Religious Experience

First published Tue Nov 8, 2011; substantive revision Wed Dec 13, 2017

Religious experiences can be characterized generally as experiences that seem to the person having them to be of some objective reality and to have some religious import. That reality can be an individual, a state of affairs, a fact, or even an absence, depending on the religious tradition the experience is a part of. A wide variety of kinds of experience fall under the general rubric of religious experience. The concept is vague, and the multiplicity of kinds of experiences that fall under it makes it difficult to capture in any general account. Part of that vagueness comes from the term ‘religion,’ which is difficult to define in any way that does not either rule out institutions that clearly are religions, or include terms that can only be understood in the light of a prior understanding of what religions are. Nevertheless, we can make some progress in elucidating the concept by distinguishing it from distinct but related concepts.

First, religious experience is to be distinguished from religious feelings, in the same way that experience in general is to be distinguished from feelings in general. A feeling of elation, for example, even if it occurs in a religious context, does not count in itself as a religious experience, even if the subject later comes to think that the feeling was caused by some objective reality of religious significance. An analogy with sense experience is helpful here. If a subject feels a general feeling of happiness, not on account of anything in particular, and later comes to believe the feeling was caused by the presence of a particular person, that fact does not transform the feeling of happiness into a perception of the person. Just as a mental event, to be a perception of an object, must in some sense seem to be an experience of that object, a religiously oriented mental event, to be a religious experience, must in some way seem to be an experience of a religiously significant reality. So, although religious feelings may be involved in many, or even most, religious experiences, they are not the same thing. Discussions of religious experience in terms of feelings, like Schleiermacher’s (1998) “feeling of absolute dependence,” or Otto’s (1923) feeling of the numinous, were important early contributions to theorizing about religious experience, but some have since then argued (see Gellman 2001 and Alston 1991, for example) that religious affective states are not all there is to religious experience. To account for the experiences qua experiences, we must go beyond subjective feelings.

Religious experience is also to be distinguished from mystical experience. Although there is obviously a close connection between the two, and mystical experiences are religious experiences, not all religious experiences qualify as mystical. The word ‘mysticism’ has been understood in many different ways. James (1902) took mysticism to necessarily involve ineffability, which would rule out many cases commonly understood to be mystical. Alston (1991) adopted the term grudgingly as the best of a bad lot and gave it a semi-technical meaning. But in its common, non-technical sense, mysticism is a specific religious system or practice, deliberately undertaken in order to come to some realization or insight, to come to unity with the divine, or to experience the ultimate reality directly. At the very least, religious experiences form a broader category; many religious experiences, like those of Saint Paul, Arjuna, Moses, Muhammad, and many others come unsought, not as the result of some deliberate practice undertaken to produce an experience.

1. Types of Religious Experience

Reports of religious experiences reveal a variety of different kinds. Perhaps most are visual or auditory presentations (visions and auditions), but not through the physical eyes or ears. Subjects report “seeing” or “hearing,” but quickly disavow any claim to seeing or hearing with bodily sense organs. Such experiences are easy to dismiss as hallucinations, but the subjects of the experience frequently claim that though it is entirely internal, like a hallucination or imagination, it is nevertheless a veridical experience, through some spiritual analog of the eye or ear (James 1902 and Alston 1991 cite many examples). In other cases, the language of “seeing” is used in its extended sense of realization, as when a yogi is said to “see” his or her identity with Brahman; Buddhists speak of “seeing things as they are” as one of the hallmarks of true enlightenment, where this means grasping or realizing the emptiness of things, but not in a purely intellectual way. Another type is the religious experience that comes through sensory experiences of ordinary objects, but seems to carry with it extra information about some supramundane reality. Examples include experiencing God in nature, in the starry sky, or a flower, or the like. A second person standing nearby would see exactly the same sky or flower, but would not necessarily have the further religious content to his or her experience. There are also cases in which the religious experience just is an ordinary perception, but the physical object is itself the object of religious significance. Moses’s experience of the burning bush, or the Buddha’s disciples watching him levitate, are examples of this type. A second person standing nearby would see exactly the same phenomenon. Witnesses to miracles are having that kind of religious experience, whether they understand it that way or not. A fourth type of religious experience is harder to describe: it can’t be characterized accurately in sensory language, even analogically, yet the subject of the experience insists that the experience is a real, direct awareness of some religiously significant reality external to the subject. These kinds of experiences are usually described as “ineffable.” Depending on one’s purposes, other ways of dividing up religious experiences will suggest themselves. For example, William James (1902) divides experiences into “healthy-minded” and “sick-minded,” according to the personality of the subject, which colors the content of the experience itself. Keith Yandell (1993, 25–32) divided them into five categories, according to the content of the experiences: monotheistic, nirvanic (enlightenment experiences associated with Buddhism), kevalic (enlightenment experiences associated with Jainism), moksha (experiences of release from karma, associated with Hinduism), and nature experiences. Differences of object certainly make differences in content, and so make differences in what can be said about the experiences. See section four for further discussion of this issue.

2. Language and Experience

Many have thought that there is some special problem with religious language, that it can’t be meaningful in the same way that ordinary language is. The Logical Positivists claimed that language is meaningful only insofar as it is moored in our experiences of the physical world. Since we can’t account for religious language by linking it to experiences of the physical world, such language is meaningless. Even though religious claims look in every way like ordinary assertions about the world, their lack of empirical consequences makes them meaningless. The principle of verification went through many formulations as it faced criticism. But if it is understood as a claim about meaning in ordinary language, it seems to be self-undermining, since there is no empirical way to verify it. Eventually, that approach to language fell out of favor, but some still use a modified, weaker version to criticize religious language. For example, Antony Flew (Flew and MacIntyre, 1955) relies on a principle to the effect that if a claim is not falsifiable, it is somehow illegitimate. Martin (1990) and Nielsen (1985) invoke a principle that combines verifiability and falsifiability; to be meaningful, a claim must be one or the other. It is not clear that even these modifed and weakened versions of the verification principle entirely escape self-undermining. Even if they do, they seem to take other kinds of language with them—like moral language, talk about the future or past, and talk about the contents of others’ minds — that we might be loath to lose. Moreover, to deny the meaningfulness of religious-experience claims on the grounds that it is not moored in experience begs the question, in that it assumes that religious experiences are not real experiences.

Another possibility is to allow that religious claims are meaningful, but they are not true or false, because they should not be understood as assertions. Braithwaite (1970), for example, understands religious claims to be expressions of commitments to sets of values. On such a view, what appears to be a claim about a religious experience is not in fact a claim at all. It might be that some set of mental events, with which the experience itself can be identified, would be the ground and prompting of the claim, but it would not properly be what the claim is about.

A second challenge to religious-experience claims comes from Wittgensteinian accounts of language. Wittgenstein (1978) muses at some length on the differences between how ordinary language is used, and how religious language is used. Others (see Phillips 1970, for example), following Wittgenstein, have tried to give an explanation of the strangeness of religious language by invoking the idea of a language-game. Each language-game has its own rules, including its own procedures for verification. As a result, it is a mistake to treat it like ordinary language, expecting evidence in the ordinary sense, in the same way that it would be a mistake to ask for the evidence for a joke. “I saw God” should not be treated in the same way as “I saw Elvis.” Some even go so far as to say the religious language-game is isolated from other practices, such that it would be a mistake to derive any claims about history, geography, or cosmology from them, never mind demand the same kind of evidence for them. On this view, religious experiences should not be treated as comparable to sense experiences, but that does not entail that they are not important, nor that they are not in some sense veridical, in that they could still be avenues for important insights about reality. Such a view can be attributed to D. Z. Phillips (1970).

While this may account for some of the unusual aspects of religious language, it certainly does not capture what many religious people think about the claims they make. As creationism illustrates, many religious folk think it is perfectly permissible to draw empirical conclusions from religious doctrine. Hindus and Buddhists for many centuries thought there was a literal Mount Meru in the middle of the (flat, disc-shaped) world. It would be very odd if “The Buddha attained enlightenment under the bo tree” had to be given a very different treatment from “The Buddha ate rice under the bo tree” because the first is a religious claim and the second is an ordinary empirical claim. There are certainly entailment relations between religious and non-religious claims, too: “Jesus died for my sins” straightforwardly entails “Jesus died.”

3. Epistemological Issues

Since the subjects of religious experiences tend to take them to be real experiences of some external reality, we may ask what reason there is to think they are right. That is to say, do religious experiences amount to good reasons for religious belief? One answer to that question is what is often called the Argument from Religious Experience: Religious experiences are in all relevant respects like sensory experiences; sensory experiences are excellent grounds for beliefs about the physical world; so religious experiences are excellent grounds for religious beliefs. This argument, or one very like it, can be found in Swinburne (1979), Alston (1991), Plantinga (1981, 2000), and others. Critics of this approach generally find ways in which religious experiences are different from sensory experiences, and argue that those differences are enough to undermine the evidential value of the experiences. Swinburne (1979) invokes what he calls the “Principle of Credulity,” according to which one is justified in believing that what seems to one to be present actually is present, unless some appropriate defeater is operative. He then discusses a variety of circumstances that would be defeaters in the ordinary sensory case, and argues that those defeaters do not obtain, or not always, in the case of religious experience. To reject his argument, one would have to show that religious experience is unlike sensory experience in that in the religious case, one or more of the defeaters always obtains. Anyone who accepts the principle has excellent reason to accept the deliverances of religious experience, unless he or she believes that defeaters always, or almost always, obtain.

Plantinga offers a different kind of argument. According to Cartesian-style foundationalism, in order to count as justified, a belief must either be grounded in other justified beliefs, or derive its justification from some special status, like infallibility, incorrigibility, or indubitability. There is a parallel view about knowledge. Plantinga (1981) argued that such a foundationalism is inconsistent with holding one’s own ordinary beliefs about the world to be justified (or knowledge), because our ordinary beliefs derived from sense-experience aren’t derived from anything infallible, indubitable, or incorrigible. In fact, we typically treat them as foundational, in need of no further justification. If we hold sensory beliefs to be properly basic, then we have to hold similarly formed religious beliefs, formed on experiences of God manifesting himself to a believer (Plantinga calls them ‘M-beliefs’), as properly basic. He proposed that human beings have a faculty—what John Calvin called the ‘sensus divinitatis’—that allows them to be aware of God’s actions or dispositions with respect to them. If beliefs formed by sense-experience can be properly basic, then beliefs formed by this faculty cannot, in any principled way, be denied that same status. His developed theory of warrant (2000) implies that, if the beliefs are true, then they are warranted. One cannot attack claims of religious experience without first addressing the question as to whether the religious claims are true. He admits that, since there are people in other religious traditions who have based beliefs about religious matters on similar purported manifestations, they may be able to make the same argument about their own religious experiences.

Alston develops a general theory of doxastic practices (constellations of belief-forming mechanisms, together with characteristic background assumptions and sets of defeaters), gives an account of what it is to rationally engage in such a practice, and then argues that at least the practice of forming beliefs on the basis of Christian religious experiences fulfills those requirements. If we think of the broad doxastic practices we currently employ, we see that some of them can be justified by the use of other practices. The practice of science, for example, reduces mostly to the practices of sense-perception, deductive reasoning, and inductive reasoning (memory and testimony also make contributions, of course). The justificatory status the practice gives to its product beliefs derives from those more basic practices. Most, however, cannot be so reduced. How are they justified, then? It seems that they cannot be justified non-circularly, that is, without the use of premises derived from the practices themselves. Our only justification for continuing to trust these practices is that they are firmly established, interwoven with other practices and projects of ours, and have “stood the test of time” by producing mostly consistent sets of beliefs. They produce a sufficiently consistent set of beliefs if they don’t produce massive, unavoidable contradictions on central matters, either internally, or with the outputs of other equally well-established practices. If that’s all there is to be said about our ordinary practices, then we ought to extend the same status to other practices that have the same features. He then argues that the Christian practice of belief-formation on the basis of religious experience does have those features. Like Plantinga, he admits that such an argument might be equally available to other religious practices; it all depends on whether the practice in question generates massive and unavoidable contradictions, on central matters, either internally, or with other equally well-established practices. To undermine this argument, one would have to show either that Alston’s criteria for rationality of a practice are too permissive, or that religious practices never escape massive contradictions.

Both Plantinga’s and Alston’s defense of the epistemic value of religious experiences turn crucially on some degree of similarity with sense-experience. But they are not simple arguments from analogy; not just any similarities will do to make the positive argument, and not just any dissimilarities will do to defeat the argument. The similarities or dissimilarities need to be epistemologically relevant. It is not enough, for example, to show that religious experiences do not typically allow for independent public verification, unless one wants to give up on other perfectly respectable practices, like rational intuition, that also lack that feature.

The two most important defeaters on the table for claims of the epistemic authority of religious experience are the fact of religious diversity, and the availability of naturalistic explanations for religious experiences. Religious diversity is a prima facie defeater for the veridicality of religious experiences in the same way that wildly conflicting eyewitness reports undermine each other. If the reports are at all similar, then it may be reasonable to conclude that there is some truth to the testimony, at least in broad outline. A version of this objection is the argument from divine hiddenness (cf. Lovering 2013). If God exists, and shows himself to some people in religious experiences, then the fact that he doesn’t do so for more people, more widely distributed, requires some explanation. But if two eyewitness reports disagree on the most basic facts about what happened, then it seems that neither gives you good grounds for any beliefs about what happened. It certainly seems that the contents of religious-experience reports are radically different from one another. Some subjects of religious experiences report experience of nothingness as the ultimate reality, some a vast impersonal consciousness in which we all participate, some an infinitely perfect, personal creator. To maintain that one’s own religious experiences are veridical, one would have to a) find some common core to all these experiences, such that in spite of differences of detail, they could reasonably be construed as experiences of the same reality, or b) insist that one’s own experiences are veridical, and that therefore those of other traditions are not veridical. The first is difficult to manage, in the face of the manifest differences across religions. Nevertheless, John Hick (1989) develops a view of that kind, making use of a Kantian two-worlds epistemology. The idea is that the object of these experiences, in itself, is one and the same reality, but it is experienced phenomenally by different people differently. Thus, is possible to see how one and the same object can be experienced in ways that are completely incompatible with one another. This approach is only as plausible as the Kantian framework itself is. Jerome Gellman (2001) proposes a similar idea, without the Kantian baggage. Solutions like these leave the problem untouched: If the different practices produce experiences the contents of which are inconsistent with one another, one of the practices must be unreliable. Alston (1991) and Plantinga (2000) develop the second kind of answer. The general strategy is to argue that, from within a tradition, a person acquires epistemic resources not available to those outside the tradition, just as travelling to the heart of a jungle allows one to see things that those who have not made the journey can’t see. As a result, even if people in other traditions can make the same argument, it is still reasonable to say that some are right and the others are wrong. The things that justify my beliefs still justify them, even if you have comparable resources justifying a contrary view.

Naturalistic explanations for religious experiences are thought to undermine their epistemic value because, if the naturalistic explanation is sufficient to explain the experience, we have no grounds for positing anything beyond that naturalistic cause. Freud (1927) and Marx (1876/1977) are frequently held up as offering such explanations. Freud claims that religious experiences can be adequately explained by psychological mechanisms having their root in early childhood experience and psychodynamic tensions. Marx similarly attributes religious belief in general to materialistic economic forces. Both claim that, since the hidden psychological or economic explanations are sufficient to explain the origins of religious belief, there is no need to suppose, in addition, that the beliefs are true. Freud’s theory of religion has few adherents, even among the psychoanalytically inclined, and Marx’s view likewise has all but been abandoned, but that is not to say that something in the neighborhood might not be true. More recently, neurological explanations of religious experience have been put forward as reasons to deny the veridicality of the experiences. Events in the brain that occur during meditative states and other religious experiences are very similar to events that happen during certain kinds of seizures, or with certain kinds of mental disorders, and can also be induced with drugs. Therefore, it is argued, there is nothing more to religious experiences than what happens in seizures, mental disorders, or drug experiences. Some who are studying the neurological basis of religious experience do not infer that they are not veridical (see, e.g., d’Aquili and Newberg 1999), but many do. Guthrie (1995), for example, argues that religion has its origin in our tendency to anthropomorphize phenomena in our vicinity, seeing agency where there is none.

There are general problems with all kinds of naturalistic explanations as defeaters. First of all, as Gellman (2001) points out, most such explanations (like the psychoanalytic and socio-political ones) are put forward as hypotheses, not as established facts. The proponent assumes that the experiences are not veridical, then casts around for an explanation. This is not true of the neurological explanations, but they face another kind of weakness noted by Ellwood (1999): every experience, whatever its source, is accompanied by a corresponding neurological state. To argue that the experience is illusory because there is a corresponding brain state is fallacious. The same reasoning would lead us to conclude that sensory experiences are illusory, since in each sensory experience, there is some corresponding neurological state that is just like the state that occurs in the corresponding hallucination. The proponent of the naturalistic explanation as a defeater owes us some reason to believe that his or her argument is not just another skeptical argument from the veil of perception.

One further epistemological worry accompanies religious experience. James claimed that, while mystical experiences proved authoritative grounds for belief in the person experiencing them, they cannot give grounds for a person to whom the experience is reported. In other words, my experience is evidence for me, but not for you. This claim can be understood in a variety of ways, depending on the kind of normativity that attaches to the purported evidential relation. Some (see Oakes 1976, for example) have claimed that religious experiences epistemically can necessitate belief; that is, anyone who has the experience and doesn’t form the corresponding belief is making an epistemic mistake, much like a person who, in normal conditions, refuses to believe his or her eyes. More commonly, defenders of the epistemic value of religious experience claim that the experiences make it epistemically permissible to form the belief, but you may also be justified in not forming the belief. The testimony of other people about what they have experienced is much the same. In some cases, a person would be unjustified in rejecting the testimony of others, and in other cases, one would be justified in accepting it, but need not accept it. This leaves us with three possibilities, on the assumption that the subject of the experience is justified in forming a religious belief on the basis of his or her experience, and that he or she tells someone else about it: the testimony might provide compelling evidence for the hearer, such that he or she would be unjustified in rejecting the claim; the testimony might provide non-compelling justification for the hearer to accept the claim; or the testimony might fail to provide any kind of grounds for the hearer to accept the claim. When a subject makes a claim on the basis of an ordinary experience, it might fall into any one of these three categories, depending on the claim’s content and the epistemic situation of the hearer. The most natural thing to say about religious experience claims is that they work the same way (on the assumption that they give the subject of the experience, who is making the claim, any justification for his or her beliefs). James, and some others after him, claim that testimony about religious experiences cannot fall under either of the first two categories. If that’s true, it must be because of something special about the nature of the experiences. If we assume that the experiences cannot be shown a priori to be defective somehow, and that religious language is intelligible—and if we do not make these assumptions, then the question of religious testimony doesn’t even arise—then it must be because the evidential value of the experience is so small that it cannot survive transmission to another person; that is, it must be that in the ordinary act of reporting an experience to someone else, there is some defeater at work that is always stronger than whatever evidential force the experience itself has. While there are important differences between ordinary sense-experience and religious experience (clarity of the experience, amount of information it contains, presence of competing explanations, and the like), it is not clear whether the differences are great enough to disqualify religious testimony always and everywhere.

4. The Diverse Objects of Religious Experience

Just as there are a variety of religions, each with its own claims about the nature of reality, there are a variety of objects and states of affairs that the subjects of these experiences claim to be aware of. Much analytic philosophy of religion has been done in Europe and the nations descended from Europe, so much of the discussion has been in terms of God as conceived of in the Jewish, Christian, and Islamic traditions. In those traditions, the object of religious experiences is typically God himself, understood as an eternal, omniscient, omnipotent, free, and perfectly good spirit. God, for reasons of his own, reveals himself to people, some of them unbidden (like Moses, Muhammad, and Saint Paul), and some because they have undertaken a rigorous practice to draw closer to him (like the mystics). To say that an experience comes unbidden is not to say that nothing the subject has done has prepared her, or primed her, for the experience (see Luhrmann 2012); it is only to claim that the subject has not undertaken any practice aimed at producing a religious experience. In such experiences, God frequently delivers a message at the same time, but he need not. He is always identifiable as the same being who revealed himself to others in the same tradition. Other experiences can be of angels, demons, saints, heaven, hell, or other religiously significant objects.

In other traditions, it is not necessarily a personal being who is the object of the experience, or even a positive being at all. In the traditions that find their origin in the Indian subcontinent—chiefly Hinduism, Buddhism, and Jainism—the object of religious experiences is some basic fact or feature of reality, rather than some entity separate from the universe. In the orthodox Hindu traditions, one may certainly have an experience of a god or some other supernatural entity (like Arjuna’s encounter with Krishna in the Bhagavad Gita), but a great many important kinds of experiences are of Brahman, and its identity with the self. In Yoga, which is based in the Samkhya understanding of the nature of things, the mystical practice of yoga leads to a calming and stilling of the mind, which allows the yogi to apprehend directly that he or she is not identical to, or even causally connected with, the physical body, and this realization is what liberates him or her from suffering.

In Theravada Buddhism, the goal of meditation is to “see things as they are,” which is to see them as unsatisfactory, impermanent, and not-self (Gowans 2003, 191). The meditator, as he or she makes progress along the way, sheds various delusions and attachments. The last one to go is the delusion that he or she is a self. To see this is to see all of reality as made up of sequences of momentary events, each causally dependent on the ones that went before. There are no abiding substances, and no eternal souls. Seeing reality that way extinguishes the fires of craving, and liberates the meditator from the necessity of rebirth (Laumakis 2008, 158–161). Seeing things as they are involves removing from the mind all the delusions that stand in the way of such seeing, which is done by meditation practices that develop the meditator’s mastery of his or her own mind. The type of meditation that brings this mastery and allows the meditator to see the true nature of things is called Vipassana (insight) meditation. It typically involves some object of meditation, which can be some feature of the meditator him- or herself, some feature of the physical or mental world, or some abstraction, which then becomes the focus of the meditator’s concentration and examination. In the end, it is hoped, the meditator will see in the object the unsatisfactory and impermanent nature of things and that there is no self to be found in them. At the moment of that insight, nirvana is achieved. While the experience of nirvana is essentially the realization of a kind of insight, it is also accompanied by other experiential elements, especially of the cessation of negative mental states. Nirvana is described in the Buddhist canon as the extinction of the fires of desire. The Theravada tradition teaches other kinds of meditation that can help the meditator make progress, but the final goal can’t be achieved without vipassana meditation.

In the Mahayana Buddhist traditions, this idea of the constantly fluctuating nature of the universe is extended in various ways. For some, even those momentary events that make up the flow of the world are understood to be empty of inherent existence (the idea of inherent existence is understood differently in different traditions) to the point that what one sees in the enlightenment experience is the ultimate emptiness (sunyata) of all things. In the Yogacara school of Mahayana Buddhism, this is understood as emptiness of external existence; that is, to see things as they are is to see them as all mind-dependent. In the Zen school of Mahayana Buddhism, the enlightenment experience (kensho) reveals that reality contains no distinctions or dualities. Since concepts and language always involve distinctions, which always involve duality, the insight so gained cannot be achieved conceptually or expressed linguistically. In all Mahayana schools, what brings enlightenment is direct realization of sunyata as a basic fact about reality.

The situation is somewhat more complicated in the Chinese traditions. The idea of religious experience seems to be almost completely absent in the Confucian tradition; the social world looms large, and the idea of an ultimate reality that needs to be experienced becomes much less prominent. Before the arrival of Buddhism in China, Confucianism was primarily a political and ethical system, with no particular concern with the transcendent (though people who identified themselves as Confucians frequently engaged in Chinese folk religious practices). Nevertheless, meditation (and therefore something that could be called “religious experience”) did come to play a role in Confucian practice in the tenth century, as Confucian thought began to be influenced by Buddhist and Taoist thought. The resulting view is known as Neo-Confucianism. Neo-Confucianism retains the Mencian doctrine that human beings are by nature good, but in need of purification. Since goodness resides in every person, then examination of oneself should reveal the nature of goodness, through the experience of the vital force within (qi). The form of meditation that arises from this line of thought (“quiet sitting” or “sitting and forgetting”) are very like Buddhist vipassana meditation, but there is no value placed on any particular insight gained, though one can experience the principle of unity (li) behind the world. Success is measured in gradual moral improvement. The Taoist ideal is to come to an understanding of the Tao, the fundamental nature of reality that explains all things in the world, and live according to it. Knowledge of the Tao is essential to the good life, but this knowledge cannot be learned from discourses, or transmitted by teaching. It is only known by experiential acquaintance. The Tao gives the universe a kind of grain, or flow, going against which causes human difficulty. The good human life is then one that respects the flow of Tao, and goes along with it. This is what is meant by “life in accordance with nature.” By paying attention, a person can learn what the Tao is, and can experience unity with it. This picture of reality, along with the picture of how one can come to know it, heavily influenced the development of Ch’an Buddhism, which became Zen.


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