Structural Rationality

First published Wed Sep 13, 2023

Many paradigm instances of irrationality involve one’s mental states failing to cohere with one another, in a fairly broad sense of ‘cohere’.[1] For example, it’s commonly thought to be irrational to hold (obviously) inconsistent beliefs – say, to believe that you are a great cook, to believe that great cooks never overcook eggs, and yet to believe that you have overcooked the eggs. These three beliefs are jointly incoherent. Similarly, many central instances of practical irrationality, such as instrumental irrationality, can be thought of as instances of incoherence: it is incoherent to simultaneously intend to shop for groceries today, believe that to shop for groceries today you must get on your bike now, but yet not intend to get on your bike now. In recent years, many philosophers have come to refer to these incoherence-involving instances of irrationality as forms of ‘structural irrationality’, and to call the property of having mental states that do cohere with one another properly ‘structural rationality’.

Structural rationality is often contrasted with ‘substantive rationality’, which is typically understood in terms of responsiveness to normative reasons. So, for example, when we say that it isn’t rational to (intend to) gamble one’s life savings on the outcome of a horse race, this seems to reflect the existence of strong normative reasons against gambling (or intending to gamble) one’s life savings on the outcome of the race, rather than pinpointing any incoherence that must be present in the mental states of anyone who gambles her life savings on the outcome of the race. Similarly, when we say it isn’t rational to believe in astrology, this seems to reflect a judgment that there are strong normative reasons – presumably supplied by the available evidence – against believing in astrology, rather than presuming that anyone who believes in astrology must be incoherent.

This entry is composed of three sections. In §1, we survey debates about what structural rationality is, including the emergence of the concept in the contemporary literature, its key characteristics, its relationship to substantive rationality, its paradigm instances, and the questions of whether these instances are unified and, if so, how. In §2, we turn to the debate about structural requirements of rationality – including controversies about whether they are “wide-scope” or “narrow-scope”, synchronic or diachronic, and whether they govern processes or states; as well as examining various forms of skepticism about structural requirements of rationality. In §3, we turn to the debate about the normative significance of structural rationality, surveying central challenges for the view that structural rationality is normatively significant and the theoretical options that arise in light of these challenges.

1. What is Structural Rationality?

1.1 The Emergence of the Concept of Structural Rationality

The term ‘structural (ir)rationality’ is relatively recent; to the best of our knowledge, its first use with its current meaning is in Scanlon (2007).[2] However, philosophers have been theorizing about the underlying concept, using different terminology, for significantly longer. Interesting questions can be asked about whether historical figures such as Hume and Kant had theories of structural rationality. However, the contemporary debate about structural rationality can be more directly traced to a number of important articles and books from the 1970s and 80s (Hill 1973; Greenspan 1975; Dancy 1977; Darwall 1983), which largely focus on practical rationality.

Darwall’s 1983 book Impartial Reason is particularly instructive to focus on. The first half of the book is devoted to arguing against what Darwall calls the “DBR thesis”, on which an agent’s normative reasons are all dependent on her desires or ends – a thesis that was highly popular at the time. One line of support for the DBR thesis to which Darwall responds can be reconstructed roughly as follows:

  1. It’s irrational not to intend to take the believed means to one’s ends.
  2. Therefore, not intending to take the believed means to one’s ends involves a failure to respond to one’s reasons.
  3. Therefore, one’s reasons are strongly dependent on one’s ends.

This line of argument, if successful, generates strongly subjectivist (and anti-moralist) results about reasons. For example, to adapt Darwall’s memorable example, suppose Jo intends to kill Jay in the most violent way possible, and believes that the most violent way to kill Jay is with a cleaver. But suppose Jo does not intend to kill Jay with a cleaver. Jo is, then, practically irrational. According to the line of thought above, the way to explain this is by holding that Jo’s intention to kill Jay in the most violent way possible – perhaps together with her belief that the most violent way to kill Jay is with a cleaver – gives her a strong reason to (intend to) kill Jay with a cleaver. Generalizing, the result is that Jo can give herself strong reasons to perform highly immoral (or, indeed, imprudent) acts merely by adopting ends to which those acts are (believed) necessary means.

Not so fast, says Darwall, however. He focuses on critiquing the transition from (a) to (b) – though one could certainly also question the transition from (b) to (c). According to Darwall, the irrationality of failing to (intend to) take the (believed) means to one’s ends need not equate to a failure to respond to one’s reasons. Rather, it can be understood as a failure to conform to a sui generis rational requirement of coherence, which itself has no consequences for claims about reasons. Darwall calls such requirements principles of “relative rationality”; this notion is roughly equivalent to the more contemporary notion of structural rationality. As well as treating the requirement of instrumental rationality this way, Darwall makes a similar move regarding decision-theoretic principles that require us to do what maximizes subjective utility given our credences and preferences.

The basic maneuver here recurs in the works of a number of other philosophers (McDowell 1995; Scanlon 1998, 2004; Broome 1999, 2001a, 2004; Dancy 2000). In each case, the aim is to avoid highly subjectivist or anti-moralist results about reasons, or instances of what is often called “bootstrapping” (Bratman 1987; Broome 2001a), whereby merely having an attitude that is itself immoral or unreasonable can give one reasons to adopt further immoral or unreasonable attitudes. And in each case, these results are avoided by treating the requirements of structural rationality as autonomous and distinct from requirements that concern responding to reasons. By making space for a distinctively structural or coherence-based notion of rationality, the thought goes, we can accommodate intuitions about the irrationality of incoherence without committing ourselves to potentially problematic subjectivist assumptions about normative reasons.

Analogous points can be made in doxastic cases. To adapt an example from Fogal (2020), suppose that Ali believes that he is Superman, and believes that Superman can fly. If we now add that Ali believes that he cannot fly, Ali seems to be subject to a (further) charge of irrationality that he was not otherwise subject to. Should we conclude from this that, merely by believing that he is Superman and that Superman can fly, Ali gives himself a strong reason to believe that he can fly – one that he flouts by believing, instead, that he cannot fly? Many epistemologists would deny this: on most views, you can’t make an evidentially unsupported belief reasonable just by adopting other, equally unsupported, beliefs that entail it. Indeed, as Broome (1999) points out, if this were so, then any belief could make itself reasonable, since all propositions entail themselves. Rather, the thought goes, we can account for Ali’s irrationality by saying that he violates a requirement of structural rationality forbidding inconsistent beliefs (or, perhaps, particular kinds of inconsistent beliefs).

Once reasons and requirements of structural rationality are distinguished in this way, a number of important questions arise. One pressing question is whether there are any reasons to comply with the requirements of structural rationality. We’ll return to this question in §3. Before that, there is more to be said about the notion of structural rationality and requirements thereof.

1.2 Key Characteristics of Structural Rationality

As we have already seen, evaluations of structural rationality concern the coherence of one’s mental states. However, we can get a sharper focus on the notion of structural rationality by identifying some further often identified features of evaluations of structural rationality or irrationality, which are supposed to distinguish them from evaluations of substantive rationality or irrationality.

First, structural rationality typically concerns combinations of attitudes (and absences thereof), rather than individual attitudes (and absences thereof). Consider someone who believes \(p\) and believes not-\(p\). Either or both beliefs may fail to be substantively rational if they are ill-supported by the agent’s epistemic reasons. But the structural irrationality lies in the combination, not in either individual belief. The same is true of, for example, intending to \(\Phi\), believing that in order to \(\Phi\) one must \(\Psi\), but not intending to \(\Psi\). Again, one or more of these states may fail to be individually substantively rational, but the structural irrationality lies in the combination. However, it is controversial whether structural rationality always concerns combinations of attitudes, rather than individual attitudes. Broome (2013: 153), for example, suggests that a belief in a conjunctive proposition of the form \((p\) & not-\(p)\) is, on its own, structurally irrational. Nor is it distinctive of structural rationality that it concerns combinations of attitudes. There may be failures of substantive rationality that obtain specifically in virtue of a combination of attitudes: for example, it might not be substantively rational to intend to go to a job interview tomorrow and intend to wear swim shorts tomorrow, even if either of these intentions is rationally permitted on its own.

Second, and relatedly, evaluations of the structural rationality of some combination of attitudes can be made independently of judgments about which (if any) of the individual attitudes within the combination of attitude is substantively rational, or adequately supported by reasons. For example, suppose that Ravi believes that all taxes are illegitimate, while also believing that income taxes are legitimate. A left-liberal might judge that Ravi has good reasons for the second belief but not the first, while an anarcho-capitalist might judge the reverse, and a political agnostic might have no views about which of Ravi’s beliefs, if either, is supported by good reasons. Yet this should be no barrier to all three agreeing that Ravi’s combination of beliefs is structurally irrational. Similarly, even when we disagree about whether some end is worth pursuing, we should be able to agree that intending that end while not intending the believed means to it is structurally irrational.

Third, evaluations of structural rationality can be made without knowing anything about the situation of the agent being evaluated, or about the agent’s information about their situation. In this respect, they again contrast with evaluations of substantive rationality. Whether it is substantively rational for you to intend to go to medical school depends on the information available to you about your likely chances of succeeding in medical school, the costs of going, whether being a doctor would be a career you’d enjoy, and so on. We cannot possibly evaluate the substantive rationality of your intention to go to medical school without knowing what information is available to you about these matters. But if you simultaneously intend to go to medical school, believe that to do so you must take the entrance exam, and yet do not intend to take the entrance exam, then we can tell that you are structurally irrational, without needing to know this sort of information.

Finally, evaluations of structural rationality may be called formal in the sense that we can tell whether combinations of attitudes are structurally irrational even when abstracting at least somewhat from their content. So, for example, it’s always structurally irrational to believe \(p\) and believe not-\(p\), for any proposition \(p\), regardless of its content. Similarly, the means-end requirement says (or entails) that it is irrational to intend to \(\Phi\), to believe that to \(\Phi\) one must \(\Psi\), and not intend to \(\Psi\), for any actions \(\Phi\) and \(\Psi\), regardless of what they are.

1.3 The Relationship Between Structural and Substantive Rationality

The distinction between structural and substantive rationality is not beyond dispute. Some hold that it does not bear scrutiny. Moreover, those who accept the distinction hold competing views on its significance as well as on the relation between substantive and structural rationality.

First, there are those who identify rationality simpliciter with structural rationality (Scanlon 1998; Broome 2013, 2020; Ridge 2014: ch. 8). Such philosophers deny that what others call ‘substantive rationality’ is genuinely a kind of rationality at all: they hold that the requirements of structural rationality exhaust the requirements of rationality simpliciter. It is debatable to what extent this dispute is merely terminological or substantive. These philosophers don’t deny that there is an important normative notion – viz. ‘ought’ or ‘most reason’ – that can be understood in terms of what one’s reasons, on balance, support. But they want to withhold the label ‘rationality’ from it.

One argument for withholding the label ‘rationality’ from (what we’ve called) substantive rationality proceeds from the purported conceptual constraint that rationality supervenes on the mind: there can be no change in whether an agent counts as rational without a change in her mental states (Wedgwood 2002; Broome 2013, 2020). It then holds that reasons do not supervene on the mind: one’s reasons can change without one’s mental states changing. Thus, it is concluded, rationality cannot require us to correctly respond to our reasons. The argument can be supported by intuitions about cases. In a famous case (Broome 2007a), Lois has a piece of fish in front of her, which unbeknownst to her, contains salmonella. The fact that the fish contains salmonella is a decisive reason for Lois not to eat it; yet, since Lois is unaware of this reason, she cannot be irrational for failing to respond to it. Arguably, it is precisely because rationality supervenes on the mind that Lois cannot be irrational for failing to respond to a reason that she is entirely unaware of.

Defenders of the notion of substantive rationality reply that the notion of ‘reasons’ at work in the conception of rationality as reasons-responsiveness is in some important way constrained by the agent’s epistemic position (Kiesewetter 2017; Lord 2018). Perhaps, for example, substantive rationality requires us to respond only to the reasons that our evidence makes available to us – often called “available” or “possessed” reasons. If this is so, then eating the fish may well be substantively rational for Lois. Moreover, while unpossessed reasons do not supervene on the mind, it is less clear that the same is true for possessed reasons. Thus, the rational requirement to correctly respond to these reasons may be compatible with the supervenience of rationality on the mind (Kiesewetter 2020).

It is also worth noting that the proposal that rationality simpliciter is just structural rationality is much less popular in epistemology than it is in ethics and the practical rationality literature (Worsnip 2016b). In epistemology, it is orthodoxy that agents who fail to respond to their evidential reasons for belief thereby fail to be rational,[3] and thus that there are rational requirements of reasons-responsiveness – i.e. requirements of substantive rationality. By contrast, purely coherentist theories of epistemic rationality – which effectively identify epistemic rationality with a kind of structural rationality – are now widely rejected.

A second view about the relationship between structural and substantive rationality contends that these two notions of rationality ultimately come to the same thing (Wedgwood 2017; Smithies, forthcoming). This position can be motivated in part by taking on board the aforementioned point that substantive rationality requires us only to respond to those reasons that our evidence makes available to us. Putting this together with the claim that our evidence consists in or at least supervenes on our mental states, it can be argued that the rational requirement to respond to our evidentially available reasons is itself a requirement to ensure a kind of coherence between our mental states, in a broad sense of ‘coherence’. Thus, it is argued, the distinction between substantive rationality (viz. reasons-responsiveness) and structural rationality (viz. coherence) breaks down.

Defenders of the structural-substantive distinction respond that the notion of (in)coherence that we should employ in order to understand structural rationality is narrower than the one needed to break the distinction down (Fogal and Worsnip 2021). Consider someone who has a belief that is insufficiently supported by her (available) evidence: say, she believes that the Orioles will win today’s baseball game, when her (available) evidence doesn’t, in fact, give her sufficient grounds for thinking this. Suppose, however, that she holds her belief not in knowing defiance of her evidence, but rather because she simply mistakenly overestimates the probative strength of her evidence. In this case, she has a belief that is insufficiently supported by her (available) evidential reasons, and thus fails to be substantively rational. Yet it is only in a very broad sense of ‘incoherent’ that she is incoherent. In a narrower sense of ‘incoherent’, she need not be incoherent: as long as she does not recognize what her (available) reasons support believing, there seems to be no internal clash between her attitudes here. This narrow sense of ‘incoherent’ – it is held – is the one relevant for structural rationality. This position can be bolstered by appeal to the central characteristics of structural rationality identified in §1.2 above. The judgment that there is a rational shortcoming involved in believing that the Orioles will win today depends on substantive judgments about reasons, and the circumstances and evidence of the agent. Moreover, this rational shortcoming isn’t an instance of a more general pattern of irrationality that can be identified in abstraction from the content of the attitude involved. Additionally, the narrower sense of (in)coherence relevant for structural (ir)rationality is held to obtain only between what Scanlon (1998, 18ff.) has called “judgment-sensitive attitudes”, such as beliefs and intentions, and cannot involve other mental states such as perceptions, which are not responsive to judgment or reasoning. Thus, to have beliefs that are out of whack with one’s perceptual evidence will not be incoherent in this narrower sense, nor structurally irrational.

A third set of views holds that, though substantive and structural rationality can be intelligibly distinguished, one is reducible to the other. Some hold that structural rationality can be reduced to substantive rationality (Kiesewetter 2017; Lord 2018; Henning 2018; Lasonen-Aarnio 2021; see also Singh forthcoming). One way of effecting this reduction is via the claim that what it is to be structurally irrational is to have a combination of attitudinal mental states such that it is guaranteed that, whatever one’s situation (and thus, one’s reasons) is like, at least one of the mental states fails to be substantively rational (Kiesewetter 2017: 235–39; see also Kolodny 2007a and 2008 and Lord 2018 for related ideas). For example, it seems plausible that whatever one’s situation (and thus, one’s reasons) is like, one’s evidence can never sufficiently support both believing \(p\) and believing not-\(p\). If this is so, then to believe \(p\) and believe not-\(p\) is to have a combination of attitudinal mental states such that it is guaranteed that, whatever one’s situation is like, at least one of these mental states fails to be substantively rational. Similarly, it might be thought, one’s reasons could never support intending an end and believing that a means is necessary for that end, while also supporting not intending the means; and this is what makes the combination structurally irrational. Notice that this view is not one on which structural and substantive irrationality turn out to be the same property: having attitudes that guarantee a failure to respond correctly to one’s reasons (structural irrationality) is a stronger property than merely having failed to respond correctly to one’s reasons (a failure of substantive rationality). It thus accommodates the natural idea that structural rationality involves a distinct kind of failure.

Critics of this view push back in a number of ways, but perhaps the most common response is to point to cases where jointly incoherent attitudes are individually permitted by one’s reasons (Broome 2013: 85–6; Way 2013). For example, suppose that your evidence indicates that to go to the supermarket, you must get on your bike (thus permitting, or perhaps even requiring, belief in this proposition). And suppose that your reasons permit, but don’t require, you to go to the supermarket. In that case, it seems like your reasons permit, but don’t require, you to get on your bike. In that case, neither the intention to go to the supermarket, nor the belief that to do so you must get on your bike, nor the absence of an intention to get on your bike, fails to be substantively rational. Yet it seems that the three are still structurally irrational in combination. If this is right, then the structural irrationality of some combination of attitudes is not a guarantee that at least one of the attitudes fails to be substantively rational. Similarly, perhaps there are permissive cases with respect to one’s doxastic attitudes (Ballantyne and Coffman 2011; Schoenfield 2014). For example, perhaps your evidence can permit a credence of 0.6 for \(p\), but also permit a credence of 0.61 for \(p\). Correspondingly, then, it permits a credence of either 0.39 or 0.4 for not-\(p\). In that case, neither a credence of 0.61 for \(p\) nor a credence of 0.4 for not-\(p\) fails to be substantively rational. Yet the combination of the two is structurally irrational (Staffel 2020).

Various strategies have been proposed to deal with this challenge. Kolodny (2011) and Lord (2018: Ch.2) both suggest that the adoption of an intention can alter one’s reasons to take the means, rendering a means-intention that was merely permitted prior to the adoption of the end-intention, substantively required (an analogous story about credences is suggested in Lord 2020). Drawing on work by Bratman (1987), Kiesewetter (2017: Ch. 10) argues that in cases of merely permissible ends, means-end incoherent agents will flout economical reasons because maintaining intentions that one will not carry out makes one susceptible to waste resources. With respect to doxastic incoherence, it is also an option to reject the kind of permissivism that is in conflict with explaining structural irrationality in terms of substantive requirements of rationality (e.g., White 2005, Schultheis 2018). On one alternative view, substantive epistemic rationality permits us to have imprecise credences rather than several precise credences that are probabilistically incoherent.

Other philosophers can be understood as pursuing a reduction in the opposite direction: that is, a reduction of substantive rationality to structural rationality. For example, some hold that what it is to have a reason to \(\Phi\) is to be such that, were one’s mental states to be corrected for structural irrationality, one would be motivated to \(\Phi\) – or desire to \(\Phi\), or intend to \(\Phi\), or similar (Smith 1994; Markovits 2014). Such accounts of reasons are often called “idealized attitudes” accounts. If reasons can be reduced to facts about structural rationality, this plausibly provides the materials to reduce substantive rationality (itself understood in terms of reasons-responsiveness) to facts about structural rationality too. However, idealized attitudes accounts of reasons have been subjected to numerous objections (see e.g. Enoch 2005). One important objection in the present context is that it is quite unclear how to generalize this view to reasons for (and thus, the substantive irrationality of) belief (Cuneo 2007: ch. 7). Another is that, since there is typically more than one way to correct for structural irrationality, such views will leave it radically indeterminate what our reasons are, or perhaps generate reasons for almost anything (Sampson 2021).

Fourth, and finally, some philosophers hold that substantive and structural rationality are both equally genuine kinds of rationality and that neither is reducible to the other (Worsnip 2021). Such views owe us an account of how, if at all, these two kinds of rationality relate to one another: for example, can they come into conflict with one another? If substantive rationality often recommends one thing and structural rationality recommends another, this may seem dissatisfying, especially if there is nothing to be said about which demand takes rational precedence. Indeed, some may think the prospect of structural and substantive rationality conflicting shows that they can’t both be bona fide sources of rational requirements.

However, it’s worth noting that the extent of any conflicts between structural and substantive rationality depends on the positive theory of structural rationality that we adopt. On a “wide-scope” view about structural rationality (see §2.1 below), its requirements are merely negative, prohibiting incoherent combinations of attitudes, and one can come to satisfy the relevant requirement by revising any of the incoherent attitudes. If this is so, it reduces the potential for conflicts between substantive and structural rationality. This is because, on this view, structural rationality simply tells one that one should restore coherence in some way when one is incoherent, and this leaves room for substantive rationality to (sometimes) determine, more specifically, which way to do so. For example, consider again Ali, who believes that he is Superman and that Superman can fly. If Ali’s evidence is normal, substantive rationality prohibits Ali from believing he can fly. Does structural rationality require him to believe he can fly? Not obviously: it might permit him instead to revise one of his original beliefs, requiring only that he either believe he can fly or revise one of these original beliefs. Some have argued, however, that conflicts between substantive and structural rationality can arise in subtler ways in special cases (Worsnip 2018a).

1.4 Instances of Structural (Ir)rationality: An Inventory

So far, we’ve focused mostly on inconsistent beliefs and means-end incoherence as paradigm instances of structural irrationality. But there are many other putative instances. Any particular instance will be controversial, since it is always up for debate whether some combination of mental states really is structurally irrational. And it is not feasible to be completely comprehensive in identifying all the candidate instances. But we will draw attention to some of the (patterns of) combinations of states that are among the most plausible candidates.

Let’s begin with some combinations of doxastic states that are plausibly structurally irrational. Along with strictly contradictory beliefs – i.e., a belief in \(p\) and a belief in not-\(p\) – it is often thought that other logically inconsistent sets of beliefs are structurally irrational. For example, as mentioned earlier, it seems structurally irrational for Ali to believe he is Superman, believe that Superman can fly, and yet believe that he cannot fly. More strongly, some have thought that it is structurally irrational to fail to believe the logical entailments of one’s beliefs – so that Ali would be irrational were he to believe that he is Superman, believe that Superman can fly, and merely fail to believe that he himself can fly. The requirement that one believes the logical entailments of one’s beliefs is often called ‘deductive closure’.

However, there are thorny issues about whether all instances of inconsistency, or of failing to believe the logical entailments of one’s beliefs, involve irrationality. First, it is not clear if this is so when the relevant inconsistency or entailment is extremely subtle and would take a complex logical proof to detect (Broome 2013: 154–5). Second, it is not clear that we are irrational for failing to clutter our minds with the infinite trivial consequences of our existing beliefs (Harman 1986: 12). In response to the first problem, some say that structural irrationality obtains only when one recognizes the relevant inconsistency or entailment (Sainsbury 2002). In response to the second, some say that, where \(q\) is some consequence of one’s existing beliefs, one needs to care about whether \(q\) (Broome 2013) or attend to \(q\) to be structurally irrational for failing to believe \(q\). However, these restrictions do not deal with all purported cases of rational inconsistency. For example, the preface paradox (Makinson 1965) is a plausible case of rational but inconsistent beliefs (see esp. Christensen 2004). In this case, an author writes a book containing a number of claims, but modestly affirms in the preface that doubtless, the book contains errors – i.e., that at least one of the claims in the book is false. This total set of beliefs – the claims in the book, plus the preface claim – is inconsistent, but arguably, it is not irrational to hold these beliefs – even if one recognizes the inconsistency, and attends to and cares about the relevant beliefs. While some (MacFarlane 2004 – see Other Internet Resources) hold that this is a case where substantive and structural rationality conflict, others (Worsnip 2016a) have argued that the inconsistent beliefs in these cases are not even structurally irrational.

It is also widely held that agents can be structurally irrational in virtue of the ways that their first-order beliefs combine with their higher-order beliefs: that is, with beliefs about the normative status of their first-order beliefs, or about their evidence for them. For example, it’s often thought to be structurally irrational to believe \(p\) while also believing that one’s evidence does not adequately support \(p\) – or to fail to believe \(p\) while also believing that one’s evidence decisively supports \(p\) (see, among many others, Kolodny 2005; Feldman 2005; Titelbaum 2015). Such combinations of states are sometimes described as “epistemically akratic” (Horowitz 2014; Greco 2014). While some deny that such states must be irrational on the grounds that they can be rational in cases of misleading higher-order evidence (Coates 2012; Lasonen-Aarnio 2020), others think that it is at most substantively rational, but not structurally rational, to be epistemically akratic in such cases (Worsnip 2018a).

Many of the kinds of irrationality pinpointed by formal epistemologists, which typically pertain to credences rather than to full belief, can also be plausibly regarded as structural. For example, (most) failures to conform one’s credences to the axioms of probability – such as the aforementioned case of assigning credence 0.6 to \(p\) and credence 0.41 to not-\(p\) – are plausibly structurally irrational. Somewhat more controversially, failing to update one’s credences via conditionalization might be viewed as a kind of structural irrationality between one’s prior and posterior credences. The latter case is more controversial, because this kind of “incoherence” is typically understood as diachronic, whereas some think that structural irrationality is a synchronic phenomenon (see §2.3). Consequently, viewing it as a kind of incoherence either requires us to pinpoint some kind of synchronic failure that occurs when one fails to conditionalize properly, or to allow for diachronic instances of structural irrationality.

Let’s now turn to forms of structural irrationality that (at least partly) involve non-doxastic states. One paradigmatic example of structural irrationality that we’ve already mentioned is means-end incoherence (also known as ‘instrumental irrationality’, though this term is sometimes used with other meanings; see also the entry on instrumental rationality), whereby one intends to \(\Phi\), believes that in order to \(\Phi\) one must \(\Psi\), but does not intend to \(\Psi\). Besides this, perhaps the most common example of structural irrationality involving non-doxastic states is practical akrasia – believing one ought, all things considered, to \(\Phi\) but not intending to \(\Phi\) (see, among many others, Broome 2001b, 2013; Kolodny 2005; for dissent, see Arpaly 2000). Notably, this form of structural irrationality (as well as means-end incoherence) involves incoherence between a belief and an intention (or lack of), thus bridging doxastic and conative states. Another example of a form of incoherence that bridges doxastic and conative states might be intending to do something that one believes one cannot do.

There are also plausible examples of structural irrationality that obtain solely between conative states. It’s often held that it is structurally irrational to have contradictory intentions – that is, to intend to \(\Phi\) and intend not to \(\Phi\). And as in the doxastic case, there are forms of incoherence studied by formally-inclined philosophers (and economists) that are naturally thought of as instances of structural irrationality – such as having cyclical preferences, whereby one prefers \(A\) to \(B\), prefers \(B\) to \(C\), and yet prefers \(C\) to \(A\) (Davidson, McKinsey and Suppes 1955; Gaus 2008: 36–40).

Finally – though this is understudied – there may be forms of structural irrationality that involve affective and emotional states (see also the entry on emotion, section 10). For example, perhaps it is structurally irrational to hope for something that one believes to be bad, or to fear something that one believes to be good. And perhaps it is also irrational to hope for or fear something that one believes to be impossible.

1.5 The Unity of Structural Rationality

As the above list makes clear, the instances of structural irrationality are a diverse bunch. One may reasonably wonder what, if anything, all these instances have in common. Some (e.g. Broome 2013) seem to think that it is enough simply to say that they are all combinations of states that are jointly irrational, but others aspire to identify something deeper in virtue of which they share this property.

One way of trying to do this is to embrace the reductivist view mentioned in §1.3 above. On this view, what structurally irrational states have in common is that they are all combinations of attitudes that cannot simultaneously be supported by one’s reasons. However, as we saw, this view faces some important challenges, such as accounting for the structural irrationality of sets of individually permissible attitudes. (It’s worth noting that there is another family of views that also, in a different way, tries to explain structural rationality in terms of reasons. On these views, what unifies structurally irrational states is that they involve the agent’s going against her beliefs about reasons (“transparency” accounts), or her apparent reasons (“apparent reasons accounts”). We discuss these views, and problems with them, in §3.3.)

In a similar but somewhat different vein, some explore the idea that attitudes are structurally irrational just in case they can’t all “succeed”, or fulfil their “aim”, where this might be truth for beliefs and satisfaction or correctness for intentions or preferences (Fink forthcoming; Fullhart and Martinez forthcoming; see also Gibbard 2003; Brunero 2020: Ch. 7; Rosa 2022; Singh forthcoming). However, this proposal struggles to explain the incoherence of other mental states, such as credences. It is also far from obvious that akratic attitude combinations cannot be jointly successful – after all, the beliefs involved in epistemic akrasia are logically consistent, and it is possible for a belief that one ought to \(\Phi\) to be true even if the corresponding intention is not satisfied. Proponents of this view are thus pressed to either accept certain revisionary implications, to introduce more substantive and hence more controversial success conditions for attitudes, or to give up the ambition to provide a fully unifying account of structural irrationality.

Another at least partially unifying proposal is “cognitivism”, which aspires to reduce certain structural requirements governing intention (such as that of means-end coherence) to certain structural requirements governing belief (such as that of deductive closure) (Harman 1976; Velleman 1989; Wallace 2001; Setiya 2007). This view is premised on a corresponding cognitivism about intention, on which, roughly, intending to \(\Phi\) involves believing one will \(\Phi\). Given this, failures of means-end coherence (for example) arguably result in one’s violating closure – specifically, violating a modus ponens requirement by believing one will \(\Phi\), believing that one will \(\Phi\) only if one \(\Psi\)-s, but not believing that one will \(\Psi\). As cognitivists recognize (Setiya 2007), their account must be complicated or supplemented to deliver this result. This is because even if intending to \(\Phi\) involves believing that one will \(\Phi\), it doesn’t follow that not intending to \(\Psi\) involves not believing that one will \(\Psi\) (perhaps one believes that one will unintentionally \(\Psi)\). Moreover, the view that an intention to \(\Phi\) involves believing one will \(\Phi\) has been criticized (e.g., Bratman 2009a). Further, even if cognitivists are right to think that means-end incoherence necessarily involves doxastic incoherence, there are reasons to think that the former involves a distinctively practical mistake that cannot be reduced to a mistake in one’s cognitive attitudes (e.g., Brunero 2020: Ch. 6). And finally, in our context, it is an open question whether cognitivism can be a fully unifying theory of structural rationality, as it is unclear how, for example, practical akrasia can be understood as a violation of a purely doxastic structural requirements, or how cognitivism delivers unity within the class of doxastic structural requirements.

A proposal put forward by some formally-inclined philosophers is that structurally irrational states are those that make one exploitable to loss through devices such as Dutch books or money pumps.[4] However, again, this proposal seems insufficiently general to capture all instances of structural irrationality: for example, there is no obvious way in which someone with (either epistemically or practically) akratic states is vulnerable to such loss. Moreover, even where structural irrationality and exploitability coincide, it is dubious whether it is the latter that explains the former, rather than vice versa. Numerous philosophers have argued that one’s susceptibility to Dutch books or money pumps merely reflects or brings out one’s irrationality, rather than grounding or explaining it, since it is unclear why vulnerability to purely hypothetical monetary loss (that can only be exacted by someone with full knowledge of one’s mental states, and is almost certain not to actually occur) is the right sort of thing to make one irrational (Lewis 1999: 404–5; Christensen 2004: 109–24; Gaus 2008: 39; Levy 2014: 2).

Finally, it has recently been proposed that structurally irrational states are unified by the fact that it is in some way difficult to sustain them in full, reflective self-knowledge. On one version of this proposal (Worsnip 2018b), this is because it is constitutive of the mental states involved that to genuinely count as having these states, one must have some disposition to revise them when these conditions of “full transparency” are met. For example, if one believes that to go shopping today one must get on one’s bike now, and does not intend to get on one’s bike now, and one is fully and consciously aware of both of these states and has no disposition to revise them, then one arguably does not count as intending to go shopping today (cf. also Finlay 2009; Lee 2022). Again, though, this proposal faces some challenges. In particular, it seems to force us to choose between denying that completely clear-eyed practical akrasia is possible and denying that practical akrasia is structurally irrational. It may also struggle with examples of individuals who hold logically inconsistent or even contradictory beliefs but are not disposed to revise them because they subscribe to non-classical logics.

2. Requirements of Structural Rationality

A common assumption in the literature on structural rationality is that agents have the property of being structurally rational or irrational in virtue of satisfying or violating certain norms or requirements of structural rationality (see esp. Broome 2013: Ch. 7). This section is concerned with various disputes surrounding such structural requirements. §§2.1–2.4 address questions about the general form of structural requirements, while §2.5 is concerned with skepticism about structural requirements and with approaches to structural rationality that dispense with structural requirements. These disputes are important for anyone who aspires to spell out a theory of structural rationality. They are also – as we’ll see in §3 – relevant for debates about the normativity of rationality.

2.1 Wide- vs. Narrow-Scope Requirements

The most widely debated – and arguably most important – question about the form of structural requirements of rationality is whether these requirements take wide scope (e.g. Broome 1999; Wallace 2001; Bratman 2009b) or narrow scope (e.g. Korsgaard 1997; Schroeder 2004; Kolodny 2005). To explain this distinction, recall that structural irrationality involves (at least in the vast majority of cases) a tension between at least two attitude-states (where an attitude-state might consist in either the presence or the absence of an attitude). For example, akrasia involves a tension between a belief to the effect that one ought to \(\Phi\) \([\rBO\Phi]\) and the lack of an intention to \(\Phi\) \([\rI\Phi].\) On the received view, having this combination of attitude-states is irrational in virtue of violating a requirement of structural rationality. And on a prima facie natural interpretation of such requirements, these requirements are conditional on one (or more) of the relevant attitude-states (the “antecedent state(s)”) and take scope over some other attitude-state (the “consequent state”). Thus, for example, a natural way to understand what Broome (2013) has dubbed the “enkratic requirement” – the requirement prohibiting akrasia – is as follows:

Enkratic requirement, narrow-scope:
If \(A\) believes that she ought to \(\Phi\), then rationality requires \(A\) to intend to \(\Phi\) \([\rBO\Phi \to \rR(\rI\Phi)].\)

As several authors have emphasized, however, structural requirements can also be understood in a different way (Hill 1973; Greenspan 1975; Dancy 1977; Darwall 1983; and, more recently, Broome 1999, 2007c, 2013; Wallace 2001; Bratman 2009b; Brunero 2010, 2020; Way 2011). According to this alternative reading, structural requirements are not conditional on the antecedent state; instead, both the antecedent and the consequent state are part of the scope of requirement, which is why this is called a ‘wide scope’ reading. In case of the enkratic requirement, this interpretation says:

Enkratic requirement, wide-scope:
Rationality requires of \(A\) that [if \(A\) believes that she ought to \(\Phi\), then \(A\) intends to \(\Phi\)] \([\rR(\rBO\Phi\to\rI\Phi)]\).

To illustrate the relevance of this distinction and the ways in which the two requirements have different consequences, consider Ava, an environmentalist activist who has gone astray and formed the belief that she ought to extinguish all human life. The narrow-scope and wide-scope enkratic requirements will have different results for our verdicts about Ava along two dimensions: symmetry and detachment.

Beginning with symmetry: Ava can comply with the wide-scope enkratic requirement in one of two ways: either by coming to intend to extinguish human life or by dropping her belief that she ought to extinguish human life.[5] Conversely, she can comply with the narrow-scope enkratic requirement only by coming to intend to extinguish human life. In this sense, the wide-scope requirement is symmetric while the narrow-scope requirement is asymmetric. Strikingly, this difference has been employed as part of arguments for both the wide-scope and narrow-scope views. Wide-scopers claim that symmetry is desirable because it would not be irrational in any good sense for Ava to drop her misguided belief instead of coming to intend to extinguish human life (Broome 1999; Worsnip 2021). Narrow-scopers, by contrast, charge that symmetry is undesirable because there is an important difference between forming an intention on the basis of a normative belief and dropping a normative belief merely on the basis of an absence of an intention to follow through on it: the former process seems in some way more rational than the latter (Schroeder 2004, 2009; Kolodny 2005; Bedke 2009; Finlay 2010). Whether this latter charge is a compelling argument against the wide-scope view depends in large part on whether structural requirements such as the enkratic requirement should reflect facts about which states it is rational to base on which: Kolodny (2005) argues that they must, while many wide-scopers (Way 2011; Brunero 2012; Broome 2013) hold that they do not, maintaining that there are independent “basing prohibitions” and “basing permissions” that account for the rationality of basing in particular.

Let’s now consider detachment. Consider the inference:

\(\rBO\Phi\to \rR(\rI\Phi)\)

This inference-pattern is valid via modus ponens. Applied to the case of Ava, this means that we can derive (or “detach”) a requirement for Ava to intend to extinguish human life (3) from the narrow-scope enkratic requirement (1a) and the premise that Ava believes that she ought to extinguish human life (2). The wide-scope account avoids this implication, for the following inference is not validated by the propositional calculus:


Hence, the conclusion that Ava is rationally required to intend to extinguish all human life (3) does not obviously follow from the wide-scope enkratic requirement (1b) and the premise that Ava believes that she ought to extinguish all human life (2). In order for this inference to be valid, the deontic logic of rational requirements would need to contain the following axiom:

Factual detachment:
If \(p\), and rationality requires of \(A\) that \(p\to q,\) then rationality requires of \(A\) that \(q\).

But this principle is questionable and widely rejected (see esp. Broome 1999).

Some philosophers (e.g., Broome 1999; Bratman 2009b) take the fact that narrow-scope requirements detach while wide-scope requirements do not as a point in favor of the wide-scope requirement. Suppose that we have derived the conclusion that Ava is rationally required to intend to extinguish all human life from the narrow-scope enkratic requirement via modus ponens. If we add the further premise that rationality is normative (see §3 below) in the sense that we ought (or have reason) to comply with structural requirements, we are forced to conclude that Ava ought (or has reason) to intend to extinguish all human life – simply because she has adopted a crazy belief. But this kind of “bootstrapping” is widely regarded as unacceptable (recall §1.1). Thus, if rationality is normative, this seems to tell against the narrow-scope view.

It is worth noting that the issues of symmetry, detachment, and bootstrapping arise with regard to the scope of all structural requirements on attitude-combinations, including those that concern only doxastic states. For one example, take the aforementioned (putative) requirement forbidding “epistemic akrasia”, which requires alignment between one’s higher-order and first-order doxastic states. Suppose Darren believes that his evidence supports believing that the earth is flat. Again, a narrow-scope version of an anti-epistemic akrasia requirement seems to allow us to detach the conclusion that (structural) rationality requires Darren to believe that the earth is flat. Wide-scopers will complain that this is incorrect, since structural rationality should at least permit Darren to instead drop his higher-order belief that the evidence supports believing that the earth is flat (i.e., the requirement should be symmetrical). Moreover, they will say, it is particularly objectionable when paired with the thesis that rationality is normative, since this would allow us to conclude that Darren can make it the case that he ought or has reason to believe the earth is flat merely by (unjustifiably) believing that this is what his evidence supports (i.e., would license problematic bootstrapping). On the other hand, narrow-scopers will charge that it is more rational to come to believe \(p\) on the basis of a belief that one’s evidence supports \(p\) than to drop a belief that one’s evidence support \(p\) on the basis of a mere absence of belief in \(p\). Or consider the requirement to respect modus ponens, and our aforementioned character Ali, who believes he is Superman and that Superman can fly. Wide-scopers will hold that structural rationality should at least permit Ali to drop his belief that he is Superman rather than come to believe he can fly. In addition, they will stress that any view that yields the conclusion that Ali can make it the case that he ought or has reason to believe he can fly merely by holding the beliefs that he is Superman and that Superman can fly must be rejected. By contrast, narrow-scopers will hold that it is more rational to come to believe \(q\) on the basis of belief in \(p\) and belief that if \(p\) then \(q\) than it is to give up one’s belief in \(p\) or one’s belief that if \(p\) then \(q\) on the basis of a mere absence of belief in \(q\) (as distinct from a positive belief that not-\(q)\). (For reasons of brevity, we will focus on the practical enkratic requirement in the remainder of this section, but as with this subsection, the same points apply to other structural requirements, including those that concern only doxastic states.)

The wide-scope account has sometimes been charged with assuming a mistaken semantic view, namely that ordinary conditionals of the form “If you \(\Phi\), you ought to \(\Psi\)” are to be read as really expressing the wide-scope requirement that you ought to be such that (if you \(\Phi\), then you \(\Psi)\).[6] Many philosophers of language reject this “wide-scope semantics” (Hansson 1969, van Fraassen 1972, Lewis 1973, Kratzer 1981; for applications to contemporary debates about rationality, see Dreier 2009, Schroeder 2011, Dowell 2012, Silk 2014). In response, wide-scopers can make two points (Kiesewetter 2017: Ch. 3; Worsnip 2021: Chs. 6–7). First, they can maintain that while the fundamental explanation of structural irrationality is provided by wide-scope requirements, the semantics of ordinary conditionals is a different matter. For example, Worsnip (2021: Ch. 7) combines the wide-scope view of structural requirements with a more orthodox, contextualist account of ordinary deontic conditionals along the lines of Kratzer (1981). Second, they can point out that the spirit of the wide-scope view can be maintained without stating structural requirements as involving conditionals at all. The relevant requirements can instead be understood as requiring disjunctive responses or as prohibitions on combinations of responses. For example, the wide-scope enkratic requirement can be formulated in either of the following two ways:

Enkratic requirement, disjunctive:
Rationality requires \(A\) to [intend to \(\Phi\) or not believe that she ought to \(\Phi\)].

Enkratic requirement, combination prohibition:
Rationality requires \(A\) to not [believe that she ought to \(\Phi\) and not intend to \(\Phi\)].

These requirements are symmetric and do not allow for detachment; they thus share with the original wide-scope formulations the properties that distinguish them from narrow-scope requirements.

2.2 Synchronic vs. Diachronic Requirements

As we have discussed them so far, structural requirements do not index attitude-states to time points and are thus open to two interpretations. On the synchronic interpretation, all the attitude-states are indexed to the same point in time, while on a diachronic interpretation, the attitude-states are indexed to different time points or periods. For example, the narrow-scope enkratic requirement (§2.1) may be understood in either of the following ways:

Enkratic requirement, narrow-scope + synchronic: If \(A\) believes at \(t\) that she ought to \(\Phi\), rationality requires \(A\) to intend at \(t\) to \(\Phi\).

Enkratic requirement, narrow-scope + diachronic: If \(A\) believes at \(t_1\) that she ought to \(\Phi\), rationality requires \(A\) to intend at \(t_2\) to \(\Phi\).

The literature contains two kinds of arguments for the diachronic approach. The first is that only diachronic requirements can guide our reasoning going forward (Schroeder 2004; Kolodny 2005). The second is that synchronic requirements cannot accommodate “rational delay” – the assumption that limited beings like us are not rationally criticizable for taking time to adjust their attitudes to new circumstances and establish coherence (Kiesewetter 2017: 62–70; Podgorski 2017).

However, it is difficult to spell out diachronic requirements. An important challenge for any diachronic approach is to specify the relation between \(t_1\) and \(t_2\). A possible view is that \(t_2\) is just any time after \(t_1\), perhaps even including \(t_1\) (Lord 2014). While this might speak to the guidance-related argument for the diachronic account, it does not seem appropriate as a response to the phenomenon of rational delay. And since the length of rational delay appears to depend on particular circumstances and individual abilities, there is reason to be skeptical that there could be a principled specification of diachronic requirements that accounts for rational delay.

Moreover, if one is persuaded that the wide-scope approach is superior to the narrow-scope approach, there are further problems for the diachronic approach, as it is debatable whether the diachronic approach is consistent with the spirit of the wide-scope approach. Consider:

Enkratic requirement, wide-scope + diachronic: Rationality requires \(A\) to (not-believe at \(t_1\) that she ought to \(\Phi\) or intend at \(t_2\) to \(\Phi)\).

If \(A\) believes at \(t_1\) that she ought to \(\Phi\), then at \(t_2\) intending to \(\Phi\) is the only way in which \(A\) can satisfy this requirement. Thus, a requirement to adopt this intention can plausibly be detached (Broome 2013). This violates the spirit of the wide-scope approach. While other ways of spelling out diachronic wide-scope requirements have been proposed, it remains controversial whether they can preserve symmetry and non-detachability without collapsing into their synchronic counterparts (Lord 2014; Reisner 2009; Kiesewetter 2017: 58–69; Worsnip 2021: 183–7).

While there is considerable disagreement about whether all structural requirements are diachronic, it is somewhat less controversial that there are at least some essentially diachronic requirements of rationality ­– for example, requirements of attitude persistence that prohibit abandoning beliefs or intentions arbitrarily (Broome 2013; Bratman 2018; Brunero 2022). However, at least in the doxastic realm, some authors have argued that there are no diachronic requirements at all (Hedden 2015; Moss 2015).

2.3 Process vs. State Requirements

While most authors take requirements of structural rationality to govern attitude-states, such as beliefs or intentions, some have argued that they should rather be understood as requirements on processes, such as reasoning or, more generally, the forming, dropping or retaining of attitudes (Kolodny 2005, 2007b; Podgorski 2017). Since processes are temporally extended, all process requirements are diachronic. What is less often recognized is that the reverse is not true: diachronic requirements need not be process-requirements, since they can govern states at different points in time (Podgorski 2017). Thus, the synchronic/diachronic debate is distinct from the process/state debate.

In support of the process-oriented view, Kolodny (2005) holds that requirements can be response-guiding and potentially normative (§2.2) only if they govern processes rather than states. He also argues that state-requirements are redundant once all plausible process requirements have been specified. Critics of the process-oriented view have responded by drawing an analogy to reasons for belief and other attitudes, which can be response-guiding and normative even though they are for states rather than processes, and have challenged Kolodny’s redundancy claim (Kiesewetter 2017: 73–79).

While it is very controversial whether all instances of structural irrationality can be explained in terms of process requirements, it is less controversial that there are process requirements that cannot be reduced to state requirements. For example, what seems irrational about wishful thinking is not necessarily the belief or the wish, or the combination of these states, or their occurrence in a certain chronological order, but specifically the process through which the belief was formed. More generally, it seems plausible that there are basing prohibitions (Broome 2013) – rational requirements not to base certain attitudes on others – which cannot be reduced to state-requirements.

2.4 Skepticism about and Alternatives to Requirements of Structural Rationality

A number of authors have raised skepticism about structural requirements of rationality. We will distinguish three varieties of such skepticism.

The first variety, which we call “impossibilist skepticism”, is based on the view that once one specifies sufficient conditions for structural irrationality, it turns out to be impossible to violate these conditions. The idea that it is impossible to violate at least some putative structural requirements has a long history: the Socrates of Plato’s Protagoras denies the possibility of akrasia (see also Davidson 1969 and the entry on weakness of will), while other authors have denied the possibility of epistemic akrasia specifically (Hurley 1989; Adler 2002), irrational self-contradiction (Price 2008), and instrumental irrationality (Finlay 2009; Timmermann 2022). Impossibilist skeptics combine the premise that the putative structural requirements are inviolable with the further premise (argued for by Korsgaard 1997, among others) that any genuine requirement of rationality must leave room for violation, to yield the conclusion that the putative structural requirements are not genuine rational requirements after all (Finlay 2009; Lee 2022).

Impossibilist skepticism entails not only that there are no structural requirements of rationality, but also that there is no such thing as a property of structural rationality (understood as a property that people can fail to have). By contrast, a second kind of skepticism, which we call “particularist skepticism”, does not necessarily take issue with this property; it merely denies that the occurrence of structural irrationality can be explained in terms of general structural requirements. Proponents of this view hold that all general structural requirements prohibiting attitude-combinations are subject to counterexamples, for example in cases of luminosity failure (i.e. failure to be in a position to know one’s own attitudes) and cases in which subjects have higher-order beliefs or evidence that conflict with the putative requirement (Fogal 2020; Lasonen-Aarnio 2021).

In place of the requirements-based approach, particularist skeptics offer alternative models. For example, Fogal (2020) suggests a “pressure-based” model, on which attitudes exert a gradable rational pressure (analogous to the normative pressure of pro tanto reasons) and the structural rationality or irrationality of an attitude depends on the greatest positive or negative rational pressure overall. By contrast, Lasonen-Aarnio (2021) proposes to explain the irrationality of incoherence in terms of the manifestation of certain bad dispositions – dispositions that conflict with being a competent follower of substantive norms (for a similar view, see also Raz 2005). Both views avoid a commitment to generalizable truths to the effect that certain sets of attitudes are by themselves sufficient for irrationality.

A third kind of skepticism, which we call “substantivist skepticism”, holds that even if extensionally adequate formulations of general structural requirements are available, the assumption that there are such requirements is dispensable since structural irrationality can be explained in terms of requirements of substantive rationality alone.[7] (We mentioned this reductive view already in §1.3.) Proponents of substantivist skepticism often hold that we should dispense with structural requirements if we can because they are problematic. For example, some hold that such requirements cannot be normative (see §3) but would have to be normative in order to exist at all (Price 2008; Kiesewetter 2017: Ch. 2, and Ch. 6 for some additional undesirable implications of structural requirements).

3. The Normative Significance of Structural Rationality

It is widely held that ascriptions of irrationality involve a certain kind of criticism and, thus, that truths about rationality or irrationality are, or at least appear to be, normative or normatively significant (e.g. Parfit 2001; Kolodny 2005; Broome 2007b; Scanlon 2007). A natural (and dominant) way to spell out this intuition is to say that there necessarily are normative reasons to conform to rational requirements. But while it seems evident that there necessarily are reasons to conform to substantive requirements (at least on standard conceptions of substantive rationality), it is much less clear why this should be so in the case of structural requirements. In this section, we give an overview of the most important challenges for the assumption that there necessarily are reasons to conform to structural requirements and discuss the major theoretical options that one can adopt with respect to the normativity of rationality more generally.

3.1 Bootstrapping and Detachment

Perhaps the most widely discussed challenge for the normativity of structural rationality is the worry that the assumption of reasons for conforming to structural requirements would license implausible forms of “bootstrapping” or detachment (see esp. Bratman 1981, Broome 2001a, Kolodny 2005, and cf. §1.1 above). As we already saw in §2.1, a narrow-scope account of structural requirements plus the assumption that rationality is normative seems to yield unacceptable bootstrapping. For example, it suggests that merely by believing that she ought to extinguish all human life, Ava can make it the case that she ought to, or at least has reason to, intend to extinguish all human life. As we again saw in §2.1, some take this as an objection to the narrow-scope view. Others, however, take it as an argument that structural rationality cannot be normative (Kolodny 2005).

In support of the latter way of going, some have argued that a normative interpretation of structural requirements licenses implausible detachment even on the wide-scope view. Such arguments typically appeal to certain transmission principles – which are (roughly speaking) principles about how reasons are transmitted from ends to means (see also the entry on instrumental rationality, section 2). A prominent instance is Raz’s argument against the wide-scope instrumental requirement (Raz 2005). The argument is based on what is sometimes called a “liberal” principle of reasons transmission, which says (roughly) that for every means that facilitates or probabilizes doing what we have reason to do, there is a derivative reason to take this means (Raz 2005; Bedke 2009; Kolodny 2018). Because wide-scope requirements are symmetric, both dropping the antecedent attitude-state as well as adopting the consequent attitude-state are (highly effective) means to conforming to the requirement. Therefore, if there is a reason to conform to wide-scope requirements, it follows from the liberal transmission principle that we can detach a reason to adopt the consequent attitude-state (as well as a reason to drop the antecedent attitude-state). Again, we end up with the unwanted result that Ava has a reason to intend to extinguish all human life. If this argument is sound, opting for a wide-scope rather than a narrow-scope account of structural requirements does not avoid the problem with detachment. However, some reject the liberal transmission principle on which the argument is based, at least in full generality (Broome 2005; Way 2010; Rippon 2011; Kiesewetter and Gertken 2021).

A different argument to the effect that even wide-scope normative requirements of structural rationality license implausible detachment is based not on the liberal transmission principle, but on the weaker principle that reasons transmit to necessary means (Setiya 2007, who partly draws on Greenspan 1975). The problem is that an agent may be psychologically incapable of altering one of her antecedent attitudes, which renders adopting the consequent attitude a necessary means for conforming to the wide-scope requirement. For example, if Ava is unable to give up her belief that she ought to extinguish all human life, then intending to extinguish all human life is a necessary means to conforming to the wide-scope enkratic requirement. Thus, if Ava has reason to conform to this requirement, the necessary means transmission principle entails that we can detach a reason to intend to extinguish all human life once again. As before, however, some reject the transmission principle on which this argument is based (Broome 2013; but see Kiesewetter 2015 for replies). Others (Bratman 2009b) have replied to the argument by suggesting that the general reason to satisfy structural requirements – which in Bratman’s view, is one of self-governance – is not operative in cases where the agent is psychologically unable to alter their attitudes (but see Brunero 2010; 2020: Ch. 5; Kiesewetter 2017: Ch. 5 for challenges for Bratman’s view).

3.2 The Why-Be-Rational Challenge

A second major difficulty for the view that there necessarily are reasons to conform to structural requirements is to come up with a satisfying answer to the question “Why be rational?” (Kolodny 2005) ­– an answer that explicates what such reasons consist in and justifies the assumption that they exist.[8] It is worth noting that this challenge applies to requirements of structural rationality in particular. At least if requirements of substantive rationality are understood in terms of facts about the balance of reasons, it makes no sense to ask what reasons we have to conform to such requirements: there is no need for a reason to do what there is reason to do. But since structural requirements are not to be understood in terms of facts about the balance of reasons, it is a fair question why one should conform to them.

It is natural to think that an answer to the why-be-rational challenge must show how one can derive a reason to conform to structural requirements from other reasons that exist independently of structural rationality. According to this derivative approach, there is reason to satisfy structural requirements because doing so is conducive to (or necessary for) – for example – being an agent (Korsgaard 2009), governing oneself (Bratman 2009b), doing what is objectively choiceworthy (Wedgwood 2017), or being interpretable by others (Mildenberger 2019). Proposals of this form are subject to at least one of two potential objections. One might question that structural rationality is in fact necessarily conducive to (or necessary for) the other relevant property, and one might question that there necessarily is a reason to instantiate this other property (Kolodny 2005; Broome 2007b; Kiesewetter 2017; Brunero 2020). The current state of the literature tends towards the verdict that none of the existing proposals has been shown to be immune against both kinds of objections.

Partly in response to problems for the derivative approach, some of those who are sympathetic to the normativity of structural rationality have opted for a non-derivative approach, according to which, for any structurally irrational combination of attitudes, there is a sui generis “reason of [structural] rationality” to avoid them, constituted by the very fact that the attitudes in question are prohibited by structural rationality (Southwood 2008; see also Broome 2013; Hussain 2007 – see Other Internet Resources). This move is often supported by way of an analogy with H.A. Prichard’s influential response to the why-be-moral challenge, which essentially involved the rejection of the idea that morality could be derivatively justified (Prichard 1912). Critics of the non-derivative approach respond that it seems fetishistic to treat structural rationality as something we have reason to aim at for its own sake (Kolodny 2005) and that the alleged normativity of structural rationality lacks the kind of self-evident status that Prichard claims for the moral case and bases his view on (Brunero 2020).

Besides the objections that apply to the derivative and the non-derivative approaches specifically, Kolodny (2005) also has raised an important general challenge for the assumption that there necessarily is a reason to do what satisfies structural requirements. On the most general level, the problem is that it is unclear what deliberative relevance such a reason could have. Typically, we form attitudes on the basis of considerations connected to their correctness rather than their coherence with other attitudes. For example, we adopt beliefs because we think they are supported by evidence rather than because they cohere with our other beliefs. Indeed, it seems that because of their correctness-independence, coherence-based reasons for attitudes would belong to the category of so-called “wrong-kind reasons”.[9] The existence of wrong-kind reasons is often denied (e.g. Kolodny 2005; Way 2016), and even those who accept their existence typically agree that such reasons are irrelevant for the rationality of attitudes (Schroeder 2012). It would thus be very surprising if the normativity of certain rational requirements depended on such reasons. (See Worsnip 2021: Ch. 8 for a recent defense of the view that the normativity of structural rationality can be understood in terms of right-kind of reasons, and Daoust 2022 and Kiesewetter 2023 for criticism.)

3.3 Transparency and Apparent Reasons Accounts

If there are not necessarily reasons to conform with requirements of structural rationality, this raises the questions of whether there is some other interesting relation between structural rationality and reasons, and whether there is an explanation of why it has seemed to many that structural rationality is normatively significant. Two prominent views in the literature on rationality – the transparency account and the apparent reasons account – provide answers to these questions.

According to the transparency account, structural rationality is a matter of coherence between one’s attitudes and one’s normative beliefs about such attitudes, and for an attitude to be required by structural rationality is for one to have a belief that this attitude is supported by conclusive reasons (Kolodny 2005, and on one reading, Scanlon 2007). On this view, the apparent normativity of structural rationality is due to the fact that from the first-personal standpoint, rationally required attitudes are always believed to be supported by conclusive reasons.

The transparency account faces problems, however. First, the normative appearance of rationality is not limited to the first-personal perspective. We seem to presuppose that rationality is normatively significant when we recommend options as rational or criticize responses as irrational, and the hypothesis that rationally required responses must be believed to be normatively supported by the agent for whom they are required does not help to understand this (Bridges 2009; Hussain 2007 – see Other Internet Resources). Second, the assumption that structural irrationality always involves a conflict between an attitude and a normative belief about that attitude is questionable: a number of plausible instances of structural irrationality – in particular those involved in certain forms of belief inconsistency and means-end incoherence (see §1.4) – do not seem to involve such a conflict.

While the transparency account explains rationality in terms of believed reasons, the apparent reasons account explains rationality in terms of “apparent reasons”, which are usually understood as the reasons we would have if our beliefs were true (e. g. Parfit 2011; Schroeder 2009; Way 2009; Whiting 2014; Alvarez 2018; see also Sylvan 2015 for a more sophisticated conception of apparent reasons). It has been stated as the view that “for you to be rationally required to \(A\) is for it to be the case that you would have conclusive reasons to \(A\), if your beliefs were true” (Way 2009, 4). Parfit (2001) first proposed a view along these lines, arguably as an account of substantive rationality. However, several authors have tried to explain structural rationality (and, by extension, its apparent or actual normative force) in terms of apparent reasons as well (Schroeder 2009; Way 2012; Sylvan 2021a).

Some proponents of the apparent reasons account suggest that rationality is in fact normative on their view. For example, Schroeder (2009) identifies rational requirements with “subjective oughts”, which he takes to be genuinely normative, and Parfit claims that “normativity involves reasons or apparent reasons” (2011, 59). According to Way (2009), the apparent reasons account vindicates the normativity of rationality, because it explains rational requirements in terms of hypothetical truths of the form ‘If your beliefs were true, you would have conclusive reason to A’ – and such truths are in an interesting sense normative, as a normative error theorist is committed to denying them. However, critics have contended that the sense in which hypotheticals about reasons are normative is a merely technical one that does nothing to vindicate the actual normative significance of rationality (Kiesewetter 2012). (For more on the normative relevance of apparent reasons, see González de Prado Salas 2018; Sylvan 2021a).)

The apparent reasons account also faces similar challenges as the transparency account when it comes to accounting for kinds of structural irrationality that do not involve attitudes with normative contents. While it is straightforward that akratic agents go against what would be conclusive reasons if their beliefs were true, it is much more difficult to see that this is true for agents with “formally incoherent” attitudes, such as incoherent credences.

3.4 The Theoretical Options

To summarize, the debate on the normativity of rationality is often centred around two theoretical options. One is to preserve the normativity of rationality by defending the claim that there necessarily are reasons to conform to structural requirements. The other is to deny this claim, and abandon the view that rationality is normative. As we have seen, both options face significant challenges. Proponents of the first view must explain why their views do not entail implausible forms of detachment, why the reasons they allude to exist, and why they are of the right kind. Proponents of the second view must explain why rationality seems normative when it isn’t. More specifically, proponents of the second view need to explain both why describing someone as irrational amounts to a serious form of criticism if there is no reason to avoid irrationality, and how requirements of structural rationality can count as requirements if there’s no sense in which we have reason to comply with them (and if they also aren’t “institutional” or “positive” requirements like the requirements of a social club or 19th century etiquette). In addition, they face an especially strong challenge to say what unites structural requirements as such, as they cannot to account for the unity of structural rationality by appeal to the reasons that support it.

There is a third option to deal with the issues discussed in this section, which is to dispense with structural requirements of rationality (§2.4) and adopt the view (briefly discussed in §1.3) that structural irrationality is to be explained in terms of substantive requirements of rationality, understood as requirements to respond correctly to reasons, alone. As its proponents have emphasized, this view has the benefits of preserving the idea that rationality is normative, while avoiding the problems that arise with assuming that there are reasons to comply with structural requirements. It is not troubled by detachment worries and can dismiss the why-be-rational challenge as an illegitimate request for a reason to do what we have reason to do. It is well-positioned to explain the criticizability of irrationality and the unity of rationality. But as we have seen already, it faces its own challenges. As noted at the beginning of this entry (§1.1), distinguishing between reasons and requirements of structural rationality gave us a way to explain how one’s holding one attitude can make it the case that one holds another attitude, one is irrational, without allowing the attitudes one has (no matter how misguided) to dictate what substantive reasons one has. Whether a theory that operates only with requirements of substantive rationality can do this is still a controversial question.

Thus, despite the now-voluminous literature on structural rationality, there remain deep challenges for all the views that have been identified. How one adjudicates the comparative seriousness of these challenges will affect whether one opts for a theory of rationality that includes normative structural requirements, non-normative structural requirements, or no structural requirements at all.


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We gratefully acknowledge funding by the Deutsche Forschungsgemeinschaft (Centre for Advanced Studies “Human Abilites”, Humboldt University and Free University Berlin) and the European Union (ERC Grant 101040439, REASONS F1RST). Views and opinions expressed are however those of the authors only and do not necessarily reflect those of the European Union or the European Research Council Executive Agency. Neither the European Union nor the granting authority can be held responsible for them. In addition, we would like to thank the participants of Thomas Schmidt’s philosophical colloquium at Humboldt University for their feedback. Parts of this article draw on The Normativity of Rationality, by Benjamin Kiesewetter (Oxford University Press 2017), and Fitting Things Together by Alex Worsnip (Oxford University Press 2021).

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