Notes to Structural Rationality

1. Though the sense of ‘cohere’ involved here is fairly broad, it (usually) isn’t so broad as to include relations of positive support between one’s mental states, but rather refers to the absence of conflicts between them. In this respect it contrasts with the richer notion of explanatory coherence often invoked in philosophy of science and parts of epistemology. See §1.3 for related discussion.

2. The term was previously used by Nida-Rümelin (2001), but with a somewhat different meaning.

3. Whether these evidential reasons for belief supervene on the mind is controversial. But the orthodoxy (that failures to correctly respond to these evidential reasons are failures of rationality) is at least compatible with the view that they are, and thus with the view that rationality supervenes on the mind.

4. Dutch books involve a combination of bets that agents with certain incoherent states (e.g., probabilistically incoherent credences) seem committed to accepting, but which guarantee that such agents lose money no matter what the outcome (Ramsey 1926; de Finetti 1937; see also the entry on Dutch book arguments). Money pumps involve a series of trades that agents with certain incoherent states (e.g., cyclical preferences) seem committed to accepting, but that ultimately leave such agents with less money and the same goods they started with; theoretically, the series can be repeated infinitely to extract an infinite amount of money (Davidson, McKinsey and Suppes 1955; Gustafsson 2022).

5. This is because by dropping your belief you make it true that if you believe you ought to \(\Phi\), you intend to \(\Phi\) – at least if we assume the orthodox view that the content of a wide-scope requirement is a material conditional. For ease of exposition, we assume the orthodox view in this section, but see below for how to formulate the wide-scope approach without making this assumption.

6. Or at least that such conditionals are subject to a scope-ambiguity, where the reading given here is at least one of the possible readings.

7. Kolodny (2007a, 2008) holds a limited version of substantivist skepticism, which applies only to what he calls “requirements of formal coherence as such” – a significant subset of candidate structural requirements, which includes requirements of means-end coherence and belief consistency. Kolodny accepts requirements prohibiting (practical or epistemic) akrasia. See also Sylvan (2021b).

8. The challenge is often (following Kolodny 2005) put in terms of finding a reason to be [structurally] rational, where this strongly suggests that there needs to be a single reason to be [structurally] rational in general. But this is arguably an unfair burden to place on the defender of the normativity of structural rationality (see Worsnip 2021: ch. 8). It suffices for the normativity of structural rationality if, for every response required by structural rationality, there necessarily is a reason to have it (and for every response prohibited by structural rationality, there is a reason not to have it).

9. See Gertken and Kiesewetter (2017) for an overview over the distinction between right-kind and wrong-kind reasons. See also the entry on fitting attitude theories of value, section 3.1.

Copyright © 2023 by
Benjamin Kiesewetter <>
Alex Worsnip <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free