Petrus Ramus

First published Tue May 9, 2006; substantive revision Fri Oct 2, 2020

While Petrus Ramus (1515–1572) undoubtedly occupies an important place in the history of ideas, few nowadays would consider him to be one of the most significant philosophers of his time. Yet in his day he gained an impressive number of followers and admirers, and his works influenced the curriculum of many European universities. According to scholars such as Walter J. Ong, Ramus’ frequently reprinted books on logic “could in no real sense be considered an advance or even a reform” (Ong 1958: 5). Yet, it was mainly on the basis of these books that he acquired an impressive reputation in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries

We must look at Ramus as a typical phenomenon of the sixteenth century and its unceasing religious controversies. It was also a period of state building, during which Italian humanism was transformed into its Northern European counterpart. Ramus himself took part in this process. A Huguenot convert from Catholicism, he was one of the most famous victims of the St. Bartholomew’s day massacre. From early youth he fought against scholasticism and its interpretation of Aristotle; and he tried to reform the contemporary university curriculum in a way that would fulfill the new needs of the emerging states. As a good humanist, he approached everything linguistically and rhetorically.

The extent to which he was, in reality, an offspring of the scholastic tradition has yet to be recognized. Although he attracted many ardent supporters, a little scholastic anti-scholasticism was the main reason why his revolt against traditional philosophy did not produce an entirely new philosophical system. Ramus soon came to be considered, not an innovative thinker, but an outmoded one.

To gain a true picture of Petrus Ramus and his work, it is necessary to strike a balance between, on the one hand, the enthusiasm of his admirers and hagiographical biographers and, on the other, the scholars who, from a philosophical or a scholastic perspective, have criticized his lack of originality and consistency. Even among modern scholars there are different opinions of the significance or consistency of his work. It is impossible to describe Ramus’ thinking and to understand his importance without considering all sides of the story. He may never have intended to achieve what posterity has blamed him for not achieving. Instead modern historians have emphasized the huge impact his pedagogical ideas had for almost a century.

1. Biography

1.1 Ramus’ background and studies

Our information about Ramus’ life, apart from scattered biographical notes in his own books, comes mainly from three of his contemporaries: Johannes Thomas Freigius, Theophilus Banosius and Nicolas Nancelius. Freigius and Banosius spent only brief periods with Ramus and relied mostly on written sources. Banosius met Ramus once in Heidelberg in 1569, and Fregius’ time together with Ramus was limited to the latter’s stay in Basel in 1569–1570. Nancelius, however, was a close friend of his, first as a student and later as a colleague and collaborator; and the account he produced is more exhaustive and better written.

Ramus was born in 1515 to a poor but, according to him, illustrious family who lived in a small village in Picardy not far from Noyon, the birthplace of his contemporary, John Calvin (1509–1564). For some time his father even had to earn his living as a charcoal-burner. Later Ramus’ enemies would ridicule his humble parentage. According to Skalnik, however, we should consider Ramus’ doctrine and his pedagogical program in the light of these circumstances. After losing his father as a young boy, Ramus worked for a short time as a foot-soldier and a servant before he got the opportunity to study in Paris, becoming a Master of Arts in 1536. Nancelius praises his diligence and tells us that he earned his living by helping other students of greater means and consequently slept hardly more than three hours a night, resulting in a painful eye disease (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 178). The lengthy curriculum of the University of Paris was mostly governed by the demands of the Church and strongly influenced by a scholastic tradition dating from the late Middle Ages. In 1529 Francis I had established several royal professorships and had also set up a special college with a more humanist curriculum, the Collège royal (later known as the Collège de France), in order to reduce the power of the university.

Our knowledge of Ramus’ precise whereabouts and activities during these first years in Paris is quite limited; but it is likely that early on he began to criticize the role of scholasticism in university education. He claimed that he had reacted from the very beginning against the inconsistencies of the curriculum and of the teaching. As soon as he was allowed to give lectures, he tried to change what he himself had found so unsatisfactory. His endeavors to reform the curriculum were not, however, appreciated by his colleagues, who mounted strong resistance to them: his first textbooks, Aristotelicae animadversiones and Dialecticae institutiones, both published in 1543, were censured and eventually prohibited. He himself was briefly banned from teaching logic and rhetoric.

1.2 Regius professor

The tension between Ramus and the university did not abate. In 1551, however, he was appointed to a regius (royal) professorship in eloquence and philosophy. Holders of these chairs taught according to more humanist principles than those followed by university professors. The latter, for instance, strenuously defended the medieval rules for pronouncing Latin and Greek, which Ramus ridiculed, just as he derided those who tried to develop a formal logic that departed from the normal way in which people talk and write. Importantly the royal professorships were separated from the university and without any rules governing lectures or other duties, so the holders had a significant degree of independence. Still more important were Ramus’ insistent endeavors to reform the university. Among other things he suggested that the professors should be paid from public funds rather than by the students. Skalnik has emphasized the significance of Ramus’ program and dream of widening the scope of education to include even instruction of future craftsmen. Ramus argued unrelentingly in favor of a kind of meritocracy that implied selecting officials and professors on the basis of merits rather than lineage (Skalnik 2002: 41, 64 and 157).

Ramus published many books during his career. More than fifty were printed, and some came out in several editions. They vary in genre and length from commentaries on classical texts to short tracts or orations. His textbooks were widely read, but how the rules actually should be used is more clearly displayed in his commentaries. It is sometimes difficult to distinguish Ramus’ works from those of his closest colleague and friend, Omar Talon (c. 1510–1562). The two scholars influenced each other and exchanged ideas and texts. Talon’s Rhetorica (1548), for example, was essentially a slightly revised version of Ramus’ Institutiones oratoriae (1545). Nancelius describes an episode typical of this intricate friendship. Ramus, attacked by a colleague, took only three days to produce a witty reply, which was printed a few days later with Talon’s name on the title-page, though the latter had barely seen the manuscript (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 219–221). It was a great loss for Ramus when Talon died in 1562.

In 1561 Ramus took the dramatic step of converting to Protestantism. As a Huguenot, he lost the influential support of the Cardinal of Lorraine, which until then had been vital for his career advancement. From now on he could only hope for the patronage of the king. He was forced to leave Paris and the university, spending some years in Germany and Switzerland. He tried to obtain a chair in Heidelberg, where he took part in his first Protestant communion; despite this, the other professors refused him the chair that had been promised to him by the Count Palatine, Fredrick III. His attempt to be appointed to a chair in Strasbourg was also unsuccessful. Therefore, in 1570 he returned to Paris, where he took up his former position as royal professor, but without regaining his licentia docendi, his right to teach at the university. This meant that he was no longer permitted to deliver lectures and therefore was unable to attract large audiences (Banosius 1577: 33; cf. Ong 1958: 28). Ramus remained controversial also among his Reformed brethren. He sided with a minority that argued for a congregational leadership against a Presbyterian polity. In this debate Ramus adamantly defied Theodore Beza, who had succeeded Calvin in Geneva as leader of the Reformed Church. Beza was upset and even threatened Ramus with excommunication (Skalnik 2002: 88–147; Hotson 2007: 19).

1.3 Ramus’ death and personality

Ramus was an extremely controversial figure. He acquired admirers and friends as easily as he did opponents, critics and enemies—one of whom, according to an unreliable report, was responsible for his death. In spite of the differing accounts given by his biographers, we know that Ramus was murdered during the St. Bartholomew’s day massacre, which started on August 24, 1572. On the third day he was captured in his study at the Collège de Presles. His body was mutilated and perhaps decapitated before being thrown into the Seine. Although the king had ordered for him to be spared, we do not know why these instructions were disobeyed. Since, however, Ramus was not killed until the slaughter had almost died down, this may indicate that the reasons for his murder went beyond his conversion to Protestantism. At any rate, he became a kind of martyr to his many followers.

Nancelius, in order to present an accurate portrait of Ramus, provides some details about his way of life and his personality. He tells us that Ramus was as dark-skinned as an Italian or a Spaniard, rather tall and had an impressively black and bushy beard, of which he was very proud—once when the rector of the University of Paris ordered all professors to shave, Ramus obeyed but stayed at home until his beard had grown out again. His gait was graceful and regal, his posture striking and dignified. He seems to have been quite moderate in his drinking and eating habits. He spent most of his time reading, writing and talking with friends. Nancelius also reports that Ramus took a bath only once a year, but washed his hands, face and beard daily in a mixture of water and white wine. Although as a professor he was not allowed to marry, he did from time to time have female friends.

Ramus is reputed to have had a very bad temper. Sometimes he even physically attacked his young students, though apparently this did not prevent him from gaining many devoted disciples. He amassed a substantial fortune and made a provision in his will that this money should be used to establish a chair of mathematics. Significantly, it was not to be attached to the University of Paris but was instead to have the same type of special conditions granted to royal professors.

1.4 Ramus’ works

Ramus often shifted his opinions and constantly made quite substantial changes in his textbooks; sometimes he also reconsidered his views on important part of his writings, although he always stuck to the core of his program. During Ramus’ early years at the University of Paris he devoted himself to the disciplines or arts of the traditional trivium: grammar, rhetoric and dialectic. He formulated his ideas on logic in 1540s and the early 1550s, and it is during this period that he gave most explicit expression to his anti-Aristotelianism. In 1555 he published a logic textbook in French, entitled Dialectique, which in many ways provided a clear indication of his ambitions and aims. Although he had become well known for his Latin eloquence, he broke with the scholastic tradition by writing in the vernacular. The following year he published the same book in Latin under the title Dialecticae libri duo (henceforth Dialectica). It was later printed in many different languages, and hundreds of editions of the Latin version were published. The book was widely disseminated and used at schools and universities throughout Europe, mostly in the Protestant countries.

Ramus’ rhetoric textbook, the Institutiones rhetoricae, written with Talon, appeared in 1545 but with only Talon’s name on the title-page. It was a kind of companion to the Dialecticae institutiones, published two years earlier. A second edition, entitled Rhetorica, though popular and frequently reprinted in new editions, never attained the diffusion and influence of his logic textbook. During the late 1550s and the 1560s Ramus published his lectures on the various arts, including physics and metaphysics. While his textbooks were succinctly organized according to very strict principles, the lectures (Scholae) were less laconic and offered more detailed discussion. They were later collected together and published as Scholae in liberales artes in a Basel edition of 1569.

Ramus also turned his hand to mathematics, although his knowledge of the subject was limited. He had problems at first understanding the Greek mathematicians, and later he recalled his early encounter with them:

…I threw away my drawing-board and ruler, and burst out in rage against mathematics, because it tortures so cruelly those who love it and are eager for it. (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 205)

According to Nancelius, Ramus used to gather around him in his own house a number of proficient mathematicians, so that they could help him to understand what he would later teach his students. Yet, from the very beginning, he was convinced of the importance of mathematics. Nancelius thinks his master’s keen interest in mathematics was a consequence of his banishment for some time from teaching philosophy (Ramus, Collectaneae praefationes, epistolae, orationes, p. 409; Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 197–201; Goulding 2006: 74, 2010: 20). In any case, he improved his abilities in both Greek and mathematics, and in his will he stipulated that the holder of the chair he wanted to endow should be an expert in both. Ong’s negative judgment of Ramus’ mathematical abilities may be correct (Ong 1958: 27); nevertheless, his enthusiasm for this field was crucial to the future history of Ramism.

Whatever Ramus’ own mathematical abilities may have been, he consistently demonstrated his conviction of its importance. He was confident that there was a natural way to think and argue and also to calculate. Arts should therefore always be built of parts that represent this true nature. Mathematics should mirror a natural mathematical thinking. We will see below how significant this thought was for Ramus when he worked out his syllabus and his method.

Ramus addressed the challenge of his weak knowledge of mathematics not only by improving his ability but also by grasping its history. It became essential for him not only to distinguish those who in the past had contributed to make mathematics an art but also those who in different ways had tried to undermine it. In his early writings, he seems mostly to have been focused on the natural aspects of mathematics and looked on it as an expression of natural dialectic; but later on he turned his attention more to the practical or useful aspects of mathematics. Goulding has explained this development in detail, outlining how Ramus’ evaluation of Pythagoras evolved over time, until he eventually became more and more like Ramus himself. He even condemned the way Euclid had, in his view, destroyed what was natural in mathematics and instead filled it with subtleties. In the Prooemium mathematicum (1667) and later in Scholae mathematicae, he criticized the theoretical works of the ancient Greek mathematicians on the grounds that they were confusing and led away from the usefulness of the discipline for practitioners. He wanted “an art at once practical and methodical”. As Goulding points out, if the holder of his endowed chair of mathematics was to be in a position to observe the provisions of his will, he would have to be made in Ramus’ own image (Goulding 2010: 35f., 50 and 180).

Thus, while the early phase of Ramus’ academic career was concentrated on the disciplines of the trivium, in the later period, from around 1560, he moved on to the quadrivium (arithmetic, geometry, music and astronomy), though in practice his interest was largely restricted to mathematics. He could never fully endorse Copernicus’ new heliocentric astronomy because he was unable to accept an hypothesis as a scientific argument (see §2.4 below). The famous Danish astronomer Tycho Brahe (1546–1601) left a report of an encounter he had with Ramus in Augsburg in 1569, registering his own amazement at this attitude. It was Brahe’s view that, according to Ramus, the astronomer’s task in describing the movements of the planets must be based solely on observation: he was not allowed to use hypotheses such as assuming a circular planetary movement. Ramus even promised to let anyone who could create an astronomy without hypotheses take over his own royal chair. Of course, no one seriously claimed to have succeeded until Kepler in 1597 mockingly declared himself entitled to it (Skalnik 2002: 59; Hooykaas 1958: 64–67; Jardine & Segonds 2001).

Although Ramus challenged the values and educational principles of scholasticism, he never attempted to discuss theological issues. His sole interest was in reforming the curriculum of the arts faculty. Nancelius points out that Ramus’ large library had very few volumes on theology, medicine or law (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 273). Nevertheless, during his final years he wrote a book on Christian theology, the Commentariorum de religione Christiana libri quatuor, which was published posthumously. The most striking feature of this work was that Ramus defined theology as the art of living virtuously, ars bene vivendi, adopting an essentially Zwinglian point of view. Theology may give us the rules by means of which we can and must live, but it cannot bring us salvation. In a particularly interesting chapter of the treatise (I:8), Ramus discusses the meaning of predestination. Mostly he sided with a Zwinglian against a Genevan position, as he did in the sacramental theology.

Banosius mentions that several of Ramus’ manuscripts were destroyed or scattered at the time of his murder and that among these were a commentary on Aristotle’s Politics and various works on ethics and music (Banosius 1577: 39). Unfortunately, no trace of these writings has survived. Nancelius was eager to mention that he had collaborated with Ramus in planning a long series of works on mathematics. For some reason, however, this corpus mathematicum was never printed and, along with many other manuscripts, these works disappeared after Ramus’ assassination (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 205 and 273 ).

2. Ramist philosophy

2.1 Historical context

The enormous impact of Ramus on European education in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries has seemed astonishing to some modern scholars; and among his harshest critics have been historians of logic. Carl Prantl, for instance, claimed that Ramus had no talent whatsoever for philosophy and logic (Prantl 1855–1870: 157–169; cf. Kneale and Kneale 1962: 300–302); and Walter J. Ong was also keen to point out his incompetence (Ong 1958: 7 and 24). Without engaging in arguments with these scholars, it is still legitimate to ask what it was that made Ramus so popular and so controversial. One key to understanding the impact of Ramism can be found in his own statement, in the Scholae dialecticae, that the aim of his reforms was to adapt Aristotle’s Organon to the service of learning, ad eruditionis usum.

The arts faculty was supposed to prepare young students for further studies in theology, medicine or jurisprudence. Most students, however, never advanced to these higher faculties but left the university for employment in the Church. The arts curriculum had been geared toward this situation since the Middle Ages. The political developments which led to the rise of a new kind of state in the Renaissance also affected the educational program of universities. In the short term, rulers tried to find quick and practical solutions such as special colleges or special professorships; but in the long run, more thorough measures, which included establishing new institutions and devising new curricula, were needed. The arts faculty had gradually changed, and what we now call the humanities (history, literature, rhetoric and ethics) had started to play a more important role. The stress on some aspects of logic and metaphysics, characteristic of the medieval arts faculty, was becoming obsolete. A new curriculum adjusted to the humanities was therefore necessary.

Ramus was most concerned about the obvious lack of efficiency of the scholastic curriculum that he had observed as a student. According to him, students had to spend too many years learning too little of use for them. He adopted as his motto a famous line by Vergil “Labor improbus omnia vincit” (Relentless work overcomes everything; Georgics 1.145). From his own experience, he knew the importance of hard work, and he wanted to make it possible for students of more humble means to study and, by diligent application, reach their goals more quickly. Therefore, he needed to make education much cheaper by shortening the amount of time students put into studying. To achieve this, he had to reflect on the pedagogical means and goals (Hotson 2007: 39–51).

2.2 Anti-Aristotelianism

Ramus’ reform program may have been designed to respond to this need. He became famous for his strong reaction against Aristotle’s undisputed primacy in the medieval university curriculum. According to his devoted biographer Freigius, his academic career began with a public disputation in 1536 where he defended the thesis “that everything Aristotle had said was false” (quaecumque ab Aristotele dicta essent, commentitia esse). It is unlikely, however, that such a disputation ever took place since no one apart from Freigius mentions it. Nevertheless, the episode was referred to by many contemporaries, as well as by later historians, and certainly helped to associate Ramus’ name with all forms of anti-Aristotelianism (Ong 1958: 37–39). Although savage attacks on Aristotle were not uncommon during the Reformation, Ramus’ criticism of his philosophy became one of the most famous outbursts of anti-Aristotelianism. Yet Ramus was hardly a typical anti-Aristotelian in the mold of Luther or other impassioned anti-intellectuals. Though many of his followers could be considered zealots, he himself was insistent on pointing out the difference between what he referred to as the true and the false Aristotle. Attacks on Aristotle were often launched by those who emphasized the fact that he had not been a Christian; some fanatics even thought that his philosophy had paved the way for Satan. Ramus did not share this view. According to him, it was not because Aristotle had been a pagan that he was wrong but rather because he had been misinterpreted by later commentators.

Ramus claimed that his work to reform the curriculum had begun during his early schooldays. As a young student he had to endure the inadequate way in which Aristotle was taught; no one seemed to care if young boys could ever use what they had learnt. For Ramus, the main reason for reforming the curriculum was related to the usefulness of education and not to the question of Aristotle’s role in it. In fact, he emphasized the value of Aristotelian philosophy. He considered Aristotle to be the most important of logicians, though he pointed out that Aristotle had not invented the discipline of logic but rather developed what his predecessors had hinted at. Even more significant for Ramus was the need to call attention to the damage that the corpus Aristotelicum had suffered after Aristotle’s death, which meant that we could not know for certain what he had intended to say on any given question. Because of the bad state in which Aristotle’s texts were transmitted, his commentators, in their discussions of individual books of the Metaphysics and Physics, had taken up certain issues that really belonged to logic. This is also why the Organon gives the impression of being an amalgamation of different subjects. Ramus laid the blame for all of this on the shoulders of the ancient and medieval commentators who he thought had for centuries misinterpreted the Greek philosopher owing to the poor condition of the Aristotelian corpus. He also highlighted another circumstance that helped to explain the confusions and obscurities that, in his view, were scattered throughout Aristotle’s books. The Philosopher himself had intentionally made his theories a little more abstruse than they needed to be in order to sift the wheat from the chaff among his disciples (Ramus, Scholae dialecticae, in Scholae in liberales artes, col. 68).

To Ramus, Aristotle was a Socratic philosopher, whose approach was broadly in line with that of Cicero. By contrast, Aristotle’s followers, especially those belonging to the scholastic camp, were merely a bunch of frauds:

Let us ignore all these Aristotelians and return to Aristotle, the author of such a noble discipline [i.e., philosophy], and to Cicero, who tries to emulate Aristotle’s teaching and to imitate him. (Ramus, Collectaneae praefationes, epistolae, orationes, p. 299)

2.3 Definition of Philosophy

In 1569 there was a furious exchange of letters between Ramus and one of the most prominent and learned Aristotelians of his day, Jacob Schegk (1511–1587), a professor at the University of Tübingen. The conflict may not have been based solely on a difference of philosophical opinions. Schegk had a grudge against Ramus, who had pulled one of his books to pieces. The discussion nevertheless forced Ramus to reconsider some of his positions.

Ramus’ final contribution to the debate was entitled, characteristically, Defensio pro Aristotele adversus Jacobus Scheccium, that is, a defense of Aristotle against Schegk. In this work he makes clear the difference between his position, which he maintained had also been that of Aristotle, and the view of Schegk and other Aristotelians. The question at stake was what logic really was: its definition, its limitations, its goal and its nature. According to the Aristotelians, the different parts of the Organon—the Categories, On Interpretation, the Prior and Posterior Analytics, the Topics and the Sophistical Refutations—corresponded to the different parts of logic. There was, for instance, an essential difference between probability (the subject of the Topics) and certainty (dealt with in the two Analytics).

To understand Ramus’ line of reasoning we have to start with his firm rejection of the basic Aristotelian conception of philosophy. The Aristotelians defined philosophy as a habitus intellectualis, a rational attitude toward being. In looking at being we can try to understand it; but we can also, as humans, use our knowledge to act rightly or wrongly toward other humans. For this reason, Aristotle divided philosophy into a theoretical part and a practical part. Logic, however, does not fit into this division of philosophy because it does not give us any knowledge at all of being. It is instead a way of acquiring knowledge and of finding the truth. The Aristotelians therefore called it a habitus instrumentalis, an instrumental attitude (the Greek term organon, traditionally used to denote Aristotle’s logical writings, means instrument or tool). According to the Aristotelians, philosophy always concerns the rational aspects of human beings; their productive aspects, by contrast, belong to the practical disciplines or arts. For the Aristotelian, it was essential to separate science and philosophy from the arts. Yet while Aristotle had firmly rooted his philosophical theories in an attitude toward being, educational practice in schools was concerned solely with theorems and rules. Young pupils had to study not being in a theoretical and abstract way but rather the items that the teacher demanded them to learn, often by heart.

The Stoic conception of philosophy, therefore, was often far more suitable to a classroom situation. For the Stoics, the universe was rationally organized in a way that was directly equivalent to human reason. They believed that there was a correspondence in the universe, or in nature, between order and reason and that the reason which organized and governed the universe was essentially the same as human reason. The connection between nature and reason could be studied from three different perspectives: physical, ethical and rational or logical. One consequence of the Stoic theory was that there must be an absolute analogy between the contents of an art and those of nature, that is, all arts must also be about nature or being. There could not be a difference of rank between the parts of nature, nor between the parts of philosophy, as the Aristotelians thought. Another consequence was that logic became an integral part of philosophy rather than an instrument to be used by the other branches of the discipline.

Ramus’ way of looking at philosophy and logic was in many ways similar to that of the Stoics. His definition of philosophy as a cognitio artium liberalium, a knowledge of the liberal arts, reveals both the influence of Stoicism and of the medieval educational tradition. Ramus thus regarded logic as a part of philosophy and defined it as an art that truly gives us knowledge of being. Ramus’ followers often substituted the word doctrina for cognitio, which made it even clearer that the perspective was more pedagogical than ontological (cf. Ramus, Dialectica, p. 11, where he uses another variant, defining philosophy as a comprehensio praeceptorum, a collection of precepts).

It may seem that Ramus’ attitude toward Aristotle and the Aristotelians was not very consistent. At times, he claimed to be the only true Aristotelian and criticized the scholastic Aristotelians for misinterpreting Aristotle. On other occasions, he maintained that the entire Aristotelian tradition, including Aristotle himself, was totally wrong. This inconsistency is due to the fact that, true to his usual habit, he adopted different strategies in response to different polemical situations. Although Ramus was an offspring of the Aristotelian tradition, he was also influenced by Ciceronian and Stoic ideas. Only rarely did he directly attack Aristotle himself. So, for example, whenever there was a clash between the Aristotelian and the Stoic way of thinking, he tried to solve the problem by pointing out differences between Aristotle and his later commentators.

2.4 The three laws of philosophy

Ramus stressed that all arts should represent separate parts of nature. It would consequently be a serious mistake to confuse one art with another. In the Posterior Analytics Aristotle had set out certain rules or laws for how a predicate should be related to a subject in order to make a correct scientific proposition. Ramus took over these laws; but he applied them not only to propositions but also to the construction of entire arts.

The first law, the lex veritatis, or law of truth, stated that every theorem in an art must be general and indispensable. For example, a theorem stating that the angle of a triangle is a right angle would not be a false statement since there are indeed triangles with right angles. But since it is not true in relation to all triangles, such a theorem would violate the law of truth. A theorem which states that the sum of the degrees of the three angles of a triangle is 180 would, however, be totally correct and generally true.

The second law was called the lex justitiae, or law of justice. Ramus regarded this as the most important of the three laws. It ensured that justice was done to all the arts. No theorem belonging to one art should be allowed to trespass into the subject matter of another, since that would be unjust. This law also demanded that all parts of an art should be homogeneous. It was on the basis of this law that Ramus objected to Copernicus’ planetary hypothesis (see §1.4 above). He held that Copernicus was not allowed to put forward theories as to how the planets really moved in the heavens, which belonged to the art astrophysics, while at the same time using mathematical hypotheses, which belonged to the art of mathematics. To Ramus, this law was fundamental for the purpose of organizing a new curriculum and was also, as we shall see, an important aspect of his method (Hooykaas 1958: 65).

The third law, the lex sapientiae, or law of wisdom, was the concrete principle of how an art should be organized according to general theorems. A more general theorem should always precede a less general and more particular one. The theorem that an isosceles triangle has angles which add up to a total of 180 degrees is quite correct; but since it is true for all triangles, it should precede theorems applicable to specific kinds of triangle.

This way of treating philosophy as an aggregate of rigidly separated arts may have had some pedagogical value, but it also raised difficulties. Ramus, for instance, could not accept metaphysics as a separate discipline, although in this case his nominalism was also in operation. By insisting that every art must have its correctly formulated theorems, organized from the more general to the more specific, and that no theorem should be allowed to have reference to more than one art, Ramus almost seems to impose a military discipline on nature. Sometimes his followers defined philosophy as merely a methodical collection of arts, a collectio methodica, which reveals even more clearly their understanding of the discipline.

On account of his idealistic belief in the correspondence between the arts—including their concepts and words—and being, some scholars have assumed that Ramus was reliant on Platonism. In his early writings he certainly assumed a clear metaphysical link between nature, mathematics and dialectic. Indeed, his contemporaries sometimes called him the Plato Gallicus, the French Plato; but, in reality, the Platonic influences on him were rather vague and often concealed. Gradually, the Platonic ontological strains in his works lost importance and faded away. Although he at times claimed to be a Platonist, his references to Plato were mostly aimed at distancing himself from Aristotle and, above all, from contemporary Aristotelians. In practice, he was more often inspired by Cicero and by Stoicism than by Platonism. And despite his attacks on Aristotle, he was essentially dependent on the scholastic tradition (cf. Bruyère 1984, who takes the opposite view on this issue).

3. Logic and method

3.1 Logic as an art

Logic, according to the Ramist and Stoic perspective, is a part of philosophy. Ramus rejected the Aristotelian definition of logic as a habitus instrumentalis, since an instrumental attitude could be considered to be an effect of logic but not equivalent to it. Instead he defined logic as the ars bene disserendi, the art of correctly discussing or analyzing something. Consequently, Ramus thought that logic was about being, which made the discipline of metaphysics superfluous.

One of the logic books that students had for centuries studied was the Summulae logicales of Petrus Hispanus (probably the same Petrus who was elected pope in 1276 and adopted the name John XXI). Even in the beginning of the sixteenth century the treatise was still in use and attracted severe criticism from humanists. Ramus stated explicitly that he wanted to remove the Summulae from the curriculum, and it was mainly this book that he was thinking about when he lamented his own youthful experiences of studying logic. His devastating judgment on the book was that it had not made him

more judicious in his studies of history and antiquity, nor more skilled in disputation, nor more competent at writing poetry, nor indeed more competent at anything at all…. (Ramus, Scholae dialecticae, in Scholae in liberales artes, col. 153)

Nevertheless, Ramus’ own dialectic showed many signs of influence from Summulae. Therefore, to understand the development of Ramist logic, we have to pay attention to this scholastic background, as well as to Cicero, who played a key role in the advance of humanist logic.

The three main parts of Aristotle’s great work on logic, the Organon, are represented by the Categories, the Prior and Posterior Analytics and the Topics. The categories (praedicamenta) are not only treated as a formal part of a proposition but also, and most importantly, as universals, which meant that their ontological status also had to be considered. The other two parts of Aristotle’s logic dealt with the problems of how to reach scientific and dialectical conclusions respectively: the Analytics is about finding correct axioms and using them to acquire scientific knowledge; the Topics teaches us how to discuss and treat those issues where it is impossible to attain the truth, so that we have to be satisfied with seeking what is most probable.

3.2 Inventio

The Stoics were inclined to concentrate on linguistic rather than ontological issues. Cicero observed that the Aristotelians were mainly interested in the aspect of logic that he called the ars inveniendi, that is, the art of finding the right arguments. The Stoics, on the other hand, according to Cicero, were more concerned about the different aspects of the judgments that we make. They wanted to analyze arguments. He called this kind of dialectic the ratio disserendi, a definition that Ramus, via Agricola, rephrased as the ars bene disserendi. While the Aristotelians thought that the categories were the natural introduction to logic, the Stoics preferred judgment.

During the Middle Ages both the Peripatetic and the Stoic views on dialectic were preserved, the latter via Cicero and Augustine. Petrus Hispanus’ Summulae consisted of several treatises (tractatus). In the first of these students could learn how to construct a proposition. In the second Petrus discussed the five praedicabilia that made it possible to classify different kinds of propositions. The third tractatus dealt with the Categories, the fourth and the fifth with the problems that Aristotle had taken up in his Prior Analytics and in his Topics. The last seven treatises were concerned with specific logical problems such as significatio or suppositio. With few exceptions these treatises do not correspond to any part of the Organon; instead, they are for the most part related to the parva logicalia, a form of medieval logical thinking which was especially repugnant to the humanists. The Posterior Analytics was hardly considered at all. The main emphasis at school was on teaching young boys to construct syllogisms. The purpose of the Summulae was not to train the students to reflect on the problem of how to make scientifically correct conclusions but rather to prepare them for what they normally were expected to do: to take part in endless series of disputations. In that respect the Summulae succeeded (cf. Ong 1958: 55–74).

While, for Ramus, Petrus Hispanus’ Summulae was like a red rag to a bull, he willingly admitted that he had learned a great deal from a more recent book on logic, De inventione libri tres by the Dutch humanist Rudolph Agricola (1443–1485). This book, printed for the first time in 1515, was to a great extent influenced by humanism. In many ways Agricola’s logic was based less on Aristotle than on Cicero. Aristotle had considered the Topics or dialectic as a special kind of deduction. This was the reason why Aristotelians wanted the study of logic to start with what Cicero and the humanists often called iudicium or judgment, to be learned from the Categories, On Interpretation and the two Analytics, before the student went on to the Topics. But Agricola disagreed. In his view, you must find the arguments before you can employ them in your argumentation. Aristotelians maintained instead that it was necessary to know what to do with arguments before you could go looking for them. In fact, Agricola hardly touched on iudicium in the more than 400 pages of his treatise. In concentrating on the Topics, it was much easier for him to lean on Cicero rather than on Aristotle. The close connection between inventio, as a part of logic, and the art of rhetoric made it seem, however, as if humanists could not separate the two disciplines. Another weakness which Aristotelians often pointed out in Agricola and Ramus was that they were not interested in finding answers to difficult questions but rather in finding good arguments to use in defending a certain thesis (Sellberg 1979: 58).

3.3 Judgment

Ramus wanted to carry on from where Agricola had left off. So, he added to inventio the other part of logic, iudicium. Although it never received as much attention as inventio, iudicium became very controversial in Ramus’ account, and he therefore made large changes to his presentation of it. His most detailed discussion of iudicium was in the 1566 edition of the Dialectica, but this was neither the most read nor the most important edition. The shorter version, published in 1572, was more suitable for schools and was therefore followed in most later editions. In the 1572 edition there are 32 chapters devoted to inventio and only 20 to iudicium. Every chapter was carefully constructed with questions and definitions of the main problems and with examples, mostly taken from ancient authors.

In his first treatise on logic, Dialecticae institutiones (1543) Ramus had divided iudicium into three parts: syllogistic, method and a kind of doctrine of ideas. The third part was an odd element added in order to demonstrate that logic had a divine origin; three years later it was removed, never to return. Thereafter, he adopted a two-fold division of iudicium into the axiomaticum and the dianoeticum. In the former part students learnt to organize the arguments found in inventio into a proposition or—as Stoics and even Ramus preferred to call it—an axioma. The second part of iudicium, the dianoeticum, was divided into syllogistic and method. The most remarkable aspect of his treatment of syllogistic was that Ramus admitted a syllogismus expositorius, in which the conclusion did not have to be about something universal but could be about something individual, as we can see from the example:

Socrates is a philosopher; he is also a human being; consequently, there is at least one human being who is a philosopher. (Ramus, Dialectica 1623: 71)

This type of conclusion would nowadays seem unscientific and arbitrary; but the fact that Ramus included it tells us something about his attitude toward logic. As we have seen, he thought that it was basically a natural way to think, and he was determined to make it useful for the humanities (§ 1.4). Given the Aristotelian demand that a scientific conclusion should always be universal, it was extremely difficult to deal with the uniqueness of history and literature in a scientific framework. This syllogism was an attempt to cope with that difficulty. But it also reveals Ramus’ lack of interest in the problem of how to acquire new knowledge. It shows that his aim was instead to systemize and organize arguments. For Ramus, therefore, method became the most important part of logic.

3.4 Method

Method was a topic of enormous interest during the sixteenth century. Aristotle’s words in the Physics (184a10–22) were difficult to interpret, and all sides claimed an inheritance from him. Ramus’ interpretation of the lines in question made it possible for him to maintain that his method was strictly Aristotelian. The Aristotelians, for their part, largely followed Averroes’ commentary on this passage, which led to a very different conclusion (Ramus, Dialectica 1569: 513–515). The problem was to determine whether method was a way of acquiring knowledge or of displaying it. Discussions about methodological issues changed in this period from being merely commentaries on Aristotle to taking into account a wide range of considerations, including ones belonging to medicine and geometry. The concepts of analysis and synthesis, for example, were borrowed from geometry and soon became the main principles of method. The problem for many logicians was that it was impossible to find relevant discussions of these concepts in the Prior and Posterior Analytics, despite the titles of these treatises (Gilbert 1960: 27–32). It became obvious that more than one method could exist and that there was a difference between methodus and ordo. The latter term came to be applied to a pedagogical method, a way of teaching or displaying. But it was also necessary to think about natural vs. artificial methodus and ordo, as well as considering the correct way of proceeding from the general to the particular and vice versa.

Among Aristotelians there was considerable disagreement on these issues. But Ramus took an extreme position. He explicitly denied that there could be more than one method and that there was any difference between methodus and ordo. As a consequence of his definition of an art, he could not accept any uncertainty as to how one should proceed or as to whether the procedure should be natural or artificial. In his succinct Latin formulation, he claimed that what was notiora nobis, more known to us, must be the same as what was notiora naturae, more known to nature. What is more general with respect to nature must consequently have priority in our method over what is more particular. If you see a living creature in the distance, it is not until you are closer to it that you will be able to identify it as a human being, and it will take still more time before you can eventually recognize who it is. This example shows, according to Ramus, that a method which proceeds from the general to the particular is not arbitrary but natural (Ramus, Quod sit unica doctrinae instituendae methodus, p. 117). Since it was obvious, at least to Ramus, that an argument is more general than an axioma, or proposition, and that an axioma is more general than a syllogism, this proved that his way of organizing logic was the correct one. The other arts should, of course, be constructed in the same way. In medicine, for example, it is natural to start with the whole body before you go on to the limbs. When you cure a man who has a wound on his forehead, you can either say that you cure him or his whole body, but not that you cure his eyes or his belly, which, like his forehead, are parts of his body (Ramus, Dialectica 1569: 487).

This method was an important part of Ramus’ logic since it had direct relevance for his philosophy as a whole. Every art must be founded on it, given that it was not merely the correct but the only method. In describing the arts, he and his followers often used large dichotomies, set out in diagrams or bracketed tables; but it is important to note that these dichotomies were an instrument to display the structure of an art. They were not—as many historians have supposed—the same thing as the method. Ramus thought it essential to construct a system of precepts arranged according to their degree of generalization, always starting with the more general and proceeding toward the more specific. This would make the method natural, so that it reflects nature, just as the arts do. To stress this point, Ramus in some of his writings preferred to call the second part of logic not iudicium but dispositio or arrangement.

Considering Ramus’ desire to make logic responsive to the needs of the humanities, it is reasonable to ask whether the method was applicable to artificial products such as poetry or only to natural things. Ramus was aware of the difficulty of demonstrating his natural method in literature. This was a particular problem for him since he wanted students to learn the method by reading the great authors of antiquity. According to him, the method was also used by poets like Virgil and Horace. He had to admit, however, that the ancients had sometimes intentionally departed from it. Therefore, in earlier editions of the Dialectica he had included another method, a methodus prudentiae, which, as he pointed out, was really no different from the one method. The confusion occasioned by this special method, however, led Ramus to remove it from later editions of the treatise. Instead, he talked about a methodi secunda illustratio, that is, a second representation of the one method (Ramus, Dialectica 1623: 93; see Hotson 2007: 48).

4. Practice

It has already been pointed out that Ramus had little interest in the precise requirements for attaining scientific knowledge but was instead primarily concerned with curriculum reforms. Yet he by no means rejected Aristotelian epistemology, and he accepted that the principles of every art should be based on experience and observation. The process of acquiring knowledge should consist of four steps, as we can see in the following example. In the first place, we feel intoxicated. Secondly, we realize by means of observation that this feeling may have been induced by wine, since we have consumed a great deal of it. But is there actually a causal connection between our consumption of wine and our feeling of drunkenness? To establish certain knowledge, it is necessary, thirdly, to examine by means of induction the effects of drinking wine, so that we can conclude that the wine is genuinely the cause of our drunkenness. Fourthly, we can by means of experience use our knowledge to avoid getting drunk next time.

According to Ramus, there are always three essential aspects of every art which need to be considered: nature, principles and practice (exercitatio). It was the third element, practice, which was essential, for it was through practice that one demonstrated that the art and its principles were correct. If they were correct, the art was useful and constructed according to nature. All three elements were thus closely connected, and Ramus often presented the various arts by setting out their three main parts (as, for instance, in the Dialecticae institutiones).

We have seen that Ramus considered it extremely important to follow the natural method. When, however, it came to practice, this was not always possible. Sometimes it was necessary to start with the most particular, at other times the most general. Practice, moreover, required analysis as well as synthesis. Ramus wanted students to learn logic by reading and practicing the way we naturally think and argue. An oration or even a poem could reveal how the principles of logic work in practice. We should start by analyzing the text in order to see how it is constructed according to logical principles: what problem is being considered, what arguments are chosen and so on. After this has been done, the text is further analyzed with help of the main parts of logic, inventio and iudicium, and afterwards by the minor parts: the propositions, syllogisms and suchlike (Ramus, Scholae dialecticae, in Scholae in liberales artes, cols 192–193; Cf. Ong 1958: 263–267). When the analysis is completed, it is time for students to move on to synthesis, the part of practice that Ramus usually referred to as genesis. At this stage students were expected to imitate, more or less, the procedure which they had previously studied by means of analysis. This was a crucial moment because they could now show how useful their studies had been by demonstrating the ways in which they had benefited from their theoretical knowledge.

The same procedure could be applied to any art since analysis involved textual study. When reading Aristotle’s Physics or Pliny’s Natural History, students did not examine nature but rather what the ancients thought about natural things. Although this made it possible for them to apply the same procedure, but from a different angle, to other ancient texts, it also restricted their studies to a great extent by focusing solely on texts. It certainly showed that Ramus’ real intention was to make the curriculum useful to students of the humanities and to future scholars and also, by making the course of studies as short and effective as possible, to a new category of student, aiming for a different type of occupation (Hooykaas 1958: 22; Skalnik 2002: 8).

As a young lecturer Ramus was accused of violating the rules of the University of Paris; and the specific charge was of combining the different arts and bringing the study of ancient orators into them. The university statutes prescribed that studies should proceed in a specific order, starting with grammar, followed by rhetoric and so on. For instance, students were expected to read Cicero’s orations before they went on to logic, which entailed memorizing a large number of rules and mnemonic aids such as the pons asinorum, which helped them to find the correct middle terms for various types of syllogism. This accusation may seem somewhat paradoxical given that Ramus was very anxious not to confuse the arts in any way. Modern scholars have emphasized this point too much and overlooked the fact that Ramus actually made a very clear distinction between manuals or textbooks and practice. Nancelius describes the importance Ramus attached to combining the different arts in practice and notes that he introduced an educational exercise at his own college, which, according to Nancelius, made all his students more learned and better orators than at other colleges. It was decisive for Ramus to teach his disciples how to put their knowledge into practice. The curriculum that he himself had followed in his youth, on the other hand, had forced students to complete the study of one art before proceeding to the next. Ramus turned this upside down. The arts should be kept completely separate. When, however, students put what they had learned into practice, they should not hesitate to combine the contents of different arts. On the contrary, it was necessary for them to do so in order to make their studies truly useful (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 189–193; Mack 2011: 9).

Ramus systematized the arts according to his method, which stated that each art or doctrina should have exclusive rights to its own principles. One result of this was that, as mentioned above, he totally rejected metaphysics as a discipline, since ontological issues could not be separated from logical ones. Another was that he defined rhetoric as having only two parts: style and delivery (elocutio and pronuntiatio). This was an extremely radical transformation of rhetoric, which was usually considered to have three additional parts (inventio, iudicium and memoria). It is easy to understand why he excluded inventio and iudicium from rhetoric, since he regarded them as belonging to dialectic. As Mack points out, this did not in any way mean that Ramus thought that the practice of rhetoric could be restricted solely to style and delivery. On the contrary, he strongly maintained that all the parts of rhetoric and dialectic were closely intertwined in performance; and Mack underlines that Ramus in no way wanted to reduce the scope of rhetoric:

Ramus’ rhetoric and dialectic textbooks take a strongly dialectical approach to a syllabus which is primarily rhetorical. (Mack 2011: 13)

However, Ramus’ reason for removing memoria, memory, was typically Ramist. All arts had to be methodologically adapted to nature. Since the natural order is also basically our normal way of thinking, a genuine knowledge of any art must always be easy for us to remember. Therefore, we do not need the aids supplied by mnemonics.

As has already been noted, Ramus’ endeavors to increase the efficiency of education and, in this way, make it possible for students of lesser means to study, pushed him to change the curriculum radically and shorten it. It would take no more than seven years to complete, which was a considerable reduction compared to all other curricula. Nevertheless, he included some mathematical sub-disciplines such as mechanics that were normally not studied. His lectures on the history of mathematics revealed an increasing disapproval of the ancient Greeks’ inclination for making mathematics too abstract and, consequently, neglecting its application; Euclid was considered one of those who was most to blame. Ramus even censured Archimedes for not having assigned sufficient importance to utility and for having been too prone to direct his projects towards pure contemplation. Ramus himself lauded the way the German city of Nuremberg had instead supported and encouraged the study of the mechanical arts; for him, such a syllabus was the key to the future (Ramus, Scholarum mathematicarum, p. 28 and Collectaneae praefationes, epistolae, orationes, pp. 136–137, and see Hotson 2007: 80).

5. Freedom to philosophize

In a letter of 1551 to his patron, the Cardinal of Lorraine, Ramus wrote that he had heard a rumor that he was considered to be an academicus, that is, an adherent of the Academic school or, in other words, a skeptic, who taught his students to doubt. Although Ramus firmly rejected this accusation, he had difficulties in clearing himself of the charge (Ramus, Collectaneae praefationes, epistolae, orationes, p. 327).

From the very beginning he had criticized the scholastics for philosophizing, not in order to reach the truth, but to endorse the views of their master. Ramus accused them of treating Aristotle as infallible and said that in doing so they subordinated their own reason to blind faith in authority. In this respect, they were by no means true Aristotelians, for:

Aristotle philosophized with the utmost freedom and, for the sake of the truth, he held views with utter freedom, against the entire tradition of the past, including his teacher Plato. And he practiced the art of logic not only in short debates but also in continuous disputations, in which both sides of the question were discussed. It was, in fact, his interpreters who rejected the freedom to seek and defend the truth. (Ramus, Scholae, in Scholae in liberales artes, col. 29)

If Freigius’ account of the 1536 disputation is correct (see §2.2 above), this was one of the very few occasions when Ramus really did attack Aristotle. On the whole, as we have seen, he tried to separate Aristotle from his later commentators, and he often explained the mistakes of Aristotelian philosophy as the result of bad interpreters who had distorted Aristotle’s original meaning. For Ramus, as for other humanists, the scholastics became the villains of the story.

In the Prior and Posterior Analytics, Aristotle had set out a method of attaining reliable knowledge; and in the Topics he had dealt with all those instances where it was not possible to attain such knowledge. This latter part of logic was dominant in the tradition of inventio associated with Agricola (see §3.2 above), where the standard practice, attributed to Aristotle by Ramus in the passage quoted above, was to discuss both sides of a question (in utramque partem disserere). This describes a confrontational situation where one side argues against another, resulting in the victory of one or the other position. In such circumstances, however, you can never say that the side which triumphs is the absolute winner, though you can come fairly close to a definitive resolution. In dialectical argumentation, therefore, we must be satisfied with probabilities. But if the very best we can attain is probability, the knowledge we reach is not as certain as that which results from a scientific demonstration. Consequently, it is more difficult to be fanatically devoted to a particular opinion. In the wake of humanism, ancient skepticism had its own renaissance. Ramus, however, in line with the majority of humanists, was more of an eclectic than a skeptic. He regarded Galen as his ideal since he had borrowed from earlier thinkers what he considered to be good and useful for his own theories (Ramus, Dialectica 1569: 11 and 27).

Adopting radical skepticism in this period would have laid Ramus open to the serious charge of holding dangerous philosophical or theological views and even of atheism. It was therefore imperative for him to refute this accusation. To his patron, the cardinal, who had expressed concern over the claim that Ramus was an academicus, he explained that the academici were merely eclectics, who

differ from other philosophers as free men differ from slaves, as the wise differ from the reckless and as the steadfast differ from the obstinate.

Not surprisingly, Ramus declared that he would rather be a philosopher than the slave of a philosopher (Ramus, Collectaneae praefationes, epistolae, orationes, pp. 55 and 89). There was no danger in allowing men to think freely, he maintained, since true reason can never be wrong. As long as we used our ability to understand the natural order, everything would turn out well in the end. Risks arose when we did not dare to trust our own reason but instead, like the scholastics, uncritically adopted the opinions of others.

Ramus’ belief in the freedom to philosophize and his eclecticism caused difficulties for his followers. If they showed too much enthusiasm for Ramus’ ideas, would they not also be accused of being the slaves of their master? Ramus himself was aware of this problem, a kind of “Catch 22” situation. “What prevents us”, he wrote,

from briefly playing Socrates and, having left aside all our trust in Aristotelian authority, asking: is this the true and correct art of dialectic? Perhaps the Philosopher deceives us with his authority? (Ramus, Scholae dialecticae, in Scholae in liberales artes, col. 155)

Here we see the great respect that Ramus and his adherents had for Socrates, whom they regarded as their hero. Ramus associated his own dialectical procedure with the method used by Socrates,

whose main intention was to draw those with whom he debated away from views based on opinions and the testimonies of other people and to lead them toward mental composure and freedom of judgement …. (ibid.)

Although his followers preferred to call their philosophy Socratic rather than Ramist, in order to avoid the accusation of slavish trust in his authority, this tactic was not very successful. One of his most devoted disciples, Guilielmus Adolphus Scribonius, attacked another Ramist for departing from the teaching of the Dialectica and for criticizing Ramus. Yet, at the same time, he emphatically declared that every adherent of Ramist philosophy must swear to the principle of libertas philosophandi, the freedom to philosophize. Scribonius was certainly aware of the difficulty of striking a balance between total freedom and permitting support for a particular school. He tried to resolve it by maintaining that while all philosophers were to some degree wrong, Ramus, like Socrates, had almost always been right. By adopting this position, however, he took some of the sting out of his own criticism of the insufficiently faithful Ramist, as the latter was quick to point out (Sellberg 1979: 106–107).

Neither Ramus nor his followers felt able to extend this freedom to theological questions, though their scholastic opponents accused them of having done so. In the end, they had to concede so many restrictions on the freedom to philosophize that hardly anything remained.

6. Usefulness and significance of Ramism

Some of Ramus’ opponents called him usuarius or usurarius. Both words derive etymologically from the Latin verb uti, to use or to receive benefit from. The second term, usurarius, is directly related to usura, interest. Its application to Ramus was, no doubt, intended as a criticism, indicating that he was strutting around in borrowed finery, perhaps combined with an imputation of avarice. According to Nancelius, his fortune was modest but still substantial enough for him to defray the costs of endowing a professorship (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 243). By insisting that studies should be useful, humanists were attacking the scholastics for promoting what they regarded as a useless curriculum. Ramus, along with other humanists, often ridiculed the meaningless rules and facts that young students were compelled to memorize (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 212; cf. Ong 1958: 321n). It is easy to see why such unsatisfactory practices in the universities were condemned and why a humanist like Ramus was deeply unsympathetic toward the bad Latin which scholastics regularlarly and deliberately employed in disputations to express their logical type of linguistic arguments:

Incredible as it seems, it is nevertheless true and can be found in published books that at this famous university there have been teachers who stubbornly maintained and defended the view that Ego amat (‘I loves’) is as correct as Ego amo (‘I love’). (Ramus, Scholae grammaticae, in Scholae in liberales artes, col. 15)

As we have seen, Ramus wanted the study of every art to be directed toward practice. There was no point in memorizing rules unless one also learned how to use them. In this respect he was a pioneer in the field of pedagogy. When lecturing, he would not rattle off one paragraph after another, but instead would comment on the text page by page, a habit which earned him the nickname paginarius, the “page man”. He set out to reform the curriculum, and he wrote books that would fit in with the new demands of the age. Not surprisingly, his innovative ideas attracted interest from those outside the universities. The king of France and other rulers were keen to hire well-educated officials for their expanding administrations, enabling them to reduce their dependence on the church. They therefore lent their enthusiastic support to Ramus’ call for useful studies.

As a humanist, Ramus was also interested in including the humanities within the encyclopedia of learning. He himself intended to edit and comment on every speech of Cicero. His lectures were famous and, according to Nancelius, his spoken Latin was eloquent (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 207). Although he did not want rhetoric and philosophy to be confused as arts, he certainly wanted logic and rhetoric to be integral parts of the student’s practice in every discipline; and he specifically wanted to make logic more useful for the humanities (see §3.4 above).

Ramus was neither a bad logician nor a bad philosopher. Nonetheless, his work in these fields does not earn him a prominent place in the history of logic or philosophy. But this was not what he set out to achieve. His goal was to reform university teaching of the arts; and he deserves to be regarded as a pedagogical trailblazer, even though he perhaps lacked the originality and creativity of a thinker such as Jan Amos Comenius (1592–1670).

Nancelius reminds us that Ramus was accused by his opponents of

introducing poets and orators into the schools, and of claiming that you could derive from them the benefit not only of speaking well, but the sure practice of the whole philosophy, especially ethics, rhetoric and logic. (Nancelius Petri Rami Vita: 213)

It was not, in any case, his originality that brought him to a position of eminence among his contemporaries. The reason for his enormous impact, within both the university and the wider society, was his capacity to perceive new needs and to respond to new demands. His program of educational reform was, for instance, well suited to the Reformation but even more so to the demands of the early modern states, which needed better educated officials and manufacturers, craftsmen and businessmen. Because Ramist logic made possible a more concise presentation of different questions, it proved more advantageous than scholasticism to Protestant theologians, who began to set out their doctrines in the form of loci or brief passages on a specific topic. Toward the end of the sixteenth century, several Protestant professors tried to combine the ideas of Ramus with those of the Lutheran educational reformer Philipp Melanchthon (1497–1560).

Ramus appealed to statesmen and to humanists on account of his endeavors to promote the humanities, especially the study of ancient culture and languages. His anti-scholastic and anti-Aristotelian outbursts attracted other groups who, sometimes erroneously, regarded him as an ally. The emphasis which he and other humanists laid on the usefulness of studies was a means to transform learned culture and adjust it to the new demands of modern states.

For the last 50 years Ramus has been at the center of considerable scholarly interest and activity. Modern scholars are divided on some basic points. There are those such as Bruyère-Robinet who strongly disagree with Ong’s disparaging opinion about Ramus as a philosopher and think instead that his departure from the Aristotelian tradition and all his writings stemmed from a Platonic ontological outlook, which he never abandoned. From such a point of view, Ramus was a consistent philosopher and creator of a coherent system. Thus, his censure of Aristotle was not directed only against scholastic abuse of Aristotelianism.

Other scholars, however, are not so sure on this point and have researched Ramus from other perspectives. The focus has gradually shifted from examining Ramus’ own works — even if several of his books have been edited, and various aspects of his textbooks, lectures and commentaries have been explored — to tracing their significance and influence.

Studies have been devoted to his followers and to the political and social context in which he developed his ideas and not least to a better understanding of the impact his writings and his program had on the education in early-modern Europe. We now know more about Ramus’ own pedagogical ideas and his radical ambition to reform higher education, as well as his political outlook, at least in general terms. We also know that, contrary to early assumptions, his ideas did not have a confessional impact. His pedagogical program was not carried out primarily at Reformed universities. Undoubtedly, however, his violent death made him into a martyr for the Reformers and even for other Protestants. Indeed, it was not at old and well-established universities that professors lectured from the Ramist textbooks but instead at poorer and less renowned schools such as gymnasia or gymnasia illustria. From this perspective, the importance of Ramus’ program cannot be overestimated. In small Hanseatic cities and imperial counties and principalities, it became possible, thanks to the Ramist curriculum, to found schools and teach young students, in an adequate way, to fulfill a variety of future positions. Of course, the new pedagogical forms and syllabuses were not well received by everyone in the republic of learning. As has already been noted, the humanists had difficulties accepting such condensed studies of classical literature, and anyone interested in digging deep into philosophical problems was likely to find concise Ramist summaries insufficient. As Hotson had demonstrated, this resistance did not defeat the impact of the Ramist textbooks, but it did change it. At the end of the 16th century, several authors and professors tried to combine Ramist doctrine and the best of his ideas with a more thorough outline of Aristotelian philosophy, in order to produce a kind of compendium or systematized presentation from which students could efficiently benefit in a relatively short space of time. Instead of spending several years reading Aristotle’s treatises, lengthy commentaries or other ancient texts, a host of poor university students could study the Ramist compendia which replaced these works. This sometimes makes it difficult to decide if a certain author should be categorized as a Ramist, a semi-Ramist or a Philippo-Ramist; but Wilson has suggested a conceivable way to determine if a logical textbook puts forward what she identifies as a more Aristotelian logic of stasis or rather, in the Ramist manner, a logic of dynamism. With the latter Wilson means a focusing on the moving parts of logic like verbs rather than on nouns which the Aristotelian textbooks seemed to prefer. She demonstrates a short way to arbitrate which of the two practices gain the upper hand by looking on the system of chapters in the textbooks, of which those more characteristic of Aristotelianism begin with the predicables and the predicaments while the Ramist ones rather start with inventio and then the headings cause, form, end and effect and so on. The inclination to either dynamism or stasis would then be discernible even in all those textbooks that in a different extent were mixtures of a Ramist and an Aristotelian logic (Wilson 2019; cf. Feingold 2001 & Freedman 1993).

Studies of Ramus’ influence on learned and pedagogical programs have been devoted to his many adherents in early modern Europe and to the different circumstances in which these individuals developed his curriculum. In Northern and Central Europe, Ramus’ textbooks, both in Latin and in the vernacular, were frequently used and admired but they also aroused resistance (Reid and Wilson 2011; Knight and Wilson 2019).

There is also an increasing scholarly concentration on the influence of Ramus and Ramism on vernacular literature. The famous 1555 edition of his dialectic in French was followed by others in various different vernaculars. And by employing the vernacular the works of the Pléiade and of Ramus converged in Paris. Even though scholars have tried to find more substantial links to the Pléiade in other fields, few have been found. Frequent studies on grammar and in particular on Ramus’ and Talon’s many rhetoric textbooks have encouraged studies and debates about their impact on literature and culture. Inspired by Tuve’s classic work on metaphysical imagery, scholars have discussed what consequence of Ramus’ putting the arts of rhetoric and dialectic into common practice may have had.

Another controversy concerns Ramus’ impact on literature and the humanities. Grafton and Jardine have argued that Ramism meant a step away from humanism toward a kind of pragmatism; but against these conclusions, Henderson has maintained that even if Ramus wanted to achieve too much with his one method, his ambition had been to unite rhetoric with philosophy, including moral philosophy. On the other hand, Sharratt has pinpointed Ramus’ lack of literary sensibility as a reason why he never succeeded in making his philosophy a part of the humanist tradition. At English educational institutions, Ramism often was considered a threat to the humanities (Grafton & Jardine 1986, Henderson 1999, Couzinet 2015, Sharratt 1976 & Feingiold 2001).


Selected books by Ramus

  • Aristotelicae AnimadversionesDialecticae institutiones, Paris, 1543; reprinted with an introduction by W. Risse, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1964.
  • Peter Ramus’s Attack on Cicero: Text and Translation of Ramus’s Brutinae Quaestiones, edited with an introduction by James J. Murphy and translation by Carole Newlands, Davis, CA: Hermagoras Press, 1992.
  • Collectaneae praefationes, epistolae, orationes, Marburg, 1599; reprinted with an introduction by W.J. Ong, Hildesheim, New York: G. Olms, 1969.
  • Commentariorum de religione Christiana libri quatuor, Frankfurt am Main, 1577; reprinted Frankfurt a. M.: Minerva, 1969.
  • La Dialectique (1555), M. Dassonville (ed.), Geneva: Droz, Travaux d’humanisme et renaissance, 67, 1964.
  • La Dialectique (1555), un manifeste de la Pléiade, N. Bruyère (ed.), Paris: Vrin, 1992.
  • Dialecticae institutiones, Paris 1543; reprinted with an introduction by W. Risse, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog 1964.
  • Dialectica Audomari Talaei praelectionibus illustrata, Basel 1569.
  • Diaelcticae libri duo per Rolandum Makilmenaeum Scotum, auctoris jussu in quibusdam locis emendati, Frankfurt, 1581.
  • Quod sit unica doctrinae instituendae methodus, translated into English in Renaissance Philosophy, Leonard A. Kennedy (ed.), The Hague and Paris: Mouton, 1973, pp. 108–55.
  • Arguments in Rhetoric against Quintilian: Translation and Text of Peter Ramus’s Rhetoricae distinctiones in Quintilianum (1549), translated by Carole Newlands; introduction by J.J. Murphy, DeKalb, IL: Northern Illinois University Press, 1986.
  • Scholae in liberales artes, Basel, 1569; reprinted with an introduction by W.J. Ong, Hildesheim, New York: G. Olms, 1970.
  • Scholarum mathematicarum libri unus et triginta a Lazaro Schonero recogniti et emendati, Frankfurt am Main, 1599; reprinted Hildesheim: G. Olms, 2008.

Selected books and articles on Ramus

  • Banosius, Theophilus, 1577, Petri Rami Varomandui vita, philosophiae et eloquentiae Regii professoris celeberrimi, printed in P. Ramus, Commentariorum de religione Christiana libri IV, Frankfurt, 1577.
  • Bruyère-Robinet, N., 1984, Méthode et dialectique dans l’oeuvre de La Ramée: Renaissance et Age classique, Paris: Vrin.
  • Couzinet, Marie-Dominique, 2015, Pierre Ramus et la critique du pédantisme: Philosophie, humanisme et culture scolaire au XVIe siècle, Paris: Honoré Champion.
  • Desmaze, Charles, 1864, P. Ramus: sa vie, ses écrits, sa mort. (1515–1572), Paris; reprinted Genève: Slatkine Reprints, 1970.
  • Freigius, Johannes Thomas, 1599, Petri Rami Vita, in Ramus, Collectaneae, pp. 580–623.
  • Feingold, M., J.S. Freedman, and W. Rother (eds.), 2001, The Influence of Petrus Ramus: Studies in Sixteenth and Seventeenth Century Philosophy and Sciences, Basel: Schwabe.
  • Freedman, Joseph S.,1993, “The Diffusion of the Writings of Petrus Ramus in Central Europe, c. 1570–c. 1630”, Renaissance Quarterly, 46: 98–152.
  • Gilbert, N.W., 1960, Renaissance Concepts of Method, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Goulding, Robert, 2006, “Method and Mathematics: Petrus Ramus’s Histories of the Science”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 63–85.
  • –––, 2010, Defending Hypatia: Ramus, Savile, and the Renaissance Rediscovery of Mathematical History, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Grafton, Anthony & Jardine, Lisa, 1986, From Humanism to the Humanities: Education and the Liberal Arts in Fifteenth and Sixteenth Century Europe, London: Duckworth.
  • Graves, Frank P., 1912, Peter Ramus and the Educational Reformation of the Sixteenth Century, New York: The Macmillan Company.
  • Henderson, Judith Rice, 1999, “Must a Good Orator Be a Good Man? Ramus in the Ciceronian Controversy”, in Rhetorica Movet: Studies in Historical and Modern Rhetoric in Honor of Heinrich F. Plett, Peter Oesterreich and Thomas Sloane (eds.), 43–56. Leiden: Brill
  • Hooykaas, R., 1958, “Humanisme, science et réforme. Pierre de la Ramée (1515–1572)”, Free University Quarterly, 5: 167–294.
  • Hotson, Howard, 2007, Commonplace Learning: Ramism and its German Ramifications 1543–1630, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ingemarsdotter, Jenny, 2011, Ramism, Rhetoric and Reform. An Intellectual Biography of Johan Skytte (1577–1645), Uppsala: Uppsala Universitet.
  • Jardine, Nicholas & Segonds, Alain, 2001, “A Challenge to the Reader: Ramus on Astrologia without Hypotheses” in The Influence of Petrus Ramus: Studies in Sixteenth and Seventeenth Century Philosophy and Sciences, M. Feingold, J. S. Freedman, and W. Rother (eds.) Basel: Schwabe.
  • Kneale, W. and M. Kneale, 1962, The Development of Logic, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Knight, Sarah & Wilson, Emma Annette (eds.), 2019, The European Contexts of Ramism, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Mack, Peter, 1998, “Ramus Reading: The Commentaries on Cicero’s Consular Orations and Vergil’s Eclogies and Georgics”, Journal of the Warburg and Courtauld Institutes, 61: 111–141.
  • –––, 2011, “Ramus and Ramism: Rhetoric and Dialectic”, in Ramus, Pedagogy and the Liberal Arts: Ramism in Britain and the Wider World, Steven J. Reid and Emma Annette Wilson (eds.), Farnham: Ashgate, pp. 7–23.
  • Meerhoff, K., 1986, Rhétorique et poétique au XVIe siècle en France. Du Bellay, Ramus et les autres, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
  • Meerhoff, K. and J.-C. Moisan (eds.), 1997, Autour de Ramus: Texte, théorie, commentaire, Quebec: Nuit Blanche.
  • Meerhoff, K. and M. Magnien (eds.), 2004, Ramus et l’université, Paris: Rue d’Ulm, Broché Cahiers V.L. Saulnier.
  • ––– (eds.), 2005, Autour de Ramus: Le Combat, Paris: H. Champion.
  • Nancelius, Nicolaus, 1599, Petri Rami Vita, edited with an English translation and introduction by Peter Sharratt in Humanistica Lovaniensia, XXIV (1975): 161–277.
  • Oldrini, G., 1997, La disputa del metodo nel Rinascimento: Indagini su Ramo e sul ramismo, Florence: Le Lettere.
  • Ong, W.J., 1958, Ramus. Method and the Decay of Dialogue, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Prantl, C., 1855–1870, Geschichte der Logik im Abendlande, 4 vols, Leipzig; reprinted Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1955.
  • Reid, Steven J. and Emma Annette Wilson (eds.), 2011, Ramus, Pedagogy and the Liberal Arts: Ramism in Britain and the Wider World, Farnham: Ashgate.
  • Robinet, André, 1996, Aux sources de l’esprit cartésien: L’axe La Ramée-Descarte; De la “Dialectique” de 1555 aux “Regulae”, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Sellberg, Erland, 1979, Filosofin och nyttan I. Petrus Ramus och ramismen, Göteborg: Acta Universitatis Gothoburgensis [with English summary].
  • –––, 2013, “The Impact of Education on Early Modern Political Culture”, (Re-)Contextualizing Literary and Cultural History: The Representation of the Past in Literary and Material Culture, E. Wåghäll Nivre, B. Schirrmarcher, and C. Egerer (eds.), Stockholm: Stockholm University, pp. 207–219.
  • –––, “Petrus Ramus and Ramism”, in Oxford Bibliographies in Renaissance and Reformation, Margaret King (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, forthcoming.
  • Sharratt, P., 1972, “The Present State of Studies on Ramus”, Studi francesi, 47–48: 201–213.
  • –––, 1987, “Recent work on Peter Ramus (1970–1986)”, Rhetorica, 5: 7–58.
  • –––, 2000, “Ramus 2000”, Rhetorica, 18: 399–455.
  • Skalnik, James, 2002, Ramus and Reform: University and Church at the End of the Renaissance, Kirksville, MO: Truman State University Press.
  • Tuve, Rosemund, 1947, Elizabethan and Metaphysical Imagery:Renaissance Poetic and Twentieth-Century Critics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Waddington, C., 1855, Ramus, sa vie, ses écrits et ses opinions, Paris, 1855; reprinted C. Brown Reprint Library, Dubuque, IA: Brown Reprint Library, 1969.
  • Wainwright, Michael, 2018, Rational Shakespeare: Peter Ramus, Edward de Vere, and the Question of Authorship, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Wilson, Emma Annette, 2019, “The International Nature of Britannic Ramism”, in The European Contexts of Ramism, by Sarah Knight and Emma Annette Wilson (eds.), Turnhout: Brepols, 153–185.
  • Vasoli, C., 1968, La dialettica et la retorica dell’umanesimo. “Invenzione” e “metodo” nella cultura del XV e XVI secolo, Milan: Feltrinelli.
  • Verdonk, J.J., 1966, Petrus Ramus en de wiskunde, Assen: Van Gorcum.

Further Reading

  • Akkerman, F. and A. Vanderjagt (eds.), 1988, Rudolphus Agricola Phrisius 1444–1485, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
  • Dreitzel, H., 1970, Protestantischer Aristotelismus und absoluter Staat. Die “Politica” des Henning Arnisaeus (1575–1636), Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner.
  • Dumitriu, Anton, 1977, History of Logic, II, Tunbridge Wells: Abacus Press.
  • Freedman, J., 1988, European Academic Philosophy in the Late Sixteenth and Early Seventeenth Centuries: The Life, Significance, and Philosophy of Clemens Timpler (1563/4–1624), 2 volumes, Zurich: G. Olms.
  • –––, 2000, Philosophy and the Arts in Central Europe, 1500–1700: Teaching and Texts at Schools and Universities, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Hotson, H., 2000, Johann Heinrich Alsted (1588–1638): Between Renaissance, Reformation and Universal Reform, Oxford:Oxford University Press.
  • Howell, W.S., 1956, Logic and Rhetoric in England 1500–1700, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Mack, Peter, 2011, A History of Renaissance Rhetoric, 1380–1620, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Risse, Wilhelm, 1964, Die Logik der Neuzeit, I: 1540–1640, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog.
  • Rummel, E., 1995, The Humanist-Scholastic Debate in the Renaissance and Reformation, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Schmitt, C.B., 1972, Cicero Scepticus: A Study of the Influence of the Academica in the Renaissance, The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Schmitt, C.B., Q. Skinner, and E. Kessler (eds.), 1988, The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sharratt, P. (ed.), 1976, French Renaissance Studies: Humanism and the Encyclopedia, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.

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