s processist analysis of knowledge. Offering detailed reconstructions of the procedures of knowledge production, Rescher argues that rational inquiry, including science, is the process of creating coherent theories that systematize what we have established as data with increasing complexity (Rescher 1982). That this method of inquiry can yield (temporary) truths is justified by its practical success, but the method is essentially (a) interminable and (b) progressive, since: (a1) each knowledge claim contains presuppositions that raise new questions; (a2) reality is “cognitively inexhaustible”; and (b) since the increasing complexification of scientific knowledge can count as cognitive progress, even though such progress may not be discernible as cumulative or linear advance (Rescher 1977, 1978, 1984). For claims (a2) and (b) Rescher supplies process-metaphysical underpinnings, endorsing a view of nature as continuously evolving and a view of evolution as directed towards increasing complexity (Rescher 1996, 2006 ch. 10, and 2012; see also below section 6).

Perhaps the clearest example for the progress that a processist approach can bring to longstanding tasks of philosophy is in the theory of selfhood and personhood. Whatever cultural notions of ‘person’ and ‘self’ we may have acquired, our immediate self-awareness reveals us to ourselves as engaged in doings and undergoings. What we find ourselves to be doing and undergoing we understand as belonging to a space of possible occurrences. We notice patterns in what might possibly be going on with us, and some of these patterns we use to identify ourselves: in terms of our talents, skills, capabilities, traits, dispositions, habits, inclinations, and tendencies to action and inaction. It is integral to your self-awareness at this moment that your reading is yours, the reading of a self that is the same over time. But the sameness of this self we experience not as the sameness of a time-invariant thing but as the sameness of an ‘operation’ of integration—an ongoing unification of experienced patterns in ways that enable a first-person perspective. Some process philosophers have taken the experience of dynamic sameness in self-experience as the basis for constructing a process-metaphysical account of personhood that defines the core self as a unified manifold of actions and capacities, tendencies, and dispositions to (physical or psychical) actions (see e.g. Rescher 1996 ch.6). In this way they preserve a concept of personhood that renders the self or ego experientially accessible. The unity of a person is a unity of experience—the coalescence of all of one’s diverse micro-experiences as part of one unified macro-process. Importantly, processists do not equate the cross-temporal unity of a person-process with a sequence of momentary total states of consciousness, as neo-Humean accounts currently postulate; rather, it is the sort of unity of process that links each minute’s happenings into a single overall journey. From the process point of view a self just is the complex process composed of various physical interactions, experiences, feelings, moods, and actions in their systemic interrelationship. The whole individual person is continuously ‘in the making’ or being constituted, yet it also continuously influences which components (e.g., experiences, feelings, actions) enter into the constitution of the whole and in which ways these components occur. Such circular dependencies between a whole and its parts cannot be accommodated within a theory of individuals that is committed to the basic constructional principles of the substance paradigm, especially the claim that concrete individuals are fully determinate. Relationships of mutual constitution are legitimate theoretical tools within process ontologies where entangled recursive definitions are not in conflict with basic tenets about individual entities. By extending the dynamic dependencies among the component processes of a self to include aspects of the person’s physical and social context, a process account of persons can formulate in a differentiated and scientifically informed fashion various claims about the formative role of our environments.[16]

Harking back to (Claim 2) and (Claim 3) above, extant process-geared treatments of familiar topics surely provide considerable support for the claim that process philosophy is viable (Claim 2). But in the eyes of many processists (Claim 3) matters most—as the next section will sketch, currently it may be process philosophy’s primary asset that it enables us to articulate and address important new questions raised by modern science.

4. Tracking science: new topics for process philosophy

The relationship to science and technology appears to mark a distinctive difference between continental process philosophy (Heidegger, Deleuze, Badiou) on the one hand, and, on the other hand, early American process philosophy (Peirce, James, Dewey, Whitehead, Mead) as well as current analytical process thought. While the former develops a critical point of view to reflect on the enterprises of science and technology as cultural objects, the latter aligns its investigations with the aims and results of science and technology, often with an explicit commitment to naturalism. In fact, the early phase of process philosophy in America was mainly motivated by an effort to come to terms with the far-reaching philosophical implications of the Darwinian theory of evolution. For these early American process thinkers evolution was an emblematic and paradigmatic process—it seemed to provide a clear template for understanding how novelty and innovation come into both the human world and the world of nature. The evolutionary framework calls for a new metaphysics, the American pragmatists argued, which could articulate the pervasive role of process and of the passage of time. Was there a vehicle or substance that could ‘carry’ physical, biological, and cosmic evolution? If neither individuals nor types (species) of things are time-invariant, a new account of being was needed that had room for the emergence of novelty in nature, and could convey a sense of human existence as both “precarious and stable” (Dewey). The idea that evolution was a fact that philosophy had to accommodate explains many of the elements of early American process thought, in particular the understanding of dynamicity as a force of creating novelty, as well as the need to take a stance on the question whether the overall process of reality is directed or blind—which ultimately split the group (see section 6).

Present-day contributions to analytical process philosophy are no longer driven by an attempt of making sense of evolution. However, they are often still motivated by the view that there are certain results in science that philosophy simply must come to grips with, and if this task involves a fundamental revision of the standard tools of philosophy, then philosophy should provide new conceptual tools. For quite some time researchers in the philosophy of biology and in the philosophy of chemistry have argued that process-based or process-geared approaches yield better ontological descriptions of these domains, i.e., better capture the inferential content of the basic concepts of biology and chemistry.[17] The case of biology provides particularly strong empirical motivations for a ‘process turn,’ as witnessed by a recent collection of research in philosophy of biology that deserves special attention since most of its contributors do not proceed from but arrive at process-ontological theses (Nicholson and Dupré 2018). As the editors point out, metabolism, lifecycles, and interdependencies between genetics and ecology—that is, processes that occur both at the level of cell biology as well as at the level of multicellular organism—present three classes of biological phenomena that in different ways dismantle substance-ontological presumptions; these phenomena call for an ontology that treats transtemporal sameness as a time-scale dependent feature of process systems and models organisms no longer as independent and comparatively discrete substances but as a complex network of internal and external interactions.[18]

Beyond chemistry and biology there are other scientific domains where scientific progress suggests process-ontological redescriptions since the conceptual contents of the relevant scientific terms cannot, without problematic distortions, be analyzed in terms of the categories of substance metaphysics. However, there are also scientific domains and topics that directly imply a process-ontological interpretation since the researchers working in these areas already have adopted processist idioms in their informal glosses of mathematical descriptions and in their heuristic approach to the domain. Cases in point for a ‘process turn’ within science itself are (i) quantum physics, (ii) self-organization, and, most recently, (iii) cognition.

(i) Quantum-physical processes: When Whitehead turned from mathematics to philosophy, he was quite aware that recent developments in physics (the demise of classical atomism in the face of quantum theory and relativity theory) had thrown out our old common-sense vision of the order of the universe. Quantum physics brought on the dematerialization of physical matter—matter in the small could no longer be conceptualized as a Rutherfordian planetary system of particle-like objects. The entities described by the mathematical formalism seemed to fit the picture of a collection of fluctuating processes organized into apparently stable structures by statistical regularities—i.e., by regularities of comportment at the level of aggregate phenomena. During the early decades of the twentieth century process philosophers were excited by the evidence that physics had turned the tables on the core refuge of substance metaphysics: classical atomism. Instead of very small things (atoms) combining to produce standard processes (avalanches, snowstorms) modern physics seemed to suggest that very small processes (quantum phenomena) combine to produce standard things (ordinary macro-objects) as a result of an as yet not understood modus operandi that could, nevertheless, be mathematically described. So-called enduring “things” in this picture would come about through the emergence of stabilities in statistical fluctuations, as a stability wave in a surging sea of process, metaphorically speaking.

Contemporary quantum physics has produced a more diversified theory landscape, and it is an open question whether we have moved beyond the point where Whitehead’s metaphysical transposition of the field concept is still pertinent, or could be adjusted to interpret also one of the currently competing theories.[19] However, very generally speaking, there are at least four basic aspects of our current views of the quantum-physical domain that seem to favor a process metaphysics, whether Whiteheadian or non-Whiteheadian. First, as the so-called ‘problem of identical particles’ indicates, in the microphysical domain individuation and countability fall asunder, which calls for an ontology of ‘subject-less’ processes that are the features by which we individuate quantum-physical entities, but occur in countable units only relative to interaction context. Second, if spacetime is quantized and emergent, metaphysics cannot operate with basic entities that are individuated in terms of their spacetime locations. Third, the “measurement problem” presents a particular difficulty for substance metaphysics, since the latter rests on the assumption that all individuals are fully determinate independently of their interaction context. In contrast, process metaphysics endorses the principle that ‘interaction is determination.’ Fourth, quantum entanglement (e.g., in EPR-Bohm systems) seems a clear-cut example of ontic emergence that substance metaphysics cannot accommodate; while some systems properties (e.g., weight) can be construed as resulting directly from the causal properties of the elements of a collection of persistent substrata, the correlations that measurements on entangled quantum entities display cannot be interpreted in this fashion since the properties of the components of the system do not exist independently of the measurement performed. The measured correlations thus are properties of an interaction and not of any substance. While working quantum physicists often are hesitant to attempt any conceptual explication of mathematical models of quantum physical processes, Carlo Rovelli is a notable exception. Rovelli’s relationist interpretation of loop quantum gravity is committed to an understanding of physical being as becoming in a radical sense, as a sort of change that does not presuppose a pre-existing spacetime framework.[20]

Interestingly, via the unlikely subject of an ontology of quantum physics, new points of contact have opened up between analytical and (‘continental’) interpretive process thought in Karen Barad’s metaphysics of “agential realism” (Barad 2007). Grounded in a detailed interpretation of the philosophy of Niels Bohr, Barad views reality as the entanglement of natural and social“agencies” the distinctness of which emerges in the specific “intra-actions” produced by specific physical set-ups (experiments); the continuous “intra-activity” of reality, Barad argues, calls for a non-essentialist, performatist understanding of meaning and values.

(ii) Self-organization: Process metaphysics traditionally has been motivated by the fact that it seems to give the best explanation of the phenomena of diachronic emergence, originally understood as an integral feature of evolution. Since the development of scientific theories of “self-organization,” “chaos,” and “complexity” have begun to alter our understanding of evolutionary change, there is a new need for a metaphysics that can accommodate all sorts of phenomena where dynamic organizations exert causal constraints. While older, speculative, process metaphysics embraced the idea of purposes and creativity in nature, and allowed for the explanatory category of a ‘self-realizing’ or ‘self-engendering’ entity (in various terminological guises), present-day analytical processists confine themselves to arguing that “downward causation” becomes perfectly intelligible once physicalism has been divorced from the assumptions of the substance paradigm, and especially from the principle that causal powers cannot be attributed to dynamic organizations.[21]

(iii) Embodied cognition: The turn to “embodied cognition” in cognitive science provides another strong motivation for the turn to process in metaphysics. The standard model of cognition as the computation of symbolic representations fits well with the assumptions of substance metaphysics and suggested a pleasing analogy to classical atomism: mental operations effect relational change of cognitive atoms. But the first rivals to the standard model, connectionism and the so-called “Dynamic Hypothesis” (Van Gelder 2000), were constructed along largely process-ontological lines, replacing the classical conception of cognitions as discrete abstract objects that represent concrete things outside the head with a dynamic conception of cognitions as modes of functionings of a neural net or of process organizations. The neural network model of the mind dominates in recent cognitive science and neuroscience where mathematical models of “predictive processing” (see the entry on connectionism). In parallel with the development of the connectionist model of the mind, proponents of “interactivism” and “embodied cognition” argued that the bodily interaction of an organism plays a constitutive role in cognition. A key notion for the early debate about the‘embodiment thesis’ was the concept of “structural coupling,” a phase in the contemporaneous development of two systems (e.g., organism and environment) where mutual dynamic dependencies unfold across system boundaries. During the last decade researchers working in the intersection of cognitive science and philosophy of mind appear to have adopted the “4E model of cognition”, holding that cognition is not only embodied, but also “embedded, enacted, and extended” (Newen et al 2018). The 4E model of cognition is explicitly committed to a process view but much ontological work remains to be done in order to distill biologically relevant process architectures from the statistical formulas (e.g., “Markov blankets”) that characterize neural network behaviors.[22]

5. Current challenges

Process philosophers share the view that being is dynamic or that there are no concrete static entities; however, as stressed throughout this entry, there are also profound differences in the way process philosophers work out this basic intuition in their descriptions of the structure of reality and our understanding of it. Which of the competing approaches to process philosophy can count as the currently most promising? If processist theories recommend themselves in terms of their explanatory force, as offering new solutions to old problems (section 3), or better conceptual resources for new tasks (section 4), then surely explanatory force should also be the standard for evaluating processist theories. But while cross-paradigm explanatory advantages in the sense of sections 3 and 4 can be gauged more straightforwardly, this becomes rather more difficult at the level of intra-paradigm comparisons. Does the wide scope of Whitehead’s philosophy of organism outweigh the fact that all explanatory technical terms are dissociated from the rest of philosophical discourse? Or again, is the explanatory force of a formal axiomatic process ontology greater than a process metaphysics formulated with the means of common sense terms whose meanings are carefully gerrymandered, or one that operates with a network of metaphors and relies on the reader’s hermeneutic response? Should depth and detail of the ontological description matter less perhaps than the impressive explanatory scope of a consistently naturalist process view of “The Whole Person”, from microphysics to macrosociology (Bickhard 2022)? Here, at the intra-paradigm level, arise all the far-reaching methodological questions that surround philosophical explanation in general. Setting these larger questions aside, and focusing just on processist work in the style of analytic philosophy, the explanatory force of a processist theory may depend on how well it addresses the following challenges.

The first challenge is to define the notion of dynamicity itself. If the individuals of a processist theory are ‘dynamic’ rather than ‘static,’ how can we make sense of this new category feature? Some processists say that a process or dynamic entity is denoted by an English sentence in the progressive, or—less closely tied to the peculiarities of English grammar—by sentences licensing certain inferential patterns of aspectual meaning (see footnote 6). In both cases the definitional task is thus deferred to linguistic theories of aspect; these theories, however, take the term ‘dynamic’ to be understood. Alternatively, one might return to Aristotle and define dynamicity as the actualization of a potency or capacity. Such metaphysical expenditure can be justified if we need to embrace a notion of the ‘real’ as characterized by actuality and potentiality anyway in order to arrive at a plausible interpretation of quantum physics (as argued in Eastman et al 2016 and Eastman 2020). A third, naturalist, strategy for defining different types of dynamicity has been suggested by Terrence Deacon, who introduces an ontological label (“homeodynamics”) for the processing that realizes the tendency of energy dissipation characterized by the second law of thermodynamics, and describes the emergence of two other forms of dynamicity (“morphodynamics” and “teleodynamics”) in terms of relationships of processes constraining each others’ tendencies for thermodynamic dissipation (Deacon 2012). Since some of those processual constraints are self-referential in the sense that they prevent (constrain) the thermodynamic dissipation of processing-under-such-constraints—a process architecture that Mark Bickhard labeled “recursive self-maintenance” (2004)—Deacon’s approach to an understanding of dynamicity not only picks up on metaphysical insights of articulated in Buddhism and Daoism (Deacon and Cashman 2016), but also resonates with the fourth strategy of defining dynamicity, championed in German Idealism. Notwithstanding profound differences in systematic embedding, Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling exploit the semantics of self-referential propositions to convey a dynamic understanding of being that is ‘presence without availability’, i.e., a ‘presence’ that can be grasped by, and as such has the character of, a non-terminating recursion. A fifth strategy for addressing the task of defining dynamicity would be to reject the task and to directly challenge the idea of being as static. For example, one might argue that we may be able to think coherently that geometrical shapes have a sort of being that is static or unchanging, but physical entities this is not possible, since it would imply that physical properties can be literally possessed at an instant of time.

The second challenge is to state precisely how processes relate to space and time. Does a commitment to a process metaphysics imply a certain metaphysics of time? Do processes in some fashion constitute space and time, as Whitehead postulated? Or are they occupiers of spatiotemporal regions like perduring entities, just not static (and thus, for example, providing better support for presentist accounts of time than classical substances)? Upon a closer look, the distinction between “perdurance” and “endurance” (Mark Johnston, David Lewis), which is commonly (though perhaps not quite correctly) linked to W.E. Johnson’s distinction between occurrents and continuants, sits badly with a process ontology. For ‘activity-like’ processes (e.g., snowing) somehow seem to take time just as perduring entities do, yet are “wholly present” at every time at which they exist, just like enduring entities or continuants. Several authors thus have pointed out that processes behave like continuants.[23] As mentioned above in section 3, this opens up a new solution path for the problem of persistence, but it also calls for a clear account of how ongoing developmental and activity-like processes are situated in time and space, and how they relate to extended temporal and spatial regions. Moreover, if processes relate to space and time in ways that does not allow for individuation in terms of spatiotemporal location, how else do we individuate processes? Should we take our bearings from scientific practices of individuating particular processes (Pemberton 2018) or can we, at least for some types of processes, lay down general conditions to determine which processes are parts of particular process individuals (Kaiser 2018)? For those who take processes to be (abstract or concrete) “type-like” non-particulars the question of individuation can be addressed in the same way in which we individuate types, namely, by classificatory taxonomies that, among other criteria, relate to the way in which processes occur in space and/or time. [24]

The third challenge consists in describing the different ways in which processes relate to each other and especially, how they combine. Since process combinations may engender emergent processes, and also in other regards do not abide by the laws of Boolean algebra, neither set theory not classical extensional mereology can be used as formal frameworks ontologically to describe and classify different types of process combinations. Moreover, since the parthood relation on processes is not transitive, at least when processes are not identified with extended spatiotemporal regions, further deviations from the classical axiomatization of the parthood relations are necessary to formalize a mereology on processes.[25] Alternatively, some authors suggest representing process architectures with the means of mathematical category theory. Since some category-theoretically defined notions of compositionality restrict decomposition, proponents of “applied category theory” argue that interdependencies of (the identity of) wholes and parts in process structures also can be represented within this formalism without incurring substance-ontological commitments. Some authors recommend category theory for a formal Whiteheadian approach to process metaphysics (Ferrari 2021, Auxier & Herstein 2017), while others use it to formulate notions of compositionality that can be applied across domains from computer science to quantum physics (Coecke 2017). Also systematic connections between process structures can be captured category-theoretically, as Phillips and Wilson (2010 ) show the case of the systematicity of cognitive capacities. Besides mereology and category theory, some authors explore formal dialectical theories in order to describe the “logic” of real changes (Brenner and Igamberdiev 2021).

The fourth challenge is more fundamental. If any of the basic theoretical terms of the many process philosophies, past and present, are to have explanatory value at all, there must be a way to tie the process philosopher’s basic intuition to ordinary experience. After all, the purpose of philosophy is to enhance human understanding, and the core concepts of philosophical explanations must in some fashion be anchored in what we intuitively understand from everyday experience. In fact, some process philosophers (e.g., Whitehead) argue that the traditional notion of substance (a time-invariant, necessarily uniquely located particular) precisely lacks any experiential grounding. On the other hand, substance ontology has been capitalizing on the fact that the canonical illustrations of substances, things or living things, loom large in our practical interactions. The explanatory force of a process ontology thus will depend on whether it is possible to identify a similarly salient canonical illustration for whatever technical notion of process is postulated as basic category. Some process approaches use self-experience as anchoring canonical illustration for postulated technical notions of dynamic sameness and unity, but one might worry that this model is all too complex.

6. The ultimate question: is reality directed?

As emphasized throughout, process philosophy is a complex and highly diversified field that is difficult to describe in more than general and disjunctive terms. In conclusion this section will highlight a topic on which contemporary process philosophers are fundamentally divided, to the extent that one group believes that the entire issue is ill-conceived.

As Rescher (1996, ch. 5) points out, processists fall into two principal camps. On the one side is the teleological (and often theological) wing that sees nature’s processuality as a matter of teleological directedness towards a positive destination. On the other side is the naturalistic (and generally secularist) wing that sees nature’s processuality as a matter of an inner dynamicity without any directness or at least without any directedness towards a specifiable destination. Both agree in according a central role to inherent dynamicity in nature. But the one (naturalistic) wing sees this in terms of randomness that leads in arbitrary ways away from the settled formulations of an established past, while the other (teleological) wing sees this in terms of a goal-directed purposiveness preestablished by some value-geared directive force.

The division between secular and theological process philosophy has its roots in the early phase of contemporary process thought in late 19th and the first half of the 20th century, and centers on two views of evolutions. For secular, atheological processists evolution typifies the creative workings of a self-sustaining nature that fulfills the vision of a certain positivist program, dispensing altogether with a God function to explain any of the events in or appertaining to the universe.[26] For theological processists like Teilhard de Chardin, however, evolution exhibits God’s handwriting in the book of nature.

Present-day processists, who in the main no longer take Darwinian evolution as a concept or phenomenon that demands a commitment for or against theism, are wont to point to possible areas of agreement (see Rescher ibid.). First, present-day processists point out that both secular and theological protagonists of process thought can see evolution not only as a crucial instrument for understanding the role of intelligence in the world’s scheme of things but also as a key aspect of the world’s natural development. In addition, both secular and theological processists can agree that the evolutionary process provides process philosophy with one of its main models for how large scale collective processes can inhere in and result from the operation of numerous small-scale individual processes, thus accounting for innovation and creativity also on a macro-level scale. Second, present-day processists draw attention to the fact that early process thinkers were divided in their assessment of the phenomenon of evolution, since they failed to draw a division within the phenomenon of evolution itself. Undoubtedly, human intelligence is based on teleologically blind natural selection operating with random mutations to produce the neurophysiological capacities of the human brain. Cultural evolution, on the other hand, does not share these features and could well appear as in some sense directed. For example, one might argue that cultural evolution is generally Teilhardian, in that it is governed by a rationality-geared selection among purposefully devised mutational variations. Cognitive evolution involves both biological and cultural components, superimposing non-random rational decision-making on biological selection. Our cognitive capacities and faculties are part of the natural endowment we owe to biological evolution. But our cognitive methods, procedures, standards, and techniques are socio-culturally developed resources that evolve through rationality-geared decision making in the process of cultural transmission through successive generations. Our cognitive hardware (mechanisms and capacities) develops through Darwinian natural selection, but our cognitive software (the methods and procedures by which we transact our cognitive business) develops in a Teilhardian process of rationality-geared decision-making that involves purposeful intelligence-guided variation and selection. In the eyes of present-day processists—at least those that no longer pursue speculative process thought—it is for scientific research to decide whether, and to what extent, the relationship between biological and cognitive evolution can be understood on the analogy that ‘biology produces the instrument and culture writes the music,’ with the instrument constraining the playable music, and not vice versa (cf. Rescher 1996 ch. 5 and Rescher 2006 ch. 10).

There is a middle ground between strict theological teleology on the one hand, and, on the other hand, the naturalistic view that there is no final end that all processes are ultimately directed towards. According to this third alternative, a ‘soft’ version of the teleological position, process is progress. For, so goes this line of reasoning, one can draw a lesson from evolutionary theory about collective progress despite contingency and mortality at the scale of the individual organism. In the small – i.e., item by item – nature’s processes are self-canceling: what arises in the course of time perishes in the course of time. But nevertheless, so the argument goes, (i) the overall course of processual change tends to the development of ever richer, more complex and sophisticated conditions of occurrence. Moreover, Darwinian evolutionism suggests (ii) that

… the arrangements which do succeed in establishing and perpetuating themselves will as a general tendency manage to have done so because they represent actual improvements in one way or another. … Accordingly, fruitfulness in the long run compensates for transiency and mortality at a smaller scale of occurrence. (Rescher 1996: 102)

These two central premises for soft teleology are quite substantive, however. Premise (i) presupposes that (iii) there is a general and comprehensive measure of simplicity or complexity that could be applied to natural and cultural processes in order to claim an overall tendency of development towards increased complexity; in particular, such a measure of complexity should make it possible to offset decreases of complexity with respect to one parameter by increases in complexity relative to another parameter. Premise (ii) presupposes that (iv) species survival can be taken as an indication of some aspect that meaningfully can be connected to the axiology of progress. Whether the optimism of the soft teleological position is justified thus ultimately depends on the tenability of claims (iii) and (iv).[27] The fact that the premises for soft teleology have direct implications for our current debate about transhumanism endows the old question of the directionality of reality with unexpected practical relevance for the regulation of artificial intelligence and robotics.

7. Institutionalization

Process thought constituted a prominent sector of the active philosophical scene in the USA during the first half of the 20th century. Apart from the proliferation of books and articles on the topic, it has achieved considerable institutionalization in the USA during the years after World War II. Indications of this phenomenon include the formation of the Society for Process Studies, as well as the prominence of process philosophizing within the aegis of the Society for American Philosophy and the American Metaphysical Society. Another clear token is the journal Process Studies, published by the Center for Process Studies in Claremont CA, and founded in 1971 by Lewis S. Ford and John B. Cobb, Jr., a publication that has become a major vehicle for article-length discussions in the field. Representatives of process philosophy occupy influential posts in departments of philosophy and of religious studies in many of American universities and colleges, and some half-dozen doctoral dissertations are produced annually in this field. But contemporary process philosophy is not geographically confined. In 2002, the publishing house Ontos in Frankfurt, Germany, launched a book series on “Process Thought”; though taken over by DeGruyter in 2015, over 25 volumes have appeared. In Europe the Center for Practical Philosophy at the Université du Louvain, Belgium, directed by Michel Weber, is a focal point for research on, and applications of, international process philosophy. The Bulgarian Academy of Science recently created a Center for Process Studies for philosophers and computer scientists. The German Whitehead Society regularly organizes conferences and summer schools on both Whiteheadian and non-Whiteheadian process thought. The International Process Network, recently launched by Mark Dibben at the University of Tasmania, Australia, is a new web community of international process philosophers of all philosophical proveniences East and West. Even though process philosophy is not institutionalized as such everywhere in the global field of philosophy, it is a research paradigm that currently is in use all around the world.


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Other Internet Resources


This entry owes inspiration, both in structure as well in scope, as well as some specific content (e.g., in the second half of section 2 and in section 6) to its predecessor, authored by N. Rescher. Whenever specific content has been adopted, references to Rescher’s work are given.

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