Notes to Reductionism in Biology

1. James Griesemer (2000, 2002, 2011) argues that scientists deploy a heuristic use of reduction in attempts to relate different theories and models to one another. Although this account is clearly methodological, it does not focus on how scientists discover molecular mechanisms or develop reductive explanations of wholes in terms of parts. Thus, it is distinct from the sense of methodological reductionism used here.

2. The issue of reduction has played a substantial role in both philosophy of mind and philosophy of social science. In the former, a central question is whether and in what sense mental phenomena can be reduced to physical phenomena. Philosophers of mind have developed sophisticated accounts that concentrate on ontological reduction and mereological constitution (e.g., supervenience; see Kim 1998, 2005). In philosophy of social science, key questions include whether social phenomena can be explained solely in terms of the interactions of individuals (in contrast to some methodological holism), whether different fields of social science can be reduced to economics, and whether social science as a whole can be reduced to one or more of the natural sciences (Kincaid 1997). Regardless of whether reduction is considered within philosophy of biology, mind, or social science, similar ideas and arguments have been used in these different fields (e.g., multiple realization; see Section 4.2).

3. “Let us now, if you please, imagine that a small worm lives in the blood, whose sight is keen enough to distinguish the particles of blood, lymph, etc., and his reason to observe how each part on collision with another either rebounds, or communicates a part of its own motion, etc. That worm would live in this blood as we live in this part of the universe, and he would consider each particle of blood to be a whole, and not a part. And he could not know how all the parts are controlled by the universal nature of blood, and are forced, as the universal nature of blood demands, to adapt themselves to one another, so as to harmonize with one another in a certain way. For if we imagine that there are no causes outside the blood to communicate new motions to the blood, and that outside the blood there is no space, and no other bodies, to which the particles of blood could transfer their motion, it is certain that the blood would remain always in its state, and its particles would suffer no changes other than those which can be conceived from the given relation of the motion of the blood to the lymph and chyle, etc., and so blood would have to considered always to be a whole and not a part. But, since there are very many other causes which in a certain way control the laws of the nature of blood, and are in turn controlled by the blood, hence it comes about that other motions and other changes take place in the blood, which result not only from the mere relation of the motion of its parts to one another, but from the relation of the motion of the blood and also of the external causes to one another: in this way the blood has the character of a part and not of a whole. … all the bodies of nature can and should be conceived in the same way as we have here conceived the blood” (Spinoza to Oldenburg, Letter 32; Wolf 1966, 210-211).

4. “Now it is true that the ultimate elements of organized matter are precisely those which enter into the composition of Unorganized substances: But by the operation of a power, distinct from Gravitation, molecular attraction, or any of the known imponderable agents which operate on unorganized substances, these elements assume combinations of a character essentially different from those which are the result of ordinary chemical affinities” (Owen, Hunterian Lectures [1837] in Sloan 1992, 209).

5. The mid-twentieth century separation of discussions about relations between domains of science (Nagelian theory reduction) and relations between parts and wholes in biology (explanatory reduction) is concretely visible in David Hull’s Philosophy of Biological Science (1974). Chapter 1 is a justly famous discussion regarding the difficulties of effecting theory reduction between classical and molecular genetics, but chapter 5 (“Organicism and Reductionism”) has been relatively neglected. It includes a very different set of themes, including vitalism, biological organization and complexity, and the relations between parts and wholes in living systems.

6. Rosenberg’s argument contains several controversial premises, such as the need for strict laws in biological explanation and the distinction between molecular and functional biology (for criticisms, see Kaiser 2015, chap. 4–5, Love et al. 2008). The intersection of natural selection and molecular biology in the context of explanatory reductionism has been explored by Sarkar (2005 [1991]) with much less optimism.

7. E.g., “cellular context is important when deciphering how EGF [epidermal growth factor] interacts with EGFR [epidermal growth factor receptor]. From a general perspective, care is advisable when generalizing ligand-receptor interaction results across multiple cell-lines” (Björkelund et al. 2011, 1). Also, “Agents binding to the enzyme catalysing the reaction may influence this Michaelis constant [describing the enzyme’s reaction kinetics] … All components of the same living cell may therewith affect the role the enzyme plays in the cell’s behaviour, including the components that are not yet known” (Westerhoff and Kell 2007, 37–38).

8. In the debate about the relations between classical and molecular genetics, Philip Gasper (1992) dubs this “multiple supervenience” in order to contrast it with multiple realization. A different way to make a similar point is that biological entities and processes (including molecular ones) often possess their causal properties extrinsically (i.e., due to features external to the bearer of the property). For example, a particular segment of DNA is a gene as a consequence of its ability to code for a functional product, which depends on both DNA elements external to this gene and non-genetic factors. Therefore, being a gene is a property of a DNA segment, but an extrinsic one.

9. The derivation demanded by theory reduction for molecular biology requires that the premises contain a purely molecular specification of the total context. Although Nagel and Schaffner have explicated the notion of theory reduction, they have not shown how to effect the molecular deduction. Even Schaffner’s most detailed defense of reduction (Schaffner 1993) focuses on the condition of connectability, giving a partial account of how to relate the predicate “dominance” used in classical genetics to expressions from biochemistry. However, he does not give a single example of a higher level statement being deducible from some lower level theory; and theory reduction requires that the condition of derivability be met. Debate over Schaffner’s model has focused primarily on the condition of connectability, especially whether a molecular characterization of the notion of a classical gene is possible. Yet as Hull (1974) made plain, a critic of theory reduction needs no more than an argument against connectability as a necessary condition on reduction, while a reductionist has to defend derivability over and above connectability.

10. One of Schaffner’s replies to Hull regarding the one-many objection is that the molecular context of a mechanism can be included in the premises to the extent that it matters. Wimsatt (1976a) rightly points out that stressing the inclusion of context will always rely on how mechanisms are individuated (Hüttemann and Love 2011; see Section 4.3). Schaffner’s move to include the total context implies that any two possible situations will have distinct overall molecular configurations, but others view this as the same mechanism in different contexts. Generality requires treating parts of different particular molecular configurations as instantiating the same type of mechanism. A consequence of this need for generality is that the same type of mechanism can occur in different contexts, possibly with a different effect. This sense of one–many relations between molecular and higher level kinds does not necessarily preclude some types of reduction, but explanations in molecular biology must to be sensitive to the associated epistemic issues.

11. Higher level laws can have exceptions: e.g., if \(M_d\), one of the molecular kinds realizing \(S\), does not cause any of the realizers \(N_1 , \ldots ,N_j\) of \(T\). Waters (1990) has argued that explaining such an exception requires an appeal to the molecular level detail and therefore is a form of reductionism. This contrasts with Fodor (1974) who argued that a reductionist approach encourages eliminating the higher level generality in favor of exceptionless lower level laws. But scientists often accept higher level laws despite exceptions that require appeal to the molecular level precisely because they aim to address both the higher and lower level situations.

12. Rosenberg incorporated the concept of supervenience in part due to the inspiration of work by Jaegwon Kim in philosophy of mind. “The formalization of supervenience employed here is the application of one due to Jaegwon Kim” (Rosenberg 1978, 373). Referring to Kim’s paper “Nomological Incommensurables” (read at Oberlin Colloquium in 1977), Rosenberg continues in a footnote: “My debts to this paper are by no means limited to its account of supervenience. In fact, the whole perspective adopted here with respect to the relation between theories involved in reduction, and the bearing of causal and mereological determinism on this relation are inspired by this paper. … The reader is referred to Kim’s paper for a fuller account of supervenience and its role in ethics, aesthetics, and the philosophy of mind in general.” Rosenberg subsequently redeployed Kim’s (1998) causal exclusion argument based on allied considerations in support of reductionism in biology (Rosenberg 2006; cf. Eronen 2011, Sachse 2007).

13. The notions of multiple realization and supervenience were originally developed in philosophy of mind as part of a non-reductive physicalism about mental phenomena (see also note 12). Whether these concepts offer an adequate account of the relation between mental and physical phenomena has been questioned (Kim 1992, 1998). The status of multiple realization in philosophy is currently a subject of debate and may hinge on certain metaphysical commitments about the concept of realization (Gillett 2002, 2003, 2010). “Realization” takes on different roles in scientific and philosophical discussions (Wilson and Craver 2007) and the significance of these differences has not yet been analyzed for the situations of multiple realization frequently discussed in philosophy of biology (but see Gillett 2016). Biological examples used in these philosophical discussions, such as eyes, have often not been treated with adequate care and precision (Couch 2005, 2009).

14. “Out of over 1 million animal species, modern developmental biology has focused on a very small number which are often described as ‘model organisms.’ This is because the motivation for their study is not simply to understand how that particular animal develops, but to use it as an example of how all animals develop” (Slack 2006, 61).

15. A less common objection concerns whether the domains being reductively related are actually distinct. For example, Russell Vance (1996) has argued against the premise that classical genetics and molecular genetics are separate fields or theories (e.g., “genetics is the area of biological science that seems most immediately amenable to the philosopher’s conception of scientific reduction. The main reason for this is that in genetics there are two clearly identifiable theories, bodies of law, expressions of regularity – one molecular and one nonmolecular” [Rosenberg 1985, 90]). While this undermines global attempts at reductively relating classical genetics and molecular genetics, and modulates how to understand local explanatory reductions, its more general impact can be understood as a caution against presuming that two areas of biology are distinct in practice or distinguishable in principle (as is often done in theory reduction). One cannot simply assume an individuation of the epistemic units being related reductively.

16. For example, some explanations in developmental biology appear to rely on temporal representations that are not keyed to the temporal organization of mechanisms (e.g., normal stages). If so, the issue of temporality in explanations cannot be reduced to the issue of temporality in a mechanism. Additionally, qualitative change in ontogeny, where novel structures emerge out of distinct developmental precursors, does not appear straightforwardly amenable to a mechanisms approach. “Mechanism” also has been advocated by those discussing reductionism in the context of evolutionary biology (Brandon 1996).

17. E.g.: “The heart provides an excellent example both of the huge advances that have been made using the reductive approach and of the severe limits of this approach” (Noble 1998, 56); “Our results suggest that the cellular responses induced by multiplex protein kinase inhibitors may be an emergent property that cannot be understood fully considering only the sum of individual inhibitor-kinase interactions” (Kung et al. 2005, 3587); “Our results therefore point to the need to consider each complex biological network as a whole, instead of focusing on local properties” (Guimerà and Nunes Amaral 2005, 899); “Robustness … is one of the fundamental and ubiquitously observed systems-level phenomena that cannot be understood by looking at individual components” (Kitano 2004, 826); “The molecular reductionism that dominated twentieth-century biology will be superseded by an interdisciplinary approach that embraces collective phenomena” (Goldenfeld and Woese 2007, 369); “Understanding the dynamics of infectious-disease transmission demands a holistic approach, yet today’s models largely ignore how epidemics change individual behaviour” (Ferguson 2007, 733); “The collective behaviour of matter can give rise to startling emergent properties that hint at the nexus between biology and physics” (Coleman 2007, 379); “After several decades dominated by reductionist approaches in biology, researchers are returning to the study of complex biology with a litany of new and old techniques” (Hogenesch and Ueda 2011, 407). Noble (2006) represents a book-length treatment in this vein.

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