Political Legitimacy

First published Thu Apr 29, 2010; substantive revision Mon Dec 11, 2023

Political legitimacy is a virtue of political institutions and of the decisions—about laws, policies, and candidates for political office—made within them. This entry will survey the main answers that have been given to the following questions. First, how should legitimacy be defined? Is it primarily a descriptive or a normative concept? If legitimacy is understood normatively, what does it entail? Some associate legitimacy with the justification of coercive power and with the creation of political authority. Others associate it with the justification, or at least the sanctioning, of existing political authority. Authority stands for a right to rule—a right to issue commands and, possibly, to enforce these commands using coercive power. An additional question is whether legitimate political authority is understood to entail political obligations or not. Most people probably think it does. But some think that the moral obligation to obey political authority can be separated from an account of legitimate authority, or at least that such obligations arise only if further conditions hold.

Next there are questions about the requirements of legitimacy. When are political institutions and the decisions made within them appropriately called legitimate? Some have argued that this question must be answered primarily on the basis of procedural features of political decision-making. Others argue that legitimacy depends—exclusively or at least in part—on the substantive values that are realized. And on what grounds is the procedure versus substance question to be settled, is it on moral grounds— relating to values such as freedom or equality—or is it on epistemic grounds—relating to the epistemic merits of how political decisions are made? A related question is: does political legitimacy demand democracy or not? Insofar as democracy is seen as necessary for political legitimacy, when are democratic decisions legitimate? Can that question be answered with reference to procedural features only, or does democratic legitimacy depend both on procedural values and on the quality of the decisions made? And what is the role of epistemic considerations in this regard? Finally, there is the question which political institutions are subject to the legitimacy requirement. Historically, legitimacy was associated with the state and institutions and decisions within the state. The contemporary literature tends to judge this as too narrow, however. This raises the question how the concept of legitimacy may apply—beyond the nation state and decisions made within it—to the international and global context.

1. Descriptive and Normative Concepts of Political Legitimacy

If legitimacy is interpreted descriptively, it refers to people’s beliefs about political authority and, sometimes, political obligations. In his sociology, Max Weber put forward a very influential account of legitimacy that excludes any recourse to normative criteria (Mommsen 1989: 20, but see Greene 2017 for an alternative reading). According to Weber, that a political regime is legitimate means that its participants have certain beliefs or faith (“Legitimitätsglaube”) in regard to it: “the basis of every system of authority, and correspondingly of every kind of willingness to obey, is a belief, a belief by virtue of which persons exercising authority are lent prestige” (Weber 1964: 382). As is well known, Weber distinguishes among three main sources of legitimacy—understood as the acceptance both of authority and of the need to obey its commands. People may have faith in a particular political or social order because it has been there for a long time (tradition), because they have faith in the rulers (charisma), or because they trust its legality—specifically the rationality of the rule of law (Weber 2009 [1918]; 1964). Weber identifies legitimacy as an important explanatory category for social science, because faith in a particular social order produces social regularities that are more stable than those that result from the pursuit of self-interest or from habitual rule-following (Weber 1964: 124).

In contrast to Weber’s descriptive concept, the normative concept of political legitimacy refers to some benchmark of acceptability or justification of political power or authority and—possibly—obligation. On one view, held by John Rawls (1993) and Arthur Ripstein (2004), for example, legitimacy refers, in the first instance, to the justification of coercive political power. Whether a political body such as a state is legitimate and whether citizens have political obligations towards it depends on whether the coercive political power that the state exercises is justified. On a widely held alternative view, legitimacy is linked to the justification of political authority. On this view, political bodies such as states may be effective, or de facto, authorities, without being legitimate. They claim the right to rule and to create obligations to be obeyed, and as long as these claims are met with sufficient acquiescence, they are authoritative. Legitimate authority, on this view, differs from merely effective or de facto authority in that it actually holds the right to rule and creates political obligations (e.g., Raz 1986). On some views, even legitimate authority is not sufficient to create political obligations. The thought is that a political authority (such as a state) may be permitted to issue commands that citizens are not obligated to obey (Dworkin 1986: 191). Based on a view of this sort, some have argued that legitimate political authority only gives rise to political obligations if additional normative conditions are satisfied (e.g. Wellman 1996; Edmundson 1998; Buchanan 2002).

There is sometimes a tendency in the literature to equate the normative concept of legitimacy with justice. Some explicitly define legitimacy as a criterion of minimal justice (e.g., Hampton 1998; Buchanan 2002). Someone might claim, for example, that while political institutions such as states are often unjust, only a just state is morally acceptable and legitimate in this sense. Unfortunately, there is sometimes also a tendency to blur the distinction between the two concepts, and a lot of confusion arises from that. Rawls (1993, 1995) clearly distinguishes between the two concepts. In his view, while justice and legitimacy are related—they draw on the same set of political values—they have different domains and legitimacy makes weaker demands than justice (1993: 225; 1995: 175ff.). Political institutions may be legitimate but unjust, but the converse is not possible: just political institutions are necessarily legitimate (see also Langvatn 2016 on this). On other views, legitimacy and justice have different normative foundations (e.g., Simmons 2001; Pettit 2012). According to Pettit (2012: 130ff), a state is just if it imposes a social order that promotes freedom as non-domination for all its citizens. It is legitimate if it imposes a social order in an appropriate way. A state that fails to impose a social order in an appropriate way, however just the social order may be, is illegitimate. Vice versa, a legitimate state may fail to impose a just social order.

Realist political theorists criticize any tendency to blur the distinction between legitimacy and justice (e.g., Rossi and Sleat 2014). They diagnose it as a sign of misplaced “political moralism” (Williams 2005; Horton 2010), or, relatedly, as a misleading interpretation of political theory as a branch of applied ethics (e.g., Honig 1993). But they also want to carve out an alternative to a purely descriptive interpretation of legitimacy. Bernard Williams’s claim (2005: 4ff) that political institutions are subject to a “basic legitimation demand” has been very influential in this regard. According to Williams, the first political question is how a state provides basic political goods such as security and stability and the conditions for cooperation. That it provides these goods is a necessary requirement for legitimacy, but it is not sufficient. A state is also under the normative expectation to justify how it provides these goods. That normative expectation is the distinctively political basic legitimation demand.

By interpreting the concept of political legitimacy along those lines, political realists lend support to those who have questioned a sharp distinction between the descriptive and normative concepts of legitimacy (e.g., Habermas 1979; Beetham 1991; Horton 2012). The objection to a strictly normative concept of legitimacy is that it is of only limited use in understanding actual processes of legitimation. The charge is that philosophers tend to focus too much on the general conditions necessary for the justification of political institutions but neglect the historical actualization of the justificatory process. In Jürgen Habermas’ words (Habermas 1979: 205): “Every general theory of justification remains peculiarly abstract in relation to the historical forms of legitimate domination. … Is there an alternative to this historical injustice of general theories, on the one hand, and the standardlessness of mere historical understanding, on the other?” The objection to a purely descriptive concept such as Weber’s is that it neglects people’s second order beliefs about legitimacy—their beliefs, not just about the actual legitimacy of a particular political institution, but about the justifiability of this institution, i.e. about what is necessary for legitimacy. According to Beetham, a “power relationship is not legitimate because people believe in its legitimacy, but because it can be justified in terms of their beliefs” (Beetham 1991: 11). As Tommie Shelby (2007) has highlighted, from the point of view of oppressed minorities political institutions often lack legitimacy because they (rightly) perceive the social order to be unjust.

A key claim of political realism is that while legitimacy is a normative property of political institutions or decisions, its normativity is not (just) moral (e.g., Rossi 2012, Sleat 2014). In support of this claim, some realists argue that the basic legitimation demand can’t be satisfied just by appeal to moral arguments, for example because political processes are necessary to forge political agreements (Stears 2007). Others focus on the role of epistemic normativity (see the discussion in Burelli and Destri 2022). But, as Leader Maynard and Worsnip (2018) ask, is there a distinct political normativity that political realists could resort to? Or does normative political philosophy have resources to address the realists’ worries? A possible reply to these questions is that realist political theory is less concerned with the nature of normativity than with drawing attention to neglected topics in political theory (Baderin 2014; Jubb 2019). But this raises the further question whether there is a unified project at the core of political realism, or whether it is better seen as the intersection of different projects motivated by a range of meta-normative, normative, and political concerns.

2. The Function of Political Legitimacy

This section lays out the different ways in which legitimacy, understood normatively, can be seen as relating to political authority, coercion, and political obligations.

2.1 Legitimacy and the Justification of Political Authority

The normative concept of political legitimacy is often seen as related to the justification of authority. The main function of political legitimacy, on this interpretation, is to explain the difference between merely effective or de facto authority and legitimate authority.

John Locke put forward such an interpretation of legitimacy. Locke’s starting-point is a state of nature in which all individuals are equally free to act within the constraints of natural law and no individual is subject to the will of another. As Rawls (2007: 129) characterizes Locke’s understanding of the state of nature, it is “a state of equal right, all being kings.” Natural law, while manifest in the state of nature, is not sufficiently specific to rule a society and cannot enforce itself when violated, however. The solution to this problem is a social contract that transfers political authority to a civil state that can realize and secure the natural law. According to Locke, and contrary to his predecessor Thomas Hobbes, the social contract thus does not create authority. Political authority is embodied in individuals and pre-exists in the state of nature. The social contract transfers the authority they each enjoy in the state of nature to a particular political body.

While political authority thus pre-exists in the state of nature, legitimacy is a concept that is specific to the civil state. Because the criterion of legitimacy that Locke proposes is historical, however, what counts as legitimate authority remains connected to the state of nature. The legitimacy of political authority in the civil state depends, according to Locke, on whether the transfer of authority has happened in the right way. Whether the transfer has happened in the right way depends on individuals’ consent: “no one can be put out of this estate and subjected to the political power of another without his own consent” (Locke 1980 [1690]: 52). Anyone who has given their express or tacit consent to the social contract is bound to obey a state’s laws (Locke 1980 [1690]: 63). Locke understands the consent criterion to apply not just to the original institutionalization of a political authority—what Rawls (2007: 124) calls “originating consent”. It also applies to the ongoing evaluation of the performance of a political regime—Rawls (2007: 124) calls this “joining consent”.

Although Locke emphasises consent, consent is not, however, sufficient for legitimate authority because an authority that suspends the natural law is necessarily illegitimate (e.g., Simmons 1976). On some interpretations of Locke (e.g., Pitkin 1965), consent is not even necessary for legitimate political authority; the absence of consent is only a marker of illegitimacy. Whether an actual political regime respects the constraints of the natural law is thus at least one factor that determines its legitimacy.

This criterion of legitimacy is negative: it offers an account of when effective authority ceases to be legitimate. When a political authority fails to secure consent or oversteps the boundaries of the natural law, it ceases to be legitimate and, therefore, there is no longer an obligation to obey its commands. For Locke—unlike for Hobbes—political authority can thus not be absolute.

The contemporary literature has developed Locke’s ideas in several ways. John Simmons (2001) uses them to argue that we should distinguish between the moral justification of states in general and the political legitimacy of actual states. We will come back to this point in section 3.2. Joseph Raz links legitimacy to the justification of political authority. According to Raz, political authority is just a special case of the more general concept of authority (1986, 1995, 2006). He defines authority in relation to a claim—of a person or an agency—to generate what he calls pre-emptive reasons. Such reasons replace other reasons for action that people might have. For example, if a teacher asks her students to do some homework, she expects her say-so to give the students reason to do the homework.

Authority is effective if it gets people to act on the reasons it generates. The difference between effective and legitimate authority, on Raz’ view, is that the former merely purports to change the reasons that apply to others, while legitimate authority actually has the capacity to change these reasons. Legitimate authority satisfies a pre-emption thesis: “The fact that an authority requires performance of an action is a reason for its performance which is not to be added to all other relevant reasons when assessing what to do, but should exclude and take the place of some of them” (Raz 1986: 46). (There are limits to what even a legitimate authority can rightfully order others to do, which is why it does not necessarily replace all relevant reasons.)

When is effective or de facto authority legitimate? In other words, what determines whether the pre-emption thesis is satisfied? Raz’ answer is captured in two further theses. The “dependence thesis” states that the justification of political authority depends on the normative reasons that apply to those under its rule directly, independently of the authority’s directives. Building on the dependence thesis, the “normal justification thesis” then states that political authority is justified if it enables those subject to it to better comply with the reasons that apply to them anyway. In full, the normal justification thesis says: “The normal way to establish that a person has authority over another involves showing that the alleged subject is likely to better comply with the reasons which apply to him (other than the alleged authoritative directive) if he accepts the directives of the alleged authority as authoritatively binding and tries to follow them, rather than by trying to follow the reasons which apply to him directly” (Raz 1986: 53). The normal justification thesis explains why those governed by a legitimate authority ought to treat its directives as binding. It thus follows as a corollary of the normal justification thesis that such an authority generates a duty to be obeyed. Raz calls his conception the “service conception” of authority (1986: 56). Note that even though legitimate authority is defined as a special case of effective authority, only the former is appropriately described as a serving its subjects. Illegitimate—but effective—authority does not serve those it aims to govern, although it may purport to do so.

William Edmundson formulates this way of linking authority and legitimacy via a condition he calls the warranty thesis: “If being an X entails claiming to F, then being a legitimate X entails truly claiming to F.” (Edmundson 1998: 39). Being an X here stands for “a state”, or “an authority”. And “to F” stands for “to create a duty to be obeyed”, for example. The idea expressed by the warranty thesis is that legitimacy morally justifies an independently existing authority such that the claims of the authority become moral obligations.

2.2 Justifying Power and Coercion

Those who link political legitimacy to the problem of justifying authority tend to think of political coercion as only a means that legitimate states may use to secure their authority. As Leslie Green puts it: “Coercion threats provide secondary, reinforcing motivation when the political order fails in its primary normative technique of authoritative guidance” (Green 1988: 75). According to a second important view, held by Rawls (1993), for example, the main function of legitimacy is precisely to justify coercive power. (For an excellent discussion of the two interpretations of legitimacy and a defense of the coercion-based interpretation, see Ripstein 2004; see also Hampton 1998.) On coercion-based interpretations, the main problem that a conception of legitimacy aims to solve is how to distinguish the rightful use of political power from mere coercion. Whether a political body such as a state is legitimate and whether citizens have political obligations towards it depends, on this view on whether the coercive political power that the state exercises is justified. Again, there are different ways in which this idea might be understood.

In Thomas Hobbes’ influential account, political authority is created by the social contract. In the state of nature, everyone’s self-preservation is under threat, and this makes it rational for all to consent to a covenant that authorizes a sovereign who can guarantee their protection and to transfer their rights to this sovereign—an individual or a group of individuals. When there is no such sovereign, one may be created by a covenant—Hobbes calls this “sovereignty by institution”. But political authority may also be established by the promise of all to obey a threatening power (“sovereignty by acquisition”; see Leviathan, chapter 17). Both manners of creating a sovereign are equally legitimate. And political authority will be legitimate as long as the sovereign ensures the protection of the citizens, as Hobbes believes that the natural right to self-preservation cannot be relinquished (Leviathan, chapter 21). Beyond that, however, there can be no further questions about the legitimacy of the sovereign. In particular, there is no distinction between effective authority and legitimate authority in Hobbes’ thought. It might even be argued that Hobbes fails to distinguish between legitimate authority and the mere exercise of power (Korsgaard 1997: 29; see chapter 30 of Leviathan, however, for an account of the quality of the sovereign’s rule).

Another way in which the relation between legitimacy and the creation of authority may be understood is that the attempt to rule without legitimacy is an attempt to exercise coercive power—not authority. Such a view can be found in Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s work. Legitimacy, for Rousseau, justifies the state’s exercise of coercive power and creates an obligation to obey. Rousseau contrasts a legitimate social order with a system of rules that is merely the expression of power. Coercive power is primarily a feature of the civil state. While there are some forms of coercive power even in the state of nature—for example the power of parents over their children—Rousseau assumes that harmful coercive power arises primarily in the civil state and that this creates the problem of legitimacy. In the first chapter of the first book of On the Social Contract he remarks that while “[m]an is born free”, the civil state he observes makes everyone a slave. Rousseau’s main question is under what conditions a civil state, which uses coercive power to back up its laws, can be thought of as freeing citizens from this serfdom. Such a state would be legitimate. As he puts it in the opening sentence of the Social Contract, “I want to inquire whether there can be some legitimate and sure rule of administration in the civil order, taking men as they are and laws as they might be.”

Rousseau’s account of legitimacy is importantly different from Locke’s in that Rousseau does not attach normativity to the process through which a civil state emerges from the state of nature. Legitimate political authority is created by convention, reached within the civil state. Specifically, Rousseau suggests that legitimacy arises from the democratic justification of the laws of the civil state (Social Contract I:6; cf. section 3.3. below).

For Immanuel Kant, as for Hobbes, political authority is created by the establishment of political institutions in the civil state. It does not pre-exist in individuals in the state of nature. What exists in the pre-civil social state, according to Kant, is the moral authority of each individual qua rational being and a moral obligation to form a civil state. Establishing a civil state is “in itself an end (that each ought to have)” (Kant, Theory and Practice 8:289; see also Perpetual Peace, Appendix I). Kant regards the civil state as a necessary first step toward a moral order (the “ethical commonwealth”). It helps people conform to certain rules by eliminating what today would be called the free-riding problem or the problem of partial compliance. By creating a coercive order of public legal justice, “a great step is taken toward morality (though it is not yet a moral step), toward being attached to this concept of duty even for its own sake” (Kant, Perpetual Peace 8:376, notes to Appendix I; see also Riley 1982: 129f).

The civil state, according to Kant, establishes the rights necessary to secure equal freedom. Unlike for Locke and his contemporary followers, however, coercive power is not a secondary feature of the civil state, necessary to back up laws. According to Kant, coercion is part of the idea of rights. The thought can be explained as follows. Coercion is defined as a restriction of the freedom to pursue one’s own ends. Any right of a person—independently of whether it is respected or has been violated—implies a restriction for others. (cf. Kant, Theory and Practice, Part 2; Ripstein 2004: 8; Flikschuh 2008: 389f). Coercion, in this view, is thus not merely a means for the civil state to enforce rights as defenders of an authority-based concept of legitimacy claim. Instead, according to Kant, it is constitutive of the civil state. This understanding of rights links Kant’s conception of legitimacy to the justification of coercion.

Legitimacy, for Kant, depends on a particular interpretation of the social contract. For Kant, the social contract which establishes the civil state is not an actual event. He accepts David Hume’s objection to Locke that the civil state is often established in an act of violence (Hume “Of the Original Contract”). Kant invokes the social contract, instead, as the test “of any public law’s conformity with right” (Kant Theory and Practice 8:294). The criterion is the following: each law should be such that all individuals could have consented to it. The social contract, according to Kant, is thus a hypothetical thought experiment, meant to capture an idea of public reason. As such, it sets the standard for what counts as legitimate political authority. Because of his particular interpretation of the social contract, Kant is not a social contract theorist in the strict sense. The idea of a contract is nevertheless relevant for his understanding of legitimacy. (On the difference between voluntaristic and rationalistic strands in liberalism, see Waldron 1987.)

Kant, unlike Hobbes, recognizes the difference between legitimate and effective authority. For the head of the civil state is under an obligation to obey public reason and to enact only laws to which all individuals could consent. If he violates this obligation, however, he still holds authority, even if his authority ceases to be legitimate. This view is best explained in relation to Kant’s often criticized position on the right to revolution. Kant famously denied that there is a right to revolution (Kant, Perpetual Peace, Appendix II; for a recent discussion, see Flikschuh 2008). Kant stresses that while “a people”—as united in the civil state—is sovereign, its individual members are under the obligation to obey the head of the state thus established. This obligation is such that it is incompatible with a right to revolution. Kant offers a transcendental argument for his position (Kant Perpetual Peace, Appendix II; Arendt 1992). A right to revolution would be in contradiction with the idea that individuals are bound by public law, but without the idea of citizens being bound by public law, there cannot be a civil state—only anarchy. As mentioned earlier, however, there is a duty to establish a civil state. Kant’s position implies that the obligation of individuals to obey a head of state is not conditioned upon the ruler’s performance. In particular, the obligation to obey does not cease when the laws are unjust.

Kant’s position on the right to revolution may suggest that he regards political authority as similarly absolute as Hobbes. But Kant stresses that the head of state is bound by the commands of public reason. This is manifest in his insistence on freedom of the pen: “a citizen must have, with the approval of the ruler himself, the authorization to make known publicly his opinions about what it is in the ruler’s arrangements that seems to him to be a wrong against the commonwealth” (Kant Theory and Practice 8:304). While there is no right to revolution, political authority is only legitimate if the head of state respects the social contract. But political obligations arise even from illegitimate authority. If the head of state acts in violation of the social contract and hence of public reason, for example by restricting citizens’ freedom of political criticism, citizens are still obligated to obey.

In 2004, Ripstein argued that much of the contemporary literature on political legitimacy has been dominated by a focus on the justification of authority, rather than coercive political power (Ripstein 2004). In the literature since then, it looks as if the tables are turning, especially if one considers the debates on international and global legitimacy (section 5). But prominent earlier coercion-based accounts include those by Nagel (1987) and by contemporary Kantians such as Rawls and Habermas (to be discussed in sections 3.3. and 4.3., respectively).

Let me briefly mention other important coercion-based interpretations. Jean Hampton (1998; drawing on Anscombe 1981) offers an elegant contemporary explication of Hobbes’ view. According to her, political authority “is invented by a group of people who perceive that this kind of special authority as necessary for the collective solution of certain problems of interaction in their territory and whose process of state creation essentially involves designing the content and structure of that authority so that it meets what they take to be their needs” (Hampton 1998: 77). Her theory links the authority of the state to its ability to enforce a solution to coordination and cooperation problems. Coercion is the necessary feature that enables the state to provide an effective solution to these problems, and the entitlement to use coercion is what constitutes the authority of the state. The entitlement to use coercion distinguishes such minimally legitimate political authority from a mere use of power. Hampton draws a further distinction between minimal legitimacy and what she calls full moral legitimacy, which obtains when political authority is just.

Buchanan (2002) also argues that legitimacy is concerned with the justification of coercive power. Buchanan points out that this makes legitimacy a more fundamental normative concept than authority. Like Hampton, he advocates a moralized interpretation of legitimacy. According to him, “an entity has political legitimacy if and only if it is morally justified in wielding political power” (2002: 689). Political authority, in his approach, obtains if an entity is legitimate in this sense and if some further conditions, relating to political obligation, are met (2002: 691). Anna Stilz (2009) offers a coercion-centered account of state legitimacy that draws on both Kant and Rousseau.

2.3 Political Legitimacy and Political Obligations

Historically speaking, the dominant view has been that legitimate political authority entails political obligations. Locke, for example, writes: “every man, by consenting with others to make one body politic under one government, puts himself under an obligation to every one of that society to submit to the determination of the majority, and to be concluded by it; or else this original compact, whereby he with others incorporates into one society, would signify nothing, and be no compact if he be left free and under no other ties than he was in before in the state of nature” (Locke 2009 [1690]: 52f).

While this is still the view many hold, not all do. Some take the question of what constitutes legitimate authority to be distinct from the question of what political obligations people have. Ronald Dworkin (1986: 191) treats political obligations as a fundamental normative concept in its own right. What he calls “associative obligations” arise, not from legitimate political authority, but directly from membership in a political community. (For a critical discussion of this account, see Simmons 2001; Wellman 1996.)

Arthur Applbaum (2019) offers a conceptual argument to challenge the view that legitimate political authority entails an obligation to obey. Applbaum grants that legitimate political authority has the capacity to change the normative status of those under its rule, as Raz (1986), for example, has influentially argued, and that this capacity should be interpreted as a moral power in Hohfeld’s sense, not as a claim right to rule. But, Applbaum argues, Hohfeldian powers, unlike rights, are not correlated with duties; they are correlated with liabilities. On Applbaum’s view, legitimate political authority thus has the capacity to create a liability for those under its rule, but not an obligation. To be liable to legitimate political authority means to not be free from the authority’s power or control. To be sure, the liability might be to be subject to a duty, but to be liable to be put under a duty to obey should not be confused with being under a duty to obey (see also Perry 2013 on this distinction).

Views that dissociate legitimate authority from political obligation have some appeal to those who aim to counter Robert Paul Wolff’s influential anarchist argument. The argument highlights what today is sometimes called the subjection problem (Perry 2013): how can autonomous individuals be under a general—content-independent—obligation to subject their will to the will of someone else? A content-independent obligation to obey the state is an obligation to obey a state’s directives as such, independently of their content. Wolff (1970) argues that because there cannot be such a general obligation to obey the state, states are necessarily illegitimate.

Edmundson (1998) has a first response to the anarchist challenge. He argues that while legitimacy establishes a justification for the state to issue directives, it does not create even a prima facie duty to obey its commands. He claims that the moral duty to obey the commands of legitimate political authority arises only if additional conditions are met.

Simmons (2001) has a different response to Wolff. Simmons draws a distinction between the moral justification of states and the political legitimacy of a particular, historically realized, state and its directives. According to Simmons, the state’s justification depends on its moral defensibility. If it can successfully be shown that having a state is morally better than not having a state (Simmons 2001: 125), the state is justified. But moral justification is only necessary, not sufficient, for political legitimacy, according to Simmons. The reason is that our moral obligations are to everyone, including citizens of other states, not to the particular state we live in. A particular state’s legitimacy, understood as the capacity to generate and enforce a duty to obey, depends on citizens’ actual consent. While there is no general moral duty to obey the particular state we live in, we may have a political obligation to obey if we have given our prior consent to this state. The absence of a general moral duty to obey the state thus does not imply that all states are necessarily illegitimate (Simmons 2001: 137).

3. Sources of Political Legitimacy

Insofar as legitimacy, understood normatively, determines which political institutions and which decisions made within them are justified or acceptable, and, in some cases, what kind of obligations people who are governed by these institutions incur, there is the question of what makes political institutions and political decisions legitimate. As we’ll see, this question has both a normative and a meta-normative dimension (see Peter 2023 for more on this distinction). This section briefly reviews different accounts that have been given of the sources of legitimacy.

3.1 Consent

While there is a strong voluntarist line of thought in Christian political philosophy, it was in the 17th century that consent came to be seen as the main source of political legitimacy. The works of Hugo Grotius, Hobbes, and Samuel Pufendorf tend to be seen as the main turning point that eventually led to the replacement of natural law and divine authority theories of legitimacy (see Schneewind 1998; Hampton 1998). The following passage from Grotius’ On the Law of War and Peace expresses the modern perspective: “But as there are several Ways of Living, some better than others, and every one may chuse which he pleases of all those Sorts; so a People may chuse what Form of Government they please: Neither is the Right which the Sovereign has over his Subjects to be measured by this or that Form, of which divers Men have different Opinions, but by the Extent of the Will of those who conferred it upon him” (cited by Tuck 1993: 193). It was Locke’s version of social contract theory that elevated consent to the main source of the legitimacy of political authority.

Raz helpfully distinguishes among three ways in which the relation between consent and legitimate political authority may be understood (1995: 356): (i) consent of those governed is a necessary condition for the legitimacy of political authority; (ii) consent is not directly a condition for legitimacy, but the conditions for the legitimacy of authority are such that only political authority that enjoys the consent of those governed can meet them; (iii) the conditions of legitimate political authority are such that those governed by that authority are under an obligation to consent. There is a question, however, whether versions of (ii) and (iii) are best understood as versions of a consent theory of political legitimacy, or whether they are versions of an alternative justificationist theory (Stark 2000; Peter 2023).

Locke and his contemporary followers such as Robert Nozick (1974) or Simmons (2001), but also Rousseau and his followers defend a version of (i)—the most typical form that consent theories take. Amanda Greene (2016) defends a version of this view she calls the quality consent view. One question that all versions of (i) must address is whether consent must be explicit or whether tacit consent, expressed by residency, is sufficient (see Puryear 2021 for a defence of the latter).

Versions of (ii) appeal to those who reject actual consent as a basis for legitimacy, as they only regard consent given under ideal conditions as binding. Theories of hypothetical consent, such as those articulated by Kant or Rawls, fall into this category. Such theories view political authority as legitimate only if those governed would consent under certain ideal conditions (cf. section 3.2).

David Estlund (2008: 117ff) defends a version of hypothetical consent theory that matches category (iii). What he calls “normative consent” is a theory that regards non-consent to authority, under certain conditions as invalid. Authority, in this view, may thus be justified without actual consent. Estlund defines authority as the moral power to require action. Estlund uses normative consent theory as the basis for an account of democratic legitimacy, understood as the permissibility of using coercion to enforce authority. The work that normative consent theory does in Estlund’s account is that it contributes to the justification of the authority of the democratic collective over those who disagree with certain democratically approved laws.

Although consent theory has been dominating for a long time, there are many well-known objections to it. As we will explain more fully in the next section, Simmons (2001) argues that hypothetical consent theories (and, presumably, normative consent theories, too) conflate moral justification with legitimation, and that only actual consent can legitimize political institutions. Other objections, especially to Lockean versions, are about as old as consent theory itself. David Hume, in his essay “Of the Original Contract”, and many after him object to Locke that consent is not feasible, and that actual states have almost always arisen from acts of violence. The attempt to legitimize political authority via consent is thus, at best, wishful thinking (Wellman 1996). What is worse, it may obscure problematic structures of subordination (Pateman 1988). Hume’s own solution to this problem was, like Bentham later, to propose to justify political authority with reference to its beneficial consequences (see section 3.3).

3.2 Public Justification and Political Participation

An important legacy of consent theory in contemporary thought is manifest in accounts that attribute the source of legitimacy either to an idea of public reason—taking the lead from Kant—or to a theory of democratic participation—taking the lead from Rousseau. Theories of deliberative democracy combine elements of both accounts.

Public reason accounts tend to focus on the problem of justifying political coercion. The solution they propose is that political coercion is justified if it is supported on the basis of reasons that all reasonable persons can share. Interest in public reason accounts started with Rawls’ Political Liberalism, but Rawls developed the idea more fully in later works. Rawls’ starting-point is the following problem of legitimacy (Rawls 2001: 41): “in the light of what reasons and values … can citizens legitimately exercise … coercive power over one another?” The solution to this problem that Rawls proposes is the following “liberal principle of legitimacy”: “political power is legitimate only when it is exercised in accordance with a constitution (written or unwritten) the essentials of which all citizens, as reasonable and rational, can endorse in the light of their common human reason” (Rawls 2001: 41; see Michelman 2022 for an extensive discussion of constitutional essentials).

Rawls’ idea of public reason, which is at the core of the liberal principle of legitimacy, rests on the method of “political”—as opposed to “metaphysical”—justification that Rawls has developed in response to critics of his theory of justice as fairness (Rawls 1993). This means that public reason should be “freestanding” in the same way as his theory of justice is. Public reason should involve only political values and be independent of—potentially controversial—comprehensive moral or religious doctrines of the good. This restricts the content of public reason to what is given by the family of what Rawls calls political conceptions of justice (Rawls 2001: 26). Rawls recognizes that because the content of the idea of public reason is restricted, the domain to which it should apply must be restricted too. The question is: in what context is it important that the restriction on reason is observed? Rawls conceives of the domain of public reason as limited to matters of constitutional essentials and basic justice and as applying primarily—but not only—to judges, government officials, and candidates for public office when they decide on matters of constitutional essentials and basic justice.

Simmons (2001) criticizes Rawls’ approach for mistakenly blurring the distinction between justifying the state and political legitimacy (see also section 2.3.). A Rawlsian could reply, however, that the problem of legitimacy centrally involves the justification of coercion, and that legitimacy should thus be understood as what creates—rather than merely justifies—political authority. The following thought supports this claim. Rawls—in Political Liberalism—explicitly focuses on the democratic context. It is a particular feature of democracy that the right to rule is created by those who are ruled. As Hershovitz puts it in his critique of the Razian approach to political legitimacy, in a democracy there is no sharp division between the “binders” and the “bound” (2003: 210f). The political authority of democracy is thus entailed by some account of the conditions under which citizens may legitimately exercise coercive power over one another (see Viehoff 2014 and Kolodny 2023 on this question). But even if Simmons’ objection can be refuted in this way, a further problem for public reason accounts is whether they can successfully show that some form of public justification is indeed required for political legitimacy (see Enoch 2015).

Recent public reason accounts have developed Rawls’ original idea in different ways (see also the entry on public reason). Those following Rawls more closely will understand public reasons as reasons that attract a—hypothetical—consensus. On this interpretation, a public reason is a reason that all reasonable persons can be expected to endorse. The target of the consensus is either the political decisions themselves or the procedure through which political decisions are made. On a common reading today, the Rawlsian idea of public reason is understood in terms of a hypothetical consensus on substantive reasons (e.g., Quong 2011; Hartley and Watson 2018). On those conceptions, the use of political coercion is legitimate if it is supported by substantive reasons that all reasonable persons can be expected to endorse. The problem with this interpretation of public reason is that the demand for a consensus on substantive reasons in circumstances of moral and religious pluralism and disagreement either relies on a very restrictive characterization of reasonable persons or ends up with a very limited domain for legitimate political coercion.

Rawls’ conception of political legitimacy can also be understood in terms of procedural reasons (Peter 2008). On this interpretation, the domain of public reason is limited to the justification of the process of political decision-making, and need not extend to the substantive (as opposed to the procedural) reasons that justify a decision. For example, if public reason supports democratic decision-making, then the justification for a decision is that it has been made democratically. Of course, a political decision that is legitimate in virtue of the procedure in which it has been made may not be fully just. But this is just a reflection of the fact that legitimacy is a weaker idea than justice.

An alternative interpretation of the public reason account focuses on convergence, not consensus (Gaus 2011; Vallier 2011; Vallier and Muldoon 2020). A political decision is legitimized on the basis of public reason, on this account, if reasonable persons can converge on that decision. They need not agree on the—substantive or procedural—reasons that support a decision. Instead, it is argued, it is sufficient for political legitimacy if all can agree that a particular decision should be made, even if they disagree about the reasons that support this decision. Note that the convergence needs not be actual; it can be hypothetical.

Accounts that emphasize political participation or political influence regard a political decision as legitimate only if it has been made in a process that allows for equal participation of all relevant persons. They thus see political legitimacy as dependent on the participation or influence of all, to paraphrase Bernard Manin’s (1987) expression, not on the will of all, as consent theories do, or on a justification all can access, as public reason accounts do. Older accounts of this kind focus on democratic participation (Pateman 1970). Newer accounts include deliberative democracy accounts (Manin 1987), Philipp Pettit’s equal control view (Pettit 2012), and Lafont’s theory of democratic legitimacy (Lafont 2019).

Rousseau’s solution to the problem of how to explain the legitimacy of political decisions has influenced many contemporary democratic theorists (see section 4.3.). One of the important departures from Locke’s version of social contract theory that Rousseau proposes is that tacit consent is not sufficient for political legitimacy. Without citizens’ active participation in the justification of a state’s laws, Rousseau maintains, there is no legitimacy. According to Rousseau, one’s will cannot be represented, as this would distort the general will, which alone is the source of legitimacy: “The engagements that bind us to the social body are obligatory only because they are mutual… the general will, to be truly such, should be general in its object as well as in its essence; … it should come from all to apply to all; and … it loses its natural rectitude when it is directed towards any individual, determinate object” (Rousseau, Social Contract, II:4; see also ibid. I:3 and Rawls 2007: 231f).

Rousseau distinguishes among a citizen’s private will, which reflects personal interests, a citizen’s general will, which reflects an interpretation of the common good, and the general will, which truly reflects the common good. A democratic decision is always about the common good. In democratic decision-making, citizens thus compare their interpretations of the general will. If properly conducted, it reveals the general will. This is the legitimate decision.

Active participation by all may not generate a consensus. So why would those who oppose a particular decision be bound by that decision? Rousseau’s answer to this question is the following. On Rousseau’s view, citizens can—and will want to—learn from democratic decisions. Since the democratic decision, if conducted properly, correctly reveals the general will, those who voted against a particular proposal will recognize that they were wrong and will adjust their beliefs about what the general will is. In this ingenious way, individuals are only bound by their own will, but everyone is bound by a democratic decision.

3.3 Normative Facts and Epistemic Advantage

The theories of political legitimacy reviewed in the previous two sections take the citizens’ will, whether expressed through their actual consent, supported by shared or converging reasons, or established through processes of political participation, as the ground of political legitimacy. While such will-based conceptions have dominated the philosophical literature on political legitimacy, they are not the only conceptions on offer. There are two main alternatives, as well as hybrid conceptions (see Peter 2023). A first alternative are fact-based conceptions of political legitimacy, according to which the legitimacy of political institutions and decisions depends on whether they accord with normative facts. Utilitarian theories, which focus on the beneficial consequences of political institutions and the decisions made within them, are a good example. According to belief-based conceptions, as articulated in epistocratic conceptions and in some epistemic theories of democracy, the source of political legitimacy is some form of epistemic advantage that supports the justification of political decisions. In this section, we expand on the two main alternatives to will-based conceptions of political legitimacy.

In the utilitarian view, legitimate political authority should be grounded on the principle of utility. The relevant normative facts are facts concerning the maximization of happiness or utility. Christian Thomasius, a student of Pufendorf and contemporary of Locke, may be seen as a precursor of the utilitarian approach to political legitimacy, as he rejected voluntarism and endorsed the idea that political legitimacy depends on principles of rational prudence instead (Schneewind 1998: 160; Barnard 2001: 66). Where Thomasius differs from the utilitarians, however, is in his attempt to identify a distinctively political—not moral or legal—source of legitimacy. He developed the idea of “decorum” into a theory of how people should relate to one another in the political context. Decorum is best described as a principle of “civic mutuality” (Barnard 2001: 65): “You treat others as you would expect them to treat you” (Thomasius, Foundations of the Law of Nature and of Nations, quoted by Barnard 2001: 65). By thus distinguishing legitimacy from legality and justice, Thomasius adopted an approach that was considerably ahead of his time.

Jeremy Bentham (in Anarchical Fallacies) rejects the Hobbesian idea that political authority is created by a social contract. According to Bentham, it is the state that creates the possibility of binding contracts. The problem of legitimacy that the state faces is which of its laws are justified. Bentham proposes that legitimacy depends on whether a law contributes to the happiness of the citizens. (For a contemporary take on this utilitarian principle of legitimacy, see Binmore 2000.)

A well-known problem with the view that Bentham articulates is that it justifies restrictions of rights that liberals find unacceptable. John Stuart Mill’s answer to this objection consists, on the one hand, in an argument for the compatibility between utilitarianism and the protection of liberty rights and, on the other, in an instrumentalist defense of democratic political authority based on the principle of utility. According to Mill, both individual freedom and the right to participate in politics are necessary for the self-development of individuals (Mill On Liberty and Considerations on Representative Government, see Brink 1992; Ten 1998).

With regard to the defense of liberty rights, Mill argues that the restriction of liberty is illegitimate unless it is permitted by the harm principle, that is, unless the actions suppressed by the restriction harm others (On Liberty, chapter 1; for a critical discussion of the harm principle as the basis of legitimacy, see Wellman 1996; see also Turner 2014). Mill’s view of the instrumental value of (deliberative) democracy is expressed in the following passage of the first chapter of On Liberty: “Despotism is a legitimate mode of government in dealing with barbarians, provided that the end be their improvement and the means justified by actually effecting that end. Liberty, as a principle, has no application to any state of things anterior to the time when mankind have become capable of being improved by free and equal discussion.” Deliberation is important, according to Mill, because of his belief in the power of ideas—in what Habermas would later call the force of the better argument (Habermas 1990: 158ff). Deliberation should keep partisan interests, which could threaten legitimacy by undermining the general happiness, in check: “The representative system ought … not to allow any of the various sectional interests to be so powerful as to be capable of prevailing against truth and justice and the other sectional interests combined. There ought always to be such a balance preserved among personal interests as may render any one of them dependent for its successes, on carrying with it at least a large proportion of those who act on higher motives, and more comprehensive and distant views” (Mill, Collected Works XIX: 447, cited by Ten 1998: 379).

Many are not convinced that such instrumentalist reasoning provides a satisfactory account of political legitimacy. Rawls (1971:175ff) and Jeremy Waldron (1987: 143ff) object that the utilitarian approach will ultimately only convince those who stand to benefit from the felicific calculus, and that it lacks an argument to convince those who stand to lose.

Can fact-based conceptions of political legitimacy address this problem? Fair play theories offer one solution to this problem (see Klosko 2004 and the entry on political obligation). Wellman’s (1996) samaritan account of political legitimacy is also an attempt to overcome this problem. In his account, a state’s legitimacy depends on it being justified to use coercion to enforce its laws. His suggestion is that the justification of the state can be grounded in the samaritan duty to help others in need. The thought is that “what ultimately legitimizes a state’s imposition upon your liberty is not merely the services it provides you, but the benefits it provides others” (Wellman 1996: 213; his emphasis). Wellman argues that because “political society is the only vehicle with which people can escape the perils of the state of nature” (Wellman 1996: 216), people have a samaritan duty to provide to one another the benefits of a state. Associated restrictions of their liberty by the state, Wellman claims, are legitimate.

Perfectionist theories offer another alternative. Perfectionist conceptions can be found in ancient Chinese philosophy (see Chan 2013; Jiang 2021). The best-known perfectionist theory in contemporary Western political philosophy is Raz’ service conception of legitimate authority (section 2.1). Raz tries to show how an account of legitimacy based on beneficial consequences is compatible with everyone having reasons to obey the directives of a legitimate authority. According to Raz (1995: 359), “[g]overnments decide what is best for their subjects and present them with the results as binding conclusions that they are bound to follow.” The justification for this view that Raz gives (“the normal justification thesis”) is, as explained above, that if the authority is legitimate, its directives are such that they help those governed to better comply with reasons that apply to them. (For criticisms of this approach, see Hershovitz 2003 and 2011, Nussbaum 2011, and Quong 2011).

Perfectionist theories are often cast as versions of fact-based conceptions of political legitimacy. But, as Plato highlighted in the Republic, there isn’t just the question of what the right political decisions are, whether construed as those that maximize utility, honor our duties, or realize some perfectionist ideal. There is also the question of who should be in charge. And the answer that Plato gave to that second question echoes a belief-based conception of political legitimacy: it’s those who know best and who are capable of ruling accordingly (Estlund 2003). Seen in that light, even Raz’ service conception of political legitimacy appears as a belief-based conception. It holds that “epistemic abstinence” is not an option (Raz 1995) and that political authority is legitimate if held by those who know best what reasons apply to all citizens and exercised accordingly (see Peter 2023 for this interpretation of Raz’ service conception).

Belief-based conceptions of political legitimacy span versions of epistocracy as well as versions of epistemic democracy. I’ll have more to say about epistemic democracy in section 4, so let me focus on epistocratic conceptions here. Epistocratic conceptions of political legitimacy are best understood in opposition to the democratic commitment to strict political equality among the citizens (see section 4). The idea is captured by Jason Brennan’s “antiauthority tenet” (Brennan 2016: 17), which echoes David Estlund’s “authority tenet” (2008: 30): “When some citizens are morally unreasonable, ignorant, or incompetent about politics, this justifies not permitting them to exercise political authority over others.”

Epistocratic conceptions of political legitimacy can support the legitimacy of authoritarianism, assuming that there is an authoritarian elite that has the right kind of political knowledge and is able to effectively rule on that basis. We should not equate epistocracy with authoritarianism, however, as epistocracy is also compatible with a Millian plurality voting scheme and similar political regimes. Still, as highlighted by Ross Mittiga (2022) and Fabienne Peter (2023), the question has to be addressed whether non-democratic political decision-making can be legitimate in circumstances where the threats to citizens’ lives are enormous (through climate change, for example, or pandemics), the evidence for what needs to be done is sufficiently robust, and the democratic process is failing to address the issues.

An important objection to belief-based conceptions of political legitimacy is that they conflate political authority and epistemic authority (Estlund 2008, Darwall 2010, Lafont 2019; see also section 4 below). Raz (2010) rejects this objection, arguing that it only shows that epistemic authority is not sufficient for political authority, not that it is not necessary. Peter (2023) argues that even if this objection can be refuted, belief-based conceptions of political legitimacy often (but not necessarily always) fail because political decision-making remains epistemically underdetermined.

4. Political Legitimacy and Democracy

This section takes a closer look at the relationship between democracy and political legitimacy. In contemporary political philosophy, many, but by no means all, hold that democracy is necessary for political legitimacy. Democratic instrumentalism is the view that democratic decision-making procedures are at best a means for reaching just outcomes, and whether or not legitimacy requires democracy depends on the outcomes that democratic decision-making brings about. Thomas Christiano (2004) helpfully distinguishes between monistic conceptions of political legitimacy and non-monistic ones. Democratic instrumentalism is a monistic view. It reduces the normativity of political legitimacy to a single dimension: only the quality of the outcomes a particular political regime generates is relevant for political legitimacy. The main alternative in contemporary political philosophy is a form of proceduralism according to which democracy is necessary for political legitimacy, independently of its instrumental value (Buchanan 2002). Some such proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy are also monistic. What is commonly called pure proceduralism is an example of a monistic view. According to pure proceduralism only procedural features of decision-making are relevant for democratic legitimacy. Many philosophers are drawn to non-monistic conceptions of democratic legitimacy. Such mixed conceptions of democratic legitimacy combine conditions that refer to the quality of outcomes of democratic decision-making with conditions that apply to procedural features.

4.1 Democratic Instrumentalism

Democratic instrumentalism is sometimes used to argue against democracy. According to arguments of this kind, some ideal of good outcomes, however defined, forms the standard that determines political legitimacy (see section 3.3). If democracy does not contribute to better outcomes than an alternative decision-making procedure, it is not necessary for political legitimacy. The instrumentalist accounts of Richard Arneson (2003) and Steven Wall (2007), for example, refer to some ideal egalitarian distribution. In their view, the legitimacy of political institutions and the decisions made within them depends on how closely they approximate the ideal egalitarian distribution. If sacrificing political equality allows for a better approximation of equality overall, so their argument goes, then this does not undermine legitimacy.

One problem with this view is that it treats political equality as less important than the other kinds of equality that inform the perfectionist standard. This is implausible to those who take political equality to be one of the most important egalitarian values (e.g., Rawls 1993; Buchanan 2002; Christiano 2008). In addition, anti-democratic instrumentalism is at odds with the view that many democrats hold—that democratic procedures create or constitute political authority (Viehoff 2014, Kolodny 2023).

Instrumentalist defenses of democracy aim to show that democratic decision-making procedures are legitimate because they are best able to produce the right outcomes. Many of those arguments for the legitimacy of democracy focus on the (instrumental) epistemic value of democratic decision-making procedures. I’ll discuss these in a moment. But, first, it’s important to note that not all do. A fact-based version of democratic instrumentalism holds that democratic decision-processes are legitimate to the extent that they, in fact, promote morally good or just outcomes. Amartya Sen’s finding that democracies prevent famines illustrates the idea (Sen 1999). Brinkmann (2019) argues that there is an indirect version of instrumentalism about political legitimacy, which ties legitimacy to justice, but that is less vulnerable to standard objections against instrumentalism. This indirect instrumentalism, he argues, can support the legitimacy of democratic procedures.

Epistemic justifications of democracy do not always target the legitimacy of democracy. Some just aim to add to our overall understanding of the justification of democracy, without claiming that the epistemic argument provided is sufficient to establish the legitimacy of democracy. Some pragmatist epistemic defences of democracy, which need not be instrumentalist, are best interpreted along those lines (e.g., Misak 2004, Talisse 2009). But to the extent that they do target legitimacy, epistemic instrumentalist defenses of democracy rely on what Estlund calls a “correctness theory of democratic legitimacy” (Estlund 2008: 99). According to this theory, democracy is necessary for legitimacy to the extent that it generates political decisions that are correct or more likely to be correct.

The best-known epistemic instrumentalist defense of democracy draws on the Condorcet jury theorem (see Goodin and Spiekermann 2019 for a comprehensive recent discussion). In its original formulation, the Condorcet jury theorem assumes that there are two alternatives and one of them is the correct outcome, however defined. Take the latter to be the legitimate outcome. The theorem says that if each voter is more likely to be correct than wrong, then a majority of all is also more likely to be correct than wrong. In addition, the probability that a majority will vote for the correct outcome increases with the size of the body of voters. Since democracy has a greater constituency than any other regime, the theorem gives an argument for why democracy is best able to generate legitimate outcomes. Bernard Grofman and Scott Feld (1988) interpret the Condorcet jury theorem as an explanation of Rousseau’s theory of how a democratic decision reflects the general will.

In addition to arguments based on the Condorcet jury theorem, there are other ways to defend the instrumental epistemic value of democracy. The main alternative to the jury theorem is a diversity-based mechanism. Hélène Landemore (2012, 2020) draws on work by Lu Hong and Scott Page (2004) to argue that by bringing together diverse perspectives, democratic decision-making can outperform decision-making by less diverse groups, e.g., groups of experts.

Cristina Lafont (2019) objects that such epistemic instrumentalist arguments misconstrue the grounds of political legitimacy, echoing objections against epistocracy (section 3.3). According to Lafont, epistemic arguments for democracy imply that citizens ought to defer once the correct decision is identified. But, Lafont argues, the unique legitimacy of democracy stems from honoring each citizen’s equal political authoritativeness and seeing each citizen as an addressee of political justification, not as a co-supplier of information for tracking a correct answer to a question. This blocks a requirement to blindly defer to others – a point she argues is lost in epistemic instrumentalist theories of democratic legitimacy.

4.2 Pure Proceduralist Conceptions of Democratic Legitimacy

According to pure proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy, democratic decisions are legitimate as long as they are the result of an appropriately constrained process of democratic decision-making. These views place all the normative weight on the democratic procedure.

There are several ways in which pure proceduralism might be understood. On an account of aggregative democracy—which takes the aggregation of individual preferences, for example through voting, to be the key feature of democracy—pure proceduralism implies that democratic decisions are legitimate if the aggregative process is fair. Kenneth May’s defense of majority rule (May 1952) relies on a view of this sort (see also Dahl 1956).

On a deliberative account of democracy, legitimacy depends, at least in part, on the process of public deliberation (Manin 1987; Bohman 1996; Gutmann and Thompson 1996). Thomas Christiano has a good characterization of what pure proceduralism entails in an account of deliberative democracy: “democratic discussion, deliberation, and decisionmaking under certain conditions are what make the outcomes legitimate for each person. … [W]hatever the results of discussions, deliberation, and decisionmaking …, they are legitimate. The results are made legitimate by being the results of the procedure” (Christiano 1996: 35). The idea is that while democratic deliberation helps sorting through reasons for and against particular candidates or policy proposals, and perhaps even generates new alternatives, the legitimacy of the outcomes of such a process only depends on the fairness of the decision-making process, not on the quality of the outcomes it produces. The justification for conceptions of democratic legitimacy of this kind is that there is no shared standard for assessing the quality of the outcomes—deep disagreement about reasons for and against proposals will always remain. A fair way to resolve such disagreements is thus the only source of the legitimacy of the outcomes (Waldron 1996; Gaus 1997; Christiano 2008).

Estlund (2008) has raised a challenge against fairness-based versions of democratic proceduralism. He points out that other decision-making procedures—flipping a coin, for example—also satisfy a fairness requirement. An argument from fairness is thus insufficient to establish the superior legitimacy of democratic decision-making. Pure proceduralists can respond to this challenge by pointing to the distinctive fairness of democratic decision-making procedures. They can argue that the legitimacy of democratically made decisions stems from the kind of political equality realized only by democracy. According to Christiano (2008), only in a democracy are people publicly treated as equals. According to Viehoff (2014) and Kolodny (2023), only a democracy secures the kind of relational equality that avoids subordinating some citizens to the decisions of others.

Another response to Estlund’s challenge against fairness-based arguments is to focus on the kind of freedom that democracy offers, rather than on egalitarian considerations. Pettit’s equal control view, already mentioned in sections 1 and 3.3, rests on this strategy. Pettit’s republican theory defends democracy as uniquely able to secure the non-domination of the citizens. Lafont (2019) defends the legitimacy of democracy on the basis of its link to self-governance (see the discussion of her view in section 4.1).

A different proceduralist response to Estlund’s challenge is to point to the procedural epistemic values that the democratic process realizes—on how inclusive it is, for example, or how thoroughly the knowledge claims on which particular proposals rest have been subjected to criticism. The thought is that political legitimacy may be jeopardized not just by unequal access to political, social and economic institutions, but also by unjustified epistemic privilege. What Peter calls pure epistemic proceduralism is a conception of democratic legitimacy according to which political decisions are legitimate if they are the outcome of a deliberative democratic decision-making process that satisfies some conditions of political and epistemic fairness (Peter 2008).

4.3 Alternative Conceptions of Democratic Legitimacy

Some conceptions of democratic legitimacy seek to reconcile instrumentalist and non-instrumentalist considerations. What we may call rational proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy add conditions that refer to the quality of outcomes to those that apply to the procedural properties of democratic decision-making.

As is the case with pure proceduralist conceptions, rational proceduralist conceptions of democratic legitimacy also vary with the underlying account of democracy. A version of rational proceduralism is implicit in Arrow’s approach to aggregative democracy (Arrow 1963; see Peter 2008 for a discussion). The problem he poses is: are there methods of democratic decision-making that are based on equal consideration of individual interests and are conducive to rational social choice? As is well known, his impossibility theorem shows a problem with finding such decision-making mechanisms. Arrow’s way of posing the problem—which contrasts with May’s (1952)—suggests that the possible irrationality of majority rule undermines its legitimacy, even if it respects certain procedural values. His view implies that democratic legitimacy only obtains if the outcomes themselves satisfy certain quality conditions—specifically, he postulated that they should satisfy certain rationality axioms.

The default conception of democratic legitimacy that many deliberative democrats favor is also a version of rational proceduralism. Habermas’ conception of democratic legitimacy is an example. Drawing on discourse ethics, Habermas (1990; 1996) argues that people’s participation in the justificatory processes of deliberative democracy is necessary for political legitimacy. According to him, “the procedures and communicative presuppositions of democratic opinion- and will-formation function as the most important sluices for the discursive rationalization of the decisions of an administration bound by law and statute” (1996: 300). The legitimacy of democratic decisions, then, depends on both procedural values and on the substantive quality of the outcomes that these deliberative decision-making procedures generate. As Habermas puts it: “Deliberative politics acquires its legitimating force from the discursive structure of an opinion- and will-formation that can fulfill its socially integrative function only because citizens expect its results to have a reasonable quality” (Habermas 1996: 304; see also Benhabib 1994; Knight and Johnson 1994; Cohen 1997a,b; Bohman 1997). In his view, only deliberative democratic decision-making can produce a decision everyone has reasons to endorse.

Estlund objects to both pure proceduralist and the versions of rational proceduralism just discussed that they unduly neglect epistemic considerations. But he also objects to epistemic instrumentalist accounts that they fail to give a sufficient explanation for why those who disagree with the outcome of the democratic decision-making process ought to treat it as binding. To correct for that, Estlund’s alternative conception of democratic legitimacy puts more emphasis on procedures while still giving weight to epistemic considerations. The conception of legitimacy that he advocates “requires that the procedure can be held, in terms acceptable to all qualified points of view, to be epistemically the best (or close to it) among those that are better than random” (Estlund 2008: 98). By privileging what he calls the “qualified acceptability requirement” (2008: 40ff) over epistemic considerations, Estlund avoids the worry about political deference that drives Lafont’s (2019) rejection of epistemic theories of democratic legitimacy.

As we saw, worries about political deference are an important source for scepticism about both epistocratic and epistemic democracy theories of legitimacy (see also van Wietmarschen 2019, Lillehammer 2021, and Brinkmann 2022 on political deference). Peter (2023), by contrast, argues that these principled worries about political deference are overstated and that legitimate political decision-making may be compatible with a requirement to politically defer, even in a system that is overall democratic.

5. Legitimacy and Political Cosmopolitanism

Political cosmopolitanism about political legitimacy is the view that national communities are not the exclusive source of political legitimacy in the global realm. This is a minimal characterization. It is compatible with a system in which nation states and their governments remain the main political agents, as long as there is some attribution of legitimate political authority to international conventions. For even if states and their governments are the main political entities, there is still the question about appropriate relations among national actors. When should nation states recognize another political entity as legitimate? And what are appropriate sanctions against entities that do not meet the legitimacy criteria? Call this the problem of international legitimacy.

Political cosmopolitanism is also compatible with the much more demanding idea of replacing nation states and national governments—at least in certain policy areas—by global institutions. Examples of relevant policy areas are trade or the environment. The associated global institutions may include both global rules (e.g., the rules of the WTO treaty) and global political agents (e.g., the UN General Assembly). This raises the question of what conditions such global governance institutions have to satisfy in order to qualify as legitimate. Call this the problem of global legitimacy.

5.1 Political Nationalism

The more familiar, contrasting position is political nationalism. It is the view that only the political institutions of nation states pose and can overcome the legitimacy problem and hence be a source of political legitimacy. Political nationalism is usually defended on the grounds that there is something unique either about the coercion deployed by states or about the political authority which states possess which needs justification (see Stilz 2019 and Sadurski, Sevel, and Walton 2019 for recent explorations of these issues).

Political nationalism has had much influence on debates on global justice. Some have argued that because moral cosmopolitan commitments trump commitments to (national) legitimacy, a conception of global justice can be detached from concerns with legitimacy (Beitz 1979a,b, 1998; Pogge 2008). Others have argued—again assuming political nationalism—that legitimate authority at the level of the nation state is necessary to pursue moral cosmopolitan goals (Ypi 2008 provides an empirical argument). Yet others have argued against the idea of global justice altogether, on the grounds that political legitimacy ties obligations of justice to nation states (Blake 2001; Nagel 2005). What these approaches to global justice have failed to address is the possibility of sound political cosmopolitan conceptions of political legitimacy. Nicole Hassoun (2012) takes this issue as her starting-point. She argues that the coercive power of global governance institutions raises a legitimacy problem of its own and, turning the arguments of Michael Blake (2001) and Thomas Nagel (2005) on their heads, that securing the legitimacy of those institutions entails obligations of global justice. (See also Aytac 2022 on this, who approaches the issue from political realist perspective.)

5.2 Political Cosmopolitanism

There are two main approaches to both international and global legitimacy: the state-centered approach and the people-centered approach. The former takes appropriate relations among states as basic. As Charles Beitz characterizes this approach: “international society is understood as domestic society writ large, with states playing the roles occupied by persons in domestic society. States, not persons, are the subjects of international morality, and the rules that regulate their behavior are supposed to preserve a peaceful order of sovereign states” (1979b: 408; see also Beitz 1998). Locke, Bentham, and Mill, among others, approached the issue of international legitimacy in this way. Among contemporary thinkers, Michael Walzer (1977, 1980) defends a state-based—or as he calls it—community-based approach. The most important criterion of international legitimacy that he proposes is the criterion of non-interference. (For discussions of Walzer’s proposal, see Beitz 1979a, b). Others have put forward conceptions based on state consent. Rawls advocates a conception based on the consent of “well-ordered” (either “liberal” or “decent”) peoples (Rawls 1999; for critical discussions, see e.g., Buchanan 2000; Wenar 2002; Cavallero 2003).

The second approach takes features of individuals—their interests or their rights—as basic for legitimacy. At present, the most comprehensive contemporary philosophical treatment of international legitimacy of this kind is probably Allen Buchanan’s Justice, Legitimacy, and Self-Determination (2003). As mentioned above (section 2.2.), Buchanan advocates a moralized conception of legitimacy, according to which entities are legitimate if they are morally justified to wield political power. Specifically, political legitimacy requires that a minimal standard of justice is met.

On the basis of this moralized conception of legitimacy, Buchanan argues against the state-based conception and against state consent theories of legitimacy in particular. State consent, Buchanan claims, is neither necessary nor sufficient for legitimacy. It is not sufficient because it is well-known that states tend to be the worst perpetrators in matters of human rights and there is thus need for an independent international standard of minimal justice to obtain legitimacy. It is not necessary, because international law recognizes many obligations as binding even without the consent of acting governments. As long as these obligations are compatible with the minimal standard of justice, they are legitimate even if they have arisen without state consent.

Buchanan also rejects the idea that the source of a legitimacy deficit at the international level is the inequality among states. He does not believe that states need to have equal weight in international institutions. What he regards as the main problem of legitimacy at the international level is, instead, that “a technocratic elite, lacking in democratic accountability to individuals and nonstate groups, is playing an increasingly powerful role in a system of regional and global governance” (2003: 289). The more efficient remedy for this problem, he argues, is protecting basic human rights and improving democratic accountability.

Buchanan uses his conception of legitimacy to answer the question when a political entity—as formed, for example, by secession or by union—should be recognized as legitimate. He lists three criteria (Buchanan 2003: 266ff). The first is a “minimal internal justice requirement”. It specifies how political entities should treat those upon whom it wields political power. Specifically, it requires that basic human rights are protected. This requirement includes a demand for minimal democracy. But not all political entities that satisfy this requirement deserve to be recognized as legitimate. They also need to be formed in the right way. The second criterion is thus a criterion of procedural justice and requires that a political entity has not come about through usurpation (“nonusurpation requirement”). Finally, there is a “minimal external justice requirement”. It contains conditions about how political entities should interact with one another.

Sofia Näsström (2007) uses the people-centered approach to push against the tendency to associate state legitimacy with the legitimacy of governments. The more fundamental question, she argues, is what makes the constitution of a people legitimate. And it would be a mistake to think that the constitution of a people is a historical issue or an empirical given. What makes the constitution of a people legitimate is a normative question in its own right that must be asked before we can ask about the legitimacy of the government of a people.

The question Näsström articulates, which is also discussed in the literature on the constitution of the demos (Goodin 2007), is important for the debate on the ethics of immigration. What is the scope for legitimate border controls? Do states have a unilateral right to control their borders or do potential immigrants have a right to participate in the determination of immigration policies? Abizadeh (2008) has argued, on the basis of the claim that the constitution of the demos is not a historical given, that a commitment to a democratic theory of domestic political legitimacy implies that one ought to reject the unilateral domestic right to control and close the state’s boundaries. His key claim is that state borders are coercive to potential immigrants. In light of this, and because, in a democracy, the exercise of coercive political power requires some form of democratic justification, he concludes that both citizens and foreigners should have say in the determination of border policies. (See Miller 2008 for a critical discussion of this argument.)

Conceptions of global legitimacy broaden the scope of legitimate authority to global governance institutions. One of the precursors of global legitimacy is Kant. Kant is often read as advocating a conception of international legitimacy based on a loose “league of nations”—especially in Perpetual Peace. But Sharon Byrd and Joachim Hruschka (2008) argue that Kant, especially in The Doctrine of Right, can also be read as favoring, a “state of nation states” as the right approach to global legitimacy. This conception, while stopping short of requiring a single world state, confers more coercive political power to the global level than the league of nations, which essentially leaves untouched the sovereignty of nation states.

The philosophical literature on global legitimacy is very much work in progress. But most proposals favor a multilevel system of governance in which global legitimacy is to be achieved through an appropriate division of labor between nation states and issue-specific global governance institutions (e.g., Caney 2006; Valentini 2012).

Any successful theory of global legitimacy has to cover the following three issues. First, what are global governance institutions and in what ways can and should they be thought of as taking over roles from states or their governments? This is a question about the subject of global legitimacy (Hurrell and MacDonald 2012). Second, what is the legitimacy problem that such governance institutions face? And, third, how can they solve this problem of legitimacy and what are legitimacy criteria that apply to them? How, if at all, do these criteria differ from those that apply at the level of nation states?

In response to the first question, Buchanan and Keohane (2006) argue that global governance institutions such as the WTO or the IMF “are like governments in that they issue rules and publicly attach significant consequences to compliance or failure to comply with them—and claim authority to do so” (Buchanan and Keohane 2006: 406). These institutions are set up to handle certain issues in similar fashion as national political agencies would. Just like national political institutions, they are coordination devices. Only they are created to solve problems that arise at the global level.

Joshua Cohen and Charles Sabel (2005) have a slightly broader account of global governance institutions—one that is not limited to them being coordination devices, but that emphasizes coercion instead. According to Cohen and Sabel 2005: 765), “[t]o a substantial and growing extent … rulemaking directly affecting the freedom of action of individuals, firms, and nation states (and the making of rules to regulate this rulemaking) is taking place … in global settings created by the world’s nations but no longer under their effective control.” In their answer to the second question, they relate the legitimacy problem of global governance institutions to the absence of political authority, understood as legitimate exercises of coercive political power, at the global level. To overcome this problem, they argue, new modes of governance must be created, with their own structures of accountability. These structures are necessary to properly deal with the coercive power that these institutions exercise.

Buchanan and Keohane agree that the attempt to rule without legitimacy is an unjustified exercise of power. They also argue that the attempt to rule without legitimacy raises not only a normative problem, but has direct practical consequences, as institutions that appear unjustified will not be effective. The problem of legitimacy that global governance institutions face is that even when there is widespread agreement that global institutions that can take on the role of co-ordination devices are necessary, there will be widespread disagreement about which particular institutions are necessary and what rules they should issue (Buchanan and Keohane 2006: 408ff).

In answer to the third question, Buchanan and Keohane (2006) propose a moralized conception of legitimacy: legitimacy “is the right to rule, understood to mean both that institutional agents are morally justified in making rules and attempting to secure compliance with them and that people subject to those rules have moral, content-independent reasons to follow them and/or to not interfere with others’ compliance with them” (2006: 411). Substantively, they propose that an institution is morally justified in this way if it does not contribute to grave injustices (“minimal moral acceptability”), if there is no obvious alternative that would perform better (“comparative benefit”), and if it respects its own guidelines and procedures (“institutional integrity”) (Buchanan and Keohane 2006: 419ff).

An important question for political cosmopolitanism is to what extent international and global legitimacy require democracy—either at the level of national states and governments or at the level of global governance institutions. Many writers on the subject have tended to take a cautiously positive stance on this issue (e.g., Beitz 1979b, 1998; Held 1995, 2002; Buchanan 2003; Buchanan and Keohane 2006). An exception is Rawls in The Law of Peoples, however, who advocates a conception of international legitimacy that demands that peoples and their states are well-ordered, but does not associate well-orderedness with democracy.

There are two worries that tend to underlie the cautious attitude. One is feasibility: it is often argued that democracy at the international level, let alone at the level of global governance institutions, is utopian and cannot be realized. The second worry is of a moral nature: democracy should not be imposed on people and peoples who endorse a different set of values (see Valentini 2014 for a discussion).

In response to the second worry, Christiano (2015) argues that a human right to democracy is compatible with a right to self-determination and that, properly understood, the right to self-determination presupposes the human right to democracy. Christiano’s work offers the most comprehensive defense of a human right to democracy at the domestic level (Christiano 2011; 2015). Christiano’s instrumental argument aims to show that democracies offer better protection of a range of human rights than non-democracies. His intrinsic argument for a human right to democracy builds on an argument discussed earlier (section 4.2), namely that democracies are uniquely able to realize the value of publicly treating people as equals.

Cohen and Sabel (2005) seek to rescue an ideal of global democracy from more skeptical tendencies in the literature. They respond to these considerations by advocating a notion of global democracy that emphasizes the deliberative aspect. Granting to skeptics that democratic decision-making mechanisms might be problematic for both feasibility reasons and moral reasons, they argue that some form of deliberation is primarily what is needed to address the legitimacy deficit that global governance institutions face (see also Appiah 2007; List and Koenig-Archibugi 2010).


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I would like to thank Thomas Pogge and Laura Valentini for very helpful comments on earlier versions of this article.

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Fabienne Peter <f.peter@warwick.ac.uk>

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